“Panentheism” is a constructed word composed of the English equivalents of the Greek terms “pan”, meaning all, “en”, meaning in, and “theism”, derived from the Greek ‘theos’ meaning God. Panentheism considers God and the world to be inter-related with the world being in God and God being in the world. While panentheism offers an increasingly popular alternative to classical theism, both panentheism and classical theistic systems affirm divine transcendence and immanence. But, classical theistic systems by prioritizing the difference between God and the world reject any influence by the world upon God while panentheism affirms the world’s influence upon God. On the other hand, while pantheism emphasizes God’s identity with the world, panentheism maintains the identity and significance of the non-divine. Anticipations of panentheistic understandings of God have occurred in both philosophical and theological writings throughout history (Hartshorne and Reese 1953; J. Cooper, 2006). However, a rich diversity of panentheistic understandings has developed in the past two centuries primarily in Christian traditions responding to scientific thought (Clayton and Peacocke 2004a). Although panentheism generally emphasizes God’s presence in the world without losing the distinct identity of either God or the world, specific forms of panentheism, drawing from different sources, explain the nature of the relationship of God to the world in a variety of ways and come to different conclusions about the nature of the significance of the world for the identity of God. Panentheists have responded to two primary criticisms: (1) the panentheistic God is a limited God, and (2) panentheism cannot be distinguished from other forms of theism such as classical theism or pantheism.
- 1. Terminology
- 2. History
- 3. Contemporary Expressions
- 4. Nature of the God/world Relation
- 5. Criticisms and Responses
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Because modern “panentheism” developed under the influence of German Idealism, Whiteheadian process philosophy, and current scientific thought, panentheists employ a variety of terms with meanings that have specialized content.
Theological terms as understood by panentheists:
- 1. Classical Theism
- Classical theism as a specific form of theism understands God as transcendent, immutable, impassible, timeless (Mullins 2020, 393). Ultimate reality is a reality which is distinct from the world (Cooper, 2008, 11; Stenmark, 2019, 30). This distinction at times develops into an ontological separation between God and the world that makes any interaction between God and the world problematic. Classical Christian theism bases God’s immanence and presence in the world on God’s transcendence. This priority of transcendence implies that God’s presence is always partial. What is crucial is God’s difference from the world. Even if God’s relationship to the world is dynamic rather than static, developing rather than fixed, divine transcendence does not allow the world to affect God.
- 2. Pantheism
- A type of theism that stresses the identity of God and the world ontologically. This identity is expressed in different manifestations so distinctions can be made, but the distinctions are temporary. There is often a strong sense of necessity in God’s creation of the world so that God as God must express deity in creation.
- 3. Transcendence
- Generally, God’s externality to the world so that God is unlimited by any other being or reality. Hegel and then Hartshorne, however, understand transcendence as including all the parts that make up the world in order to avoid any reality external to God that limits God (Whittemore 1960, 141; Davis 2019, 8 [Other Internet Resources]).
- 4. Immanence
- God’s presence and activity within the world. Panentheists assert that classical theism limits its affirmation of God’s immanence because classical theism derives God’s immanence from God’s transcendence. God is present in every situation because God is unlimited by any reality external to God. God’s transcendence makes possible God’s immanence in the world.
- 5. Kenosis
- Divine self-emptying, or withdrawal, of divine attributes. Traditionally, the choice to limit the exercise of the divine attributes resulted from the divine will whether in the case of Jesus’ human life or in God’s relation to the creation.
- 6. Essential Kenosis
- God’s nature is self-giving and other-empowering. Thomas J. Oord’s concept of essential kenosis bases the emptying of divine attributes on the divine nature rather than the divine will (Oord 2015, 158–166).
Terms influenced by the German Idealism of Hegel and Schelling:
- 1. Dialectic
- The presence of contradictory realities where the contradiction is overcome by including elements from each of the contradictory elements in a synthesis that is more than the combination of each member of the contradiction. Whitehead’s understanding of God’s redemption of evil by placing an evil event in a contrast to a good event expresses a similar understanding although he is not as explicit as Hegel in understanding all of reality as a dialectical development.
- 2. Infinite
- The obvious understanding of the infinite is as a negation of any limits such as a bounded space or time. However, many panentheists, and other thinkers (Williams 2010, 143), understand the infinite in a positive sense as the inclusion of all that is and that might be (Clayton 2008a, 152). Panentheists influenced by process philosophy emphasize that divine infinity deals with possibility not actuality (Dombrowski 2013, 253; Keller 2014, 80). In the process understanding, God contains all possibilities and presents every possible response that an actual event might make to any events from the past that influence what that event becomes.
