Cultural Evolution

First published Sun Dec 23, 2007; substantive revision Mon May 22, 2023

Researchers in the field of cultural evolutionary theory pursue an eclectic program of investigation that lies at the intersection of cognitive science, anthropology, and evolutionary biology. “Cultural Evolutionary Theory”, as we understand it here, is most thoroughly exemplified in the ongoing research tradition initiated in the 1970s and early 1980s by Cavalli-Sforza & Feldman (1981) on the one hand, and Boyd & Richerson (1985, 2005; Richerson & Boyd 2005) on the other.

What makes this program cultural (in the eyes of its adherents) is its focus on the various ways in which humans—and other organisms—learn from other members of their species. These capacities, usually described as forms of “social learning”, or channels of “cultural inheritance”, are explored both as targets of explanation, and as drivers of change. In other words, cultural evolutionary theorists ask questions about the nature and origins of capacities for social learning, and also about the effects of social learning on how populations change and adapt over time.

What makes this program evolutionary resists any brief answer, but some relevant factors include the following: researchers in this tradition often examine how cultural inheritance interacts with the forms of inheritance (especially genetic inheritance) studied by mainstream evolutionary theorists; they seek to understand culture using explanatory models and investigative tools adapted from those used in evolutionary and ecological theory; they reach back into human pre-history when determining the origins of the capacity for culture; and they ask comparative questions concerning differences between species in terms of their abilities to create and maintain storehouses of valuable socially transmitted information.

The case in favor of some cultural evolutionary theory is irresistible. It is undeniable that members of our own species survive and reproduce in part because of habits, know-how and technologies that are not only maintained by learning from others, but that are also generated as part of a cumulative project that builds on discoveries made by others. Our species also contains sub-groups with different habits, different norms, different forms of know-how, and different artefactual supports for their ways of life, which are once again generated and maintained through interaction with others. Social learning is also an important agent of adaptation, and perhaps of speciation, in animals. The interesting questions are not so much whether cultural evolution is important, but precisely how theories of cultural evolution should be fashioned, and how they should be related to more traditional understandings of organic evolution.

1. Natural Selection and Culture

Darwin believed, as do biologists today, that natural selection can explain the origin of many complex adaptive traits. In Darwin’s original presentation of natural selection, he requires that parent organisms differ in their abilities to survive and reproduce, and that offspring resemble their parents in terms of the traits that promote or inhibit these abilities (Darwin 1859).

As many have noted—including Darwin—this explanatory schema does not specify what mechanism accounts for parent-offspring resemblance. For example, offspring might learn skills from their parents, and thereby come to resemble them behaviorally. From the perspective of natural selection explanations, it does not matter why offspring resemble parents, only that they do resemble them. What is more, the general schema associated with natural selection explanations does not even require a population of reproducing organisms: it applies under any circumstances where entities in one generation give rise to resembling entities in a subsequent generation. In this sense, it is substrate-neutral.

Darwin himself explicitly espouses the view that natural selection can act on entities other than organisms in the context of the cultural phenomenon of language change. This position is briefly explored in the Origin of Species, and further expanded in the Descent of Man. In this latter work, he endorses the opinion of Max Müller:

“A struggle for life is constantly going on amongst the words and grammatical forms in each language. The better, the shorter, the easier forms are constantly gaining the upper hand, and they owe their success to their own inherent virtue”. (Darwin 1871: 60 [1877: 91], paraphrasing Müller 1870: 257)

Darwin asserts that this is no mere metaphor or loose analogy: “The survival or preservation of certain favoured words in the struggle for existence is natural selection” (1870: 60–61 [1877: 91]).

The pursuit of the cultural evolutionary project does not stand or fall with Müller’s thought that there are close affinities between processes of cultural change and the sorts of processes—of which natural selection is an example—that shape the organic world. Successful approaches can instead explore, in whatever ways seem best for the task at hand, how learning makes a difference to how species change and adapt over time. Nonetheless, as a matter of fact, many cultural evolutionary theorists have made use of explanatory concepts and models adapted from mainstream evolutionary theory, and they have often justified this by arguing for important isomorphisms between the domain of biology and the domain of culture. Mesoudi (2011; Mesoudi, Whiten, & Laland 2006) is a useful case-in-point, identifying not just “key Darwinian properties” of variation, heritability, and selection, but also pointing to disciplinary analogies between the study of cultural and biological change.

Of course, drawing analogies between cultural change and biological evolution far from settles philosophical questions about cultural evolution (see the discussion of analogical models in the entry models in science). Many cultural evolutionary terms evade rigorous and exhaustive explication. “Culture”, “transmission”, even “evolution” merely gesture towards complex phenomena. This provides latitude for researchers to fill in the analogical details between culture and biology in different ways (Sereno 1991; Stanley 2021). What, for instance, is the “culture” that evolves? What does it mean to evolve? And what mechanisms are involved? We address these questions in subsequent sections.

2. What Evolves?

2.1 The Culture Concept

What evolves in cultural evolution? Philosophers and other researchers have answered this question differently over the last hundred or so years, with few signs of consensus (Sartori 2005; Descola 2005 [2013]). The term “culture” now supports a range of uses in philosophy (See the entry on culture), the humanities (Kuper 1999; Risjord 2012) and empirical research (Driscoll 2017; Feinman & Neitzel 2020; Mohr et al. 2019; Buskell forthcoming). This widespread use facilitates different understandings of the extension of “culture” and the kinds of processes that might change it.

One important contrast distinguishes distinct levels of cultural phenomena. Though it is quite common to refer to both individual- and group-level phenomena as “culture”, it frequently leads to confusion. For example, it can lead to conflation of talk about traits—things actually or possibly possessed by individuals, such as the ability to make a Cornish pasty or to speak the Cornish language—and “the culture” of a group, as when one speaks of “Cornish culture”.

Cutting across the distinction in levels are distinct possible roles for “culture” (Risjord 2012). “Culture” might be a medium for carrying content; the background conditions needed for meaningful practices to be undertaken (Bourdieu 1972 [1977]; Ortner 1984; Rouse 2007); or the strategies (behaviours, technologies) adopted to deal with local ecological problems (White 1949; Steward 1955). Positions might be cut finer still: researchers differ on the character of the content carried, on the nature of practices, and the set of strategies that matter (Risjord 2012).

There is, then, considerable variation in how the culture concept is defined when one looks across disparate disciplines. If one focuses on the community of researchers in cultural evolution, however, one finds that Richerson and Boyd’s (2005) definition of culture is fairly typical. Culture, they say, is

information capable of affecting individuals’ behavior that they acquire from other members of their species through teaching, imitation, and other forms of social learning. (Richerson & Boyd 2005: 5)

That is, “culture” is an individual-level phenomenon, content (“information”) is carried by a wide range of material vehicles, and this content is communicated by a range of transmission mechanisms. Though cultural evolutionary researchers might talk about culture at the group-level, this tends to be an aggregate measure or generic description of the cultural information held by individuals in group, where the group itself is delineated by other means (for instance, by ethnic identity, e.g., Richerson et al. 2016; Henrich 2020. See: Buskell forthcoming for discussion).

Adopting “information” as the underlying basis of culture brings both risks and benefits (see related entries on information, and biological information). On the negative side, it is not clear how we are to understand the concept of information. Boyd and Richerson, for example, give what might look like a definition when they write that, by “information”, they mean

any kind of mental state, conscious or not, that is acquired or modified by social learning and affects behavior. (Richerson & Boyd 2005: 5)

But they later state that “some cultural information is stored in artefacts” (2005: 61), suggesting their comments are intended as a description of where most cultural information is to be found, and not as a definition of what cultural information is. When they do offer a definition, it invites obvious counterexamples. So, for instance, in early work they write that information is “something which has the property that energetically minor causes have energetically major effects” (Boyd & Richerson 1985: 35). But the long training scientists undertake, and the large amount of resources they might consume, to produce data and theories (often, in the form of written inscriptions) shows how highly energetic causes can generate energetically minor effects. Nor is it clear what it means for some causal contributor to development to count as an information-bearer, rather than some other kind of developmental participant, such as an information-reader, or a background condition for information transfer (Oyama 1985 [2000]; Griffiths 2001).

