Moral Anti-Realism

First published Mon Jul 30, 2007; substantive revision Mon May 24, 2021

It might be expected that it would suffice for the entry for “moral anti-realism” to contain only some links to other entries in this encyclopedia. It could contain a link to “moral realism” and stipulate the negation of the view described there. Alternatively, it could have links to the entries “anti-realism” and “morality” and could stipulate the conjunction of the materials contained therein. The fact that neither of these approaches would be adequate—and, more strikingly, that following the two procedures would yield substantively non-equivalent results—reveals the contentious and unsettled nature of the topic.

“Anti-realism,” “non-realism,” and “irrealism” may for most purposes be treated as synonymous. Occasionally, distinctions have been suggested for local pedagogic reasons (see, e.g., Wright 1988; Dreier 2004), but no such distinction has generally taken hold. (“Quasi-realism” denotes something very different, to be described below.) All three terms are to be defined in opposition to realism, but since there is no consensus on how “realism” is to be understood, “anti-realism” fares no better. Crispin Wright (1992: 1) comments that “if there ever was a consensus of understanding about ‘realism’, as a philosophical term of art, it has undoubtedly been fragmented by the pressures exerted by the various debates—so much so that a philosopher who asserts that she is a realist about theoretical science, for example, or ethics, has probably, for most philosophical audiences, accomplished little more than to clear her throat.” This entry doesn’t purport to do justice to the intricacy and subtlety of the topic of realism; it should be acknowledged at the outset that the fragmentation of which Wright speaks renders it unlikely that the label “moral anti-realism” even succeeds in picking out a definite position. Yet perhaps we can at least make an advance on clearing our throats.

1. Characterizing Moral Anti-realism

Traditionally, to hold a realist position with respect to X is to hold that X exists objectively. On this view, moral anti-realism is the denial of the thesis that moral properties—or facts, objects, relations, events, etc. (whatever categories one is willing to countenance)—exist objectively. This could involve either (1) the denial that moral properties exist at all, or (2) the acceptance that they do exist but this existence is (in the relevant sense) non-objective. There are broadly two ways of endorsing (1): moral noncognitivism and moral error theory. Proponents of (2) may be variously thought of as moral non-objectivists, or idealists, or constructivists. So understood, moral anti-realism is the disjunction of three theses:

  1. moral noncognitivism
  2. moral error theory
  3. moral non-objectivism

Using such labels is not a precise science, nor an uncontroversial matter; here they are employed just to situate ourselves roughly. In this spirit of preliminary imprecision, these views can be initially characterized as follows:

Moral noncognitivism holds that our moral judgments are not in the business of aiming at truth. So, for example, A.J. Ayer declared that when we say “Stealing money is wrong” we do not express a proposition that can be true or false, but rather it is as if we say “Stealing money!!” with the tone of voice indicating that a special feeling of disapproval is being expressed (Ayer [1936] 1971: 110). Note how the predicate “… is wrong” has disappeared in Ayer’s translation schema; thus the issues of whether the property of wrongness exists, and whether that existence is objective, also disappear.

The moral error theorist thinks that although our moral judgments aim at the truth, they systematically fail to secure it: the world simply doesn’t contain the relevant “stuff” to render our moral judgments true. For a more familiar analogy, compare what an atheist usually claims about religious judgments. On the face of it, religious discourse is cognitivist in nature: it would seem that when someone says “God exists” or “God loves you” they are usually asserting something that purports to be true. However, according to the atheist, the world isn’t furnished with the right kind of stuff (gods, afterlife, miracles, etc.) necessary to render these assertions true. The moral error theorist claims that when we say “Stealing is morally wrong” we are asserting that the act of stealing instantiates the property of moral wrongness, but in fact there is no such property, or at least nothing in the world instantiates it, and thus the utterance is untrue.

Non-objectivism (as it will be called here) allows that moral facts exist but holds that they are non-objective. The slogan version comes from Hamlet: “there is nothing either good or bad, but thinking makes it so.” For a quick example of a non-objective fact, consider the different properties that a particular diamond might have. It is true that the diamond is made of carbon, and also true that the diamond is worth $1000, say. But the status of these facts seems different. That the diamond is carbon seems an objective fact: it doesn’t depend on what we think of the matter. (We could all be under the impression that it is not carbon, and all be wrong.) That the diamond is worth $1000, by contrast, seems to depend on us. If we all thought that it was worth more (or less), then it would be worth more (or less).

[This entry uses the label “non-objectivism” instead of the simple “subjectivism” since there is an entrenched usage in metaethics for using the latter to denote the thesis that in making a moral judgment one is reporting (as opposed to expressing) one’s own mental attitudes (e.g., “Stealing is morally wrong” means “I disapprove of stealing”). So understood, subjectivism is a kind of non-objectivist theory, but there are many other kinds of non-objectivist theory, too.]

It is tempting to construe this idea of non-objectivity as “mind-dependence,” though this, as we will see below, is a tricky notion, since something may be mind-independent in one sense and mind-dependent in another. Cars, for example, are designed and constructed by creatures with minds, and yet in another sense cars are clearly concrete entities whose ongoing existence does not depend on our mental activity. Those who feel pessimistic that the notion of mind-dependence can be straightened out might prefer to characterize moral realism in a way that makes no reference to objectivity. There is also the concern that the objectivity clause threatens to render moral anti-realism trivially true, since there is little room for doubting that the moral status of actions usually (if not always) depends in some manner on mental phenomena, such as the intentions with which the action was performed or the episodes of pleasure and pain that ensue from it. (See Sayre-McCord 1986; also his the entry on moral realism.) Whether such pessimism is warranted is not something to be decided hastily. Perhaps the judicious course is to make a terminological distinction between minimal moral realism—which is the denial of noncognitivism and error theory—and robust moral realism—which in addition asserts the objectivity of moral facts. (See Rosen 1994 for this distinction.) In what follows, however, “moral realism” will continue to be used to denote the traditional robust version.

If moral anti-realism is understood in this manner, then there are several things with which it is important not to confuse it.