- 3. Perichoresis
- The ontological intermingling of Christ’s divine and human natures and the ontological intermingling of the members of the Trinity (Otto 2001). This concept of intermingling has also been utilized to describe the Incarnation and the relationship between God and individuals/creation. Moltmann generalizes perichoresis to the cosmic realm by affirming the presence of God in the world and the world in God (J. Cooper 2006, 252 citing Moltmann 1985, 17).
Terms influenced by Whiteheadian process philosophy:
- 1. Internal and External Relations
- Internal relations are relations that affect the being of the related beings. External relations do not change the basic nature or essence of a being. For panentheism, the relationship between God and the world is an internal relationship in that God affects the nature of the world and the world affects the nature of God.
- 2. Dipolar
- Refers especially to God as having two basic aspects. Schelling identified these aspects as necessary and contingent. Whitehead referred to God’s primordial and consequent natures meaning that God has an eternal nature and a responsive nature. Whitehead understood all reality to be dipolar in that each event includes both physical and mental aspects in opposition to a mind-body dualism. Hartshorne identified these aspects as abstract and concrete.
- 3. Panpsychism
- In the most general description, panpsychism assumes that fundamental entities possess mental and physical properties (Göcke 2018, 208). Process panentheism and panpsychism are frequently connected although neither entails the other. The basis for the connection between panentheism and panpsychism is Whitehead’s concept that every actual occasion consists of a mental and physical pole. Whitehead understood this mental pole as always present, but Philip Clayton understands mentality as emergent (Clayton 2020).
Terms related to current scientific thought:
- 1. Research Program
- Drawing on scientific practice, a research program in philosophy involves central affirmations and auxiliary hypotheses which are consistent with available data. Consistency with data, rather than being either true or false, characterizes research programs (Clayton 2019).
- 2. Dualism
- While dualism may refer to a variety of pairs of opposites, in scientific thought and process philosophy dualism refers to the position that consciousness and matter are fundamentally different substances, or types of reality. Panentheists generally reject the dualism of consciousness and matter (Clayton 2004c, 3). As an alternative, panentheists tend to affirm that consciousness and matter are different manifestations of a basic ontological unity. This basic ontological unity may take the form of panpsychism, in which all actualities include an element of mentality. Griffin prefers the term “panexperientialism” because all actualities have an experiential component (2004, 44–45). Clayton takes an alternative approach to overcome the consciousness-material dualism by advocating strong emergence in which ontologically different types of existence develop out of the basic ontological unity (2004, 3–6). J. Leidenhag identifies difficulties with each of these approaches (2016).
- 3. Reductionism
- The properties of one scientific domain consists of properties of a more elementary scientific domain (Kim 2005, 164). Modern reductionism primarily holds that all of reality can be explained by using only physical, sub-atomic, entities and denies the existence of mental realities as a separate kind of existence. Any reference to a higher type of existence results from a lack of information about the physical entities that are involved. Causation always moves from the bottom-up, from the basic physical entities to higher forms of organization. For example, thought is caused by the physical components of the brain. Reductionism allows for weak emergence but not strong emergence and top-down causation (Davies 2006, 37). Panentheism critiques reductionism as an oversimplification of reality and the experience of reality.
- 4. Supervenience
- Generally refers to a relation between properties. Popular usage refers to one property depending on another property such as mind being a quality that supervenes on physical structures. Analytic philosophy instead emphasizes a logical relation between classes of properties with a variety of understandings of the nature of the relationship (Leuenberger 2008; McLaughlin and Bennett 2014).
- 5. Emergence
- Emergence, as a process involved in supervenience, occurs when a new property arises out of a combination of elements. The traditional example is that water emerges out of the combination of oxygen and hydrogen atoms in certain proportions. A variety of types of emergence have been identified. In part-whole emergence, the whole is more than the total of all the parts (Corning 2002). Strong emergence understands evolution to produce new and distinct levels characterized by their own laws or regularities and causal forces. Weak emergence holds that the new level follows the fundamental causal processes of physics (Clayton 2004c, 9). Strong emergence is also known as ontological emergence and weak as epistemological emergence. Many panentheists attach an emergentist sense to supervenience in which higher level properties have downward causation from the supervenient property to the underlying property (Clayton 2006a, 26–27, but see J. Leidenhag 2016 for a critique of attaching a strong emergence concept to supervenience).
- 6. Top-Down Causation
- More complex levels of objects or events affect less complex elements. A common example of top-down causation is the effect of thought upon a person’s body. This contrasts with bottom-up causation where the simple is the cause of the more complex. In bottom-up causation, physical elements cause other, more complex, objects or events. Scientists debate the possibility of top-down causation (Davies 2006).