Seen in a more positive light, the plasticity of the term supports a wide range of stipulative definitions of information (Lewens 2015). These in turn facilitate an eclectic use of models and explanatory tools. Framing cultural evolution in informational terms might also support further borrowing from the theoretical study of biology. For example, what are known are “major evolutionary transitions” are sometimes characterized in terms of significant changes to the way inherited information is stored, transmitted or interpreted. In their pioneering discussion of these transitions, Maynard Smith and Szathmáry give examples including the initial arrival of the genetic code, the advent of sexual reproduction, and epigenetic inheritance. They also cite the development of language as a further example of an informational transition, illustrating the potential for an informational account of culture itself to integrate with broader discussion in theoretical biology (Maynard Smith & Szathmáry 1995; Jablonka & Lamb 2006; Calcott & Sterelny 2011)—a potential that is beginning to be actualized (e.g., Waring & Wood 2021).

2.2 Transmission and Inheritance

There are two major approaches to marking out the distinctive nature of cultural transmission and inheritance. The first looks at important aspects of the content of information; the second, the relevant channel of transmission mechanisms.

As an example of the first approach, consider Jablonka and Lamb (2005). They claim that only some forms of social transmission make use of a system of symbols. While it is true, for instance, that some birds inherit their song by social transmission, this does not imply that birdsong is a symbolic system. Humans, by contrast, trade in publicly-accessible symbols.

This approach allows for further distinctions among types of symbol system that make them more or less amenable to change. In some cases, the relationship between a symbol and what is represented is arbitrary. This the case for a word like “airplane”, which does not look or sound like a plane. This arbitrariness can facilitate rapid change in the scripts or sounds used to denote a plane (Kelly et al. 2021). In cases of iconic symbolism, the relationship is one of resemblance: signs for the airport do look like a plane. These may be less likely to change (Miton & Morin 2021).

Jablonka and Lamb use the characteristic differences between typical modes of social inheritance in animals and humans to illuminate the impact symbolic transmission systems have on human cultural evolution (see also: Deacon 1997). Although they argue that there can be non-linguistic symbolic systems (Jablonka & Lamb 2005: 224), language exemplifies nicely the way in which systems of symbols contain elements that can be recombined in countless ways to yield a vast array of different meaningful messages. Furthermore, repositories of symbolically stored information, such as books, computer databases, and libraries can also be searched, annotated, edited and so forth, in ways that add to their power and versatility. Such repositories can be powerful means by which knowledge accumulates across generations.

This manner of thinking opens several challenging issues. One important issue is the degree to which symbolic systems resemble other inheritance systems. Consider, by way of example, Stegmann’s (2004) discussion of the sense in which the genetic code is “arbitrary”. One quickly realizes that attempts to specify what makes some inheritance system a symbolic system, and to differentiate between types of symbolic systems (linguistic, non-linguistic and so forth) is philosophically demanding.

A contrasting approach aims at distinguishing cultural inheritance and transmission by focusing on a distinctive channel by which information moves. Typically, this identifies cultural inheritance with information carried by mechanisms of social learning, as opposed to genetically transmitted information, or information transmitted via other “channels” (Boyd & Richerson 1985; Richerson & Boyd 2005). Yet what is social learning?

In an important overview of work on cultural evolution, Henrich defines this key notion alongside the notion of “individual learning” that it is regularly contrasted with:

… social learning refers to any time an individual’s learning is influenced by others, and it includes many different kinds of psychological processes. Individual learning refers to situations in which individuals learn by observing or interacting directly with their environment (Henrich 2016: 12)

One consequence of this definition (a consequence which Henrich explicitly recognizes) is that “social learning” and “individual learning” are not exclusive. In our species it is rarely the case that what an individual learns is free from influence by others. Even in extreme cases, where we learn by probing our surroundings well away from social company, almost every aspect of the environments we interact with—and hence what we end up learning from those environments—has been affected by other people’s past actions. The structures and contents of our dwellings and workplaces, the constitutions of the domesticated plants and animals we interact with, the cultivated and engineered environments we live in, all have been affected by the activities of our predecessors.

Yet as the distinction between social and individual learning blurs, the question of whether there is a distinctive culture channel becomes less clear (Lewens 2017). For there are numerous ways in which activities of one generation can, by altering or maintaining stable features of biotic, social, and technical environments, have an influence over what individuals in the following generations end up learning (Laland, Odling-Smee, & Feldman 2000).

In response to these concerns, researchers have been motivated to find further distinguishing characteristics of sub-varieties of social learning. Henrich, for instance holds that

…the least sophisticated forms of social learning occur simply as a by-product of being around others, and engaging in individual learning.

He reserves the term “cultural learning” for the

more sophisticated subclass of social learning abilities in which individuals seek to acquire information from others. (2016: 12–13)

Critics of these final comments (e.g., Clarke & Heyes 2017; Heyes 2018) have urged further research concerning whether individual learning—which, as we have seen, can take place in felicitously structured environments—truly is less sophisticated than forms of learning directed to the behaviors of others. They encourage us to question whether there is an additional form of complexity in the cognitive mechanisms that underpin social (compared with individual) learning, and whether social learning has greater functionality with respect to the generation of increasingly refined behaviors, technologies, norms and institutions across populations.

2.3 Reproduction and Selection

While there may be a rough consensus among cultural evolutionists on the informational character of culture—perhaps even the social nature of transmission—there is less consensus on the nature of selection or reproduction in the domain of culture.

Here, skeptical arguments have set the stage. Fracchia and Lewontin (1999: 72–78), for instance, claim there are no analogs to biological reproduction and natural selection in cultural evolution. They take this to seriously undermine the predictive and explanatory power of the analogy. Worse, they say that attempts to fit culture into an evolutionary scheme are procrustean, lopping off the social power relations and “sociocultural particularity” they take to be at the core of explaining cultural change. Fracchia and Lewontin argue instead for understanding cultural change as an inherently historical process, where explanations appeal to the particular cultural histories of groups (an approach very similar to Sahlins’s [1985]).

In response, cultural evolutionary researchers have offered a nested taxonomy of explanatory frameworks that researchers might apply to understand culture, whose categories reflect increasingly close applications of the analogy between biology and culture. The hope is to confine concerns like Fracchia and Lewontin’s to the most stringent set of approaches, freeing up more liberal interpretations as the basis for empirical work.

Claidière, Scott-Phillips, and Sperber (2014) for instance, distinguish between populational, evolutionary, selectional, and replicator frameworks for explaining cultural change. Roughly, populational frames provide explanations in terms of the frequency of types that change over time. These could be token ideas, artifacts, or behaviors understood as instances of cultural “traits”. Evolutionary approaches are a sub-variety of populational approaches: they assume that distributions of cultural traits in a population can be explained by appeal to properties of distributions at an immediately earlier time. Selectional approaches are a sub-variety of evolutionary approach, which appeal to a form of cultural natural selection to explain changes in frequencies of cultural traits. Finally, replicator approaches are a sub-variety of selectional approaches. They assume that cultural evolution acts on cultural “replicators”, where cultural replication is understood in a fairly demanding way. To illustrate the difference between some of these approaches, consider that a selectional approach to the technological evolution of tools, for example, requires comparatively little. There must be variation and inherited resemblance over time, with some types of tool increasing their frequency over others in virtue of better fittedness to local demands. A replicator approach adds the further requirement that these tools, or perhaps the ideas that give rise to them, make copies of themselves in ways that closely parallel genetic replication.

Aside from memeticists (discussed in more detail below), few cultural evolutionary researchers are committed to the widespread existence of cultural replicators. Instead, contemporary work in cultural evolution largely adopts a populational framework. But this framework encompasses many possible approaches. Perhaps the prevailing approach to “population thinking”, exemplified by many classic studies in the literature (e.g., Cavalli-Sforza & Feldman 1981; Boyd & Richerson 1985), denotes any effort that employs abstracted psychological profiles to explore the consequences of individual-level learning dispositions for the population-level properties of groups. We will see several examples of such thinking below in the section on “dual-inheritance”. The establishment of population-level consequences are important, for they enable investigators to revise the constraints one might naively think must bear on cultural inheritance if specific forms of cultural change are to occur.

To others, the lack—or sheer implausibility—of strict selectional or replicator frameworks have spurred exploration of mechanisms similar to, but not identical with, the natural selection schema. For instance, Strimling, Enquist, and Eriksson (2009) develop a model that appeals not just to differential representation—that is, of traits in the minds of agents—but also to differential persistence in the face of new learning. Think of recipes. Home chefs will have learned how to cook many recipes over the years. Many will be too fussy, too complex, or too bland to warrant making more than once or twice. But some will be winners. These will be recipes cooked time and time again. Though the home chef will have learned how to cook all these recipes, both the overwrought and the tried-and-true, only the latter stick, in the sense they are employed again and again. The addition of such “stickiness” to a mechanism of selection makes it disanalogous to the natural selection schema, but perhaps not in a way that complicates the applicability of a more general evolutionary schema nor nearby notions like fitness (Ramsey & De Block 2017).