First, moral anti-realism is not a form of moral skepticism. If we take moral skepticism to be the claim that there is no such thing as moral knowledge, and we take knowledge to be justified true belief, then there are three ways of being a moral skeptic: one can deny that moral judgments are beliefs, one can deny that moral judgments are ever true, or one can deny that moral judgments are ever justified. The noncognitivist makes the first of these denials, and the error theorist makes the second, thus noncognitivists and error theorists count as both moral anti-realists and moral skeptics. However, since the non-objectivity of some fact does not pose a particular problem regarding the possibility of one’s knowing it (I might know that a certain diamond is worth $1000, for example), then there is nothing to stop the moral non-objectivist from accepting the existence of moral knowledge. So moral non-objectivism is a form of moral anti-realism that need not be a form of moral skepticism. Conversely, one might maintain that moral judgments are sometimes objectively true—thus being a moral realist—while also maintaining that moral judgments always lack justification—thus being a moral skeptic. (See entry for moral skepticism.)

Speaking more generally, moral anti-realism, as it has been defined here, contains no epistemological clause: it is silent on the question of whether we are justified in making moral judgments. This is worth noting since moral realists often want to support a view of morality that would guarantee our justified access to a realm of objective moral facts. But any such epistemic guarantee will need to be argued for separately; it is not implied by realism itself. Indeed, if objective facts are those that do not depend on our mental activity, then they are precisely those facts that we can all be mistaken about, and thus it seems reasonable to suppose that the desire for moral facts to be objective and the desire for a guarantee of epistemic access to moral facts are desiderata that are in tension with each other.

Second, it is worth stating explicitly that moral anti-realism is not a form of moral relativism—or, perhaps more usefully noted: that moral relativism is not a form of moral anti-realism. Moral relativism is a form of cognitivism according to which moral claims contain an indexical element, such that the truth of any such claim requires relativization to some individual or group. According to a simple form of relativism, the claim “Stealing is morally wrong” might be true when one person utters it, and false when someone else utters it. The important thing to note is that this would not necessarily make moral wrongness non-objective. For example, suppose someone were to make the relativistic claim that different moral values, virtues, and duties apply to different groups of people due to, say, their social caste. If this person were asked in virtue of what these relativistic moral facts obtain, there is nothing to prevent them offering the full-blooded realist answer: “It’s just the way the universe objectively is.” Relativism does not stand opposite objectivism; it stands opposite absolutism (the form of cognitivism according to which the truth of moral claims does not require relativization to any individual or group). One can be both a moral relativist and a moral objectivist (and thus a moral realist); conversely, one can be both a moral non-objectivist (and thus a moral anti-realist) and a moral absolutist. (See entries for relativism and moral relativism.)

Of course, someone could simply stipulate that moral realism includes the denial of moral relativism, and perhaps the philosophical community could be persuaded to adopt this definition (in which case this entry would need to be revised). But it seems reasonable to suspect that the common tendency to think that moral realism and moral relativism are opposed to each other is, more often than not, due a confused conflation of the objectivism/non-objectivism distinction and the absolutism/relativism distinction.

Third and finally, it might be helpful to clarify the relationship between moral anti-realism and moral naturalism. The moral naturalist believes that moral facts exist and fit within the worldview presented by science. (For example, a utilitarian view that identifies moral obligation with the production of happiness will count as a form of moral naturalism, since there is nothing particularly scientifically mysterious about happiness.) A moral naturalist may maintain that moral facts are objective in nature, in which case this moral naturalist will count as a moral realist. But a moral naturalist may instead maintain that the moral facts are not objective in nature, in which case this moral naturalist will count as a moral anti-realist. Consider, for example, a simplistic non-objectivist theory that identifies moral goodness (say) with whatever a person approves of. Such a view would be a form of anti-realism (in virtue of its non-objectivism), but since the phenomenon of people approving of things is something that can be accommodated smoothly within a scientific framework, it would also be a form of moral naturalism. Conversely, if a moral realist maintains that the objective moral facts cannot be accommodated within the scientific worldview, then this moral realist will count as a moral non-naturalist. (See entries for naturalism and moral naturalism.)

The noncognitivist and the error theorist, it should be noted, count as neither moral naturalists nor moral non-naturalists, since they do not believe in moral facts at all. These kinds of moral anti-realist, however, may well be naturalists in a more general sense: they may maintain that the only items that we should admit into our ontology are those that fit within the scientific worldview. Indeed, it is quite likely that it is their commitment to this more general ontological naturalism that lies behind the noncognitivist’s and the error theorist’s moral skepticism, since they may deem that moral properties (were they to exist) would have to have characteristics that cannot be accommodated within a naturalistic framework.

Summing up: Some moral anti-realists will count as moral skeptics, but some may believe in moral knowledge. Some moral anti-realists will be relativists, but some may be moral absolutists (and many are neither). Some moral anti-realists will be moral naturalists, but some may be moral non-naturalists, and some will be neither moral naturalists nor non-naturalists. These various positions can be combined into a potentially bewildering array of possible complex metaethical positions (e.g., non-skeptical, relativistic, non-naturalistic moral anti-realism)—though, needless to say, these views may vary greatly in plausibility.

2. Who Bears the Burden of Proof?

It is widely assumed that moral realism enjoys some sort of presumption in its favor that the anti-realist has to work to overcome. Jonathan Dancy writes that “we take moral value to be part of the fabric of the world; … and we should take it in the absence of contrary considerations that actions and agents do have the sorts of moral properties we experience in them” (1986: 172). In a similar vein, David McNaughton claims “The realist’s contention is that he has only to rebut the arguments designed to persuade us that moral realism is philosophically untenable in order to have made out his case” (1988: 40–41). David Brink concurs: “We begin as (tacit) cognitivists and realists about ethics.… Moral Realism should be our metaethical starting point, and we should give it up only if it does involve unacceptable metaphysical and epistemological commitments” (1989: 23–24).

It may be questioned, however, whether moral realism really does enjoy intuitive support, and also questioned whether, if it does, this should burden the anti-realist with extra labor.

On the first matter, it may be argued that some of the distinctions drawn in distinguishing moral realism from anti-realism are too fine-grained or abstruse for “the folk” to have any determinate opinion. It is, for example, radically unclear to what extent common sense embraces the objectivity of moral facts. There have been some empirical investigations ostensibly examining the extent to which ordinary people endorse moral objectivism (e.g., Goodwin & Darley 2008; Uttich et al. 2014), but, upon examination, many of these studies seem in fact to examine the extent to which ordinary people endorse moral absolutism. (See Hopster 2019.) And if even professional researchers struggle to grasp the concept of moral objectivity, it is difficult to maintain confidently that “the folk” have a firm and determinate intuition on the subject. Furthermore, even if empirical investigation of collective opinion were to locate strong intuitions in favor of a mind-independent morality, there may be other equally robust intuitions in favor of morality being mind-dependent. (For example, the fact that we seem unwilling to defer to experts when forming moral views appears to count against realism; see McGrath 2011. Similarly, the fact that we do not expect a person necessarily to accept others’ reasons for their moral views seems to reveal anti-realist tendencies; see Foot 1958 for discussion.) Given the difficulties in deciding and articulating just what kind of objectivity is relevant to the moral realism/anti-realism division, and given the range and potential subtlety of options, it might be thought rash to claim that common sense has a firm opinion one way or the other on this subject.

