Human Nature

First published Mon Mar 15, 2021

Talk of human nature is a common feature of moral and political discourse among people on the street and among philosophers, political scientists and sociologists. This is largely due to the widespread assumption that true descriptive or explanatory claims making use of the concept of human nature have, or would have, considerable normative significance. Some think that human nature excludes the possibility of certain forms of social organisation—for example, that it excludes any broadly egalitarian society. Others make the stronger claim that a true normative ethical theory has to be built on prior knowledge of human nature. Still others believe that there are specific moral prohibitions concerning the alteration of, or interference in, the set of properties that make up human nature. Finally, there are those who argue that the normative significance derives from the fact that merely deploying the concept is typically, or even necessarily, pernicious.

Alongside such varying and frequently conflicting normative uses of the expression “human nature”, there are serious disagreements concerning the concept’s content and explanatory significance—the starkest being whether the expression “human nature” refers to anything at all. Some reasons given for saying there is no human nature are anthropological, grounded in views concerning the relationship between natural and cultural features of human life. Other reasons given are biological, deriving from the character of the human species as, like other species, an essentially historical product of evolution. Whether these reasons justify the claim that there is no human nature depends, at least in part, on what it is exactly that the expression is supposed to be picking out. Many contemporary proposals differ significantly in their answers to this question.

Understanding the debates around the philosophical use of the expression “human nature” requires clarity on the reasons both for (1) adopting specific adequacy conditions for the term’s use and for (2) accepting particular substantial claims made within the framework thus adopted. One obstacle to such clarity is historical: we have inherited from the beginnings of Western philosophy, via its Medieval reception, the idea that talk of human nature brings into play a number of different, but related claims. One such set of claims derives from different meanings of the Greek equivalents of the term “nature”. This bundle of claims, which can be labelled the traditional package, is a set of adequacy conditions for any substantial claim that uses the expression “human nature”. The beginnings of Western philosophy have also handed down to us a number of such substantial claims. Examples are that humans are “rational animals” or “political animals”. We can call these claims the traditional slogans. The traditional package is a set of specifications of how claims along the lines of the traditional slogans are to be understood, i.e., what it means to claim that it is “human nature” to be, for example, a rational animal.

Various developments in Western thought have cast doubt both on the coherence of the traditional package and on the possibility that the adequacy conditions for the individual claims can be fulfilled. Foremost among these developments are the Enlightenment rejection of teleological metaphysics, the Historicist emphasis on the significance of culture for understanding human action and the Darwinian introduction of history into biological kinds. This entry aims to help clarify the adequacy conditions for claims about human nature, the satisfiability of such conditions and the reasons why the truth of claims with the relevant conditions might seem important. It proceeds in five steps. Section 1 unpacks the traditional package, paying particular attention to the importance of Aristotelian themes and to the distinction between the scientific and participant perspectives from which human nature claims can be raised. Section 2 explains why evolutionary biology raises serious problems both for the coherence of this package and for the truth of its individual component claims. Sections 3 and 4 then focus on attempts to secure scientific conceptions of human nature in the face of the challenge from evolutionary biology. The entry concludes with a discussion of accounts of human nature developed from a participant perspective, in particular accounts that, in spite of the evolutionary challenge, are taken to have normative consequences.

1. “Humans”, Slogans and the Traditional Package

1.1 “Humans”

Before we begin unpacking, it should be noted that the adjective “human” is polysemous, a fact that often goes unnoticed in discussions of human nature, but makes a big difference to both the methodological tractability and truth of claims that employ the expression. The natural assumption may appear to be that we are talking about specimens of the biological species Homo sapiens, that is, organisms belonging to the taxon that split from the rest of the hominin lineage an estimated 150,000 years ago. However, certain claims seem to be best understood as at least potentially referring to organisms belonging to various older species within the subtribe Homo, with whom specimens of Homo sapiens share properties that have often been deemed significant (Sterelny 2018: 114).

On the other hand, the “nature” that is of interest often appears to be that of organisms belonging to a more restricted group. There may have been a significant time lag between the speciation of anatomically modern humans (Homo sapiens) and the evolution of behaviourally modern humans, i.e., human populations whose life forms involved symbol use, complex tool making, coordinated hunting and increased geographic range. Behavioural modernity’s development is often believed only to have been completed by 50,000 years ago. If, as is sometimes claimed, behavioural modernity requires psychological capacities for planning, abstract thought, innovativeness and symbolism (McBrearty & Brooks 2000: 492) and if these were not yet widely or sufficiently present for several tens of thousands of years after speciation, then it may well be behaviourally, rather than anatomically modern humans whose “nature” is of interest to many theories. Perhaps the restriction might be drawn even tighter to include only contemporary humans, that is, those specimens of the species who, since the introduction of agriculture around 12,000 years ago, evolved the skills and capacities necessary for life in large sedentary, impersonal and hierarchical groups (Kappeler, Fichtel, & van Schaik 2019: 68).

It was, after all, a Greek living less than two and a half millennia ago within such a sedentary, hierarchically organised population structure, who could have had no conception of the prehistory of the beings he called anthrôpoi, whose thoughts on their “nature” have been decisive for the history of philosophical reflection on the subject. It seems highly likely that, without the influence of Aristotle, discussions of “human nature” would not be structured as they are until today.

1.2 Unpacking the Traditional Package

We can usefully distinguish four types of claim that have been traditionally made using the expression “human nature”. As a result of a particular feature of Aristotle’s philosophy, to which we will come in a moment, these four claims are associated with five different uses of the expression. Uses of the first type seem to have their origin in Plato; uses of the second, third and fourth type are Aristotelian; and, although uses of the fifth type have historically been associated with Aristotle, this association seems to derive from a misreading in the context of the religiously motivated Mediaeval reception of his philosophy.

A first, thin, contrastive use of the expression “human nature” is provided by the application of a thin, generic concept of nature to humans. In this minimal variant, nature is understood in purely contrastive or negative terms. Phusis is contrasted in Plato and Aristotle with technē, where the latter is the product of intention and a corresponding intervention of agency. If the entire cosmos is taken to be the product of divine agency, then, as Plato argued (Nadaf 2005: 1ff.), conceptualisations of the cosmos as natural in this sense are mistaken. Absent divine agency, the types of agents whose intentions are relevant for the status of anything as natural are human agents. Applied to humans, then, this concept of nature picks out human features that are not the results of human intentional action. Thus understood, human nature is the set of human features or processes that remain after subtraction of those picked out by concepts of the non-natural, concepts such as “culture”, “nurture”, or “socialisation”.

A second component in the package supplies the thin concept with substantial content that confers on it explanatory power. According to Aristotle, natural entities are those that contain in themselves the principle of their own production or development, in the way that acorns contain a blueprint for their own realisation as oak trees (Physics 192b; Metaphysics 1014b). The “nature” of natural entities thus conceptualised is a subset of the features that make up their nature in the first sense. The human specification of this explanatory concept of nature aims to pick out human features that similarly function as blueprints for something like a fully realised form. According to Aristotle, for all animals that blueprint is “the soul”, that is, the integrated functional capacities that characterise the fully developed entity. The blueprint is realised when matter, i.e., the body, has attained the level of organisation required to instantiate the animal’s living functions (Charles 2000: 320ff.; Lennox 2009: 356).

A terminological complication is introduced here by the fact that the fully developed form of an entity is itself also frequently designated as its “nature” (Aristotle, Physics 193b; Politics 1252b). In Aristotle’s teleological metaphysics, this is the entity’s end, “that for the sake of which a thing is” (Metaphysics 1050a; Charles 2000: 259). Thus, a human’s “nature”, like that of any other being, may be either the features in virtue of which it is disposed to develop to a certain mature form or, thirdly, the form to which it is disposed to develop.

Importantly, the particularly prominent focus on the idea of a fully developed form in Aristotle’s discussions of humans derives from its dual role. It is not only the form to the realisation of which human neonates are disposed; it is also the form that mature members of the species ought to realise (Politics 1253a). This normative specification is the fourth component of the traditional package. The second, third and fourth uses of “nature” are all in the original package firmly anchored in a teleological metaphysics. One question for systematic claims about human nature is whether any of these components remain plausible if we reject a teleology firmly anchored in theology (Sedley 2010: 5ff.).

A fifth and last component of the package that has traditionally been taken to have been handed down from antiquity is classificatory. Here, the property or set of properties named by the expression “human nature” is that property or property set in virtue of the possession of which particular organisms belong to a particular biological taxon: what we now identify as the species taxon Homo sapiens. This is human nature typologically understood.

This, then, is the traditional package:

Component Variant of human nature
TP1 contrastive
TP2 blueprint explanatory
TP3 explanatorily teleological
TP4 normatively teleological
TP5 classificatory or taxonomic

1.3 Essentialisms

The sort of properties that have traditionally been taken to support the classificatory practices relevant to TP5 are intrinsic to the individual organisms in question. Moreover, they have been taken to be able to fulfil this role in virtue of being necessary and sufficient for the organism’s membership of the species, i.e., “essential” in one meaning of the term. This view of species membership, and the associated view of species themselves, has been influentially dubbed “typological thinking” (Mayr 1959 [1976: 27f.]; cf. Mayr 1982: 260) and “essentialism” (Hull 1965: 314ff.; cf. Mayr 1968 [1976: 428f.]). The former characterisation involves an epistemological focus on the classificatory procedure, the latter a metaphysical focus on the properties thus singled out. Ernst Mayr claimed that the classificatory approach originates in Plato’s theory of forms, and, as a result, involves the further assumption that the properties are unchanging. According to David Hull, its root cause is the attempt to fit the ontology of species taxa to an Aristotelian theory of definition.

