Metaphysical Explanation

First published Thu Oct 21, 2021

Explanation comes in many forms. Scientific explanations typically concern the natural world, and typically proceed by citing causes of natural phenomena or subsuming them under empirical laws in some illuminating way. Mathematical explanations typically concern the world of quantity and abstract structure, and typically proceed by proving a theorem in some illuminating way. The present entry focuses on a family of explanations widely thought to be in some sense distinctively metaphysical in character. Consider the following non-exhaustive list of putative examples, which ought to be recognizable to any metaphysician:

Socrates the philosopher, and this bust of him in our seminar room, are both snub nosed because they share the property being snub-nosed.
Socrates’s cloak has a color because it is green.
Socrates is the very individual he is at least in part because he has Sophroniscus as a father.
Socrates is just because his soul is well-ordered.

Statements like (1)–(4) at least purport to express explanations on their surface: “because” is a common explanatory idiom, and any of a number of others could have been used instead (e.g., “in virtue of”, “accounts for”, “is the reason why”, “makes it the case that”, or simply “explains”). Moreover, statements like (1)–(4) are metaphysical at least in the sense that they are commonly put forward and assessed in metaphysics, and proceed by citing distinctions of importance to metaphysics in some illuminating way. These include distinctions of property-instance, determinable-determinate, essence-accident, and analysans-analysandum that appear to be at play in the examples above; others might include part-whole (e.g., “The vase is fragile because of its crystalline microstructure”) and member-set (e.g., “The set {Socrates} exists because Socrates exists”), among potentially others still.

Interest in metaphysical explanation has witnessed a recent spike, yet the topic is not a recent metaphysical innovation. Indeed, it is front and center in the very first sentence of the field’s foundational text, when Aristotle tells us that “All human beings by nature desire to know” (Metaphysics I.1, 980a21; see the entry on Aristotle’s metaphysics). For Aristotle, this desire is not fully satisfied until one understands the basic explanatory factors responsible for the broad structure of reality (see Lear 1988: chs. 1 and 6). Set aside whether Aristotle’s claim about human nature is correct. Even if it is not, a wealth of philosophical questions about the nature, varieties, and scope of metaphysical explanation emerge. Are these “explanatory factors” of one type or many, and what are they? What is it about “the broad structure of reality” that they explain? What type of understanding is gained by grasping these explanatory factors? And even if human beings by nature desire metaphysical explanations, to what extent (if any) can this natural desire actually be satisfied?

Historical interest in metaphysical explanation was not Aristotle’s alone. Philosophers as diverse as Plato, Nāgārjuna, Ibn Sīnā (Avicenna), William of Ockham, Spinoza, Leibniz, Bolzano, Duhem, and Husserl (see Mulligan 2004 and also related entries below), among many others, explicitly grappled with questions such as those above, although some in a more skeptical vein than others. Moreover, countless other philosophers both inside metaphysics and out clearly presuppose that the notion is in good standing when discussing the various types of metaphysical explanation that we discuss below. Our goal in the present entry, however, is not to provide a full accounting of how the concept has developed over time—here, we focus on framing the main questions and disputes that emerge when one attempts to state what metaphysical explanation is, exactly, and how it is supposed to work (if at all).

Our first order of business is to clarify in what sense metaphysical explanation is a form of non-causal explanation (§1), and survey some putative varieties of metaphysical explanation (§2). Afterwards, we survey three central, connected choice-points about how to think about metaphysical explanation at the most abstract level. How are metaphysical explanations related to notions of non-causal relationships such as property-instance, part-whole, essence-accident, derivative-ground, role-realizer, and others of central metaphysical importance that metaphysical explanations are said to derive their explanatory power from (§3)? To what extent is metaphysical explanation a unified phenomenon (§4)? And to what extent is it an objective, mind-independent phenomenon (§5)? Next, we survey a recent research program that attempts to extend one of the four main models of scientific explanation—causal-mechanistic, nomological, unificationist, and pragmatic—to metaphysical explanation (§6). We conclude by surveying some questions about the scope of metaphysical explanation (§7).

A clarificatory comment: for stylistic reasons, we will continue to shift back-and-forth between speaking of explanations as truths of a certain kind that can be discovered and argued over, versus speaking of them as activities by which those truths are communicated or understood. That distinction, as well as whether explanations are in fact something else (e.g., theories in a model-theoretic sense), will rise to the forefront later, but for now, we will speak loosely.

1. Metaphysical explanation as a form of non-causal explanation

To help us focus in on the topic at hand, contrast examples (1)–(4) above with familiar examples of causal explanation—for instance, the disappearance of a puddle through evaporation because of the warmth of the surrounding air. What makes this an instance of explanation is a matter for debate, although a good enough approximation for our purposes is that it turns on how (in this case causal) explanation works. As Lange puts it: a causal explanation

derives its explanatory power by virtue of supplying relevant information about the explanandum’s causes or, more broadly, about the world’s network of causal relations. (Lange 2016: 18)

A puddle’s disappearance does not merely coincide with the warmth of the surrounding air, but rather occurs because of it, at least in part thanks to causal interactions between the two systems over time.

In contrast, metaphysical explanations at least appear to work in a rather different manner. (1) seems to work at least in part due to some relationship between Socrates and the bust of him on the one hand, and a fact about those two plus a further entity, a property, on the other. Whatever that relationship is, it seems radically different from ordinary causal ones, for instance in being synchronic rather than diachronic. The same can be said about (2), which invokes a synchronic relationship between a determinable property and its determinates. Similarly, (3) seems to work at least in part due to how the essential nature of a thing non-causally constrains what features it can have, while (4) seems to work at least in part due to there being no difference between being just and having a well-ordered soul, which would appear to preclude any causal relationships between them.

It is in the minimal sense above that all should agree with the claim that metaphysical explanation is a form of non-causal explanation (see Schaffer 2017: 303). Nonetheless, one must take care here in at least three ways. First, metaphysical explanation should not be identified with non-causal explanation. After all, there are arguably many other forms of explanation besides metaphysical explanation that are non-causal; we mentioned mathematical explanation above. But this is not to say that metaphysical explanation has no role to play in how to understand these other types of non-metaphysical non-causal explanations. Take, for example, Steiner’s pioneering work on mathematical explanation, which starts with the thought that “to explain the behavior of an entity, one deduces the behavior from the essence or nature of the entity” (Steiner 1978: 143). To the extent this works in the way (3) above works, by invoking the notion of essence, to that extent mathematical explanation involves a form of metaphysical explanation.