On the second matter: even if we were to identify a widespread univocal intuition in favor of moral realism, it remains unclear to what extent we should adopt a methodology that rewards moral realism with a dialectical advantage when it comes to metaethics. By comparison, we do not think that physicists should endeavor to come up with intuitive theories. (There is, for example, a widespread erroneous intuition that a fast-moving ball exiting a curved tube will continue to travel on a curving trajectory (McCloskey et al. 1980). The fact that Newtonian physics predicts that the ball will in fact continue on a straight trajectory is surely in no sense a mark against the theory.) Moreover, it is important to distinguish between any such pro-realist intuitions ex ante and ex post. Once someone has accepted considerations and arguments in favor of moral anti-realism, then any counter-intuitiveness that this conclusion has—ex ante—may be considered irrelevant. One noteworthy type of strategy here is the “debunking argument,” which seeks to undermine moral intuitions by showing that they are the product of processes that we have no grounds for thinking are reliable indicators of truth. (See Street 2006; O’Neill 2015; Joyce 2013, 2016.) To the extent that the anti-realist can provide a plausible explanation for why humans would tend to think of morality as objective, even if it is not objective, then any counter-intuitiveness in the anti-realist’s failure to accommodate objectivity can no longer be raised as an ongoing consideration against moral anti-realism.

A theory’s clashing with common sense is not the only way in which it can face a burden of proof. Of two theories, A and B, if A explains a range of observable phenomena more readily than B, then proponents of B will have to undertake extra labor of squaring their theory with the available evidence—and this may be the case even if B strikes people as the more intuitive theory. For example, perhaps Newtonian physics is more intuitive than Einsteinian, but there is observable data—e.g., the results of the famous solar eclipse experiments of 1919—that the latter theory is much better equipped to explain.

What is it, then, that metaethical theories are expected to explain? The range of phenomena is ill-defined and open-ended, but is typically taken to include such things as the manifest features of moral language, the importance of morality in our lives, moral practices and institutions, the way moral considerations engage motivation, the character of moral disagreement, and the acquisition of moral attitudes.

Consider the first of these explananda: moral language. Here it seems reasonable to claim that the noncognitivist shoulders a burden of proof. Moral predicates appear to function linguistically like any other predicate: Just as the sentence “The cat is brown” may be used as an antecedent of a conditional, as a premise of an argument, as the basis of a question (“Is the cat brown?”), have its predicate nominalized (“Brownness is had by the cat”), be embedded in a propositional attitude claim (“Mary believes that the cat is brown”), and have the truth predicate applied to it (“‘The cat is brown’ is true”)—so too can all these things be done, without obvious incoherence, with a moral sentence like “Stealing is morally wrong.” This is entirely as the cognitivist would predict. By contrast, for a noncognitivist who maintains (as Ayer did) that this moral judgment amounts to nothing more than “Stealing!” uttered in a special disapproval-expressing tone, all of this linguistic evidence represents a major (and perhaps insurmountable) challenge.

Other explananda, on the other hand, may reveal that it is the moral realist who has the extra explaining to do. If moral properties are taken to have an essential normativity—in terms of, say, placing practical demands upon us—then the realist faces the challenge of explaining how any such thing could exist objectively. The moral non-objectivist, by contrast, sees moral normativity as something that we create—that practical demands arise from our desires, emotions, values, judgments, practices, or institutions. Thus the task of providing a moral ontology that accommodates normativity seems a much easier one for the non-objectivist than for the moral realist. (The noncognitivist and the error theorist would seem to have an even easier time, since for them there is no moral ontology at all.)

There remains a great deal of dispute concerning what the phenomena are that a metaethical theory should be expected to explain; and even when some such phenomenon is roughly agreed upon, there is often significant disagreement over its exact nature. For example, pretty much everyone agrees that any decent metaethical theory should be able to explain the close connection between moral judgment and motivation—but it is a live question whether that connection should be construed as a necessary one, or whether a reliably contingent connection will suffice. (See Svavardóttir 2006; Rosati 2021.) Even when such disputes can be settled, there remains plenty of room for arguing over the importance of the explanandum in question (relative to other explananda), and for arguing whether a given theory does indeed adequately explain the phenomenon.

In short, attempts to establish the burden of proof are as slippery and indecisive in the debate between the moral realist and the moral anti-realist as they tend to be generally in philosophy. The matter is complicated by the fact that there are two kinds of burden-of-proof case that can be pressed, and here they tend to pull against each other. On the one hand, it is widely assumed that common sense favors the moral realist. On the other hand, moral realists face a cluster of explanatory challenges concerning the nature of moral facts (how they relate to non-moral facts, how we have access to them, why they have practical importance)—challenges that seem much more tractable for the moral non-objectivist and often simply don’t arise for either the noncognitivist or the error theorist. This tension between what is considered to be the intuitive position and what is considered to be the empirically, metaphysically, and epistemologically defensible position, motivates and animates much of the debate between the moral realist and moral anti-realist.

3. Arguing For and Against Moral Anti-realism

Given that moral anti-realism is a disjunction of three views, then any argument for any of those views is an argument for moral anti-realism. By the same token, any argument against any of the three views can contribute to an argument for moral realism, and if one is persuaded by arguments against all three, then one is committed to moral realism. Here is not the place to present such arguments in detail, but offer a flavor of the kinds of considerations that push philosophers to and fro on these matters.

3.1 Noncognitivism

On the face of it, when we make a public moral judgment, like “That act of stealing was morally wrong,” what we are doing is asserting that the act of stealing in question instantiates a certain property: moral wrongness. This raises a number of extremely thorny metaethical questions: What kind of property is moral wrongness? How does it relate to the natural properties instantiated by the action? How do we have epistemic access to the property? How do we confirm whether something does or does not instantiate the property? (And so on.) The difficulty of answering such questions may lead one to reject the presupposition that prompted them: One might deny that in making a moral judgment we are engaging in the assignment of properties at all. Such a rejection is, roughly speaking, the noncognitivist proposal. (See entry for moral cognitivism vs. non-cognitivism.)