Similarly, many have noted the disanalogies between social transmission and biological reproduction. Only the former involves agents that recognize, reconstruct, and transmit traits if and when they so choose (Cao 2020). To others, these disanalogies are just a problem of locating the relevant spatiotemporal grain at which as-if reproductive relationships can be identified (e.g., Acerbi & Mesoudi 2015).

To extract a general thread winding through this section, attempts to “save the phenomena” appear to limit the explanatory power of selective explanations. For if selection and reproduction rely on agential dispositions to recognize, reconstruct, retain, and express cultural traits—and if these dispositions strongly depend on cultural history and context—then selective explanations do not seem an advance on already operative social scientific methods (Sober 1991). Consider that cultural selection should be able to explain the striking fit between cultural traits, the technologies of particular groups, and the local ecologies in which they operate. But the extent to which selective explanations are more illuminating than historical or agent-centered explanations is far from clear (Chellappoo 2022). We return to this point below.

3. A Strong Analogy: Memes and Memetics

Consider again the theory of memetics. This theory, originally put forward by Richard Dawkins (1976), is perhaps the best-known attempt to apply evolutionary thinking to culture. That said, while it has enjoyed considerable popular attention, it has not become well-established in scientific circles (although see Shennan 2008, 2011 for significant work that takes the meme’s-eye view).

The meme theory draws a strong analogy between evolution at the cultural level, and biological evolution. It begins with an abstract characterization of selection as a process requiring entities that reproduce, such that parents resemble offspring. It moves on to take the more demanding view, popularized by Dawkins, that entities which have the ability to make faithful copies of themselves—so-called “replicators”—are required to explain this trans-generational resemblance. In standard biological models of evolution, it is assumed that genes are the relevant replicators. Genes make copies of themselves, and this ability explains why offspring organisms resemble their parents. If culture is to evolve, it therefore becomes necessary to find some cultural replicator that explains cultural inheritance. Memes play this role. Dawkins gives a list of some exemplary memes: “tunes, ideas, catch-phrases, clothes fashions, ways of making pots or of building arches”. Note that while it is sometimes assumed that all memes are ideas (and vice versa), Dawkins’s list includes other types of thing, such as ways of making pots, which are techniques (see the entry on replication and reproduction).

Dawkins’s claim is that ideas, for example, can be conceptualized as entities that hop from mind to mind, making copies of themselves as they go. On the face of things, this seems an attractive proposition. Just as genes make copies of themselves at different rates according to their effects on the organisms that bear them and on their local environments, so ideas make copies of themselves at different rates according to their effects on the organisms that bear them and on their local environments. In a community of scientists, for example, different hypotheses are entertained, and some come to be believed more widely than others. A hypothesis that begins in the mind of one or two scientists thereby spreads, until it is widely held in the research community. Another hypothesis quickly dies.

We can perhaps characterize the features that make some hypotheses likely to spread, and others likely to perish. “Fit” hypotheses may have predictive power, or simplicity, or they may integrate well with existing bodies of theory. Note that what this example shows is that taking the meme’s-eye perspective does not literally show that we are being manipulated by selfish cultural replicators. One can describe scientific change as a struggle between selfish memes, but one can also describe just the same process in terms of scientists choosing to accept, or to reject, theories by reference to familiar criteria of explanatory power, theoretical elegance and so forth. It is only an incidental feature of the metaphor of memetic selfishness that appears to deprive humans of control over which ideas they do, and do not, accept.

4. Problems with Memes and Memetics

4.1 Are Cultural Units Replicators?

Replicators are units that make high-fidelity copies of themselves. Critics of the meme concept, however, argue that there are no mechanisms that explain how memes are replicated in this fashion (Sperber 2000; Claidière & Sperber 2007). Though imitation has often been suggested as a plausible mechanism, there are good reasons to think that imitation may be too error-prone to underpin replication. If we make a Victoria sponge cake using a secret family recipe, you eat the cake, and then attempt to make another one, then the chances are that the recipe you hit upon will not, in fact, be exactly the same as the one we used, even if you are able to make a similar-tasting cake.

Another significant worry for memetics is that when the same ideas do spread through a population, it is rarely because they are literally copied from each other. One alternative, for example, explains the recurrence of traits via recognition and recall (Buskell & Tennie forthcoming). Returning to the cake example; perhaps you eat a slice of our Victoria sponge, you like it, and you decide to make one for yourself. Perhaps the recipe you use is very similar to ours. But you have not figured out by tasting our cake which ingredients needed to go in and in what order. Rather, you already knew how to make a Victoria sponge. Eating our cake simply triggered the use of a recipe that was already in your repertoire. In this case, the cake we produced led to you to produce a similar one; but not because your recipe is a copy of mine.

A related form of explanation draws on Sperber’s (1996, 2000) claim that cultural trait recurrence makes use of what he calls “attractors”. In paradigm cases, these are culturally shared patterns of thought, which enable representations to spread through a population without literal copying. How does this work? The idea is that much learning is in fact reconstructive, where agents must infer and reconstruct the underlying form and content of a trait from observable instances or traces (Buskell 2017b). These reconstructions are biased due to shared patterns of thought, leading to systematic transformations of the form and content towards more attractive states. So, for example, if we have solid background experience in cooking Indian dishes, we may be able to recreate a newly encountered dal in such a way that my dal closely resembles the one just tasted. But that might not be because we see the recipe and copy it. It might not even be because we pay close attention to the specific elements of the dal just tried and aim at re-creating its component elements bit-by-bit. And it might not be because we already have the specific recipe in our repertoire. Instead, the fact that we are familiar with the traditions of cooking this type of food—we already know the sorts of ingredients used, the basic palette of methods and so forth—mean that with just a brief taste we are already primed to make something similar.

Error-prone imitation and non-replicative trait recurrence (like reconstructive learning) raise serious problems for the generality of memetics: not all cultural traits are replicators, hence not all cultural traits are memes. Defenders of the meme concept have offered two different responses to this challenge.

The first is to make the conditions required for meme-hood less demanding. Dennett (2017: 206), for example, seems to follow this path when he argues that memes constitute “ways: ways of doing something, or making something”, which are transmitted perceptually (rather than genetically). For Dennett, the meme concept has pragmatic payoff because it draws attention to the existence of stable re-tokenings of these cultural “ways”, in a manner that allows for cumulative forms of evolution via natural selection. As we read him, this means that while Dennett does require a certain level of fidelity in terms of resemblance of cultural tokens through transmission processes, he does not require a process of replication in the strict sense for an entity to count as a meme. Faithful resemblance is enough, even when underpinned by processes of Sperberian “attraction”.

The second response, also suggested by Dennett (2017) as well as by Cao (2020) among others, acknowledges that Sperberian arguments establish that not all instances of cultural recurrence are instances of cultural replication. Hence not all cultural traits—even when reproduced faithfully—are memes. Even so, this leaves open the possibility that some—perhaps many—cultural traits are memes. What is more, it invites the investigator to examine whether there are distinctive differences in cultural evolutionary dynamics afforded by memetic and non-memetic cultural reproduction. Whether this shows the meme concept to be useful depends on the sort of insights to be had by distinguishing cultural inheritance that is meme-like from cultural inheritance that is not (Sterelny 2006a).

4.2. Do Cultural Units Form Lineages?

A second important line of critique draws on the fact that while in genetic replication one can trace a new copy of a gene back to a single parent, ideas are rarely copied from a single source in a way that allows us to trace clear lineages (Boyd & Richerson 2000; Godfrey-Smith 2012).

Memeticists are fond of analyzing religious belief in terms of the spread of memes. But while religious beliefs may well spread through populations of humans, it seems unlikely that we will always be able to trace token instances of faith back to one source. Instead, individuals often acquire belief in a God through exposure to several believers in their local community. In these circumstances, belief in a God is not caused by one identifiable earlier token of the same type.

This poses a problem for meme theories, because in biological evolution Mendel’s laws have been important for explaining some aspects of evolutionary dynamics. Mendel’s laws rely on an understanding of genes as discrete, transmitted units. But if token ideas can appear in an individual in virtue of that individual’s exposure to several sources, then this makes it unlikely that anything close to Mendel’s laws will be discovered within cultural evolution. This suggests a practical limitation on inquiry that may result from this difference between ideas and genes.