The theory of definition developed in Aristotle’s logical works assigns entities to a genus and distinguishes them from other members of the genus, i.e., from other “species”, by their differentiae (Topics 103b). The procedure is descended from the “method of division” of Plato, who provides a crude example as applied to humans, when he has the Eleatic Stranger in the Statesman characterise them as featherless bipeds (266e). Hull and many scholars in his wake (Dupré 2001: 102f.) have claimed that this simple schema for picking out essential conditions for species membership had a seriously deleterious effect on biological taxonomy until Darwin (cf. Winsor 2006).

However, there is now widespread agreement that Aristotle was no taxonomic essentialist (Balme 1980: 5ff.; Mayr 1982: 150ff.; Balme 1987: 72ff.; Ereshefsky 2001: 20f; Richards 2010: 21ff.; Wilkins 2018: 9ff.). First, the distinction between genus and differentiae was for Aristotle relative to the task at hand, so that a “species” picked out in this manner could then count as the genus for further differentiation. Second, the Latin term “species”, a translation of the Greek eidos, was a logical category with no privileged relationship to biological entities; a prime example in the Topics is the species justice, distinguished within the genus virtue (143a). Third, in a key methodological passage, Parts of Animals, I.2–3 (642b–644b), Aristotle explicitly rejects the method of “dichotomous division”, which assigns entities to a genus and then seeks a single differentia, as inappropriate to the individuation of animal kinds. Instead, he claims, a multiplicity of differentiae should be brought to bear. He emphasises this point in relation to humans (644a).

According to Pierre Pellegrin and David Balme, Aristotle did not seek to establish a taxonomic system in his biological works (Pellegrin 1982 [1986: 113ff.]; Balme 1987, 72). Rather, he simply accepted the everyday common sense partitioning of the animal world (Pellegrin 1982 [1986: 120]; Richards 2010: 24; but cf. Charles 2000: 343ff.). If this is correct, Aristotle didn’t even ask after the conditions for belonging to the species Homo sapiens. So he wasn’t proposing any particular answer, and specifically not the “essentialist” answer advanced by TP5. In as far as such an answer has been employed in biological taxonomy (cf. Winsor 2003), its roots appear to lie in Neoplatonic, Catholic misinterpretations of Aristotle (Richards 2010: 34ff.; Wilkins 2018: 22ff.). Be that as it may, the fifth use of “human nature” transported by tradition—to pick out essential conditions for an organism’s belonging to the species—is of eminent interest. The systematic concern behind Mayr and Hull’s historical claims is that accounts of the form of TP5 are incompatible with evolutionary theory. We shall look at this concern in section 2 of this entry.

Because the term “essentialism” recurs with different meanings in discussions of human nature and because some of the theoretical claims thus summarised are assumed to be Aristotelian in origin, it is worth spending a moment here to register what claims can be singled out by the expression. The first, purely classificatory conception just discussed should be distinguished from a second view that is also frequently labelled “essentialist” and which goes back to Locke’s concept of “real essence” (1689: III, iii, 15). According to essentialism thus understood, an essence is the intrinsic feature or features of an entity that fulfils or fulfil a dual role: firstly, of being that in virtue of which something belongs to a kind and, secondly, of explaining why things of that kind typically have a particular set of observable features. Thus conceived, “essence” has both a classificatory and an explanatory function and is the core of a highly influential, “essentialist” theory of natural kinds, developed in the wake of Kripke’s and Putnam’s theories of reference.

An account of human nature that is essentialist in this sense would take the nature of the human natural kind to be a set of microstructural properties that have two roles: first, they constitute an organism’s membership of the species Homo sapiens. Second, they are causally responsible for the organism manifesting morphological and behavioural properties typical of species members. Paradigms of entities with such natures or essences are chemical elements. An example is the element with the atomic number 79, the microstructural feature that accounts for surface properties of gold such as yellowness. Applied to organisms, it seems that the relevant explanatory relationship will be developmental, the microstructures providing something like a blueprint for the properties of the mature individual. Kripke assumed that some such blueprint is the “internal structure” responsible for the typical development of tigers as striped, carnivorous quadrupeds (Kripke 1972 [1980: 120f.]).

As the first, pseudo-Aristotelian version of essentialism illustrates, the classificatory and explanatory components of what we might call “Kripkean essentialism” can be taken apart. Thus, “human nature” can also be understood in exclusively explanatory terms, viz. as the set of microstructural properties responsible for typical human morphological and behavioural features. In such an account, the ability to pick out the relevant organisms is simply presupposed. As we shall see in section 4 of this entry, accounts of this kind have been popular in the contemporary debate. The subtraction of the classificatory function of the properties in these conceptions has generally seemed to warrant withholding from them the label “essentialist”. However, because some authors have still seen the term as applicable (Dupré 2001: 162), we might think of such accounts as constituting a third, weak or deflationary variant of essentialism.

Such purely explanatory accounts are descendants of the second use of “human nature” in the traditional package, the difference being that they don’t usually presuppose some notion of the fully developed human form. However, where some such presupposition is made, there are stronger grounds for talking of an “essentialist” account. Elliott Sober has argued that the key to essentialism is not classification in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions, but the postulation of some “privileged state”, to the realisation of which specimens of a species tend, as long as no extrinsic factors “interfere” (Sober 1980: 358ff.). Such a dispositional-teleological conception, dissociated from classificatory ambitions, would be a fourth form of essentialism. Sober rightly associates such an account with Aristotle, citing Aristotle’s claims in his zoological writings that interfering forces are responsible for deviations, i.e., morphological differences, both within and between species. A contemporary account of human nature with this structure will be discussed in section 4.

A fifth and final form of essentialism is even more clearly Aristotelian. Here, an explicitly normative status is conferred on the set of properties to the development of which human organisms tend. For normative essentialism, “the human essence” or “human nature” is a normative standard for the evaluation of organisms belonging to the species. Where the first, third and fourth uses of the expression have tended to be made with critical intent (for defensive exceptions, see Charles 2000: 348ff.; Walsh 2006; Devitt 2008; Boulter 2012), this fifth use is more often a self-ascription (e.g., Nussbaum 1992). It is intended to emphasise metaethical claims of a specific type. According to such claims, an organism’s belonging to the human species entails or in some way involves the applicability to the organism of moral norms that ground in the value of the fully developed human form. According to one version of this thought, humans ought be, or ought to be enabled to be, rational because rationality is a key feature of the fully developed human form. Such normative-teleological accounts of human nature will be the focus of section 5.2.

We can summarise the variants of essentialism and their relationship to the components of the traditional package as follows:

Type of essentialism Relationship to the traditional package
purely classificatory equivalent to TP5
purely explanatory unspecific version of TP2
explanatory-classificatory combines TP5 with an unspecific version of TP2
explanatorily teleological equivalent to TP3
normatively teleological equivalent to TP4

Section 2 and section 5 of this entry deal with the purely classificatory and the normative teleological conceptions of human nature respectively, and with the associated types of essentialism. Section 3 discusses attempts to downgrade TP5, moving from essential to merely characteristic properties. Section 4 focuses on accounts of an explanatory human nature, both on attempts to provide a modernized version of the teleological blueprint model (§4.1) and on explanatory conceptions with deflationary intent relative to the claims of TP2 and TP3 (§4.2 and §4.3).

1.4 On the Status of the Traditional Slogan

The traditional package specifies a set of conditions some or all of which substantial claims about “human nature” are supposed to meet. Before we turn to the systematic arguments central to contemporary debates on whether such conditions can be met, it will be helpful to spend a moment considering one highly influential substantial claim. Aristotle’s writings prominently contain two such claims that have been handed down in slogan form. The first is that the human being (more accurately: “man”) is an animal that is in some important sense social (“zoon politikon”, History of Animals 487b; Politics 1253a; Nicomachean Ethics 1169b). According to the second, “he” is a rational animal (Politics 1523a, where Aristotle doesn’t actually use the traditionally ascribed slogan, “zoon logon echon”).

Aristotle makes both claims in very different theoretical contexts, on the one hand, in his zoological writings and, on the other, in his ethical and political works. This fact, together with the fact that Aristotle’s philosophy of nature and his practical philosophy are united by a teleological metaphysics, may make it appear obvious that the slogans are biological claims that provide a foundation for normative claims in ethics and politics. The slogans do indeed function as foundations in the Politics and the Nicomachean Ethics respectively (on the latter, see section 5 of this entry). It is, however, unclear whether they are to be understood as biological claims. Let us focus on the slogan that has traditionally dominated discussions of human nature in Western philosophy, that humans are “rational animals”.