Second, to say that metaphysical explanation is a form of non-causal explanation does not mean that it is disconnected from the causal realm altogether. Consider another example:

Socrates is in pain because the functional role of pain is realized by the C-fibers firing in his brain.

A functionalist about the mind might offer (5) as a part of a more comprehensive metaphysical explanation of the nature of pain and its instances. And yet, (5) invokes causation in at least two places. For one thing, the explanans of (5)—i.e., the fact which does the explaining—invokes a type of causal process. In addition, the explanandum of a metaphysical explanation—i.e., the fact to be explained—can invoke causation, as for instance would be the case were one to offer up a metaphysical explanation of causation itself. Thus what makes a metaphysical explanation non-causal is not that the explanans or explanandum are themselves non-causal, but rather that the relationship between them is. For another thing, (5) works at least in part due to the relationship between the functional role of a mental state and its realizer. So if this relationship itself consists in some relationship between the causal powers of a mental state and its realizer (perhaps the former must be a proper subset of the latter; see J. Wilson 1999, Shoemaker 2001), then to that extent, (5) derives its explanatory power from causal facts. But (5) does not derive it solely from these, for presumably the relationship between the causal powers of a mental state and its realizer is not itself a causal one (in the case of Wilson and Shoemaker, it is the is a proper subset of relation).

Third, although a useful starting point, it is not entirely uncontroversial to say that every form of metaphysical explanation is a form of non-causal explanation. Take (2), which many take to be a case of metaphysical grounding, the relationship by which more fundamental facts somehow “give rise to” less fundamental ones. Although most theorists classify grounding as non-causal, A. Wilson (2018) argues that grounding is literally a form of “metaphysical causation”, from which it would seem to follow that (2) is a form of causal explanation (see §6.1 below). Or take Bennett (2017: 61–62), who claims that causation is an instance of what she calls “metaphysical building”, every instance of which is an instance of metaphysical explanation (at least if understood as a wholly objective phenomenon, rather than one requiring that certain epistemic conditions hold; see §5 for more on realist vs. antirealist conceptions of metaphysical explanation). Nor is our starting point, useful as it is, entirely unproblematic. Consider another example:

The natural world began to exist because of the causal activity of a supernatural being.

Does (6) count as a metaphysical explanation? It might seem to, given a traditional conception of metaphysics as studying the “first causes of things” (see the entry on metaphysics). And yet, it appears to work solely thanks to certain causal facts. Both points can be reconciled with our framing so far. Whatever “metaphysical causation” might be, surely it is not causation of the ordinary sort that links sunlight to puddle evaporation over time, which is all that we meant to emphasize by characterizing metaphysical explanation as non-causal. And moreover, whether to classify all explanations offered in metaphysics as metaphysical explanations, rather than more narrowly as just those that derive their explanatory power partly from non-causal factors, is a matter of terminological decision not worth engaging with at length. Clearly there is some important difference between (1)–(5) as opposed to (6) in how they work, and that difference seems to have something to do with the non-causal ways in which they work. That is a topic worth investigating, not whether to use “metaphysical” in the broader way or the narrower one.

2. Some putative varieties of metaphysical explanation

A classic argument for the existence of properties—mind-independent abstract entities, such as those invoked in (1), that can be shared by multiple particulars—is that they are needed in order to metaphysically explain the objective resemblances we find in the world (see the entry on properties, especially §§3–4). Both Socrates the philosopher and the bust of him in our seminar room are snub-nosed. However (so the argument goes), it cannot be a brute fact that this is so; there must be something in virtue of which both of these things, separated by space and time, are snub-nosed. Specifically, (so the argument concludes), the fact that these two entities share the same property metaphysically explains why they resemble each other in this respect. Yet even if objective resemblances are, in fact, metaphysically explained by the sharing of properties by things that resemble—a big “if”, although let us suppose so for illustrative purposes—it remains to be said what kind of metaphysical explanation is to be envisaged here. Reflecting on (2)–(4) reveals at least three varieties of metaphysical explanation that have been the focus of recent work on the topic and in terms of which (1) could be understood.

One option is to offer (1) as a grounding explanation. There is considerable controversy over what grounding is, and (as we shall see) how grounding and explanations are related and how grounding explanations work. We can stay somewhat neutral in saying that they typically work by citing more fundamental facts—in the case of (1), a fact about property sharing—that in some sense non-causally “gives rise to”, “produces”, or “generates” less fundamental facts—in this case, a fact of resemblance among particulars. We say “typically”, since one may count as grounding explanations those that merely provide information about the grounds of a given fact (presumably of some contextually relevant type; see §5.4), rather than by citing its ground directly, as in (1*):

Socrates the philosopher, and this bust of him in our seminar room, are both snub-nosed because they share some property or other.

At any rate, to treat (1) and (1*) as grounding explanations would be to group them with (2), given a standardly held view, namely that instances of the determinable-determinate relation are paradigmatic instances of grounding.

Although recent interest in metaphysical explanation arose from a renewed interest in grounding over the mid to late twentieth century, grounding explanation is arguably not the only form that metaphysical explanation can take. This point was recognized as far back as Aristotle, who in the Organon and Metaphysics discusses metaphysical explanations that work by citing facts about “the what it was to be” of some target phenomenon (see, e.g., Posterior Analytics 83a7; Topics 141b35; and Metaphysics 1003b24, 1006a32, 1006b13), or what we would now call its essence. Like grounding, there is controversy over what essence is; unlike grounding, much less has been said about how essence and explanation are related and how what might be called essentialist explanations work. We can again stay somewhat neutral in saying that they typically work by citing (or perhaps just providing contextually relevant information about) part of what it is to be some phenomenon, in terms of some other phenomenon (e.g., Fine 2015 and Koslicki 2012).

Offering (1) as an essentialist explanation would be to group it with (3), which might suggest rather different truth conditions for (1) than if it were offered as a grounding explanation. Prima facie at least, (3) does not explicitly require that Socrates’s having a certain man as a father be a more fundamental fact than him being the very individual he is. Moreover, it is widely held that the grounds of a fact are modally sufficient for it to obtain, but need not be modally necessary for it, while the opposite is true for essence, which would place rather different conditions on whether a claim like (2) is true as opposed to a claim like (3). Although a number of recent accounts of grounding analyze it in terms of essence (e.g., Correia 2013, Zylstra 2018), or vice versa (e.g., deRosset 2013, Gorman 2014), others do neither (e.g., Fine 2012, 2015). As a provisional matter, we shall treat grounding explanations as distinct from (yet perhaps related to) essentialist explanations and leave open for now whether instances of the one imply instances of the other.