Criticisms of this form have been forcefully put forward by William Wimsatt (1999). He argues that the creative and inferential abilities of human users make it the case that any given idea, or item of technology, can have fluctuating numbers of cultural parents over time. This is because the causal sources of its reproduction may vary. Belief in a God may sometimes be caused by exposure to a single charismatic evangelist, sometimes by the joint inculcation of two biological parents, and sometimes by immersion in a diffuse community of theists. There are no hard and fast rules of cultural inheritance.

Ideas and items of technology also have no stable analogue to the genome, or germline, because different elements within cycles of technological reproduction, including ideas, behaviours of artisans, and material elements of technologies themselves, can all temporarily acquire the status of replicators depending on the attention that human agents happen to be paying to them. Accidental variations in one’s mental plan for constructing a pot, in actions producing the pot, or in the finished pot itself, can all conceivably be reproduced when another artisan comes to make a resembling item. Wimsatt uses these disanalogies to highlight the formidable problems facing any effort to use population genetic models in the explanation of cultural change.

4.3 Can culture be atomized into discrete units?

Ideas stand in logical relations to each other. Whether an individual can acquire some belief thus depends on conceptual competencies. It is impossible to believe in the theory of relativity without understanding it, and one cannot understand it without holding many additional beliefs relating to physics. The same is true for non-technical beliefs. Depending on which religion one is talking about, belief in God is likely to be related to various other beliefs concerning forgiveness, retribution, love and so forth.

There are two problems here. The first is whether, and to what extent, culture can be decomposed into traits at all, and if so, how. Cao (2020) argues that cultural traits should mostly be individuated relative to the interests and capacities of the agents learning and passing them along. Though this does provide a route towards individuating and distinguishing cultural traits, it should be cold comfort to memeticists. Recall that for memeticists, memes are individuated independently of the interest of agents, who are supposed to be mere hosts or scaffolds for the reproduction of further memes.

The second problem concerns the extent to which replication operates over discrete traits, however individuated. The anthropologist Adam Kuper, for instance, complains that

Unlike genes, cultural traits are not particulate. An idea about God cannot be separated from other ideas with which it is indissolubly linked in a particular religion. (Kuper 2000: 180)

Memeticists are likely to respond by saying that although ideas are interlinked, this does not undermine the meme-gene analogy. O’Brien et al. (2010), for instance, have argued that a more mature view of the role of genes in evolution and development reinstates the meme-gene parallel. Genes, too, need to be studied in a context that takes other genes, and their broader developmental and environmental settings, into account. A DNA sequence can have different effects in different organisms, depending on the network of relations it enters into with other genetic and developmental resources. Just as the significance of belief in God can vary with social context, with the result that it can make little sense to think of “belief in God” in general as a single type of meme, so the function of some DNA sequence can vary with organic context, with the result that it makes little sense to identify some sequence type as a gene for the purposes of evolutionary analysis.

5. Looser Analogies

5.1 Dual-Inheritance Theory

The most sustained and respected approach to applying evolutionary thinking to culture begins from a different starting point than memetics. This alternative view starts from the observation that cultural inheritance is important, and it seeks to integrate cultural inheritance into traditional evolutionary models. If the memetic framework tends to be driven by cultural analogies to genetic evolution, dual inheritance models are driven instead by a desire to find ways of understanding how cultural inheritance affects evolutionary processes (Henrich & McElreath 2003). This approach need not assume that cultural inheritance works in the same way as genetic inheritance (see the entry on inheritance systems).

Researchers working in this tradition model cultural inheritance in ways that frequently depart from genetic inheritance: they may build in error-prone learning (e.g., Henrich 2001), acknowledge multiple cultural “parents” (e.g., Enquist et al. 2010), or emphasize the sequential (rather than all-at-once) acquisition of cultural traits (Buskell, Enquist, & Jansson 2019). Nonetheless, these models remain recognizably evolutionary in style, primarily because they seek to explain changes in populational trait frequencies over time. They do this by using broad assumptions about how individuals acquire cultural traits, and by assessing how these acquisition rules play out at the population-level. Moreover, these rules are not merely conjectured: they are given experimental backing. Dual-inheritance theorists document the effects of various empirically-supported forms of bias, such as prestige bias. Just as Darwin’s own theory of evolution by natural selection remained largely conjectural until supplemented by empirical work showing how inheritance worked—and by statistical work focusing on the population-level consequences of inheritance, selection, mutation and other forces—dual-inheritance theory has gained insights from a similar combination of empirical and mathematical approaches (e.g., Richerson & Boyd 2005; Jordan 2015; Henrich 2016).

Models in the dual-inheritance tradition sometimes aim at showing how cultural change of various sorts—and not necessarily adaptive cultural change—can affect genetic evolution, and vice versa. These are models of gene-culture co-evolution. Other dual-inheritance models aim at assessing the cultural evolution of adaptations. In the latter set of models, theorists are not merely seeking to explain distributions of traits in populations, they are also seeking to explain the origin of valuable cultural novelties (Godfrey-Smith 2012).

In section 4 we argued that cultural change does not require cultural replicators. Various strands of work indicate that this is true even when cultural change is adaptive. The general Darwinian scheme for explaining adaptation demands reliable inheritance—that once a fitness-augmenting mutation arises, it can be retained in future generations. If cultural learning is error-prone, or if individuals acquire cultural traits by taking an average of many different models, then one might think that even if some individual were able to discover a fitness-enhancing behavior, that trait will be lost to future generations either because it might be miscopied or because it might be combined with less adaptive traits to produce an averaged mish-mash of a behavior. These considerations in favor of the importance of replication have all been challenged by recent cultural evolutionary theory.

Cultural evolutionists agree that, at the level of the population, cumulative evolution requires that fitness-enhancing cultural traits are preserved in the offspring generation. However, they deny that this requires faithful transmission between individuals. A formal model from Henrich and Boyd (1998) suggests that conformist bias—defined as the exaggerated tendency of individuals to adopt the most common representation in a population—can overcome the effects of error-prone learning to produce reliable inheritance at the population level. Henrich and Boyd’s theoretical model assumes that individuals are poor at inferring the representations of others. Even so, when one looks to the population level, conformist bias helps to correct the effects of such errors, by producing a population-wide distribution of representations in the offspring generation that is close to the population-wide distribution of representations in the parent generation. Henrich and Boyd explain the reason for this: in general, error-prone transmission tends to produce a mixture of different representations. In a population that already contains several different representations at significant frequencies, the effect of error on a population-wide distribution of representations is therefore low. In a population in which one representation is common, the effects of error are much more significant. But if we add conformist bias—and perhaps other biases, like prestige bias—we increase the chances of a commonly held representation remaining commonly held in future generations, even with error-prone imitation.

Boyd and Henrich acknowledge that this mechanism does not ensure population-level distributions are perfectly reliably inherited. But this does not mean that cumulative evolution acting on cultural inheritance is impossible. At the genetic level, highly faithful copying processes allow even very small selective forces to preserve adaptive variation. Less faithful copying demands stronger selective forces if adaptive variation is not to be lost (Enquist et al. 2010). Boyd and Henrich are confident that selective forces in the cultural realm are stronger than selective forces in the genetic realm. The moral, once again, is that it is important not to focus too closely on genetic evolution as a model for cultural evolution (Sterelny 2012; 2021b).

5.2. Cultural Attraction

Sperber, and other advocates of the approach to cultural evolution known as “cultural epidemiology”, or “cultural attraction theory”, share with dual-inheritance theorists a populational approach to cultural evolution:

the overall general framework for the study and modelling of cultural evolution should be that of “population thinking” …. (Claidière, Scott-Phillips, & Sperber 2014)

Their distinctive contribution lies in the claim that any successful execution of this approach requires that explanations of the distribution of cultural items pay close attention to what they call cultural “attractors” (Sperber 1996). Moreover, they argue that this approach frequently (although not always) gives rise to explanations that elude approaches grounded in forms of cultural selection.

As indicated earlier, Sperber argues that the simple notion of copying is only rarely appropriate to explain why broadly similar cultural items propagate in a stable manner through a population. For example, when emotional states spread through communities—perhaps at times of national mourning—one individual’s expression of grief can be causally initiated by another’s. But the second individual does not closely imitate, or copy, the emotional state of the first, even if the second emotional state resembles—and hence is a “reproduction” of—the first. Instead, a shared set of emotional dispositions, perhaps coupled to shared norms for public behavior, conspire to reconstruct a similar emotional state. Such recurrent states, which are the broadly stable outcomes of these reconstructive processes, are examples of cultural “attractors”.