First, if Pellegrin and Balme are right that Aristotelian zoology is uninterested in classifying species, then ascribing the capacity for “rationality” cannot have the function of naming a biological trait that distinguishes humans from other animals. This is supported by two further sets of considerations. To begin with, Aristotle’s explicit assertion that a series of differentiae would be needed to “define” humans (Parts of Animals 644a) is cashed out in the long list of features he takes to be their distinguishing marks, such as speech, having hair on both eyelids, blinking, having hands, upright posture, breasts in front, the largest and moistest brain, fleshy legs and buttocks (Lloyd 1983: 29ff.). Furthermore, there is in Aristotle no capacity for reason that is both exclusive to, and universal among anthropoi. One part or kind of reason, “practical intelligence” (phronesis), is, Aristotle claims, found in both humans and other animals, being merely superior in the former (Parts of Animals, 687a). Now, there are other forms of reasoning of which this is not true, forms whose presence are sufficient for being human: humans are the only animals capable of deliberation (History of Animals 488b) and reasoning (to noein), in as far as this extends to mathematics and first philosophy. Nevertheless, these forms of reasoning are unnecessary: slaves, who Aristotle includes among humans (Politics 1255a), are said to have no deliberative faculty (to bouleutikon) at all (Politics 1260a; cf. Richter 2011: 42ff.). Presumably, they will also be without the capacities necessary for first philosophy.

Second, these Aristotelian claims raise the question as to whether the ascription of rationality is even intended as an ascription to an individual in as far as she or he belongs to a biological kind. The answer might appear to be obviously affirmative. Aristotle uses the claim that a higher level of reason is characteristic of humans to teleologically explain other morphological features, in particular upright gait and the morphology of the hands (Parts of Animals 686a, 687a). However, the kind of reason at issue here is practical intelligence, the kind humans and animals share, not the capacity for mathematics and metaphysics, which among animals is exercised exclusively by humans. In as far as humans are able to exercise this latter capacity in contemplation, Aristotle claims that they “partake of the divine” (Parts of Animals 656a), a claim of which he makes extensive use when grounding his ethics in human rationality (Nicomachean Ethics 1177b–1178b). When, in a passage to which James Lennox has drawn attention (Lennox 1999), Aristotle declares that the rational part of the soul cannot be the object of natural science (Parts of Animals 645a), it seems to be the contemplative part of the soul that is thus excluded from biological investigation, precisely the feature that is named in the influential slogan. If it is the “something divine … present in” humans that is decisively distinctive of their kind, it seems unclear whether the relevant kind is biological.

It is not the aim of this entry to decide questions of Aristotle interpretation. What is important is that the relationship of the question of “human nature” to biology is, from the beginning of the concept’s career, not as unequivocal as is often assumed (e.g., Hull 1986: 7; Richards 2010: 217f.). This is particularly true of the slogan according to which humans are rational animals. In the history of philosophy, this slogan has frequently been detached from any attempt to provide criteria for biological classification or characterisation. When Aquinas picks up the slogan, he is concerned to emphasise that human nature involves a material, corporeal aspect. This aspect is, however, not thought of in biological terms. Humans are decisively “rational substances”, i.e., persons. As such they also belong to a kind whose members also number angels and God (three times) (Eberl 2004). Similarly, Kant is primarily, indeed almost exclusively, interested in human beings as examples of “rational nature”, “human nature” being only one way in which rational nature can be instantiated (Kant 1785, 64, 76, 85). For this reason, Kant generally talks of “rational beings”, rather than of “rational animals” (1785, 45, 95).

There is, then, a perspective on humans that is plausibly present in Aristotle, stronger in Aquinas and dominant in Kant and that involves seeing them as instances of a kind other than the “human kind”, i.e., seeing the human animal “as a rational being” (Kant 1785 [1996: 45]). According to this view, the “nature” of humans that is most worthy of philosophical interest is the one they possess not insofar as they are human, but insofar as they are rational. Where this is the relevant use of the concept of human nature, being a specimen of the biological species is unnecessary for possessing the corresponding property. Specimens of other species, as well as non-biological entities may also belong to the relevant kind. It is also insufficient, as not all humans will have the properties necessary for membership in that kind.

As both a biologist and ethicist, Aristotle is at once a detached scientist and a participant in forms of interpersonal and political interaction only available to contemporary humans living in large, sedentary subpopulations. It seems plausible that a participant perspective may have suggested a different take on what it is to be human, perhaps even a different take on the sense in which humans might be rational animals, to that of biological science. We will return to this difference in section 5 of the entry.

2. The Nature of the Evolutionary Unit Homo sapiens and its Specimens

Detailing the features in virtue of which an organism is a specimen of the species Homo sapiens is a purely biological task. Whether such specification is achievable and, if so how, is controversial. It is controversial for the same reasons for which it is controversial what conditions need to be met for an organism to be a specimen of any species. These reasons derive from the theory of evolution.

A first step to understanding these reasons involves noting a further ambiguity in the use of the expression “human nature”, this time an ambiguity specific to taxonomy. The term can be used to pick out a set of properties as an answer to two different questions. The first concerns the properties of some organism which make it the case that it belongs to the species Homo sapiens. The second concerns the properties in virtue of which a population or metapopulation is the species Homo sapiens. Correspondingly, “human nature” can pick out either the properties of organisms that constitute their partaking in the species Homo sapiens or the properties of some higher-level entity that constitute it as that species. Human nature might then either be the nature of the species or the nature of species specimens as specimens of the species.

It is evolution that confers on this distinction its particular form and importance. The variation among organismic traits, without which there would be no evolution, has its decisive effects at the level of populations. These are groups of organisms that in some way cohere at a time in spite of the variation of traits among the component organisms. It is population-level groupings, taxa, not organisms, that evolve and it is taxa, such as species, that provide the organisms that belong to them with genetic resources (Ghiselin 1987: 141). The species Homo sapiens appears to be a metapopulation that coheres at least in part because of the gene flow between its component organisms brought about by interbreeding (cf. Ereshefsky 1991: 96ff.). Hence, according to evolutionary theory, Homo sapiens is plausibly a higher-level entity—a unit of evolution—consisting of the lower-level entities that are individual human beings. The two questions phrased in terms of “human nature” thus concern the conditions for individuation of the population-level entity and the conditions under which organisms are components of that entity.

2.1 The Nature of the Species Taxon

The theory of evolution transforms the way we should understand the relationship between human organisms and the species to which they belong. The taxonomic assumption of TP5 was that species are individuated by means of intrinsic properties that are individually instantiated by certain organisms. Instantiating those properties is taken to be necessary and sufficient for those organisms to belong to the species. Evolutionary theory makes it clear that species, as population-level entities, cannot be individuated by means of the properties of lower-level constituents, in our case, of individual human organisms (Sober 1980: 355).

The exclusion of this possibility grounds a decisive difference from the way natural kinds are standardly construed in the wake of Locke and Kripke. Recall that, in this Kripkean construal, lumps of matter are instances of chemical kinds because of their satisfaction of intrinsic necessary and sufficient conditions, viz. their atoms possessing a certain number of protons. The same conditions also individuate the chemical kinds themselves. Chemical kinds are thus spatiotemporally unrestricted sets. This means that there are no metaphysical barriers to the chance generation of members of the kind, independently of whether the kind is instantiated at any contiguous time or place. Nitrogen could come to exist by metaphysical happenstance, should an element with the atomic number 14 somehow come into being, even in a world in which up to that point no nitrogen has existed (Hull 1978: 349; 1984: 22).

In contrast, a species can only exist at time \(t_n\) if either it or a parent species existed at \(t_{n-1}\) and there was some relationship of spatial contiguity between component individuals of the species at \(t_n\) and the individuals belonging to either the same species or the parent species at \(t_{n-1}\). This is because of the essential role of the causal relationship of heredity. Heredity generates both the coherence across a population requisite for the existence of a species and the variability of predominant traits within the population, without which a species would not evolve.

For this reason, the species Homo sapiens, like every other species taxon, must meet a historical or genealogical condition. (For pluralistic objections to even this condition, see Kitcher 1984: 320ff.; Dupré 1993: 49f.) This condition is best expressed as a segment of a population-level phylogenetic tree, where such trees represent ancestor-descendent series (Hull 1978: 349; de Queiroz 1999: 50ff.; 2005). Species, as the point is often put, are historical entities, rather than kinds or classes (Hull 1978: 338ff.; 1984: 19). The fact that species are not only temporally, but also spatially restricted has also led to the stronger claim that they are individuals (Ghiselin 1974; 1997: 14ff.; Hull 1978: 338). If this is correct, then organisms are not members, but parts of species taxa. Independently of whether this claim is true for all biological species, Homo sapiens is a good candidate for a species that belongs to the category individual. This is because the species is characterised not only by spatiotemporal continuity, but also by causal processes that account for the coherence between its component parts. These processes plausibly include not only interbreeding, but also conspecific recognition and particular forms of communication (Richards 2010: 158ff., 218).

Importantly, the genealogical condition is only a necessary condition, as genealogy unites all the segments of one lineage. The segment of the phylogenetic tree that represents some species taxon begins with a node that represents a lineage-splitting or speciation event. Determining that node requires attention to general speciation theory, which has proposed various competing criteria (Dupré 1993: 48f.; Okasha 2002: 201; Coyne & Orr 2004). In the case of Homo sapiens, it requires attention to the specifics of the human case, which are also controversial (see Crow 2003; Cela-Conde & Ayala 2017: 11ff.). The end point of the segment is marked either by some further speciation event or, as may seem likely in the case of Homo sapiens, by the destruction of the metapopulation. Only when the temporal boundaries of the segment have become determinate would it be possible to adduce sufficient conditions for the existence of such a historical entity. Hence, if “human nature” is understood to pick out the necessary and sufficient conditions that individuate the species taxon Homo sapiens, its content is not only controversial, but epistemically unavailable to us.