A third option is to instead offer (1) as what we will call a reductive explanation, which would be to group (1) with (4) (see the entry on scientific reduction). Like grounding and essence, there is some controversy over what reduction is, although somewhat more has been said about how reduction and explanation are related and how reductive explanations work than in the case of essence. We can again stay somewhat neutral in saying that reductive explanations typically work by “analyzing” or “breaking down” some phenomenon as “nothing more than” another phenomenon. Although a number of recent accounts of reduction analyze the notion in terms of grounding, or essence, or both (e.g., Correia 2017; Fine 2001, 2015; Rosen 2015), others do not (e.g., Dorr 2016, King 1998). So here too, as a provisional matter we shall treat reductive explanation as distinct from (yet perhaps related to) both grounding and essentialist explanation and leave open whether instances of the one imply instances of the other.

We are not suggesting that this list of varieties of metaphysical explanation is comprehensive. For instance, consider:

Socrates has Sophroniscus as a father because he essentially has Sophroniscus as a father.

Although Glazier (2017) calls (7) an instance of essentialist explanation, (7) appears to us to work in a different way than (3). Unlike (3), (7) does not attempt to explain what it is for Socrates to be the individual he is, or even what it is for Socrates to have Sophroniscus as a father. Rather, (7) concerns why Socrates has Sophroniscus as a father, and works by citing a certain fact about the status of this relationship—namely, that it is essential to Socrates—which would presumably help to explain why Socrates must be so. Glazier argues that explanations like (7) do not imply corresponding grounding explanations, and thus explanations like (7) are not grounding explanations. Yet there is a more general pattern here. Even if one is skeptical of the notion of essence, one might attempt to metaphysically explain why Socrates has Sophroniscus as a father in terms of some other status of this fact; for instance, one might appeal to the fact that it falls under a more general “law of metaphysics”, or one might simply appeal to the necessity of this fact alone (see Kappes forthcoming).

We are also not suggesting that one must treat all of these (or other) forms of metaphysical explanation as genuine. Nonetheless, they are prevalent enough in both classic and contemporary metaphysics that an account of metaphysical explanation that aims to be comprehensive ought to either accommodate all of them or explain why they are not genuine forms of metaphysical explanation despite initial appearances.

3. Separatism vs. unionism about metaphysical explanation

Before, we said that metaphysical explanations “derive their explanatory power” somehow from non-causal relationships. More specific proposals about the nature and varieties of metaphysical explanation diverge over which relationships those are, and how that work is carried out. Any proposal, though, must confront perhaps the most striking feature of any form of explanation, one that seems even more surprising in the case of metaphysical explanation. Metaphysical explanations seem to have one foot in the world—something to do with the way it is (causally or non-causally) structured seems to play a role. Metaphysical explanations are metaphysical, after all (or so one might think). Yet they seem to have another foot in our thought and communication about the world—our desire for explanation (even if not a natural one, as Aristotle claims) is at least in part a desire to understand, to make the world intelligible to ourselves and others, to learn the why and how of things and what to expect, to satisfy our curiosity. Metaphysical explanations are explanations, after all (or so one might think). Yet how could metaphysical explanation be at once metaphysical, but also a form of explanation?

Following Raven (2015), who applies the terminology to grounding and grounding explanations in particular, approaches to this fundamental question might be classified with regard to whether they take a “unionist” or “separatist” line. Standardly, unionism about grounding and grounding explanation is the thesis that they are one: to be grounded just is to be metaphysically explained in a distinctive way (e.g., Dasgupta 2014; Jenkins 2013; Litland 2013, 2017; Raven 2012; Rosen 2010; Thompson 2016). (A unionist might also subscribe to the stronger thesis that the expressions “grounded” and “explained in such-and-such distinctive way” are, or at least ought to be, used as synonyms, but that is not essential to how we understand the view here.) Unionists thus owe some account of how the metaphysical and explanatory elements of metaphysical explanation can be held together in a coherent package, or else jettison one element or the other. Separatism about grounding and grounding explanation is the thesis that they are separate, yet grounding explanations nonetheless “track”, or are “backed” or “underwritten” by, instances of grounding (e.g., Audi 2012, Schaffer 2016, Trogdon 2013). Separatists thus owe some account of how that link keeps the metaphysical and explanatory elements of metaphysical explanation from flying off in opposite directions. One might think that the separatist about grounding explanation here incurs no new debt, since separatists about causal explanation must meet an analogous challenge. However, note that the quasi-causal model of metaphysical explanation at play here is far from the only way in which we might model metaphysical explanation (see §6), and also that to distinguish causation from causal explanation is itself a substantive commitment.

In order to extend the unionist-separatist classification to metaphysical explanation in general, though, some care must be taken. First (and most obviously), those who believe that there are two or more forms of metaphysical explanation need not be unionists or separatists across the board. The extent to which one is a unionist or a separatist should depend on what non-causal relations one takes statements like (1)–(4) to derive their explanatory power from, as well as on background assumptions about what kind of thing an explanation is and what kinds of things it relates, or even whether these statements ascribe relations at all on the final analysis. For instance, we have spoken loosely of metaphysical explanations as truths of a certain kind that can be discovered and argued over; one might take this view, and add to it the claim that they are truths involving a relation between facts. Such a view might preclude one from being a unionist about, say, essentialist explanations like (3), if one holds that they concern relationships that may involve things that are not facts (e.g., Socrates and his father).

Second, a further complication is that there is an open question whether the various non-causal relations by which metaphysical explanations work must themselves “track” still further relations. For instance, one might maintain that instances of grounding must somehow track the relations of whole to parts, determinable to determinate, role to realizer, set to members, or others. Those with unionist sympathies must therefore be clear about whether grounding explanations are to be identified with grounding or with some non-causal relation that grounding tracks, while separatists must be clear about whether grounding explanations work by tracking grounding, or by tracking some non-causal relation(s) that grounding tracks. Similar points hold for essentialist and reductive explanations, if one holds the view that there are relations that essence-accident and analysans-analysandum must “track”.

Finally, there are viable approaches to metaphysical explanation that do not fit neatly in either the unionist or separatist camp as it is standardly understood. For instance, Maurin (2019) notes a distinction between those who believe that grounding is “by its nature” explanatory, as opposed to those who maintain that (at best) grounding has certain other features that make it apt to back grounding explanations. Interestingly, the former view (which counts as unionist on Maurin’s classification) does not automatically imply that grounding be grounding explanation (which is required to count as unionist on Raven’s classification). After all, knowledge is by its nature true, but it does not follow that knowledge is truth. Setting aside the less interesting question of how one ought to use the term of art “unionism”, Maurin’s proposal—when broadened to metaphysical explanation in general; see Thompson (2019)—shows that there is conceptual space to distinguish the metaphysical and explanatory elements of metaphysical explanation yet without explicitly linking them by appeal to a relation of backing.