We gave a rough gloss on attractors above. It is worth underlining the point, however, that an attractor should not be equated with the psychological attractiveness of some trait to individuals (Sperber 1996; Buskell 2017a). Instead, an attractor is a more abstract notion corresponding to the more-or-less stable outcome of processes of cultural reproduction. And very many different “factors of attraction” can potentially underpin such stable reproduction. For example, if a widely encountered engineering problem has only a few effective solutions, and these are also easy to figure out, then one should expect those solutions to appear again and again, even if individuals are not attempting to copy the innovations of others in detail. Thus, factors of attraction need not be psychological at all; they may be constellations of physical, ecological, and even informational constraints (Falandays & Smaldino 2022). Shared bodies of information, shared preferences, and shared emotional or inferential biases might also explain why some cultural variants reappear with regularity.

Some attractors may be grounded in evolved and universally held cognitive dispositions. Indeed, Sperber and like-minded colleagues have often declared explicit debts to evolutionary psychology (Sperber 1996). Yet cognitive attractors may also be local, corresponding to more narrowly shared dispositions or biases held by communities. Such dispositions can explain reproduction that is only reliable across narrowly specified cultural contexts. Work along these lines aims at answering the charge that the cultural epidemiology approach is vacuous or not action-guiding for empirical work (e.g., Buskell 2019). It does so by attempting to outline factors of attraction, and their populational consequences, at various spatial and temporal scales (Morin 2011 [2016a]).

5.3 Cultural Systems

A more recent approach within the cultural evolutionary research community—albeit one with a lengthy pedigree outside that domain—examines cultural change through the lens of systems thinking (Buskell, Enquist, & Jansson 2019; Jansson et al. 2021). This approach starts from an observation that there is a difference in how cultural traits (in individuals and in groups) are acquired as compared with biological traits: while the latter are largely inherited all at once (in a sexual species, at the moment of fertilization, say), cultural traits can be acquired over a protracted period of time. The sequential acquisition of cultural traits means those acquired earlier in time can affect the acquisition of those encountered later.

Acerbi, Enquist, and Ghirlanda (2009) illustrate the general idea of the cultural systems approach with a model that explores the transmission of traits that make individuals either “open” or “conservative”—that is, open to acquiring new traits, or happy to sit tight. As they suggest, a trait making one “conservative” could spread to “open” individuals—but the converse is not the case. Once an agent acquires the “conservative” trait, no new learning will occur. Expanding this line of thought, Jansson et al. (2021) argue for the importance of cultural filters: collections of traits that regulate the attentiveness towards, evaluation of, and potential acceptance of novel traits. The general idea is that relations of compatibility holding between already acquired traits will influence the addition of new ones. Thus, idiosyncratic collections of traits and their respective compatibility profiles—themselves the result of the sequential acquisition of traits—will modulate downstream acquisition.

The systems approach is less overtly evolutionary than either dual-inheritance theory or cultural epidemiology. Proponents argue that a systems approach provides a framework well-suited for formalizing and exploring the population level consequences of claims made about culture in the humanities and social sciences. Yet given the approach’s similarity to longstanding network approaches in quantitative sociology (e.g., Axelrod 1997; Centola 2015; Goldberg & Stein 2018), one might rightly wonder—at this point, what remains of the analogy between biology and culture?

5.4 A Persisting Problem: The Explanatory Power of the Biology/Culture Analogy

At the beginning of this entry it was claimed that the case for cultural evolution was irresistible. No one can deny that cultural inheritance is an important factor in explaining how our species has changed over time. In spite of all this, one might still worry that it is a mistake to understand the importance of culture using the tools of evolutionary theory. This is because one may be skeptical of the existence of a theory that is both general enough to cover all forms of cultural change and informative enough to be enlightening.

There is no doubt that it is often important to remind overly-enthusiastic orthodox Darwinians of the importance of culture. For example, it seems that the increased incidence of lactose-tolerance among human populations has arisen as a consequence of a cultural innovation—namely dairy farming. The relatively recent appearance of this genetically-controlled adaptation demonstrates that human physiological nature is something that continues to change, and it also demonstrates the causal impact of culture on genes (Richerson & Boyd 2005: 191–92). Such examples by themselves show the rashness of any view that claims either that human nature has remained fixed since the Stone Age, or that genes are somehow in the evolutionary driving seat. Yet none of this shows that we can develop a general, informative theory of cultural evolution. One might fear that, in the end, the influence of culture on aspects of the human species is best understood through a series of more idiosyncratic narratives.

Our brief examination of memetics illustrated this concern. We gain no real explanatory insight if we are told that ideas spread through populations, some more successfully than others. We want to know what makes some ideas fitter than others. And it is not clear that there will be any general rules that can help us to answer this question. In the biological realm, we need detailed accounts of local environmental circumstances, species-specific physiology and anatomy, and so forth, to tell us what makes one organic variant fitter than another. Similarly, in the cultural realm we need to look at local psychological dispositions to explain why some ideas are more likely to spread than others. Thus any explanatory value to be had from cultural evolution may be parasitic on conventional work done in psychology. And if individual preferences are subject to change over time, then there may be no general and informative theory of cultural evolution to be had; rather, we will have to settle for local explanations that look to shifting preferences. Rather than provide a new scientific framework for an understanding of culture, cultural evolution will tend to degenerate into conventional narrative cultural history (Fracchia & Lewontin 1999).

In a useful article, Elliott Sober (1991) suggests that theories of cultural evolution may have limited value for the work of social scientists, on the grounds that social scientists are primarily interested in explaining what makes individuals likely to adopt one idea, rather than another. Perhaps culture is composed of replicating entities struggling against various selection pressures, but what insight does this offer us, if in the end it presents us with nothing more than an alternative idiom in which to describe the various factors that affect the evaluation of culture? Perhaps clothes fashions are memes, but even if that is the case, one still needs to explain what makes one clothing meme fitter than another, and the fear is that once spelled out this will quickly boil down to a well-known appeal to consumer psychology.

Once again, Dennett (2017) has offered a response on behalf of the memetic approach, but it serves as a potential response from cultural evolutionary theorists more broadly. He draws attention to the risks of assuming an overly rational perspective on the factors influencing the uptake of cultural traits: one should not assume that ideas are widely adopted because they are understood and explicitly endorsed by those who adopt them; one should not assume that technological innovation occurs because users or designers understand the nature of the contribution made by some novel variant. If, as Darwin argued, the selection, preservation and augmentation of organic variation (in the early stages of domestication, for example) can sometimes be unconscious, it follows that the selection, preservation and augmentation of cultural variation can sometimes be unconscious, too.

Richerson and Boyd respond in a different, albeit complementary way. They say that Sober’s argument assumes, erroneously, that “we are all good intuitive population thinkers” (Richerson & Boyd 2005: 97). In Sober’s original article he points out that population thinking might save cultural evolutionary models from vacuity in just this way:

So the question about the usefulness of these models of cultural evolution to the day-to-day research of social scientists comes to this: Are social scientists good at intuitive population thinking? If they are, then their explanations will not be undermined by precise models of cultural evolution. If they are not, then social scientists should correct their explanations (and the intuitions on which they rely) by studying these models. (Sober 1991: 492)

6. Extensions and Elaborations

6.1 Coevolution and the Cultural Evolution of Cultural Evolution

Perhaps the core assumption of all approaches to cultural evolution is the thought that rampant social learning is an important explanatory process. Yet one may reasonably ask why it should be the case that we have the ability to learn from others at all, given the adaptive costs of such a disposition.

Boyd and Richerson (1985) claim that the overall adaptive benefits of learning from non-parents outweigh the costs (Richerson & Boyd 2005: Ch. 4). They give several reasons for this view. Suppose an inventive (or lucky) individual discovers some behavior, or technique, which augments fitness. If other individuals in the population can copy that behavior, then their fitness will probably be augmented, too. It will often be difficult for individuals to ascertain which behaviors in fact augment fitness, hence which behaviors should be copied. The problem, then, is how to tune a learning mechanism so that beneficial behaviors are copied, while non-beneficial behaviors are not.