2.2 The Nature of Species Specimens as Species Specimens

If we take such a view of the individuating conditions for the species Homo sapiens, what are the consequences for the question of which organisms belong to the species? It might appear that it leaves open the possibility that speciation has resulted in some intrinsic property or set of properties establishing the cohesion specific to the taxon and that such properties count as necessary and sufficient for belonging to it (cf. Devitt 2008: 17ff.). This appearance would be deceptive. To begin with, no intrinsic property can be necessary because of the sheer empirical improbability that all species specimens grouped together by the relevant lineage segment instantiate any such candidate property. For example, there are individuals who are missing legs, inner organs or the capacity for language, but who remain biologically human (Hull 1986: 5). Evolutionary theory clarifies why this is so: variability, secured by mechanisms such as mutation and recombination, is the key to evolution, so that, should some qualitative property happen to be universal among all extant species specimens immediately after the completion of speciation, that is no guarantee that it will continue to be so throughout the lifespan of the taxon (Hull 1984: 35; Ereshefsky 2008: 101). The common thought that there must be at least some genetic property common to all human organisms is also false (R. Wilson 1999a: 190; Sterelny & Griffiths 1999: 7; Okasha 2002: 196f.): phenotypical properties that are shared in a population are frequently co-instantiated as a result of the complex interaction of differing gene-regulatory networks. Conversely, the same network can under different circumstances lead to differing phenotypical consequences (Walsh 2006: 437ff.). Even if it should turn out that every human organism instantiated some property, this would be a contingent, rather than a necessary fact (Sober 1980: 354; Hull 1986: 3).

Moreover, the chances of any such universal property also being sufficient are vanishingly small, as the sharing of properties by specimens of other species can result from various mechanisms, in particular from the inheritance of common genes in related species and from parallel evolution. This doesn’t entail that there may be no intrinsic properties that are sufficient belonging to the species. There are fairly good candidates for such properties, if we compare humans with other terrestrial organisms. Language use and a self-understanding as moral agents come to mind. However, whether non-terrestrial entities might possess such properties is an open question. And decisively, they are obviously hopeless as necessary conditions (cf. Samuels 2012: 9).

This leaves only the possibility that the conditions for belonging to the species are, like the individuating conditions for the species taxon, relational. Lineage-based individuation of a taxon depends on its component organisms being spatially and temporally situated in such a way that the causal processes necessary for the inheritance of traits can take place. In the human case, the key processes are those of sexual reproduction. Therefore, being an organism that belongs to the species Homo sapiens is a matter of being connected reproductively to organisms situated unequivocally on the relevant lineage segment. In other words, the key necessary condition is having been sexually reproduced by specimens of the species (Kronfeldner 2018: 100). Hull suggests that the causal condition may be disjunctive, as it could also be fulfilled by a synthetic entity created by scientists that produces offspring with humans who have been generated in the standard manner (Hull 1978: 349). Provided that the species is not in the throes of speciation, such direct descent or integration into the reproductive community, i.e., participation in the “complex network […] of mating and reproduction” (Hull 1986: 4), will also be sufficient.

2.3 Responding to the Evolutionary Verdict on Classificatory Essences

The lack of a “human essence” in the sense of intrinsic necessary and sufficient conditions for belonging to the species taxon Homo sapiens, has led a number of philosophers to deny that there is any such thing as human nature (Hull 1984: 19; 1986; Ghiselin 1997: 1; de Sousa 2000). As this negative claim concerns properties intrinsic both to relevant organisms and to the taxon, it is equally directed at the “nature” of the organisms as species specimens and at that of the species taxon itself. An alternative consists in retracting the condition that a classificatory essence must be intrinsic, a move which allows talk of a historical or relational essence and a corresponding relational conception of taxonomic human nature (Okasha 2002: 202).

Which of these ways of responding to the challenge from evolutionary theory appears best is likely to depend on how one takes it that the classificatory issues relate to the other matters at stake in the original human nature package. These concern the explanatory and normative questions raised by TP1–TP4. We turn to these in the following three sections of this article.

An exclusively genealogical conception of human nature is clearly not well placed to fulfil an explanatory role comparable to that envisaged in the traditional package. What might have an explanatory function are the properties of the entities from which the taxon or its specimens are descended. Human nature, genealogically understood, might serve as the conduit for explanations in terms of such properties, but will not itself explain anything. After all, integration in a network of sexual reproduction will be partly definitive of the specimens of all sexual species, whilst what is to be explained will vary enormously across taxa.

This lack of fit between classificatory and explanatory roles confronts us with a number of further theoretical possibilities. For example, one might see this incompatibility as strengthening the worries of eliminativists such as Ghiselin and Hull: even if the subtraction of intrinsicality were not on its own sufficient to justify abandoning talk of human nature, its conjunction with a lack of explanatory power, one might think, certainly is (Dupré 2003: 109f.; Lewens 2012: 473). Or one might argue that it is the classificatory ambitions associated with talk of human nature that should be abandoned. Once this is done, one might hope that certain sets of intrinsic properties can be distinguished that figure decisively in explanations and that can still justifiably be labelled “human nature” (Roughley 2011: 15; Godfrey-Smith 2014: 140).

Taking this second line in turn raises two questions: first, in what sense are the properties thus picked out specifically “human”, if they are neither universal among, nor unique to species specimens? Second, in what sense are the properties “natural”? Naturalness as independence from the effects of human intentional action is a key feature of the original package (TP1). Whether some such conception can be coherently applied to humans is a challenge for any non-classificatory account.

3. Characteristic Human Properties

3.1 Privileging Properties

The answer given by TP2 to the first question was in terms of the fully developed human form, where “form” does not refer solely to observable physical or behavioural characteristics, but also includes psychological features. This answer entails two claims: first, that there is one single such “form”, i.e., property or set of properties, that figures in explanations that range across individual human organisms. It also entails that there is a point in human development that counts as “full”, that is, as development’s goal or “telos”. These claims go hand in hand with the assumption that there is a distinction to be drawn between normal and abnormal adult specimens of the species. There is, common sense tells us, a sense in which normal adult humans have two legs, two eyes, one heart and two kidneys at specific locations in the body; they also have various dispositions, for instance, to feel pain and to feel emotions, and a set of capacities, such as for perception and for reasoning. And these, so it seems, may be missing, or under- or overdeveloped in abnormal specimens.

Sober has influentially described accounts that work with such teleological assumptions as adhering to an Aristotelian “Natural State Model” (Sober 1980: 353ff.). Such accounts work with a distinction that has no place in evolutionary biology, according to which variation of properties across populations is the key to evolution. Hence, no particular end states of organisms are privileged as “natural” or “normal” (Hull 1986: 7ff.). So any account that privileges particular morphological, behavioural or psychological human features has to provide good reasons that are both non-evolutionary and yet compatible with the evolutionary account of species. Because of the way that the notion of the normal is frequently employed to exclude and oppress, those reasons should be particularly good (Silvers 1998; Dupré 2003: 119ff.; Richter 2011: 43ff.; Kronfeldner 2018: 15ff.).

The kinds of reasons that may be advanced could either be internal to, or independent of the biological sciences. If the former, then various theoretical options may seem viable. The first grounds in the claim that, although species are not natural kinds and are thus unsuited to figuring in laws of nature (Hull 1987: 171), they do support descriptions with a significant degree of generality, some of which may be important (Hull 1984: 19). A theory of human nature developed on this basis should explain the kind of importance on the basis of which particular properties are emphasised. The second theoretical option is pluralism about the metaphysics of species: in spite of the fairly broad consensus that species are defined as units of evolution, the pluralist can deny the primacy of evolutionary dynamics, arguing that other epistemic aims allow the ecologist, the systematist or the ethologist to work with an equally legitimate concept of species that is not, or not exclusively genealogical (cf. Hull 1984: 36; Kitcher 1986: 320ff.; Hull 1987: 178–81; Dupré 1993: 43f.). The third option involves a relaxation of the concept of natural kinds, such that it no longer entails the instantiation of intrinsic, necessary, sufficient and spatiotemporally unrestricted properties, but is nevertheless able to support causal explanations. Such accounts aim to reunite taxonomic and explanatory criteria, thus allowing species taxa to count as natural kinds after all (Boyd 1999a; R. Wilson, Barker, & Brigandt 2007: 196ff.). Where, finally, the reasons advanced for privileging certain properties are independent of biology, these tend to concern features of humans’—“our”—self-understanding as participants in, rather than observers of, a particular form of life. These are likely to be connected to normative considerations. Here again, it seems that a special explanation will be required for why these privileged properties should be grouped under the rubric “human nature”.

The accounts to be described in the next subsection (3.2) of this entry are examples of the first strategy. Section 4 includes discussion of the relaxed natural kinds strategy. Section 5 focuses on accounts of human nature developed from a participant perspective and also notes the support that the pluralist metaphysical strategy might be taken to provide.

3.2 Statistical Normality or Robust Causality

Begin, then, with the idea that to provide an account of “human nature” is to circumscribe a set of generalisations concerning humans. An approach of this sort sees the properties thus itemised as specifically “human” in as far as they are common among species specimens. So the privilege accorded to these properties is purely statistical and “normal” means statistically normal. Note that taking the set of statistically normal properties of humans as a non-teleological replacement for the fully developed human form retains from the original package the possibility of labelling as “human nature” either those properties themselves (TP3) or their developmental cause (TP2). Either approach avoids the classificatory worries dealt with in section 2: it presupposes that those organisms whose properties are relevant are already distinguished as such specimens. What is to be explained is, then, the ways humans generally, though not universally, are. And among these ways are ways they may share with most specimens of some other species, in particular those that belong to the same order (primates) and the same class (mammals).