It is impossible to characterize noncognitivism in a way that will please everyone. Sometimes it is presented as a view about mental states and sometimes about moral language. This is because it is a claim about “moral judgments,” and we can consider moral judgments either as private mental acts or as public utterances. If we are thinking of moral judgments as mental states, then noncognitivism is the claim that moral judgments are not beliefs. If we are thinking of moral judgments as speech acts, then noncognitivism is the view that moral judgments do not express beliefs—i.e., it is the view that moral judgments are not assertions. Here, for brevity, the latter formulation will be preferred.

If moral judgments are not assertions, then what are they? Here the different kinds of answers give rise to different forms of noncognitivism. Ayer, as was mentioned earlier, maintained that when we make a moral judgment we are expressing certain feelings, such as approval or disapproval. Another influential kind of noncognitivism called “prescriptivism” claims that moral judgments are really veiled commands whose true meaning should be captured using the imperative mood: Someone who says “Stealing is morally wrong” is really saying something like “Don’t steal!” (see Carnap 1935: 24–25). R.M. Hare (1952, 1963) restricted this to commands that one is willing to universalize.

If noncognitivism is defined as the negation of cognitivism—as a theory about what moral judgments are not—then the two theories are not just contraries but contradictories. However, a degree of benign relaxation of criteria allows for the possibility of “mixed” theories. If we consider noncognitivism not as a purely negative thesis, but as a range of positive proposals (such as those just mentioned), then it becomes possible that the nature of moral judgments combines both cognitivist and noncognitivist elements. For example, moral judgments (as speech acts) may be two things: They may be assertions and ways of issuing commands. (By analogy: To call someone a “kraut” is both to assert that they are German and to express a derogatory attitude toward people of this nationality.) C.L. Stevenson held such a mixed view (1944); for modern versions, see Copp 2001; Schroeder 2009; Svoboda 2011.

As mentioned, one of the major attractions of noncognitivism is that it is a means of sidestepping a number of thorny puzzles about morality. In addition, there are several features of morality that, it has been argued, the noncognitivist can accommodate more readily than the cognitivist. Here are three.

First, it has often been argued that noncognitivism does a good job of accounting for the motivational efficacy of moral judgment. If, when I say “Stealing is morally wrong,” I am expressing my disapproval of stealing, and if disapproval is a motivation-engaging state, then it seems to follow that when I sincerely judge that stealing is morally wrong, I will also be motivated not to steal. By contrast, if a Humean view of psychology is accepted, according to which beliefs alone can never motivate, then the cognitivist must allow that moral judgment alone cannot motivate; it requires the presence of certain desires as well. A number of philosophers have argued that the cognitivist view of moral motivation seems inadequate (Smith 1994; Toppinen 2004; see also Carbonell 2013). See entry for moral motivation.

Second, it has been argued that moral disagreements have certain qualities that are accommodated better by the noncognitivist than the cognitivist. The fact that moral disagreements are often both vehement and seemingly intractable, for example, might be taken as evidence that what is really going on is a clash of emotional attitudes rather than a clash of beliefs (Stevenson 1948; Gibbard 1992; Blackburn 1998).

Third, it has often been observed that we are markedly uncomfortable with the idea that anyone should come to hold a moral view on the basis of having deferred to an expert on morality—in contrast to the way that we are perfectly comfortable with the idea that a person should defer to experts when forming beliefs about, say, plate tectonics. This reluctance to defer to experts in forming our moral views would make sense if what we are doing when we make a moral judgment is expressing our emotional attitudes on the matter. (See McGrath 2009: 322, 2011; Hills 2011.)

Standing against these considerations in favor of noncognitivism are a number of weighty problems. The most well-known challenge for noncognitivism is the so-called Frege-Geach problem. If “Stealing is morally wrong” is not even the kind of thing that can be true or false, then how can we make sense of it when it is embedded in logically complex contexts (such as “If stealing is morally wrong, then encouraging your brother to steal is morally wrong”), and how are we to make sense of it as a premise in a valid argument (since validity is, by definition, a truth-preserving relation)?

There have been considerable efforts on behalf of noncognitivism to answer this challenge. Simon Blackburn, for example, has pursued what he calls a “quasi-realist” program (Blackburn 1984, 1993, 1998). The quasi-realist is someone who endorses an anti-realist metaphysical stance but who seeks, through philosophical maneuvering, to earn the right for moral discourse to enjoy all the trappings of realist talk. Such a view may hold that although the underlying logical structure of the sentence “Stealing is morally wrong” is nothing more than “Stealing: Boo!”, it is nevertheless legitimate for ordinary speakers to say things like “If stealing is morally wrong, then encouraging your brother to steal is wrong” or “‘Stealing is morally wrong’ is true.” One might, for instance, argue that all that is required to make it acceptable to consider “Stealing is morally wrong” true or false (and thus a legitimate antecedent in a conditional) is that it has the appropriate surface propositional grammar (“x is P”); and one might maintain that choosing to employ such grammar to express one’s noncognitive attitudes brings no ontological commitment to any troublesome property of moral wrongness.

One of the main challenges for the quasi-realist is to maintain a theoretic distance from the moral realist. If the quasi-realist program succeeds in vindicating the use of the truth predicate for moral sentences, and if in addition it makes it permissible to say “It is a fact that stealing is wrong,” “It is a mind-independent fact that stealing is wrong,” “Stealing would be wrong even if our attitude toward it were different,” and so on—mimicking all and any of the moral realist’s assertions—then in what sense is quasi-realism quasi-realism?—Why has it not simply collapsed into the robust moral realism that it set out to oppose? (See Wright 1988; Dreier 2018.) [A quick note on terminology: Although I have here presented Blackburn’s quasi-realism as a potential avenue for the noncognitivist to pursue, it should be noted that Blackburn himself eschews the label “noncognitivism” to describe the position he defends (Blackburn 1996); his preferred term is “projectivism.” (For discussion of the relation between the two views—noncognitivism and projectivism—see Joyce 2009.)]