4. Monism vs pluralism about metaphysical explanation

In §2, we canvassed some putatively different forms of metaphysical explanation. But how many are there in fact? Monists about metaphysical explanation think that there is just one, whereas pluralists think that there are many. There are various different respects in which one might be a monist or a pluralist. For example, one might think that metaphysical explanations derive their explanatory power from any of a number of non-causal dependence relations (e.g., Thompson 2019), but that all metaphysical explanations derive their explanatory power in the same way. This would be a pluralism in one sense, because various kinds of relations produce metaphysical explanations, but a monism in another because all metaphysical explanations have the same form. A more monistic spin on such an account would hold that grounding relations produce metaphysical explanations, but that there are various grounding mechanisms (e.g., Trogdon 2018). If the source of some metaphysical explanations is relational but the source of others is to be found in the essences of things, this is another version of this type of “lightweight” pluralism.

According to a more thoroughgoing pluralism, there are a number of fundamentally different kinds of metaphysical explanation. Such a view can be motivated in a number of ways that do not at first glance presuppose particular views about whether relations of non-causal dependence like grounding, essence, and reduction reduce to one another. Litland (2013) and Richardson (2020), for instance, distinguish between how-explanation, which tells us how or the specific way in which something is the case and why-explanation, which tells us why it is the case at all. Bertrand (2019) further recognizes a class of metaphysical explanations by constraint: “top-down” metaphysical explanations which show how particular instances fit into a general scheme. These different kinds of explanation are plausibly elicited by the asking of different questions.

In reply, the monist might deny that the asking of different kinds of questions to elicit metaphysical explanations implies that we should be pluralists. They might simply be different ways of asking for the same kind of explanation, for example. Moreover, why-questions are generally taken to elicit causal explanations but can sometimes also be used to elicit metaphysical explanations. One might then insist that whilst differentiating kinds of explanation requests by the question asked can be a useful heuristic, it is not a perfectly reliable method for distinguishing different kinds of explanation.

5. Realism vs antirealism about metaphysical explanation

In §3, we raised a surprising tension in theorizing about metaphysical explanation: at least initially, it appears at once to be about the world (qua metaphysical) and about how we think and communicate about the world (qua explanation). Realists and antirealists about metaphysical explanation disagree about how to resolve this tension. For realists, metaphysical explanation is primarily (or even entirely) objective and mind-independent. That is, there is some mind-independent fact of the matter about what metaphysically explains what; what metaphysically explains what depends on what the world is like, and not (or at least not primarily) on how we think or talk about it. Those who deny this, and think of metaphysical explanation as inescapably linked to how we think and communicate, are antirealists.

One can be realists about metaphysical explanation to varying degrees. An extreme realist view conjoins a realism about metaphysical dependence relations (they are themselves completely objective and mind-independent) with the view that metaphysical explanations just are the relevant kinds of dependence relations. Most philosophers do not think metaphysical explanation is quite like this. An attractive, widely held view is that metaphysical explanations have both a representational component and a worldly component, as is commonly the case when people adopt a version of the separatist view discussed above (§3). So long as the worldly component of metaphysical explanation (generally taken to be a non-causal dependence relation of some sort) is itself objective and mind-independent, the relevant account of metaphysical explanation is generally considered realist.

However, there is room to adopt a view of metaphysical explanation according to which constraints on how this worldly dependence relation and the relata it holds between are represented factor into whether or not something counts as an explanation. For example, one might think that an extremely complicated description of the relation between particles could fail as a metaphysical explanation of the existence of a table, because when related to subjects with our level of cognitive sophistication, it is impossible for us to understand or to expect the existence of the table on the basis of the relevant description. This would seem a less than fully realist account of metaphysical explanation, because whilst the explanation includes a worldly component, its counting as a metaphysical explanation or otherwise depends on psychological factors such as the cognitive sophistication of its likely recipients.

There are various ways to resist the above account without giving up on the idea that acts of metaphysical explanation might sometimes fail on the basis of psychological factors. One might insist that a metaphysical explanation is to be distinguished from an act of metaphysical explanation, and that all that is required for the latter is a true representation of worldly non-causal dependence. Metaphysical explanations abound to various degrees of complexity (etc.) and their existing and counting as metaphysical explanations is not something constrained by pragmatic, epistemic, or psychological factors. How well they fare in acts of explaining is another matter, one that falls under the question of whether or not they are successful explanations. A different way to resist is to insist that all that is required for realism is that one component of the explanation be objective and mind-independent, because whilst the term “metaphysical explanation” refers to a representation of a worldly relation, whether something counts as a metaphysical explanation or not fully depends on the worldly component. (One might motivate this sort of view by claiming that, e.g., grounding is the essential component of any metaphysical explanation, but explanations are representational entities and so strictly speaking it is a mistake to describe the relation as an explanation, even though it alone does all the explanatory work, so to speak.)

In contrast, antirealists about metaphysical explanation at the most extreme end of the spectrum do not see any role for worldly dependence relations (see, e.g., Dasgupta 2017 and Taylor forthcoming for discussion). They might adopt the two-component view discussed above and maintain that both the relation involved in metaphysical explanation and how it is represented are conceptual matters (e.g., because they are antirealists about the relevant non-casual dependence relations), or they might think that metaphysical explanation has only one component. That component might be a conceptual relation or a non-causal dependence relation understood in an antirealist way, or it might be something more representational. For example, one might follow Shaheen (2017) in taking the use of causal metaphors to be a component of our talk about metaphysical explanation, while going further than he does by denying that the metaphorical cause-like sense of “because” used in metaphysics has objective, mind-independent truth conditions. Or one might follow Thompson (2019), who thinks of metaphysical explanations as answers to certain kinds of questions. Both views are consistent with thinking that non-causal dependence relations play a role in metaphysical explanation (by being what certain kinds of because-claims are about, or helping to make it the case that a particular answer to a question is correct) but the relations are not themselves a component of the explanation.

Norton and Miller (2019) present what they describe as a psychologistic theory of metaphysical explanation; metaphysical explanations have truth conditions that appeal to the dispositions of agents evaluating the explanation, as well as necessitation relations between the explanans and explanandum. Since these necessitation relations are objective this is not an entirely antirealist account of metaphysical explanation, but from the way in which mental states vary between individuals it follows that metaphysical explanations are only true or false relative to a particular context of assessment. It is thus to be considered a broadly antirealist account.