Boyd and Richerson suggest that prestige bias can overcome this problem: if individuals copy techniques from those who are in prestigious positions, then this increases the chances that they will copy techniques that are, in fact, beneficial. As they put it, “Determining who is a success is much easier than determining how to be a success” (Richerson & Boyd 2005: 124). Moreover, evidence has been accumulating for the reality of prestige bias. Henrich and Broesch (2011) have argued, based on fieldwork in Fiji, that an individual’s perceived success in a single domain of activity (for example, yam cultivation) predicts whether that individual will be asked for advice in other domains (for example, fishing). In other words, they claim that individuals are accorded a broad form of prestige, which affects their likelihood of serving as a cultural model. The value of prestige bias relies on the supposition that those individuals who are able to get themselves into prestigious positions have a better than average tendency to make use of fitness-enhancing techniques.

Richerson and Boyd (2005: 120–22) suggest other learning heuristics may be adaptive too. One we mentioned above is conformist bias. To say that someone has conformist bias is to say that the person in question tends to imitate those behaviors, beliefs or other dispositions that are present among a high frequency of individuals in the population. More precisely, this bias is usually defined as a heightened, or exaggerated, tendency to imitate the most common behavior. They argue (along with many others in the field) that conformist learning provides an individual learner with behaviors that are appropriate to novel situations. More specifically, they argue that it is more adaptive in this regard than not imitating others at all, and more adaptive than imitating randomly-chosen members of a population. Conformist learning, they say, can help with the acquisition of behaviors appropriate to a new biological environment: when moving into a new habitat, with unknown plants and animals, it is best to eat the foods the locals eat, for one thereby avoids poisoning. But it can also lead to the generation of socially appropriate behaviors, which will obviate ostracism or attack. Supporting this idea, Harris and Corriveau’s (2011) empirical work concludes that while young children are unselective with regard to what they learn, they are far more selective regarding whom they learn from. Moreover, they argue that children tend to seek out cultural conformists as individuals whom they should trust. These findings offer some support for the existence of a form of conformist bias, although Lewens (2015) has suggested that both the theoretical and empirical cases for conformist bias may not be as strong as first meets the eye, and Chellappoo (2021) has offered a similarly skeptical evaluation of the case made for prestige bias.

Returning to the question that initiated this section—Why can we learn from others at all, when what we learn often seems detrimental?—these examples illustrate the form of methodological adaptationism shared between much cultural evolutionary thinking and the evolutionary psychological approach it is sometimes contrasted with (Lewens 2015). Cultural evolutionists tend to argue that while the overall adaptive benefits of social learning dispositions in past environments explain their origination through natural selection, this means neither that each specific learned trait must lead to a fitness benefit, nor that the overall payoffs of learning must still be positive in the context of modern informational environments that differ radically compared with those that confronted our ancestors.

6.2 Cumulative Culture

Other work done by cultural evolutionary researchers begins from considerations of explanatory puzzles similar to those that led Darwin to formulate his principle of natural selection in the first place. Darwin was concerned to explain how structures could arise which fit organisms so remarkably well to their conditions of existence. Cultural evolutionists frequently draw attention to a variety of adaptive cultural traits, whose origination seems inexplicable in terms of individual innovation alone.

Henrich (2016: 97–100), for example, makes good use of the example of manioc processing. Manioc (also called cassava) is a good source of starch, but it needs to be processed to make it safe to eat. Without this processing it can release poisonous hydrogen cyanide. According to Henrich, while unprocessed manioc tastes bitter, the bitter taste is not a good indicator of its safety: bitterness disappears in the preparation process before manioc becomes safe to eat. Worse, while unprocessed manioc is poisonous, it is hard to discover that this is the case, because the symptoms of poisoning only appear well after eating unsafe manioc. Henrich argues that it is hard to see how any single insightful individual could have invented this processing technology. Instead, he argues that a more gradual process of cumulative cultural adaptation, spread across the population—a form of “hidden hand explanation” modeled on organic selection—must be invoked.

The prevailing metaphor used to describe this process of cumulative cultural adaptation is that of a ratchet. Cultural traditions must be built-upon—and must not “slip-back” over time—if such adaptive traits are to be generated, maintained and further elaborated (Tomasello, Kruger, & Ratner 1993; Tomasello 1999). In fact, such “incremental improvement” is taken to be a “core criterion” of what is simply called “cumulative culture” (Mesoudi & Thornton 2018).

Two features of this characterization of cumulative culture have exercised commentators. The first is the “lumped” character of the cumulative culture concept: the concept encompasses a set of evolutionary patterns, processes, and products that might better be kept distinct. Buskell (2022) for instance, suggests that the underlying process of accumulation—the ratchet-like retention of modifications made to traits over time—should be distinguished from the cultural evolutionary patterns (or “trends”) typically associated with it; notably, the complexity, adaptiveness, or efficacy typically associated with cumulative culture. This preserves the “ratchet” of modification and retention, but distinguishes it from “incremental improvement”, opening up the possibility of generating both maladaptive and neutral traits. Just as copying errors or mutation may lead to deleterious or neutral forms of traits being passed on over time—so too might cumulative culture.

A second set of concerns considers which features of cumulative culture, if any, mark it out as a distinctive kind of cultural evolutionary process. It is usual to express the ratcheting requirement in terms of the need for high-fidelity in social learning. This, in turn, is most obviously spelled out as a requirement for a token of a trait in a learner to faithfully resemble the token of the same trait in the model. But it is not clear what “grain” of analysis should be chosen when determining resemblance (Charbonneau 2020; Charbonneau & Bourrat 2021). Suppose Andrew sings a line from a song, and Tim attempts to copy him: does “high fidelity” learning require Tim to reproduce the same melody, must he sing in the same key, must he sing with the same words, and the same emotional emphases? Note that this also raises the linked question of what it takes for two tokens to be of the same trait type. If Tim sings with different words and in a different key, are we dealing with tokens of the same, or a different trait type? There is plausibly value to the investigator in distinguishing different types of modification, rather than using a single “hi-fi/lo-fi” dimension. For example, one may wish to distinguish rearranging or multiplying the elements involved in some complex behavior, from altering the nature of those elements themselves (Charbonneau 2016; Buskell 2020).

Last are concerns about identifying instances of cumulative culture. Work in comparative cognition shows that culture is widespread among non-human animals. Yet evidence for cumulative culture is contentious. Tennie, Call, and Tomasello (2009: 2413) have argued that

the cultural traditions of non-human primate species…do not seem to accumulate modifications over time with any kind of ratchet effect.

Their view is that behavioral solutions in chimpanzees, for example, are always drawn from a limited repertoire—what Tennie and colleagues (2009) call a zone of latent solutions (ZLS)—which contains only solutions that an individual might potentially discover by itself. This does not mean that there is no element of accumulation in primate culture: Tennie et al note that an individual primate may be assisted in acquiring some behavior by the performances of others, and by the use of discarded tools. There is, then, scope for limited building on the achievements of earlier individuals. Even so, they suggest the ZLS places strong limits on cultural accumulation in these contexts. Regardless of whether the ZLS approach is a good means of evaluating the cultural capacities of animals, the prevalence of animal cultural traits and the evolutionary role of cumulative culture have been hotly disputed (Schuppli & van Schaik 2019; Haidle & Schaludt 2020; Sterelny 2021b). If nothing else, this work suggests that identifying instances of cumulative culture among non-human animals is a difficult empirical issue.

6.3 Cultural Group Selection

Introductory textbook examples of natural selection typically use cases where individual organisms differ with respect to how many offspring they have, and adaptations that promote individual fitness are selected as a consequence. For example, it is well-confirmed that camouflage puts individual peppered moths at a selective advantage over less-well camouflaged individuals in the face of predation by birds. However, theorists have regularly suggested that groups of organisms might also differ in their fitness, and that adaptations promoting group fitness might be favored by the action of selection at this higher level (see the entry on units and levels of selection). In mainstream evolutionary theory, progress has been made in disambiguating what is meant by group fitness—it can mean either the ability of a group to produce individual organisms, or the ability of a group to produce new groups—and also in assessing how robust the effects of group selection might be (Okasha 2006).