3.2 Error Theory

The error theorist is a cognitivist: maintaining that moral judgment consists of beliefs and assertions. However, the error theorist thinks that these beliefs and assertions are never true. (The error theorist contrasts here with what can be called the “success theorist.”) Moral judgments are never true because the properties that would be necessary to render them true—properties like moral wrongness, moral goodness, virtue, evil, etc.—simply don’t exist, or at least are not instantiated. Defenders of moral error theory include Mackie 1977, Hinckfuss 1987, Joyce 2001, and Olson 2014.

If I assert that my dog is a reptile, then I’ve asserted something false—though in this case there are other things that are reptiles. If I assert that my dog is a unicorn then again I’ve asserted something false—though in this case there’s nothing in the actual world to which I could attach the predicate “… is a unicorn” and end up with a true assertion. The error theorist thinks that employing moral discourse is rather like talking about unicorns, though in the case of unicorns most people now know that they don’t exist, while in the case of moral properties most people are unaware of the error. To be an error theorist about unicorns doesn’t require that you think unicorns are impossible creatures; it’s enough that you think that they simply don’t actually exist. In the same way, to be a moral error theorist doesn’t require that you think that moral properties couldn’t possibly exist; it would be enough to think that they are never actually instantiated. (Note that there may be a difference between saying “Property P is never actually instantiated” and “Property P doesn’t exist,” but that’s a problem for metaphysicians to sort out. Holding either view with respect to moral properties is enough to make one a moral error theorist.)

To be an error theorist about unicorns does not mean that every assertion involving the word “unicorn” is false. There would be no error, for example, in asserting “Unicorns do not exist,” “The ancient Greeks believed that unicorns lived in India,” or “My dog is not a unicorn.” What is distinctive about these three sentences is that one would not, in asserting them, be committing oneself to the existence of unicorns. (It would be rather troubling if this were not true of the first, in particular!) Similarly, the moral error theorist may allow that the following are true: “Moral wrongness does not exist,” “Augustine believed that stealing pears was wrong,” and “Stealing is not morally wrong.”

The last example (“Stealing is not morally wrong”) calls for an extra comment. In ordinary conversation—where, presumably, the possibility of moral error theory is not considered a live option—someone who claims that X is not wrong would be taken to be implying that X is morally good or at least morally permissible. And if “X” denotes something awful, like torturing innocent people, then this can be used to make the error theorist look awful. But when we are doing metaethics, and the possibility of moral error theory is on the table, then this ordinary implication breaks down. The error theorist doesn’t think that torturing innocent people is morally wrong, but doesn’t think that it is morally good or morally permissible either. It is important that criticisms of the moral error theorist do not trade on equivocating between the implications that hold in ordinary contexts and the implications that hold in metaethical contexts.

The sentence “Unicorns exist” is false, but there are nevertheless various contexts where one might have reason to utter the sentence: telling a story, joking, acting, speaking metaphorically, giving an example of a two-word sentence, etc. What is distinctive about these contexts is that one would not be asserting the sentence, and thus (as before) one would not, in making these utterances, be committing oneself to the existence of unicorns. Similarly, the moral error theorist might propose that we carry on saying things like “Stealing is morally wrong” but in a manner that deprives our utterances of ontological commitment to moral properties and, thus, removes the error from our discourse. If the error theorist proposes to accomplish this by modeling moral language on a way that familiar engagement with fictions nullifies commitment, then such a moral error theorist is a fictionalist. (See entry for fictionalism; see also Kalderon 2005; Joyce 2017.) Other moral error theorists may think that we would be better off if we pretty much eliminated moral talk from our thoughts and language. Such moral error theorists are known as “abolitionists” or “eliminativists.” (I say “pretty much” since presumably even the abolitionist allows that we can carry on using moral language in the context of plays, jokes, etc.) (For debate between fictionalists and abolitionists, see Garner & Joyce 2019.)

Error theory is commonly defined as the view that moral judgments are (i) truth-evaluable but (ii) always false. But there are various reasons for preferring to render (i) as a claim about speech acts—that moral judgments aim at the truth (i.e., they are assertions)—and (ii) as the broader claim that moral judgments are “untrue” rather than “false.” One might, for example, be drawn to error theory because one thinks that there is a sufficient amount of indeterminacy, fragmentation, or confusion surrounding moral concepts that the judgments that employ them, while satisfying the conditions for being beliefs and assertions, do not satisfy the conditions for having truth value. Perhaps, for example, moral concepts are historically derived from a theistic framework within which they made sense, yet removed from which they are mere remnants that evoke strong intuitions but, upon examination, make no sense. (See Anscombe 1958; MacIntyre 1984.) If this is so, then it may be argued that the concept moral wrongness is just so ill-defined that someone who makes the moral judgment “Stealing is morally wrong” fails to put forward a proposition that could be true; but since the speaker and audience are presumably unaware of this fact, the judgment should still count as an assertion. (One needs to tread carefully here. The proposal that moral judgments lack truth value is traditionally associated with noncognitivism. But the noncognitivist thinks that moral judgments lack truth value because they are not assertions at all. The error theorist, by contrast, thinks that moral judgments are (typically) asserted, but that they fail to be true. Failing to have a truth value is one way of failing to be true. Being false is the other way.)

Most arguments for moral error theory, however, presuppose that moral concepts do have a reasonably determinate content, but that there is simply nothing in the world to satisfy this content. The traditional form of argument for moral error theory, thus, has two steps. First, the error theorist undertakes the conceptual step of establishing that in participating in moral discourse we commit ourselves to the world being a certain way (that it contains certain instantiated properties, etc.). Then the error theorist undertakes the ontological step of establishing that the world is not that way. The latter may be achieved (in principle, at least) either through a priori means or through a posteriori methods.

One example of an argument with this structure is as follows. First it is noted that “S morally ought to φ” is true only if S is a moral agent. The further conceptual steps of the argument then seek to establish that in order to be moral agent, S must have the capacity to perform actions that are morally blameworthy and praiseworthy, and that these capacities presuppose that S has a certain kind of control over their actions. The ontological step of the argument then seeks to establish that no such autonomous control exists in nature; it’s an illusion. (See entry for skepticism about moral responsibility.) A couple of iterations of modus tollens then take us to the conclusion that “S morally ought to φ” is never true.