One should be clear what follows from this interpretation of “human”. The organisms among whom statistical frequency is sought range over those generated after speciation around 150,000 years ago to those that will exist immediately prior to the species’ extinction. On the one hand, because of the variability intrinsic to species, we are in the dark as to the properties that may or may not characterise those organisms that will turn out to be the last of the taxon. On the other hand, the time lag of around 100,000 years between the first anatomically modern humans and the general onset of behavioural modernity around the beginning of the Upper Palaeolithic means that there are likely to be many widespread psychological properties of contemporary humans that were not possessed by the majority of the species’ specimens during two thirds of the species’ history. This is true even if the practices seen as the signatures of behavioural modernity (see §1.1) developed sporadically, disappeared and reappeared at far removed points of time and space over tens of thousands of years before 50,000 ka (McBrearty & Brooks 2000; Sterelny 2011).

According to several authors (Machery 2008; 2018; Samuels 2012; Ramsey 2013), the expression “human nature” should be used to group properties that are the focus of much current behavioural, psychological and social science. However, as the cognitive and psychological sciences are generally interested in present-day humans, there is a mismatch between scientific focus and a grouping criterion that takes in all the properties generally or typically instantiated by specimens of the entire taxon. For this reason, the expression “human nature” is likely to refer to properties of an even more temporally restricted set of organisms belonging to the species. That restriction can be thought of in indexical terms, i.e., as a restriction to contemporary humans. However, some authors claim explicitly that their accounts entail that human nature can change (Ramsey 2013: 992; Machery 2018: 20). Human nature would then be the object of temporally indexed investigations, as is, for example, the weight of individual humans in everyday contexts. (Without temporal specification, there is no determinate answer to a question such as “How much did David Hume weigh?”) An example of Machery’s is dark skin colour. This characteristic, he claims, ceased to be a feature of human nature thus understood 7,000 years ago, if that was when skin pigmentation became polymorphic. The example indicates that the temporal range may be extremely narrow from an evolutionary point of view.

Such accounts are both compatible with evolutionary theory and coherent. However, in as far as they are mere summary or list conceptions, it is unclear what their epistemic value might be. They will tend to accord with everyday common sense, for which “human nature” may in a fairly low-key sense simply be the properties that (contemporary) humans generally tend to manifest (Roughley 2011: 16). They will also conform to one level of the expression’s use in Hume’s Treatise of Human Nature (1739–40), which, in an attempt to provide a human “mental geography” (1748 [1970: 13]), lists a whole series of features, such as prejudice (1739–40, I,iii,13), selfishness (III,ii,5), a tendency to temporal discounting (III,ii,7) and an addiction to general rules (III,ii,9).

Accounts of this kind have been seen as similar in content to field guides for other animals (Machery 2008: 323; Godfrey-Smith 2014: 139). As Hull points out, within a restricted ecological context and a short period of evolutionary time, the ascription of readily observable morphological or behavioural characteristics to species specimens is a straightforward and unproblematic enterprise (Hull 1987: 175). However, the analogy is fairly unhelpful, as the primary function of assertions in field guides is to provide a heuristics for amateur classification. In contrast, a list conception of the statistically normal properties of contemporary humans presupposes identification of the organisms in question as humans. Moreover, such accounts certainly do not entail easy epistemic access to the properties in question, which may only be experimentally discovered. Nevertheless, there remains something correct about the analogy, as such accounts are a collection of assertions linked only by the fact that they are about the same group of organisms (Sterelny 2018: 123).

More sophisticated nature documentaries may summarise causal features of the lives of animals belonging to specific species. An analogous conception of human nature has also been proposed, according to which human nature is a set of pervasive and robust causal nexuses amongst humans. The list that picks out this set would specify causal connections between antecedent properties, such as having been exposed to benzene or subject to abuse as a child, and consequent properties, such as developing cancer or being aggressive towards one’s own children (Ramsey 2013: 988ff.). Human nature thus understood would have an explanatory component, a component internal to each item on the list. Human nature itself would, however, not be explanatory, but rather the label for a list of highly diverse causal connections.

An alternative way to integrate an explanatory component in a statistical normality account involves picking out that set of statistically common properties that have a purely evolutionary explanation (Machery 2008; 2018). This reinterpretation of the concept of naturalness that featured in the original package (TP1) involves a contrast with social learning. Processes grouped together under this latter description are taken to be alternative explanations to those provided by evolution. However, learning plays a central role, not only in the development of individual humans, but also in the iterated interaction of entire populations with environments structured and restructured through such interaction (Stotz 2010: 488ff.; Sterelny 2012: 23ff.). Hence, the proposal raises serious epistemic questions as to how the distinction is precisely to be drawn and operationalised. (For discussion, see Prinz 2012; Lewens 2012: 464ff.; Ramsey 2013: 985; Machery 2018: 15ff.; Sterelny 2018: 116; Kronfeldner 2018: 147ff.).

4. Explanatory Human Properties

The replacement of the concept of a fully developed form with a statistical notion yields a deflationary account of human nature with, at most, restricted explanatory import. The correlative, explanatory notion in the original package, that of the fully developed form’s blueprint (TP2), has to some authors seemed worth reframing in terms made possible by advances in modern biology, particularly in genetics.

Clearly, there must be explanations of why humans generally walk on two legs, speak and plan many of their actions in advance. Genealogical, or what have been called “ultimate” (Mayr) or “historical” (Kitcher) explanations can advert to the accumulation of coherence among entrenched, stable properties along a lineage. These may well have resulted from selection pressures shared by the relevant organisms (cf. Wimsatt 2003; Lewens 2009). The fact that there are exceptions to any generalisations concerning contemporary humans does not entail that there is no need for explanations of such exception-allowing generalisations. Plausibly, these general, though not universal truths will have “structural explanations”, that is, explanations in terms of underlying structures or mechanisms (Kitcher 1986: 320; Devitt 2008: 353). These structures, so seems, might to a significant degree be inscribed in humans’ DNA.

The precise details of rapidly developing empirical science will improve our understanding of the extent to which there is a determinate relationship between contemporary humans’ genome and their physical, psychological and behavioural properties. There is, however, little plausibility that the blueprint metaphor might be applicable to the way DNA is transcribed, translated and interacts with its cellular environment. Such interaction is itself subject to influence by the organism’s external environment, including its social environment (Dupré 2001: 29ff.; 2003: 111ff.; Griffiths 2011: 326; Prinz 2012: 17ff.; Griffiths & Tabery 2013: 71ff.; Griffiths & Stotz 2013: 98ff., 143ff.). For example, the feature of contemporary human life for which there must according to Aristotle be some kind of blueprint, viz. rational agency, is, as Sterelny has argued, so strongly dependent on social scaffolding that any claim to the effect that human rationality is somehow genetically programmed ignores the causal contributions of manifestly indispensable environmental factors (Sterelny 2018: 120).

4.1 Genetically Based Psychological Adaptations?

Nevertheless, humans do generally develop a specific set of physiological features, such as two lungs, one stomach, one pancreas and two eyes. Moreover, having such a bodily architecture is, according to the evidence from genetics, to a significant extent the result of developmental programmes that ground in gene regulatory networks (GRNs). These are stretches of non-coding DNA that regulate gene transcription. GRNs are modular, more or less strongly entrenched structures. The most highly conserved of these tend to be the phylogenetically most archaic (Carroll 2000; Walsh 2006: 436ff.; Willmore 2012: 227ff.). The GRNs responsible for basic physiological features may be taken, in a fairly innocuous sense, to belong to an evolved human nature.

Importantly, purely morphological features have generally not been the explananda of accounts that have gone under the rubric “human nature”. What has frequently motivated explanatory accounts thus labelled is the search for underlying structures responsible for generally shared psychological features. “Evolutionary Psychologists” have built a research programme around the claim that humans share a psychological architecture that parallels that of their physiology. This, they believe, consists of a structured set of psychological “organs” or modules (Tooby & Cosmides 1990: 29f.; 1992: 38, 113). This architecture is, they claim, in turn the product of developmental programmes inscribed in humans’ DNA (1992: 45). Such generally distributed developmental programmes they label “human nature” (1990: 23).

This conception raises the question of how analogous the characteristic physical and psychological “architectures” are. For one thing, the physical properties that tend to appear in such lists are far more coarse-grained than the candidates for shared psychological properties (D. Wilson 1994: 224ff.): the claim is not just that humans tend to have perceptual, desiderative, doxastic and emotional capacities, but that the mental states that realise these capacities tend to have contents of specific types. Perhaps an architecture of the former kind—of a formal psychology—is a plausible, if relatively unexciting candidate for the mental side of what an evolved human nature should explain. Either way, any such conception needs to adduce criteria for the individuation of such “mental organs” (D. Wilson 1994: 233). Relatedly, if the most strongly entrenched developmental programmes are the most archaic, it follows that, although these will be species-typical, they will not be species-specific. Programmes for the development of body parts have been identified for higher taxa, rather than for species.