Several leading theorists of cultural evolution have placed considerable stress on the importance of what they have called Cultural Group Selection (sometimes abbreviated to “CGS”). CGS is a form of group-level selection that occurs when differences between groups of individuals are maintained by cultural inheritance. Darwin’s own work on the emergence of human morality helps set the scene for the sort of explanatory problem that a group selection process (whether cultural or otherwise) is apt to solve. He points out that forms of morally admirable behavior that benefit others can be hard to explain using simple appeals to natural selection. In many cases it seems an individual’s ability to leave offspring will be promoted by selfish, rather than other-regarding, actions. However, the detrimental effects of selection at the level of individuals can be overcome if selection is efficient at a higher level:

When two tribes of primeval man, living in the same country, came into competition, if…the one tribe included a great number of courageous, sympathetic and faithful members, who were always ready to warn each other of danger, to aid and defend each other, this tribe would succeed better and conquer the other. (Darwin 1871: 162 [1877: 130], wording from the 1877 edition which is slightly different than the 1871 edition)

Darwin writes of selection acting at the level of the “tribe” or the “community”. What makes the appeal to higher-level selection salient is its potential ability to override a countervailing force at the individual-level. Individual-level selection promotes self-regard, says Darwin, but competition between tribes favors other-regard (at least with respect to other members of one’s own tribe).

This feature is not always present in the recent invocations of CGS. Consider how Heyes (2018) understands CGS. She notes that cultural inheritance can often be “diffuse”: a trait such as the ability to ascertain what others are thinking and feeling (“mind-reading”) is acquired in part by close interaction with one’s parents as a baby, also by interaction with other relatives and siblings, by engagement with other children, and by reflective exposure to sources such as novels and films under the instruction of unrelated adults. In other words, these traits are inherited via complex crisscrossing networks. Heyes conjectures that this form of inheritance tends to reduce variation within groups, thereby accentuating variation between groups, and establishing the possibility of “an adaptive response at the level of the social group” (2018: 41). In a more detailed presentation of her understanding of cultural group selection, she envisages two groups (for simplicity she calls them Right and Left). Each group has a different prevalent version of some important cognitive mechanism. Most people in Left have M, most people in Right have M*. M and M* are stable features of Left and Right respectively, because they are inherited via diffuse forms of learning within those groups. If M* better enables individuals to carry out some significant function, then people in Right may end up having more biological offspring than people in Left. This means the Right group does better overall than Left and M* increases its representation in the population as a whole.

We do not take issue here with the potential efficacy of the mechanism Heyes proposes. We do, however, question whether it is a form of CGS. Heyes thinks of this as CGS because one group is more successful than the other, and because the inheritance of the traits of interest (M and M*) is achieved through forms of learning. But this need not indicate a distinctively group-level process of selection. This is the cultural analogue of an old-fashioned problem in mainstream evolutionary theory. A herd of fast-running deer will do better in terms of reproductive output than a herd of slow-running deer, but it does not follow that this indicates selection at the level of the herd. Here, the herd as a whole does better because of the individual-level selection processes going on within it (Williams 1966).

Richerson and Boyd’s “Tribal Social Instincts” approach to CGS is much more closely aligned with Darwin’s own explanation of features of human moral psychology. Their favored explanatory hypothesis is a complex one, involving interaction between CGS and natural selection acting on genetic variation:

Selection on tribes can account for the innate foundation of our social psychology via the process of gene-culture coevolution. (Richerson & Boyd 2005. See also: Boyd & Richerson 1985: Ch. 7)

They argue, based on a mixture of historical, ethnographic and theoretical work, for a scenario that begins with what they also call “tribes”—they consider these to be ethnolinguistic units of around 500 to 1500 people—competing against each other in ways that are aided by culturally transmissible differences in group properties. This competitive process eventually produces

culturally transmitted cooperative, group-oriented norms, and systems of rewards and punishments to ensure that such norms are obeyed. (Richerson & Boyd 2005: 196)

Once cultural transmission has established this social environment, natural selection acting on genetic variation then favors an innate psychology that is suited to this new, socially-inherited set of environmental problems.

The Tribal Social Instincts hypothesis can be challenged on empirical grounds: one can question the claims made about the innateness of the social psychological dispositions in question, the characterization of Pleistocene social groups and conditions, the inability of more traditional evolutionary resources to explain our altruistic tendencies, and so forth (see Birch 2017; Sterelny 2016, 2021b, 2022; and Birch & Buskell 2022). Such challenges are inevitable when a hypothesis is as ambitious as this one, and when it draws on such a variety of supporting sources of data. There are also conceptual concerns. The very idea of group selection has been a contested one within mainstream evolutionary theory. Some commentators have taken a skeptical view of group selection when underpinned by genetic inheritance, because of worries that competition based on genetic variation within groups will tend to undermine the effects of competition between groups.

Several cultural evolutionists (e.g., Boyd & Richerson 2009; Henrich 2016) reply that cultural inheritance processes are better able than processes of genetic inheritance to sustain between-group differences, for they believe there is good empirical and theoretical evidence that cultural processes can maintain within-group homogeneity in the face of various countervailing factors (immigration, unreliable imitation and so forth). This leads to further questions concerning how, in general, to characterize CGS. Richerson, Baldini, et al. (2016) lists three different forms, of which straightforward competition between groups is just one variant. The second, selective imitation, happens when traits move from one group to another, when individuals see their benefits and adopt them. The third, selective migration, happens when individuals move from one group to another, once again when they see the benefits of the traits in question. These are indeed additional ways by which behavioral traits that are of benefit to a group can increase in frequency in a larger population of groups. However, in the second two cases, trait frequencies are increased simply by individuals’ attraction to traits that they regard as bestowing collective benefits. Because two of these three processes are quite different to what one might think of as a central case of CGS—whereby groups compete against each other—critics such as Morin (2016b) have argued that they are not helpfully regarded as group selection processes at all.

Richerson and colleagues shrug off these concerns about labeling:

The main thing all three have in common is that they are driven by variation among groups. We are not wedded to any particular terminology in this matter. (Richerson, Baldini, et al. 2016: § R4)

These issues need not be merely terminological, for (as we suggested for Heyes’s work) they also raise basic theoretical concerns about distinguishing individual-level selection from group-level selection. These concerns become especially acute in the context of a species able to observe and learn from others. For suppose individuals in group G1 slowly develop a process P1—perhaps a form of processing food—that gives each individual using it an advantage over the older technique P0. Within the neighboring group G2, everyone still uses P0. Group G1 grows, flourishes, and expands its territory thanks to P1. Soon individuals in G2 notice the conspicuous success of the ever-expanding G1, they notice their neighbors in G1 are mainly using P1, and they start to adopt P1 as a consequence. This is a process whereby a group-beneficial trait spreads because of variation between groups. It is also an instance of selective imitation. But at least in this case—because of the payoffs of P1 compared with P0 for individuals—to call it an instance of group selection threatens to introduce confusion in the context of more general evolutionary theorizing. So selective imitation may sometimes be a mechanism for a form of group selection proper, but it need not always be.

6.4 Evolvability

Darwin’s theory is intended to explain adaptation (see the entry on adaptationism). The previous two sections have already touched on the general conditions required for novel cultural adaptations to emerge over time. In the organic realm, these conditions are sometimes understood under the general heading of “evolvability”. The philosophical analysis of cultural evolutionary evolvability has been pioneered in recent years by Kim Sterelny (e.g., 2001, 2003, 2006a, 2006b, 2007, 2012, 2021a). Once again, let us illustrate the general nature of these issues by beginning in the organic realm.

The basic conditions required for natural selection—offspring that resemble their parents with respect to fitness enhancing traits—do not suffice for the appearance of functional traits even if they may help explain it. The environment also needs to cooperate: if selective pressures change very quickly then there will be no sustained environmental demands of the sort that might build complex adaptations over time (Boyd & Richerson 1985). Development also matters. If ontogeny is set up in such a way that changes to any one trait tend to be accompanied by changes to all other traits, then cumulative adaptation will be hard to come by. Even in those cases where a mutation contributes positively to the function of one trait, the chances are that it will contribute negatively to fitness in virtue of disrupting the functioning of other traits (though, see Brown 2021). Development also needs to make a wide range of variation available. If it is highly constrained, so that only a small number of forms are possible, then selection is not presented with a broad enough range of raw materials from which to fashion complex traits.

It also seems that cumulative adaptation relies on the suppression of “outlaws” (Sterelny 2001, 2006b, 2016, 2021b). Group selection is often held to be an ineffective agent of group-level adaptation, on the grounds that it is vulnerable to “subversion from within”. This occurs when individual organisms go it alone, sabotaging complex features of group organization in favor of their own fitness (Birch 2017). Individual-level selection, in contrast, can build individual-level adaptations. This is because, by and large, genes in a given human organism share a “common fate”—they do not behave as though they were in direct competition, struggling for representation in future generations. When genes genuinely “go it alone”, for example by sabotaging meiosis so that some have greater chances of appearing in future generations than others, then the overall integrity of the organism can be compromised, and individual-level adaptation is undermined.