6. Models of metaphysical explanation

A common strategy when trying to get to a grip of some phenomenon is to model our understanding of its nature on some pre-existing and well-established understanding of the nature of a (supposedly relevantly similar) phenomenon. In this section we survey some instances of this strategy by investigating attempts to model metaphysical explanation as a kind of causal (§6.1), nomological (§6.2), unificationist (§6.3), or pragmatist explanation (§6.4).

6.1 Metaphysical explanation as quasi-causal explanation

That metaphysical explanation is like causal explanation is a view with quite a few proponents today (though see Taylor 2018 for some problem cases for this view). Mostly those who think it is, also think that all or most metaphysical explanations track or are grounding relations (see §3 above). According to these philosophers, more precisely, metaphysical explanation is like causal explanation because grounding is like causation (Fine 2012; Schaffer 2016, 2017; A. Wilson 2018). In what sense grounding is like causation varies among proponents of this view. According to Schaffer, grounding and causation, although similar (because both species of the kind directed determination relation), are distinct. According to Wilson, grounding and what he calls “nomic causation” are both kinds of causation (although of a rather different sort than ordinary causation; see §2). On both accounts, metaphysical and causal explanation are alike because grounding and causation resemble each other. One might however think that metaphysical explanation is like causal explanation simply because the relations those explanations track play the same role vis-a-vis explanation. Fine (2012: 40) may be said to give expression to something like this view when he states that: “Ground, if you like, stands to philosophy as cause stands to science”. Holding this view is compatible with the relations those explanations pick out being in all other respects different from one another.

If grounding is, or is like, causation, what follows concerning our understanding of the nature of metaphysical explanation? That depends. One suggestion is that, if grounding is (like) causation, how we understand the nature of causation (and grounding) somehow directly translates into an account of the nature of causal (and metaphysical) explanation. Some accounts of the nature of causation seem a better fit than others for this type of “translation”. If, for instance, causation is understood along counterfactual or interventionist lines, causation and causal explanation (and, is the idea, by analogy, grounding and metaphysical explanation) seem especially closely related (see the entry on causation: and manipulability and the entry on counterfactual theories of causation). On this type of account, a causal explanation amounts to laying bare systematic patterns of counterfactual dependence. In interventionist language:

[T]he common element in many forms of explanation, both causal and non-causal, is that they must answer what-if-things-had-been-different questions. (Woodward 2003: 221)

Schaffer (2016) proposes we model grounding “in the image of causation” along counterfactual lines (see A. Wilson 2018, who offers a similar model). More precisely, he suggests we understand grounding via so-called structural equation models. These are models which can be characterized using a structure (introduced by Halpern 2000) featuring a set of exogenous (independent) variables, a set of endogenous (dependent) variables, a set of (incompatible) values representing contrasts (such that there is a function mapping every variable to an at least two-membered set of values), a set of structural equations (telling us how each endogenous variable is to be evaluated on the basis of the values of other variables), and some assignment of values to each exogenous variable. Schaffer thinks this formalism is excellent for modeling directed dependency relations generally, and so is equally fitting for modeling both causal and metaphysical dependencies. All that needs adjusting when we move from causation to grounding is some of our background understanding of surrounding notions.

Schaffer is a separatist (see §3). Causal and metaphysical explanation are in other words distinct from the relations (causation and grounding, respectively) they track, and it is important not to think that everything that is true about the explanation side of things must be true of the relation side of things (and vice versa). Schaffer does draw one rather substantive conclusion from the analogy between causation and grounding, however: that there is no distinctive notion of metaphysical (as opposed to causal) explanation. There is just explanation (simpliciter) and explanation can be backed by causation, grounding or whatever other relations are apt to back explanation (which, on his view, is the same as being apt to be modeled using structural equations). Similarly, A. Wilson (2018) thinks that a “major theoretical benefit” of regarding grounding as metaphysical causation is that this accounts, in a straightforward way, for the explanatory nature of grounding claims: grounding explanations are a type of causal explanation, and they work by identifying metaphysical causes. The result is a unified theory of explanation, at least of explanations that work by tracking some worldly relation (see §4), according to which all explanation is causal explanation.

Against the account, a couple of things can and have been said. First, just as there are important analogies between grounding and causation (of the ordinary, run-of-the mill sort: §1), there are disanalogies as well. This is accepted by both friends and foes of the view. The question then is whether those differences are serious enough to undermine the work the analogy does in the account (proponents of the account, not surprisingly don’t think so; for some who do: see, e.g., Bernstein 2016, Janssen 2018, and Roski 2021; see Ylikoski 2013 for a related view). Another argument (due to Janssen 2018) against understanding grounding, and hence metaphysical explanation, in terms of structural equation models points to the representational status of models generally. Deciding whether or not a causal model includes the right variables (both in number and kind) to be able to represent the causal structure of interest sometimes involves reference to what is considered the theory that best captures the actual features of particular (local) causal processes or mechanisms. These are typically theories for which we have a posteriori evidence. Yet in the case of grounding, these sorts of “evidence” for model-aptness are not available. In fact, it is not even enough for the grounding theorist to include all possible scenarios, it seems the grounding theorist must countenance counterpossibles as well. That this is so, is admitted and defended in A. Wilson (2018). For those who think this is unacceptable, however, this is a serious problem with the account.

Another way of exploiting the analogy between grounding and causation is by modeling metaphysical explanation on so-called causal-mechanistic explanation via modeling grounding on causation, mechanistically understood (see the entry on mechanism in science). Something along these lines is suggested in Trogdon (2018). On this view:

some metaphysical explanations are representations of grounding relations as being instances of grounding mechanisms. (Trogdon 2018: 1296)

The explanandum of a grounding-mechanical explanation is the obtaining of a grounded fact, and just as we can causally explain a phenomenon by providing a model of the inner workings of the mechanism that produces it (see Machamer et al. 2000), we can metaphysically explain why a grounded fact obtains by providing a model of how grounding facts and facts they ground are connected. We explain why a grounded fact obtains by revealing the metaphysical determination relations—examples, provided by Trogdon, include set formation, the determinate-determinable relation, functional realization, constitution and mereological realization—that hold between the constituents of the relevant facts. In other words: we explain why a fact obtains via accounting for how it is (mechanistically) grounded.