A further issue that dogs any such attempts to explicate the “human” dimension of human nature in terms of developmental programmes inscribed in human DNA concerns Evolutionary Psychologists’ assertion that the programmes are the same in every specimen of the species. This assertion goes hand in hand with the claim that what is explained by such programmes is a deep psychological structure that is common to almost all humans and underlies the surface diversity of behavioural and psychological phenomena (Tooby & Cosmides 1990: 23f.). For Evolutionary Psychologists, the (near-)universality of both developmental programmes and deep psychological structure has an ultimate explanation in evolutionary processes that mark their products as natural in the sense of TP1. Both, they claim, are adaptations. These are features that were selected for because their possession in the past conferred a fitness advantage on their possessors. Evolutionary Psychologists conceive that advantage as conferred by the fulfilment of some specific function. They summarise selection for that function as “design”, which they take to have operated equally on all species specimens since the Pleistocene. This move reintroduces the teleological idea of a fully developed form beyond mere statistical normality (TP3).

This move has been extensively criticised. First, selection pressures operate at the level of groups and hence need not lead to the same structures in all a group’s members (D. Wilson 1994: 227ff.; Griffiths 2011: 325; Sterelny 2018: 120). Second, other evolutionary mechanisms than natural selection might be explanatorily decisive. Genetic drift or mutation and recombination might, for example, also confer “naturalness” in the sense of evolutionary genesis (Buller 2000: 436). Third, as we have every reason to assume that the evolution of human psychology is ongoing, evolutionary biology provides little support for the claim that particular programmes and associated traits evolved to fixity in the Pleistocene (Buller 2000: 477ff.; Downes 2010).

Perhaps, however, there might turn out to be gene control networks that do generally structure certain features of the psychological development of contemporary humans (Walsh 2006: 440ff.). The quest for such GNRs can, then, count as the search for an explanatory nature of contemporary humans, where the explanatory function thus sought is divorced from any classificatory role.

4.2 Abandoning Intrinsicality

There has, however, been a move in general philosophy of science that, if acceptable, would transform the relationship between the taxonomic and explanatory features of species. This move was influentially initiated by Richard Boyd (1999a). It begins with the claim that the attempt to define natural kinds in terms of spatiotemporally unrestricted, intrinsic, necessary and sufficient conditions is a hangover from empiricism that should be abandoned by realist metaphysics. Instead, natural kinds should be understood as kinds that support induction and explanation, where generalisations at work in such processes need not be exceptionless. Thus understood, essences of natural kinds, i.e., their “natures”, need be neither intrinsic nor be possessed by all and only members of the kinds. Instead, essences consist of property clusters integrated by stabilising mechanisms (“homeostatic property clusters”, HPCs). These are networks of causal relations such that the presence of certain properties tends to generate or uphold others and the workings of underlying mechanisms contribute to the same effect. Boyd names storms, galaxies and capitalism as plausible examples (Boyd 1999b: 82ff.). However, he takes species to be the paradigmatic HPC kinds. According to this view, the genealogical character of a species’ nature does not undermine its causal role. Rather, it helps to explain the specific way in which the properties cohere that make up the taxon’s essence. Moreover, these can include extrinsic properties, for example, properties of constructed niches (Boyd 1991: 142, 1999a: 164ff.; Griffiths 1999: 219ff.; R. Wilson et al. 2007: 202ff.).

Whether such an account can indeed adequately explain taxonomic practice for species taxa is a question that can be left open here (see Ereshefsky & Matthen 2005: 16ff.). By its own lights the account does not identify conditions for belonging to a species such as Homo sapiens (Samuels 2012: 25f.). Whether it enables the identification of factors that play the explanatory roles that the term “human nature” might be supposed to pick out is perhaps the most interesting question. Two ways in which an account of human nature might be developed from such a starting point have been sketched.

According to Richard Samuels’ proposal, human nature should be understood as the empirically discoverable proximal mechanisms responsible for psychological development and for the manifestation of psychological capacities. These will include physiological mechanisms, such as the development of the neural tube, as well as environmentally scaffolded learning procedures; they will also include the various modular systems distinguished by cognitive science, such as visual processing and memory systems (Samuels 2012: 22ff.). Like mere list conceptions (cf. §3.2), such an account has a precedent in Hume, for whom human nature also includes causal “principles” that structure operations of the human mind (1739–40, Intro.), for example, the mechanisms of sympathy (III,iii,1; II,ii,6). Hume, however, thought of the relevant causal principles as intrinsic.

A second proposal, advanced by Paul Griffiths and Karola Stotz, explicitly suggests taking explanandum and explanans to be picked out by different uses of the expression "human nature". In both cases, the “nature” in question is that of the taxon, not of individual organisms. The former use simply refers to “what human beings are like”, where “human beings” means all species specimens. Importantly, this characterisation does not aim at shared characteristics, but is open for polymorphisms both across a population and across life stages of individual organisms. The causal conception of human nature, what explains this spectrum of similarity and difference in life histories, is equated by Griffiths and Stotz with the organism-environment system that supports human development. It thus includes all the genetic, epigenetic and environmental resources responsible for varying human life cycles (Griffiths 2011: 319; Stotz & Griffiths 2018, 66f.). It follows that explanatory human nature at one point in time can be radically different from human nature at some other point in time.

Griffiths and Stotz are clear that this account diverges significantly from traditional accounts, as it rejects assumptions that human development has a goal, that human nature is possessed by all and only specimens of the species and that it consists of intrinsic properties. They see these assumptions as features of the folk biology of human nature that is as scientifically relevant as are folk conceptions of heat for its scientific understanding (Stotz 2010: 488; Griffiths 2011: 319ff.; Stotz & Griffiths 2018: 60ff.). This raises the question as to whether such a developmental systems account should not simply advocate abandoning the term, as is suggested by Sterelny (2018) on the basis of closely related considerations. A reason for not doing so might lie in the fact that, as talk of “human nature” is often practised with normative intent or at least with normative consequences (Stotz & Griffiths 2018: 71f.), use of the term to pick out the real, complex explanatory factors at work might help to counter those normative uses that employ false, folk biological assumptions.

4.3 Secondary Altriciality as a Game-Changer

Explanatory accounts that emphasise developmental plasticity in the products of human DNA, in the neural architecture of the brain and in the human mind tend to reject the assumption that explanations of what humans are like should focus on intrinsic features. It should, however, be noted that such accounts can be interpreted as assigning the feature of heightened plasticity the key role in such explanations (cf. Montagu 1956: 79). Accounts that make plasticity causally central also raise the question as to whether there are not biological features that in turn explain it and should therefore be assigned a more central status in a theory of explanatory human nature.

A prime candidate for this role is what the zoologist Adolf Portmann labelled human “secondary altriciality”, a unique constellation of features of the human neonate relative to other primates: human neonates are, in their helplessness and possession of a relatively undeveloped brain, neurologically and behaviourally altricial, that is, in need of care. However they are also born with open and fully functioning sense organs, otherwise a mark of precocial species, in which neonates are able to fend for themselves (Portmann 1951: 44ff.). The facts that the human neonate brain is less than 30% of the size of the adult brain and that brain development after birth continues at the fetal rate for the first year (Walker & Ruff 1993, 227) led the anthropologist Ashley Montagu to talk of “exterogestation” (Montagu 1961: 156). With these features in mind, Portmann characterised the care structures required by prolonged infant helplessness as the “social uterus” (Portmann 1967: 330). Finally, the fact that the rapid development of the infant brain takes place during a time in which the infant’s sense organs are open and functioning places an adaptive premium on learning that is unparalleled among organisms (Gould 1977: 401; cf. Stotz & Griffiths 2018: 70).

Of course, these features are themselves contingent products of evolution that could be outlived by the species. Gould sees them as components of a general retardation of development that has characterised human evolution (Gould 1977: 365ff.), where “human” should be seen as referring to the clade—all the descendants of a common ancestor—rather than to the species. Anthropologists estimate that secondary altriciality characterised the lineage as from Homo erectus 1.5 million years ago (Rosenberg & Trevathan 1995: 167). We are, then, dealing with a set of deeply entrenched features, features that were in place long before behavioural modernity.

It is conceivable that the advent of secondary altriciality was a key transformation in generating the radical plasticity of human development beginning with early hominins. However, as Sterelny points out, there are serious difficulties with isolating any particular game changer. Secondary altriciality, or the plasticity that may in part be explained by it, would thus seem to fall victim to the same verdict as the game changers named by the traditional human nature slogans. However, maybe it is more plausible to think in terms of a matrix of traits: perhaps a game-changing constellation of properties present in the population after the split from pan can be shown to have generated forms of niche construction that fed back into and modified the original traits. These modifications may in turn have had further psychological and behavioural consequences in steps that plausibly brought selective advantages (Sterelny 2018: 115).

5. Human Nature, the Participant Perspective and Morality

5.1. Human Nature from a Participant Perspective

In such a culture-mind coevolutionary account, there may be a place for the referents of some of the traditional philosophical slogans intended to pin down “the human essence“ or “human nature”—reason, linguistic capacity (the speaking animal”, Herder 1772 [2008: 97]), a more general symbolic capacity (animal symbolicum, Cassirer 1944: 44), freedom of the will (Pico della Mirandola 1486 [1965: 5]; Sartre 1946 [2007: 29, 47]), a specific, “political” form of sociality, or a unique type of moral motivation (Hutcheson 1730: §15). These are likely, at best, to be the (still evolving) products in contemporary humans of processes set in motion by a trait constellation that includes proto-versions of (some of) these capacities. Such a view may also be compatible with an account of “what contemporary humans are like” that abstracts from the evolutionary time scale of eons and focuses instead on the present (cf. Dupré 1993: 43), whilst neither merely cataloguing widely distributed traits (§3.2) nor attempting explanations in terms of the human genome (§4.1). The traditional slogans appear to be attempts to summarise some such accounts. It seems clear, though, that their aims are significantly different from those of the biologically, or otherwise scientifically orientated positions thus far surveyed.