By applying these sorts of considerations to the cultural realm we can understand the likely costs and benefits associated with different modes and forms of cultural inheritance (vertical, oblique, meme-like and so forth). We can also understand the different evolutionary forces that might bring these different forms of cultural inheritance into existence. In turn, these insights may facilitate comparative work that documents the general conditions required for a species to make use of cultural inheritance in order to build complex adaptations such as tools. This way of thinking offers the promise, for example, of explaining why few, if any, non-human species build progressively more and more complex cultural features in a cumulative manner (Richerson & Boyd 2005: 107; see also Laland 2017).

Questions relating to evolvability are also tied up with difficult issues relating to the units-of-selection debate (Okasha 2006). As we have seen, natural selection at a higher level of organization may be required to generate mechanisms that suppress the ability of disruptive “outlaws” to go it alone at lower levels of organization. Does something like this occur in the cultural realm? Does selection on human groups act so as to limit the ability of individual humans to go it alone? In what ways might cultural inheritance be involved in these processes? These questions are complex, both in terms of how they should be posed and how they should be answered. But some of the most interesting work in cultural evolutionary theory may come from efforts to answer them.

6.5 Macroevolution

Many evolutionists have argued that biological tools can have great value when developing a historical view of the pattern of cultural change (see, for example, Gray, Greenhill, & Ross 2007; Mace & Holden 2005; Lewens 2012, and the entry on macroevolution). Consider phylogenetics. A variety of biological methods have been developed that help us to uncover the structure of evolutionary trees: they show which taxa split from which others and when. It seems clear that cultural items of many kinds (most obviously languages, but also tools and techniques) also stand in recognizable genealogical relationships, and this has led many biological anthropologists to use phylogenetic methods borrowed or adapted from the biological sciences to reconstruct history in the cultural realm.

Critics have sometimes followed Gould (1988) in arguing that these biological methods cannot be properly applied to culture, because cultural genealogies invariably take the form of reticulated networks rather than branching trees. Cultural change is indeed often highly reticulated: it is obvious that a complex object like a car is a confluence of numerous technical lineages, which come together to form the hi-fi system, the engine, the safety devices, and so forth. Moreover, as improvements are made to cars these new developments may be borrowed by innovators of bicycles, furniture, toys, and other shifting constellations of artifacts.

These important observations need not undermine the project of cultural phylogeny. One response is to look to those aspects of culture most amenable to phylogenetic reconstruction, such as deeply conserved linguistic terms (Cabrera 2017)—a strategy adopted by many early adopters of phylogenetic methods. Another is to recognize that biological evolution is also reticulated. Bacteria, for example, do not form genealogically isolated lineages, hybridization is rife among plants, and there is also considerable borrowing of elements of the genome between apparently isolated mammalian species. Of course, this might show simply that phylogenetic modes of inference are doubly imperiled: they don’t work for much of the biological world either. But cultural evolutionists (e.g., Gray, Greenhill, & Ross 2007) are encouraged by inferential developments within biology itself, which aim to reconstruct partially reticulated trees by proposing so-called “reconciliations” of the conflicting trees that traditional methods often propose for species and genes. These have shown promise beyond the original home of cultural phylogenetics in reconstructing trees based on language families, extending to archaeology and technology (Jordan 2015; Gjesfjeld & Jordan 2019).

This kind of work is important, in part because of the uses to which well-confirmed cultural phylogenies can be put. It may be easiest to illustrate their value via a simple example. On the face of things, looking for correlations is a reasonable (albeit fallible) way to discover causal relationships. If, for example, people who smoke often get lung cancer, and people with lung cancer are often smokers, then we have good evidence that smoking causes lung cancer (or perhaps that lung cancer causes smoking). But there can be strong correlations that do not indicate causation. If, for example, we find that there is a strong correlation in animals between making a moo sound and producing large quantities of milk, we should not conclude that one causes the other. Mooing and milk production go together because the creatures in question share ancestors in common, who both mooed and gave lots of milk. Of course, in the case of cows this fact of common ancestry is so obvious that we hardly notice how it informs our causal inference. But cultural phylogenies are unobvious. Russell Gray, among others, has long argued that when we understand them better, our knowledge of phylogenies can then confirm, or undermine, causal hypotheses that are claimed on the basis of correlation.

Gray and Watts (2017), for example, have scrutinized what is sometimes called the Supernatural Punishment Hypothesis. This is the hypothesis that belief in powerful gods, who inflict punishment on wrongdoers, tends to result in societies better able to harness the fruits of cooperation (see Norenzayan et al. 2016). Gray and Watts again caution that mere correlation between societies that believe in “moralising high gods” and various measures of social complexity does not count strongly in favor of the Supernatural Punishment Hypothesis. One must also consider the potentially confounding consequences of shared ancestry among the societies surveyed. Gray and Watts draw on Austronesian data to argue that belief in moralizing high gods tends to be gained after, not before, the emergence of political complexity. These data, they suggest, undermine the thought that moralizing high gods drive this form of complexity. That said, they do find some support for a weaker supernatural punishment hypothesis based on belief in punishment interventions from natural spirits, ancestral spirits and mythical heroes, as well as from moralizing high gods. In their view this type of belief facilitated, “the rise of political complexity” without “helping sustain it” (Gray & Watts 2017: 7848). Work such as this indicates the potential for cultural phylogenetics to inform broad-sweep hypotheses about not just the patterns, but also the causal processes, that have marked the cultural history of our species.

Of course, phylogenetic methods are far from the only means of reconstructing cultural history. More recently, archaeologists have argued for new methods and theories based on analogies between archaeology and paleobiology. Just as paleobiologists identify evolutionary trends and patterns by looking at the fossil record—notably, periodic mass extinctions and rates of speciation—suitably rich archaeological databases might allow researchers to discern distinctive patterns, processes, and trends in the cultural evolutionary record (Perreault 2019; Gjesfjeld et al. 2016). Perreault (2012), for instance, compares evolutionary and archaeological datasets to quantify the oft-informally made claim that culture evolution proceeds more quickly than biological evolution. A different set of arguments considers how archaeological databases and statistical techniques may help revise archaeological systematics and cultural taxonomy (Riede et al. 2020; Lyman 2021). The two efforts are related. Classificatory work may feedback into so-called “macro-archaeological” work that includes discerning rates of cultural diversification and extinction (Perreault 2019).

7. Conclusions

Some of the early philosophical and methodological skirmishes over cultural evolution focused on grand visions for the promise of the approach. So, for example, Mesoudi, Whiten, and Laland (2006) argued that the social sciences had stagnated, while the biological sciences had shown significant progress. They suggested that this pointed towards an evolutionary synthesis within the social sciences that would parallel biology’s own, and which would have a form of natural selection at its core. Perhaps unsurprisingly, such a bold set of claims attracted vigorous responses that were equally sweeping; Tim Ingold (2007) aimed to diagnose fundamental flaws within the entire enterprise of cultural evolution; Fracchia and Lewontin (1999) suggested a series of in-principle topics (associated, for example, with phenomena of power, and with the failures of methodological individualism) which, they argued, undermined the ability of cultural evolutionary approaches to provide informative explanation.

This entry has pointed towards a different vision for cultural evolutionary work. Instead of beginning with a broad diagnosis of the supposed failures of social science, or of the presence within culture of the general conditions required for natural selection processes to act, the cultural evolution project can be understood in a more eclectic manner. It seeks to explore the significance of various forms of learning not just in humans, but in many other species. Although this article has focused primarily on humans, cultural evolutionary science increasingly investigates how learning influences adaptation and diversification in primates, birds, and fish. This prompts a series of live research questions: how widespread are these learning abilities, and why did they arise in the first place? What explains why some species possess them in apparently very different forms to others? How does change brought about by learning interact with other forms of change studied by evolutionists? What sorts of conditions are required for learning to promote long-lasting diversification within species? What sorts of conditions are required for learning to promote incremental improvements with respect to functional behaviours, or artifacts? In what ways does learning facilitate or impede the origination of other-regarding behavior, or systems of communication? An approach focusing on these sorts of questions is free to co-opt and collaborate with successful research strands in the mainstream social sciences, just as it is free to co-opt and adapt explanatory models which sometimes have their origins in disciplines like population genetics, but which can just as well have their origins in epidemiology or economics.


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