Can all metaphysical explanations be understood in quasi-causal terms? Those who want to argue that they can have their work cut out for them. They first need to explain how explanations like our (3) and (4) can be modeled in this way. Perhaps more surprisingly, some argue that this sort of account might not even work as an account of all types of metaphysical explanation involving grounding. It is generally thought that a conjunctive fact is grounded in its conjuncts. Yet, unless we think of conjunction-introduction as a (mechanistic) determination relation—something Trogdon cautions strongly against (and others: see, e.g., Wilsch 2015)—this is grounding in the absence of a grounding mechanism.

If it follows that conceptual or logical metaphysical explanations work in a different way than other types of (grounding) metaphysical explanation, then the unification gained by modeling metaphysical as causal explanation is arguably contradicted by the disunification of metaphysical explanations of the grounding-kind. If you think this is a problem, there are a couple of different options available: you may, first, claim that, although cases of “bare” grounding are bare in the sense that they do not involve any grounding-mechanisms, they are not bare in the sense that they involve no mechanism whatsoever. They do, only the mechanisms they involve are not grounding mechanisms, but rather conceptual or logical mechanisms: mechanisms involving the conceptual and/or logical analogue of the grounding determination relations. Another option is to try to redraw the boundaries for what counts as a metaphysical explanation and argue that cases of bare grounding do not back metaphysical but rather other types of—conceptual or logical—explanation (e.g., Kovacs 2017; McSweeney 2020). This frees the proponent of the mechanistic view from having to introduce different kinds of mechanisms but does not really solve the problem of disunification. Alternatively, the proponent of the mechanistic view could argue that, while there is metaphysical explanation in cases of bare grounding, those are cases where grounding doesn’t play an essential role in the explanation (grounding doesn’t back metaphysical explanation). The result would be an account of metaphysical explanation able to provide us with a unified account only of such explanations which essentially involve grounding. In view of the fact that many believe that conceptual and logical explanation, for example, need to be separately accounted for anyway, this should perhaps be acceptable.

Thus, even if there is this interesting sense in which we can unify quasi-casual metaphysical explanations and causal scientific explanations, it is not clear whether all metaphysical explanation are of this form, since at least on first glance there seem to be exceptions—sometimes major exceptions—that fail to be covered by this model. Whether this is considered a problem or not will depend on whether or not one thinks there is a special value in monism with respect to one’s account of metaphysical explanation, and to what extent one takes putative examples that do not fit the mold are genuine.

6.2 Metaphysical Explanation as nomological explanation

Some have argued that metaphysical explanation ought to be understood as a species of the kind deductive-nomological explanation. On this view (see Hempel & Oppenheim 1948 and Hempel 1965) (scientific) explanations are sound deductive arguments, featuring the following ingredients (see scientific explanation, §2):

  1. An initial condition: An event of type F obtains.
  2. A law statement: For all events, if an event of type F obtains, then an event of type G obtains.
  3. A conclusion: An event of type G obtains.

This way of understanding the nature of (scientific) explanation does not mention causation and is compatible with a Humean understanding of laws of nature, for example one that takes laws of nature to be truths that belong to any deductive system that best balances simplicity and fit with the facts. In this sense, understanding explanation in deductive-nomological terms can easily be combined with an antirealism about such explanations, if the notions of best balance, simplicity, and/or fit with the facts are understood partly in terms of how we think or communicate (see §5). Or the account can be understood as realist in nature, if, for example, one’s preferred account of the nature of laws of nature is in turn realist (those proposed by Armstrong 1983, Dretske 1977, and Tooley 1977 being one example).

Most of those who have argued that metaphysical explanation is deductive-nomological have tended to defend a comparatively “heavyweight” account of the (metaphysical) laws that metaphysical explanations involve, and so have opted for a realist separatist version of the account. Laws, on this view, are understood as something more or other than the Humean regularities they entail, and in at least some cases involve or reduce to facts about an underlying “construction” relation or essence (e.g., Glazier 2016; Kment 2014; Wilsch 2015). For more on the nature of “laws of metaphysics”, see, e.g., Sider (2011: sect. 12.4) and Rosen (2006; 2017). For a comparatively speaking less heavyweight account of the nature of the laws that feature in metaphysical explanation—one according to which such laws are nothing but “counterfactual-supporting general principles” and therefore “inclusive” in the sense of being neither necessarily fundamental nor necessarily exceptionless—see Schaffer (2017). See also Woodward and Hitchcock (2003).

Adopting a more heavyweight account of the nature of metaphysical laws, and hence of metaphysical explanation, may come with a metaphysical cost—for instance, if one takes them to be ontologically basic entities, or if one takes the distinction between laws and non-laws to be a primitive one. According to proponents of such an account, this is a price worth paying. One important reason why the traditional deductive-nomological account of (scientific) explanation has few proponents today was that the symmetry of deductive entailment in certain cases seemed to interfere with our intuitions about the asymmetry of explanation (e.g., Lehrer 1974, who gets the example from Bromberger’s (1966) famous flagpole/shadow example, see also the entry scientific explanation §2.5). If the laws that explanation invokes involve or even reduce to something which has direction (from more to less fundamental) already built in, this problem is entirely avoided. Of course, if the account is to be able to also cover metaphysical explanation in the sense of essentialist explanation (see §2 above), the fact that the laws have direction already built in could be considered a flaw rather than an advantage.

Finally, if metaphysical explanation is deductive-nomological (or “covering law”), it seems that there is no room for explanations of rare or one-off phenomena in terms of the mechanisms that ground (or cause) them, even in cases where, had a similar mechanism occurred, it need not have given rise to a similar phenomenon (e.g., Taylor 2016). According to Trogdon (2018; see also Anscombe 1971), it seems likely that some explanations are one-off in this sense, from which it would seem to follow that, even if some or most metaphysical explanations turn out to be deductive nomological, this cannot be true of all of them. For an argument against this conclusion—on the grounds that laws of metaphysics can be indeterministic and that (like indeterministic laws of nature) they can hence help explain rare events—see Wasserman (2017).

6.3 Metaphysical explanation as explanation by unification

Unificationism is a view of scientific explanation that, although it builds on some of the insights of the classic DN-model, extends and refines that model by focusing, not on individual arguments, but on those argument patterns which best unify the relevant phenomena. Its core idea is that to explain is to derive as many conclusions as possible from as few premises as possible, using as few and as stringent argument patterns as possible. The fewer patterns used, the higher the stringency. The greater the range of conclusions derived, the greater the unification. The account (inspired by Friedman 1974) was first developed by Kitcher (1981, 1989). For a good overview, see the entry on scientific explanation (§5).