The argument just sketched would locate the moral error in a mistake we make about the kind of creatures we are. The more widely discussed arguments, however, locate the moral error in a mistake we make about the kind of world we inhabit. John Mackie (who coined the term “error theory” in 1977) argues that when we participate in moral discourse we commit ourselves to the existence of objective values and objective prescriptions, but there are no such things. Essentially, Mackie argues that the moral realist is correct about morality conceptually speaking—we are moral realists—but the moral realist is incorrect about how the world actually is. Moral facts place demands upon us, but (Mackie asks) how could such demands exist objectively? This would seem to require rules of conduct somehow written into the fabric of the universe, and nothing in our understanding of the objective naturalistic world (Mackie goes on) suggests that anything of the kind exists. Mackie famously calls such properties “queer” (in what seems now an increasingly anachronistic use of the term).

Mackie occasionally cashes out his “argument from queerness” in terms of practical reasons. He writes that “to say that [objective prescriptions] are intrinsically action-guiding [which is one way he sometimes describes the normativity whose existence he denies] is to say that the reasons that they give for doing or for not doing something are independent of that agent’s desires or purposes” (Mackie 1982: 115). Surely if someone is morally required to do something (Mackie thinks), then that person must have a reason to do it. (After all, if one were to deny this, then what kind of “normative teeth” would moral properties have? “Yes, I know that X is morally wrong, but I have no reason to avoid moral wrongness, so the wrongness of X is nothing to me” would become, in principle, an acceptable thing to say.) But since morality often seems to demand that we do things that we don’t want to do, then morality seems to imply the existence of reasons to do things that we don’t want to do. One could, at this point, simply throw up one’s hands and claim that such reasons would be too weird to countenance. But one could also go beyond the “argument from queerness” by instead arguing methodically that a Humean (instrumentalist) theory of reasons for action—according to which reasons ultimately depend on our ends—is superior to any form of practical non-instrumentalism. (See entry for reason for action: internal and external.) According to such a view, the practical non-instrumentalist is correct about morality conceptually speaking—in engaging in moral discourse, we commit ourselves to non-instrumentalist reasons—but the practical non-instrumentalist is incorrect about how the world actually is: a Humean theory of reasons for action is more defensible. (It is worth noting that endorsing Humean instrumentalism about reasons for action does not in any obvious way commit one to the endorsement of instrumentalism about other kinds of reasons, such as epistemic reasons. See Joyce 2019; Cowie 2019.)

If an argument for moral error theory has two steps—the conceptual and the ontological—then there are two places to object. If we consider Mackie’s argument, for example, then one kind of opponent will agree that objective values and prescriptions would be too weird to countenance, but maintain that it doesn’t matter because moral discourse is not committed to the existence of such strange creatures. Another kind of opponent will agree with Mackie that morality is committed to the existence of objective values and prescriptions, but maintain that there is nothing particularly strange about them.

Error theorists must be prepared to defend themselves on both fronts. This job is made difficult by the fact that it may be hard to articulate precisely what it is that is so troubling about morality. This failure need not be due to a lack of clear thinking or imagination on the error theorists’ part, for the thing that is troubling them may be that there is something deeply mysterious about morality. The moral error theorist may, for example, perceive that moral imperatives are imbued with a kind of mystical practical authority—a quality that, being mysterious, of course cannot be articulated in terms satisfactory to an analytic philosopher. Such an error theorist is forced to fall back on vague metaphors in presenting their case: Moral properties have a “to-be-pursuedness” to them (Mackie 1977: 40), moral facts would require that “the universe takes sides” (Burgess [1978] 2007), moral believers are committed to “demands as real as trees and as authoritative as orders from headquarters” (Garner 1994: 61), and so on. Indeed, it may be the vague, equivocal, quasi-mystical, and/or ineliminably metaphorical imponderabilia of moral discourse that so troubles the error theorist. (See Hussain 2004.)

Even if the error theorist can articulate a clear and determinate problematic feature of morality, the dispute over whether this quality should count as a “non-negotiable component” of morality has a tendency to lead quickly to impasse, for there is no accepted methodology for deciding when a discourse is “centrally committed” to a given thesis. What is evidently needed is a workable model of the identity criteria for concepts (allowing us confidently to either affirm or deny such claims as “The concept of moral obligation is the concept of an objective requirement”)—but we have no such model, and there is no consensus even on what approximate shape such a model would take.

It is also possible that the most reasonable account of conceptual content will leave many concepts with significantly indistinct borders. There may simply be no fact of the matter about whether moral discourse is committed to the existence of non-instrumental reasons (for example). Thinking along these lines, David Lewis makes use of the distinction between speaking strictly and speaking loosely: “Strictly speaking, Mackie is right: genuine values would have to meet an impossible condition, so it is an error to think there are any. Loosely speaking, the name may go to a claimant that deserves it imperfectly … What to make of the situation is mainly a matter of temperament” (Lewis [1989] 2000: 93). Lewis’s own temperament leads him to seek to vindicate value discourse, and he thinks that this can be done by supporting a dispositional theory of value (of a kind to be discussed in the next section). But since there is no logical or methodological requirement that we should prefer speaking loosely over speaking strictly, or vice versa, then this would leave the dispute between moral error theorists and success theorists a fundamentally undecidable matter—there may simply be no fact of the matter about who is correct. (See Joyce 2012.)

3.3 Non-objectivism

To deny both noncognitivism and the moral error theory suffices to make one a minimal moral realist. Traditionally, however, moral realism has required the acceptance of a further thesis: the objectivity of morality. “Moral non-objectivism” denotes the view that moral facts exist and are mind-dependent (in the relevant sense), while “moral objectivism” holds that they exist and are mind-independent. (Note that this taxonomy makes the two contraries rather than contradictories; the error theorist and the noncognitivist count as neither objectivists nor non-objectivists. The error theorist may, however, be an objectivist in a different sense: in holding that objectivity is a feature of morality conceptually speaking.) Let us say that if one is a moral cognitivist and a moral success theorist and a moral objectivist, then one is a robust moral realist.

Yet this third condition, even more than the first two, introduces a great deal of messiness into the dialectic, and the line between the realist and the anti-realist becomes obscure (and, one might think, less interesting). The basic problem is that there are many non-equivalent ways of understanding the relation of mind-(in)dependence, and thus one philosopher’s realism becomes another philosopher’s anti-realism. At least one philosopher, Gideon Rosen, has expressed pessimism that the relevant notion of objectivity can be sharpened to a useful philosophical point:

To be sure, we do have “intuitions” of a sort about when the rhetoric of objectivity is appropriate and when it isn’t. But these intuitions are fragile, and every effort I know to find the principle that underlies them collapses. We sense that there is a heady metaphysical thesis at stake in these debates over realism … [b]ut after a point, when every attempt to say just what the issue is has come up empty, we have no real choice but to conclude that despite all the wonderful, suggestive imagery, there is ultimately nothing in the neighborhood to discuss. (1994: 279. See also Dworkin 1996.)