Two features of such accounts are worth emphasising, both of which we already encountered in Aristotle’s contribution to the original package. The first involves a shift in perspective from that of the scientific observer to that of a participant in a contemporary human life form. Whereas the human—or non-human—biologist may ask what modern humans are like, just as they may ask what bonobos are like, the question that traditional philosophical accounts of human nature are plausibly attempting to answer is what it is like to live one’s life as a contemporary human. This question is likely to provoke the counter-question as to whether there is anything that it is like to live simply as a contemporary human, rather than as a human-in-a-specific-historical-and-cultural context (Habermas 1958: 32; Geertz 1973: 52f.; Dupré 2003: 110f.). For the traditional sloganeers, the answer is clearly affirmative. The second feature of such accounts is that they tend to take it that reference to the capacities named in the traditional slogans is in some sense normatively, in particular, ethically significant.

The first claim of such accounts, then, is that there is some property of contemporary humans that is in some way descriptively or causally central to participating in their form of life. The second is that such participation involves subjection to normative standards rooted in the possession of some such property. Importantly, there is a step from the first to the second form of significance, and justification of the step requires argument. Even from a participant perspective, there is no automatic move from explanatory to normative significance.

According to an “internal”, participant account of human nature, certain capacities of contemporary, perhaps modern humans unavoidably structure the way they (we) live their (our) lives. Talk of “structuring” refers to three kinds of contributions to the matrix of capacities and dispositions that both enable and constrain the ways humans live their lives. These are contributions, first, to the specific shape other features of humans lives have and, second, to the way other such features hang together (Midgley 2000: 56ff.; Roughley 2011: 16ff.). Relatedly, they also make possible a whole new set of practices. All three relations are explanatory, although their explanatory role appears not necessarily to correspond to the role corresponding features, or earlier versions of the features, might have played in the evolutionary genealogy of contemporary human psychology. Having linguistic capacities is a prime candidate for the role of such a structural property: human perception, emotion, action planning and thought are all plausibly transformed in linguistic creatures, as are the connections between perception and belief, and the myriad relationships between thought and behaviour, connections exploited and deepened in a rich set of practices unavailable to non-linguistic animals. Similar things could be claimed for other properties named by the traditional slogans.

In contrast to the ways in which such capacities have frequently been referred to in the slogan mode, particularly to the pathos that has tended to accompany it, it seems highly implausible that any one such property will stand alone as structurally significant. It is more likely that we should be picking out a constellation of properties, a constellation that may well include properties variants of which are possessed by other animals. Other properties, including capacities that may be specific to contemporary humans, such as humour, may be less plausible candidates for a structural role.

Note that the fact that such accounts aim to answer a question asked from the participant perspective does not rule out that the features in question may be illuminated in their role for human self-understanding by data from empirical science. On the contrary, it seems highly likely that disciplines such as developmental and comparative psychology, and neuroscience will contribute significantly to an understanding of the possibilities and constraints inherent in the relevant capacities and in the way they interact.

5.2. Human Nature and the Human ergon

The paradigmatic strategy for deriving ethical consequences from claims about structural features of the human life form is the Platonic and Aristotelian ergon or function argument. The first premise of Aristotle’s version (Nicomachean Ethics 1097b–1098a) connects function and goodness: if the characteristic function of an entity of a type X is to φ, then a good entity of type X is one that φs well. Aristotle confers plausibility on the claim by using examples such as social roles and bodily organs. If the function of an eye as an exemplar of its kind is to enable seeing, then a good eye is one that enables its bearer to see well. The second premise of the argument is a claim we encountered in section 1.4 of this entry, a claim we can now see as predicating a structural property of human life, the exercise of reason. According to this claim, the function or end of individual humans as humans is, depending on interpretation (Nussbaum 1995: 113ff.), either the exercise of reason or life according to reason. If this is correct, it follows that a good human being is one whose life centrally involves the exercise of, or life in accordance with, reason.

In the light of the discussion so far, it ought to be clear that, as it stands, the second premise of this argument is incompatible with the evolutionary biology of species. It asserts that the exercise of reason is not only the key structural property of human life, but also the realization of the fully developed human form. No sense can be made of this latter notion in evolutionary terms. Nevertheless, a series of prominent contemporary ethicists—Alasdair MacIntyre (1999), Rosalind Hursthouse (1999), Philippa Foot (2001) and Martha Nussbaum (2006)—have all made variants of the ergon argument central to their ethical theories. As each of these authors advance some version of the second premise, it is instructive to examine the ways in which they aim to avoid the challenge from evolutionary biology.

Before doing so, it is first worth noting that any ethical theory or theory of value is engaged in an enterprise that has no clear place in an evolutionary analysis. If we want to know what goodness is or what “good” means, evolutionary theory is not the obvious place to look. This is particularly clear in view of the fact that evolutionary theory operates at the level of populations (Sober 1980: 370; Walsh 2006: 434), whereas ethical theory operates, at least primarily, at the level of individual agents. However, the specific conflict between evolutionary biology and neo-Aristotelian ethics results from the latter’s constructive use of the concept of species and, in particular, of a teleological conception of a fully developed form of individual members of the species “qua members of [the] species” (MacIntyre 1999: 64, 71; cf. Thompson 2008: 29; Foot 2001: 27). The characterisation of achieving that form as fulfilling a “function”, which helps the analogy with bodily organs and social roles, is frequently replaced in contemporary discussions by talk of “flourishing” (Aristotle’s eudaimonia). Such talk more naturally suggests comparisons with the lives of other organisms (although Aristotle himself excludes other animals from eudaimonia; cf. Nicomachean Ethics 1009b). The concept of flourishing in turn picks out biological—etymologically: botanical—processes, but again not of a sort that play a role in evolutionary theory. It also seems primarily predicated of individual organisms. It may play a role in ecology; it is, however, most clearly at home in practical applications of biological knowledge, as in horticulture. In this respect, it is comparable to the concept of health.

Neo-Aristotelians claim that to describe an organism, whether a plant or a non-human or human animal, as flourishing is to measure it against a standard that is specific to the species to which it belongs. To do so is to evaluate it as a more or less good “specimen of its species (or sub-species)” (Hursthouse 1999: 198). The key move is then to claim that moral evaluation is, “quite seriously” (Foot 2001: 16), evaluation of the same sort: just as a non-defective animal or plant exemplifies flourishing within the relevant species’ life form, someone who is morally good is someone who exemplifies human flourishing, i.e., the fully developed form of the species. This metaethical claim has provoked the worry as to whether such attributions to other organisms are really anything more than classifications, or at most evaluations of “stretched and deflated” kinds that are missing the key feature of authority that we require for genuine normativity (Lenman 2005: 46ff.).

5.2.1. Sidestepping the Darwinian Challenge?

Independently of questions concerning their theory of value, ethical Neo-Aristotelians need to respond to the question of how reference to a fully developed form of the species can survive the challenge from evolutionary theory. Three kinds of response may appear promising.

The first adverts to the plurality of forms of biological science, claiming that there are life sciences, such as physiology, botany, zoology and ethology in the context of which such evaluations have a place (Hursthouse 1999: 202; 2012: 172; MacIntyre 1999: 65). And if ethology can legitimately attribute not only characteristic features, but also defects or flourishing to species members, in spite of species not being natural kinds, then there is little reason why ethics shouldn’t do so too. This strategy might ground in one of the moves sketched in section 3.1 of this entry. It might be argued, with Kitcher and Dupré, that such attributions are legitimate in other branches of biological science because there is a plurality of species concepts, indeed of kinds of species, where these are relative to epistemic interests. Or the claim might simply rest on a difference in what is taken to be the relevant time frame, where temporal relevance is indexed relative to the present. In ethics we are, it might be claimed, interested in humans as they are “at the moment and for a few millennia back and for maybe not much longer in the future” (Hursthouse 2012: 171).

This move amounts to the concession that talk of “the human species” is not to be understood literally. Whether this concession undermines the ethical theories that use the term is perhaps unclear. It leaves open the possibility that, as human nature may change significantly, there may be significant changes in what it means for humans to flourish and therefore in what is ethically required. This might be seen as a virtue, rather than a vice of the view.

A second response to the challenge from evolutionary biology aims to draw metaphysical consequences from epistemic or semantic claims. Michael Thompson has argued that what he calls alternatively “the human life form” and “the human species” is an a priori category. Thompson substantiates this claim by examining forms of discourse touched on in section 3.2, forms of discourse that are generally taken to be of mere heuristic importance for amateur practices of identification, viz. field guides or animal documentaries. Statements such as “The domestic cat has four legs, two eyes, two ears and guts in its belly”, are, Thompson claims, instances of an important kind of predication that is neither tensed nor quantifiable. He calls these “natural historical descriptions” or “Aristotelian categoricals” (Thompson 2008: 64ff.). Such generic claims are not, he argues, made false where what is predicated is less than universal, or even statistically rare. Decisively, according to Thompson, our access to the notion of the human life form is non-empirical. It is, he claims, a presupposition of understanding ourselves from the first-person perspective as breathing, eating or feeling pain (Thompson 2004: 66ff.). Thus understood, the concept is independent of biology and therefore, if coherent, immune to problems raised by the Darwinian challenge.