In metaphysics, an account of explanation along something like these lines can (as noted by Roski 2019) be found already in the work of Bolzano. Recent attempts to adapt Kitcher’s model to suit metaphysical and not just scientific explanation include Kovacs (2020) and Baron & Norton (2021) (see Bertrand 2019 for an account that, although not couched in terms of unification, has a lot in common with their views).

A unificationist account of metaphysical explanation is an account according to which such explanations aim to unify the beliefs implicated in metaphysical theorizing. On this view, roughly speaking, a particular derivation is a metaphysical explanation just in case it is an instance of an argument pattern that unifies metaphysical beliefs. Several things can be said in favor of this view. If you are no fan of grounding, the fact that it takes metaphysical explanation to be something completely independent of whatever determinative (grounding) relations there happen to be (or not), will count as a big point in its favor. Another positive is the fact that it is an account of metaphysical explanation that makes unusually good sense of the link between explanation and understanding. Unificationism corresponds to an intuitive way of thinking about understanding: we understand better when we can derive large amounts of information from a fairly small number of premises and a small number of argument patterns. This is because the ability to do so suggests an ability to identify connections between things; to fit things together. Yet the resulting account is not (just) psychological. As Friedman points out, explanatoriness remains in an important sense objective if “what is scientifically comprehensible is constant for a relatively large class of people” (1974: 7–8).

For those who think of metaphysical explanation as an entirely objective and worldly affair the account will however remain highly unattractive. Indeed, even those who think of metaphysical explanation as partly representational—the so-called separatists—will most likely not find it very appealing. Note, though, that some think that metaphysical explanation can be either unificationist or understood in terms of grounding (Bertrand 2019 is one example). If so, although metaphysical explanation will become a less unified phenomenon, the fact that it can make sense of both what Bertrand (inspired by Salmon 2006) calls “top-down” and “bottom-up” metaphysical explanation, should perhaps count as a point in its favor.

Some further objections to the account—including, among other things, the question of what should count as the best systematization; if understanding metaphysical explanation in unificationist terms means having to give up on the “impure logic” of such explanations, and; if given unificationism, logical truths will lack metaphysical explanation—are discussed (and ultimately rejected) in Kovacs (2020). A classic objection to the unificationist account of causal explanation, finally, is that it, just like its close cousin the DN-account (see §6.2), fails to make sense of the asymmetry of such explanations, at least not without assuming causal realism. A similar objection may well be available to those who combine unificationism and anti-realism about metaphysical explanation.

6.4 The pragmatics of metaphysical explanation

Pragmatic accounts of metaphysical explanation hold that whether something counts as an explanation or not is context-dependent. This goes deeper than thinking that explanatory information is context-dependent; that there are pragmatic constraints on how much, how little, or what kind of explanatory information to request or give in a particular conversation is fairly widely accepted. It also goes deeper than noting that which relation the term “explains” picks out differs from context of utterance to context of utterance (since, perhaps, one takes the term “understands” to be context-sensitive in this way, and one takes the conferral of understanding to be necessary to explanation). The thesis is rather the far more controversial one that metaphysical explanation is itself a context-sensitive phenomenon in the sense that the factors relevant to evaluating the truth of a statement of metaphysical explanation, once the context of utterance has settled that statement's truth-conditions, involve facts about actual or possible (types of) explanation givers or receivers, such as facts about their interests, conceptual proficiencies, background knowledge, and the like.

In the literature on causal explanation, the most famous proponent of pragmatic explanation is van Fraassen (1980) who argues that explanations are answers to why-questions. A fairly straightforward analogue for metaphysical explanation would be to hold that metaphysical explanations are answers to what-makes-it-the-case-that questions. There are then various different ways in which aspects of context become salient. First, the context might focus the question. When we ask “What makes it the case that the ball is red?”, we will expect different answers depending on the contrast class we had in mind (e.g., red rather than some other color, or red rather than merely appearing to be red). Second, the context also determines the kinds of answers that are acceptable, which might differ based on (for example) the background knowledge of the explanation-seeker and explanation-receiver. An artist will typically have a far more finely-grained conception of what particular shade makes a certain Rothko painting red than your average schoolchild would, and so a particular answer might count as explanatory for the artist but not for a child (who may not even possess the relevant color concept).

There has, as of yet, been comparatively little discussion of pragmatic accounts of metaphysical explanation in the literature. One exception is Thompson (2019), who develops an account along the lines described above, where metaphysical explanations are pairs of context-sensitive questions and answers. Because the role of context is ineliminable, there is no sense to be made of a notion of metaphysical explanation free from pragmatic constraints. However, Thompson accounts for the correctness of particular explanations (in part) by appeal to worldly dependence relations, and so that metaphysical explanation is pragmatic does not imply that it is wholly unconstrained by worldly dependence. A different kind of pragmatic theory of metaphysical explanation is defended by Miller and Norton (2017). Their “psychologistic” account of metaphysical explanation locates the truth conditions for metaphysically explanatory claims in the psychological states of the agents evaluating the relevant “because” claims, alongside worldly necessitation relations. The relevant psychological states are dispositions towards particular beliefs, which are expected to vary between individuals. Claims about what metaphysically explains what are thus only true relative to a specific (type of) context within which the claim's truth is being assessed.

7. The scope of metaphysical explanation

7.1 Metaphysical explanation outside of metaphysics

Thus far, we have discussed the nature of metaphysical explanation, but have kept silent on what its extent might be. At first glance, facts of all sorts inside metaphysics and out seem to at least in principle admit of metaphysical explanation. In this section, we discuss recent applications in ethics, philosophy of mind, and philosophy of social science respectively.

First, ethics. In Plato’s Euthyphro, the eponymous Euthyphro is asked by Socrates to consider the following question: Is that which is pious loved by the gods because it is pious, or is it pious because it is loved by the gods? (Euthyphro 10a). This is a very early example of a request for a metaphysical explanation, for the connection between piety and being loved by the gods imagined in the second horn does not seem to be a causal connection, but a constitutive one (although what Plato means by “because” in the first horn, and the overall structure of Plato’s argument, remains controversial). Requests for explanation abound in moral philosophy: one of the key aims of first-order moral philosophy is to explain why the right actions are right and the wrong ones are wrong (Fogal & Risberg 2020), and of metaethics is to systematize those explanations. Fine (2012: 37) distinguishes between three different explanatory relations: metaphysical, normative, and natural, apparently suggesting that normative explanations and metaphysical explanations are different kinds of explanation. However, explanations in the moral realm (e.g., that an action is bad because it causes pain, or that something has intrinsic value just in case it is valuable in virtue of its intrinsic properties) are often considered paradigm cases of metaphysical explanations. Berker (2018), who is a unionist, argues at length that it is metaphysical grounding (and thus metaphysical explanation) that is at issue in moral philosophy.