As Rosen says, metaphors to mark non-objectivism from objectivism are easy to come by and easy to motivate in the uninitiated. The objectivist about X likens our X-oriented activity to astronomy, geography, or exploration; the non-objectivist likens it to sculpture or imaginative writing. (These are Michael Dummett’s metaphors (1978: xxv).) The objectivist sees the goal of our inquiries as being to “carve the beast of reality at the joints” (as the popular paraphrase of Plato’s Phaedrus puts it); the non-objectivist sees our inquiries as the application of a “cookie cutter”: imposing a noncompulsory conceptual framework onto an undifferentiated reality (to use Hilary Putnam’s equally memorable image (1987: 19)). The objectivist sees inquiry as a process of detection, our judgments aiming to reflect the extension of the truth predicate with respect to a certain subject; the non-objectivist sees inquiry as a process of projection, our judgments determining the extension of the truth predicate regarding that subject.

The claim “X is mind-(in)dependent” is certainly too coarse-grained to do serious work in capturing these powerful metaphors; it is, perhaps, better thought of as a slogan or as a piece of shorthand. There are two conspicuous points at which the phrase requires precisification. First, we need to decide what exactly the word “mind” stands for. It can be construed strictly and literally, to mean mental activity, or it can be understood in a more liberal manner, to include such things as conceptual schemes, theories, methods of proof, linguistic practices, conventions, sentences, institutions, culture, means of epistemic access, etc. Were the moral facts to depend on any of these anthropocentric things, the anti-realist imagery of humans as inventors of morality may seem more apt than that of humans as discoverers. Second, we need to decide what kind of relation is denoted by “(in)dependent.” Consider the following possibilities, any of which might form the basis of the claim that goodness depends on mental activity (in this case, for simplicity, Mary’s attitude of approval):

x is good iff Mary approves of x.

x is good iff Mary would approve of x (in such-and-such circumstances).

x is good iff x merits Mary’s approval.

The catalog can be made longer, depending on whether the “iff” is construed as necessary or contingent, conceptual, a priori, or a posteriori. To illustrate further the ubiquity of and variation among mind-dependence relations on the menu of moral theories, consider the following:

  • According to classic utilitarianism, one is obligated to act so as to maximize moral goodness, and moral goodness is identical to happiness. Happiness is a mental phenomenon.
  • According to Kant, one’s moral obligations are determined by which maxims can be consistently willed as universal laws; moreover, the only thing that is good in itself is a good will. Willing is a mental activity, and the will is a mental faculty.
  • According to John Rawls (1971), fairness is determined by the results of an imaginary collective decision, wherein self-interested agents negotiate principles of distribution behind a veil of ignorance. Decision-making, negotiation, and agency all require mental activity.
  • According to Michael Smith (1994), the morally right action for a person to perform depends in part on what advice would be given to that person by her epistemically and rationally idealized counterpart. (See also Railton 1986.) Epistemic improvement and rational improvement are mental phenomena.
  • According to Richard Boyd (1988), moral goodness is identical to a cluster of properties conducive to the satisfaction of human needs, which tend to occur together and promote each other. Human needs may not all be mental, but the needs that depend in no way on the existence of mental activity are surely few.
  • According to Frank Jackson (1998), ethical terms pick out properties that play a certain role in the conceptual network determined by mature folk morality. “The folk” necessarily have minds, and the relevant process of “maturing” is presumably one that implicates a variety of psychological events.

Indeed, it is difficult to think of any serious version of moral success theory for which the moral facts depend in no way on mental activity. Yet to conclude that the distinction between minimal and robust realism cannot be upheld would be premature. Many metaethicists who reject noncognitivism and the error theory, and thus count as minimal realists, continue to define their position (often under the label “constructivism”) in contrast to a realist view. (See Bagnoli 2002; Ronzoni 2010; Street 2010, 2012. See also the entry on constructivism in metaethics.) The challenge is to pick among the various mind-(in)dependence relations in the hope of drawing a distinction that is philosophically interesting and meshes satisfactorily with our preexisting philosophical taxonomy, such that some success theorists count as realists and some do not.

Elizabeth Tropman (2018) argues that the best way of understanding moral objectivity is as follows: The fact that x is M (where “… is M” is some moral predicate) is objective if and only if this fact doesn’t depend only on any actual or hypothetical agent’s (i) belief or noncognitive attitude about x’s being M, or (ii) noncognitive attitude about x. According to this view, many of the aforementioned examples of moral theories, although making moral facts dependent in various ways on various kinds of mental phenomena, will not count as non-objective. Consider, for example, the utilitarian view that what makes a particular action, φ, morally obligatory is that it produces maximal happiness. According to this view, although some agent’s (or agents’) mental states—in this case, their happiness—may contribute to φ’s moral status, they do not exclusively determine it. Other factors also contribute to φ’s moral status, such as how φ compares with other potential actions in terms of happiness production,. Therefore, on Tropman’s view, this form of utilitarianism would satisfy the requirements for morality to count as objective.

The attractions of moral non-objectivism are that it ticks a lot of boxes that its competitors fail to tick. Unlike noncognitivism or error theory, moral non-objectivism is a form of moral anti-realism that allows for the existence of moral beliefs, moral facts, and moral truth, and thus also potentially makes conceptual space for such things as moral progress and moral knowledge. Unlike moral realism, by making the moral facts depend on us, moral non-objectivism seems to have an easier time accounting for a moral ontology that is both naturalistic and normative.

Given the wide variety of versions of moral non-objectivity, identifying generic problems is not a straightforward task. One way of bringing out some potential worries is to see the non-objectivist as facing a dilemma. Moral non-objectivism comes in both relativistic and absolutist flavors, and either way one goes poses challenges.