Like Foot and Hursthouse, Thompson thinks that his Aristotelian categoricals allow inferences to specific judgments that members of species are defective (Thompson 2004: 54ff.; 2008: 80). He admits that such judgments in the case of the human life form are likely to be fraught with difficulties, but nevertheless believes that judgments of (non-)defective realization of a life form are the model for ethical evaluation (Thompson 2004: 30, 81f.). It may seem unclear how this might be the case in view of the fact that access to the human life form is supposed to be given as a presupposition of using the concept of “I”. Another worry is that the everyday understanding on which Thompson draws may be nothing other than a branch of folk biology. The folk tendency to ascribe teleological essences to species, as to “races” and genders, is no indication of the reality of such essences (Lewens 2012: 469f.; Stotz & Griffiths 2018: 60ff.; cf. Pellegrin 1982 [1986: 16ff., 120] and Charles 2000: 343ff., 368, on Aristotle’s own orientation to the usage of “the people”).

A final response to evolutionary biologists’ worries aims equally to distinguish the Neo-Aristotelian account of human nature from that of the sciences. However, it does so not by introducing a special metaphysics of “life forms”, but by explicitly constructing an ethical concept of human nature. Martha Nussbaum argues that the notion of human nature in play in what she calls “Aristotelian essentialism” is, as she puts it, “internal and evaluative”. It is a hermeneutic product of “human” self-understanding, constructed from within our best ethical outlook: “an ethical theory of human nature”, she claims,

should force us to answer for ourselves, on the basis of our very own ethical judgment, the question which beings are fully human ones. (Nussbaum 1995: 121f.; cf. Nussbaum 1992: 212ff.; 2006: 181ff.; McDowell 1980 [1998: 18ff.]; Hursthouse 1999: 229; 2012: 174f.)

There can be no question here of moving from a biological “is” to an ethical “ought”; rather, which features are taken to belong to human nature is itself seen as the result of ethical deliberation. Such a conception maintains the claim that the key ethical standard is that of human flourishing. However, it is clear that what counts as flourishing can only be specified on the basis of ethical deliberation, understood as striving for reflective equilibrium (Nussbaum 2006: 352ff.). In view of such a methodological proposal, there is a serious question as to what work is precisely done by the concept of human nature.

5.2.2. Human Flourishing

Neo-Aristotelians vary in the extent to which they flesh out a conception of species-specific flourishing. Nussbaum draws up a comprehensive, open-ended catalogue of what she calls “the central human capacities”. These are in part picked out because of their vulnerability to undermining or support by political measures. They include both basic bodily needs and more specifically human capacities, such as for humour, play, autonomy and practical reason (Nussbaum 1992: 216ff.; 2006: 76ff.). Such a catalogue allows the setting of three thresholds, below which a human organism would not count as living a human life at all (anencephalic children, for instance), as living a fully human life or as living a good human life (Nussbaum 2006: 181). Nussbaum explicitly argues that being of human parents is insufficient for crossing the first, evaluatively set threshold. Her conception is partly intended to provide guidelines as to how societies should conceive disability and as to when it is appropriate to take political measures in order to enable agents with nonstandard physical or mental conditions to cross the second and third thresholds.

Nussbaum has been careful to insist that enabling independence, rather than providing care, should be the prime aim. Nevertheless, the structure of an account that insists on a “species norm”, below which humans lacking certain capacities count as less than fully flourishing, has prompted accusations of illiberality. According to the complaint, it disrespects the right of members of, for example, deaf communities to set the standards for their own forms of life (Glackin 2016: 320ff.).

Other accounts of species-specific flourishing have been considerably more abstract. According to Hursthouse, plants flourish when their parts and operations are well suited to the ends of individual survival and continuance of the species. In social animals, flourishing also tends to involve characteristic pleasure and freedom from pain, and a contribution to appropriate functioning of relevant social groups (Hursthouse 1999: 197ff.). The good of human character traits conducive to pursuit of these four ends is transformed, Hursthouse claims, by the addition of “rationality”. As a result, humans flourish when they do what they correctly take themselves to have reason to do—under the constraint that they do not thereby cease to foster the four ends set for other social animals (Hursthouse 1999: 222ff.). Impersonal benevolence is, for example, because of this constraint, unlikely to be a virtue. In such an ethical outlook, what particular agents have reason to do is the primary standard; it just seems to be applied under particular constraints. A key question is thus whether the content of this primary standard is really determined by the notion of species-specific flourishing.

Where Hursthouse’s account builds up to, and attempts to provide a “natural” framework for, the traditional Aristotelian ergon of reason, MacIntyre builds his account around the claim that flourishing specific to the human “species” is essentially a matter of becoming an “independent practical reasoner” (MacIntyre 1999: 67ff.). It is because of the central importance of reasoning that, although human flourishing shares certain preconditions with the flourishing, say, of dolphins, it is also vulnerable in specific ways. MacIntyre argues that particular kinds of social practices enable the development of human reasoning capacities and that, because independent practical reasoning is, paradoxically, at core cooperatively developed and structured, the general aim of human flourishing is attained by participation in networks in local communities (MacIntyre 1999: 108). “Independent practical reasoners” are “dependent rational animals”. MacIntyre’s account thus makes room on an explanatory level for the evolutionary insight that humans can only become rational in a socio-cultural context which provides scaffolding for the development and exercise of rationality (§4). Normatively, however, this point is subordinated to the claim that, from the point of view of participation in the contemporary human life form, flourishing corresponds to the traditional slogan.

5.3. Reason as the Unique Structural Property

MacIntyre, Hursthouse and Nussbaum (Nussbaum 2006: 159f.) all aim to locate the human capacity for reasoning within a framework that encompasses other animals. Each argues that, although the capacities to recognise reasons as reasons and for deliberation on their basis transform the needs and abilities humans share with other animals, the reasons in question remain in some way dependent on humans’ embodied and social form of life. This emphasis is intended to distinguish an Aristotelian approach from other approaches for which the capacity to evaluate reasons for action as reasons and to distance oneself from ones desires is also the “central difference” between humans and other animals (Korsgaard 2006: 104; 2018: 38ff.; cf. MacIntyre 1999: 71ff.). According to Korsgaard’s Kantian interpretation of Aristotle’s ergon argument, humans cannot act without taking a normative stand on whether their desires provide them with reasons to act. This she takes to be the key structural feature of their life, which brings with it “a whole new way of functioning well or badly” (Korsgaard 2018: 48; cf. 1996: 93). In such an account, “human nature” is monistically understood as this one structural feature which is so transformative that the concept of life applicable to organisms that instantiate it is no longer that applicable to organisms that don’t. Only “humans” live their lives, because only they possess the type of intentional control over their bodily movements that grounds in evaluation of their actions and self-evaluation as agents (Korsgaard 2006: 118; 2008: 141ff.; cf. Plessner 1928 [1975: 309f.]).

We have arrived at an interpretation of the traditional slogan that cuts it off from a metaphysics with any claims to be “naturalistic”. The claim now is that the structural effect of the capacity for reasoning transforms those features of humans that they share with other animals so thoroughly that those features pale into insignificance. What is “natural” about the capacity for reasoning for humans here is its unavoidability for contemporary members of the species, at least for those without serious mental disabilities. Such assertions also tend to shade into normative claims that discount the normative status of “animal” needs in view of the normative authority of human reasoning (cf. McDowell 1996 [1998: 172f.]).

The most radical version of this thought leads to the claim encountered towards the end of section 1.4: that talk of “human nature” involves no essential reference at all to the species Homo sapiens or to the hominin lineage. According to this view, the kind to which contemporary humans belong is a kind to which entities could also belong who have no genealogical relationship to humans. That kind is the kind of entities that act and believe in accordance with the reasons they take themselves to have. Aliens, synthetically created agents and angels are further candidates for membership in the kind, which would, unlike biological taxa, be spatiotemporally unrestricted. The traditional term for the kind, as employed by Aquinas and Kant, is “person” (cf. Hull 1986: 9).

Roger Scruton has recently taken this line, arguing that persons can only be adequately understood in terms of a web of concepts inapplicable to other animals, concepts whose applicability grounds in an essential moral dimension of the personal life form. The concepts pick out components of a life form that is permeated by relationships of responsibility, as expressed in reactive attitudes such as indignation, guilt and gratitude. Such emotions he takes to involve a demand for accountability, and as such to be exclusive to the personal life form, not variants of animal emotions (Scruton 2017: 52). As a result, he claims, they situate their bearers in some sense “outside the natural order” (Scruton 2017: 26). According to such an account, we should embrace a methodological dualism with respect to humans: as animals, they are subject to the same kinds of biological explanations as all other organisms, but as persons, they are subject to explanations that are radically different in kind. These are explanations in terms of reasons and meanings, that is, exercises in “Verstehen”, whose applicability Scruton takes to be independent of causal explanation (Scruton 2017: 30ff., 46).

Such an account demonstrates with admirable clarity that there is no necessary connection between a theory of “human nature” and metaphysical naturalism. It also reinforces the fact, emphasised throughout this entry, that discussions of “human nature” require both serious conceptual spadework and explicit justification of the use of any one such concept rather than another.


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[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


I would like to thank Michelle Hooge, Maria Kronfeldner, Nick Laskowski and Hichem Naar for their comments on earlier drafts.

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Neil Roughley <>

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