Second, philosophy of mind. Although there has been limited systematic discussion of metaphysical explanation in the area, considerations about metaphysical explanation inform some of the most fundamental questions in the discipline, such as how it could be the case that consciousness exists. It is fairly common for the grounding literature to mention by way of elucidation of the notion of grounding that we might think of mental facts as grounded in the physical facts. This example is supposed to be compelling because of the attractiveness of the idea that physical facts determine and metaphysically explain the mental facts, and grounding is a prima facie appealing notion with which to characterize the relationship between the mental and the physical precisely because of its explanatory nature. This idea is made more precise in the development of grounding physicalism (see, e.g., Ney 2016; O’Conaill 2018; Rabin forthcoming-a, forthcoming-b; Schaffer 2021), though this new version of physicalism has not been met with universal approval (see, e.g., Melnyk 2016; J. Wilson 2018).

For physicalists in the philosophy of mind who maintain that the mental is grounded in, supervenient on, or identical with the physical, there is a pressing need to explain what makes it the case that some particular phenomenal feel should be associated with a given physical state (see, e.g., Chalmers 1996; Levine 2001). This explanatory gap is an epistemic one, and so there are two ways we might proceed. The first is to insist that unless the explanatory gap has been closed, we do not have a metaphysical explanation of the mental in terms of the physical. The second is to allow that we might have a metaphysical explanation without a corresponding epistemic one. Schaffer (2017) argues that grounding, and the metaphysical laws that provide the framework for grounding, close the explanatory gap between the mental and the physical (and many more besides). Rabin (2019) disagrees, claiming that the gap between consciousness and physical fundamentalia has a special status, persisting even if we grant that the former is metaphysically explained by the latter.

Third, philosophy of social science. Theorizing about the nature of social reality at least partly involves metaphysically explaining social reality. Debates between (methodological) holists and individualists, for example, concern whether social activities and events are to be explained by appeal to macro-level (social) phenomena, or by the thoughts and actions of the individuals that, most agree, make up or ground those social phenomena (see, e.g., Popper 1945; Watkins 1952). The metaphysically explanatory nature of social theorizing has not always been appreciated. This is brought out in the distinction between explanatory and ontological individualism (Lukes 1968). Explanatory individualism is the thesis that social reality is best explained in terms of individuals, their thoughts and interactions. Ontological individualism, on the other hand, holds that social reality consists in or is exhaustively determined by individuals, their thoughts and interactions. If, however, social reality is or is grounded in individuals and their interactions, social reality is metaphysically explained by those individuals and their interactions (Epstein 2015). Both these theses are theses about explanation.

Metaphysical explanation is also relevant when considering the existence and nature of social kinds. According to Haslanger (2012), for example, being a woman amounts to occupying a certain (subordinate and hence oppressed) position in a social hierarchy. This type of view gives rise to Euthyphro-like queries of the kind: is x a woman because she occupies a certain position in an oppressive structure, or does she occupy this position because she is a woman? (see Ásta 2010). According to some philosophers involved in this debate, how you answer this question will decide if your account is realist (Barnes 2017) or deflationist (Díaz-León 2018). Haslanger herself has argued that the account is best understood as something in between. Against the “deflationists”, she is an extensionalist about meaning, from which it follows that it would make no sense to say that we have to sort out what the word means before determining its extension. Against the realists, Haslanger sometimes talks as if she rejects the idea that reality is hierarchically structured and holds instead that the natural world is neither explanatorily prior to nor ontologically more fundamental than the social world (pace, e.g., Schaffer 2017).

7.2 Do all facts admit of metaphysical explanation, or none?

Abstracting from specific putative applications of metaphysical explanation outside of metaphysics proper, can one say in more general terms what the extent of metaphysical explanation is? On one extreme, proponents of the famous “principle of sufficient reason” contend that everything (or everything of a certain sort, e.g., contingent facts) has an explanation of some form or other, and Dasgupta (2016) has prominently developed a version of the principle regarding metaphysical explanation, specifically grounding explanation on his view. Notably, Dasgupta distinguishes between two ways that metaphysical explanation might be limited in extent. Call a substantive fact one that is “apt for being grounded”, in the sense that

the question of what grounds it can legitimately be raised and admits of a sensible answer (an answer that either states its ground or else states that it has none),

and call a fact autonomous just in case it is not substantive, and thus is one for which “the question of why it obtains does not legitimately arise” (2016: 383). Dasgupta’s version of the PSR is then the claim that “every substantive fact has an autonomous ground” (2016: 84).

Broadening Dasgupta’s distinction, there are two questions about the scope of metaphysical explanation to consider. First, which (types of) facts have metaphysical explanations—all, none, or something in the middle? Second, of those that lack metaphysical explanations, which (types of) facts are not apt to be metaphysically explained at all? Dasgupta suggests that facts about essence are autonomous facts (2016: 385). Other philosophers have challenged the idea that facts about essences are ungrounded, and so have opened the door to facts regarding essences having metaphysical explanations (see Tillman 2016, Glazier 2017, Raven 2021).

On the other extreme, one might maintain that no fact is apt to be metaphysically explained. One type of worry is that notions thought by some to be constitutive of metaphysical explanation, such as grounding and essence, are somehow defective (see the entry on metaphysical grounding §8 and the entry on essential vs. accidental properties §5). Another type of worry is that metaphysical explanations would compete with scientific, mathematical, and/or other forms of explanation in a manner that render metaphysical explanations objectionably superfluous. Jeff Engelhardt (2016) develops this line of thought and argues that many philosophers are implicitly committed to an objectionable sort of overdetermination involving metaphysical explanation. The sort of overdetermination he has in mind regards cases where something seems to have a sufficient causal explanation as well as a sufficient metaphysical explanation. For example, for any given house, that house exists both because it was caused to exist (causal explanation), as well as because it is grounded in its parts (metaphysical explanation). Perhaps the best solution to the problem which we can come up with, Engelhardt suggests, is that in cases such as this one the cause in question (C) causes the grounds of the house to obtain, but C does not cause the house to exist. In this case, while C does explain why the house exists, it does not causally explain why the house exists. Rather, C causally explains why the parts of the house are configured in such-and-such a manner, and those parts being configured in that manner in turn grounds the existence of the house.


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