Consider first an absolutist version on non-objectivism. Here we would have to identify some agent or group of agents whose beliefs or noncognitive attitudes determine the moral facts. Reasonable contenders for this role are not going to be actual particular people. It would not, for example, be a reasonable theory that maintained that the moral facts for everyone throughout all time are determined by what Richard Joyce thinks on the matter. (The only plausible contender for this role might be God, but such a theory faces its own array of problems.) Rather, absolutist non-objectivists are likely to plump for idealized hypothetical agents. Roderick Firth (1952), for example, identifies moral properties with dispositions to prompt responsive attitudes in an “ideal observer”—where the ideal observer is defined in terms such as omniscience, disinterestedness, and dispassionateness. (Slightly confusingly for our purposes, Firth explicitly characterizes this theory as an objectivist one, but this is because he has in mind a kind of existential mind-dependence relation. The moral status of an action, on this view, doesn’t depend on the existence of an ideal observer’s mental activity; rather, it depends on how such an agent counterfactually would respond. We can consider this as further evidence of the difficulties in nailing down a fixed notion of moral objectivity.) A structurally similar version of absolutist non-objectivism is Ronald Milo’s contractarian constructivism (1995), according to which the moral facts are determined by the choices that would be made by a hypothetical idealized group of rational contractors. (See also Scanlon 1998.)

The challenge for such theories is to explain why one should care about the moral status of actions. Since the person or group that determines the moral status of my actions is not me, and is not even someone I’ve ever met or necessarily care about, then why should their hypothetical responses matter to me? Any particular proposed action of mine will have an infinity of dispositional properties. My proposed action of, say, stealing a newspaper may have the dispositional property that a Firthian ideal observer would disapprove of it, while simultaneously having the dispositional property that a Miloesque idealized group of rational contractors would choose to refrain from it. But it also has a myriad of other dispositions to prompt responses in hypothetical agents: it may also be such that drunken Vikings would heartily cheer it, be such that zealous medieval samurai would think it dishonorable, be such that Soviet communists seeking to promote the Workers’ Revolution would regard it as obligatory, and so on. The question is why I, in trying to decide how to act, should care about any of these dispositional properties—or (perhaps more pointedly) why I should care about one of them very much indeed while ignoring all the others. Simply labeling one of these dispositional properties “moral wrongness” doesn’t make that property matter.

One response to this challenge is to make the idealized judges, whose beliefs or noncognitive states determine the moral status of agents’ actions, versions of the agents themselves (see Carson 1984). Perhaps I have reason to care about what I would think if I were, say, fully informed and had fully reflected on the matter. This brings us back to the other horn of the dilemma: the relativistic version on non-objectivism. The problem is that securing the practical significance of moral facts in this manner (something that the absolutist version struggles to secure) comes at a price. If you and I are quite different people—with different desires, interests, and goals—then the idealized version of me may have a different response to a situation than the idealized version of you would have (see Sobel 1999). In this case, the very same action may be morally right relative to me and morally wrong relative to you, and that’s all there is to it: there would be no way for you and me to settle our moral disagreement. Indeed, there may not even be a disagreement, since if when I say “X is morally right” I mean … relative to idealized me, and when you say “No, X is not morally right” you mean … relative to idealized you, then we are not really contradicting each other. (See entry for moral relativism.) If relativistic non-objectivism makes moral disagreement disappear, then it very probably also makes the notion of moral progress disappear. If the moral views I held in the past were true relative to me then (though false relative to me now), and my current very different moral views are true relative to me now (but false relative to past me), then the best one could say on behalf of moral progress is that there has been progress from my current point of view (something that will be seen as moral deterioration from my past point of view). To the extent, then, that we do wish to accommodate the existence of moral disagreement and moral progress, relativistic non-objectivism has some explaining to do. (Note that the version of relativistic non-objectivism just discussed is individual-relative, but the same problems concerning disagreement and moral progress would arise if a culture-oriented version of relativism were examined instead.)

The proposal that moral facts are non-objective—that morality is something created, not discovered—is often rejected in popular discussion because people have only crude versions of non-objectivism in mind, such as views that would make the moral facts for a person be just whatever whimsically suits them (e.g., “X is morally wrong” = “I disapprove of X”). But no professional philosopher endorses such a view; nobody thinks that the non-objectivity of morality would be like the non-objectivity of choosing your favorite ice cream flavor. Serious forms of moral non-objectivism are sophisticated and subtle. Still, there is a real worry that if the non-objectivism is too sophisticated—especially if it looks to the responses of highly idealized hypothetical agents as being determinative of the moral facts—then the question of why, on this account, morality would matter to non-idealized non-hypothetical agents comes to the fore.

4. Conclusion

This entry has not attempted to adjudicate the rich and noisy debate between the moral realist and moral anti-realist, but rather has attempted to clarify just what their debate is about. But even this much more modest task is doomed to lead to unsatisfactory results, for there is much confusion—perhaps a hopeless confusion—about how the terms of the debate should be drawn up. It is entirely possible that when subjected to acute critical examination, the traditional dialectic between the moral realist and the moral anti-realist will crumble into a bunch of evocative metaphors from which well-formed philosophical theses cannot be extracted. If this is true, it would not follow that metaethics is bankrupt; far from it—it may be more accurate to think that modern metaethics has prospered to such an extent that the old terms no longer fit its complex landscape.

But for present, at least, the terms “moral realist” and “moral anti-realist” seem firmly entrenched. With so much ill-defined, however, it would seem close to pointless to conduct metaethical debate under these terms. This latitude means that the terms “moral realist” and “moral anti-realist” are free to be bandied with rhetorical force—more as badges of honor or terms of abuse (as the case may be) than as useful descriptive labels. Rather like arguments over whether some avant-garde gallery installation does or does not count as “art,” taxonomic bickering over whether a given philosopher is or is not a “moral realist” is an activity as tiresome as it is fruitless.

Just as important as gaining a clear and distinct understanding of these labels is gaining an appreciation of what of real consequence turns on the debate. This seems particularly pressing here because a natural suspicion is that much of the opposition to moral anti-realism develops from a nebulous but nagging practical concern about what might happen—to individuals, to the community, to social order—if moral anti-realism, in one guise or another, were widely adopted. The embrace of moral anti-realism, it is assumed, will have an insidious influence. This concern presupposes that most of the folk are already pretheoretically inclined toward moral realism—an assumption that was queried earlier. But even if it is true that most people are naive moral realists, the question of what would happen if they ceased to be so is an empirical matter, concerning which neither optimism nor pessimism seems prima facie more warranted than the other. As with the opposition to moral non-objectivism, the more general opposition to moral anti-realism is frequently based on an under-estimation of the resources available to the anti-realist—on an unexamined assumption that the silliest, crudest, or most pernicious version will stand as a good representative of a whole range of extremely varied and often sophisticated theories.


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