- 7. Entanglement
- In quantum theory, the correlation of two particles that originate in a single event even though separated from each other by significant distance. Entangled objects behave in ways that cannot be predicted on the basis of their individual properties. The impossibility of prediction can be understood epistemically if behavior is considered the result of an average of many similar measurements or ontologically if behavior results from the existence of the world in an indefinite state prior to measurement. Both Bohr’s indeterministic and Bohm’s deterministic understandings of quantum theory accept this relational understanding of physical processes. Understanding the world as composed of persistent relationships among particles that are physically separated provides a model based in science for understanding God’s relation to the world. God’s influence can be present at the level of individual events although this entanglement would remain hidden from a local perspective. However, the implications of entanglement for concepts of causality become even more complex when considering the relation between God and the world. Polkinghorne suggests that causality may be active information, “pattern-forming operations” of what might be called “the causal principle”, rather than an exchange of energy (2010, 9).
Although numerous meanings have been attributed to the “in” in panentheism (Clayton 2004, 253), the more significant meanings are:
- 1. Locative meaning
- Location that is included in a broader location. For example, something may be located in a certain part of a room. Such a meaning is problematic in reference to God because of the common understanding that God is not limited by spatial categories. If spatial categories do not apply to God in ordinary usage, to say something is located in God becomes problematic. “In” then takes on metaphysical meanings.
- 2. Metaphysical basis for being
- Beings come into existence and continue to exist due to the presence of divine Being. The concept of participation in both classical theism and panentheism often includes the understanding that the world comes into being and continues to exist through taking part in God’s Being (Clayton 2008, 118–119).
- 3. Metaphysical-Epistemological basis for being
- Presence in God provides both identity and being. Karl Krause’s panentheism asserted a metaphysical structure that involved both how an entity differs from other entities (epistemological identity) and what it is in itself (ontological status) (Göcke 2013a).
- 4. Metaphysical interactive potential
- Neither God’s actions nor the world is completely determined. This lack of complete determination leads to an unpredictable self-organizing relation of both God and the world based on prior actualizations of each. “The ‘en’ designates an active indeterminacy, a commingling of unpredictable, and yet recapitulatory, self-organizing relations” (Keller 2003, 219).
- 5. Emergence metaphor
- A more complex entity comes from at least a partial source.
- 6. Mind/Body analogical meaning
- The mind provides structure and direction to the organization of the organism of the body. The world is God’s body in the sense that the world actualizes God as specifically who God is and manifests God while different from God. Many, but not all, panentheists utilize the mind/body analogy to describe the God/world relation in a manner that emphasizes the immanence of God without loss of God’s transcendence.
- 7. Part/Whole analogical meaning
- A particular exists in relation to something that is greater and different from any of its parts and the total sum of the parts. The world is in God because the world shares in the greater unity of God’s being and action.
In 1821, Karl Krause (1781–1832) used the explicit label of “panentheism” for apparently the first time. (See Pfeifer 2020, 123, especially n. 1 for a brief discussion about the first explicit use of the term “panentheism”.) However, various advocates and critics of panentheism find evidence of incipient or implicit forms of panentheism present in religious thought as early as 1300 BCE. Hartshorne discovers the first indication of panentheistic themes in Ikhnaton (1375–1358 BCE), the Egyptian pharaoh often considered the first monotheist. In his poetic description of the sun god, Ikhnaton avoids both the separation of God from the world that will characterize theism and the identification of God with the world that will characterize pantheism (Hartshorne 1953, 29–30). Early Vedantic thought implies panentheism in non-Advaita forms that understand non-dualism as inclusive of differences. Although there are texts referring to Brahman as contracted and identical to Brahman, other texts speak of Brahman as expanded. In these texts, the perfect includes and surpasses the total of imperfect things as an appropriation of the imperfect. Although not the dominant interpretation of the Upanishads, multiple intimations of panentheism are present in the Upanishads (Whittemore 1988, 33, 41–44). Hartshorne finds additional religious concepts of God that hold the unchanging and the changing together in a way that allows for the development and significance of the non-divine in Lao-Tse (fourth century BCE) and in the Judeo-Christian scriptures (1953, 32–38).
In philosophical reflection, Plato (427/428–348/347 BCE) plays a role in the development of implicit panentheism although there is disagreement about the nature of that role. Hartshorne drew a dipolar understanding of God that includes both immutability and mutability from Plato. Hartshorne understood Plato’s concept of the divine to include the Forms as pure and unchanging being and the World soul as changing and in motion. Although he concluded that Plato never reconciled these two elements in his understanding of the divine, both aspects were present (1953, 54). J. Cooper, instead, maintains that Plato retained an essential distinction between the Good and the other beings that Plato called gods. According to J. Cooper, Plotinus (204–270 CE) rather than Plato provided the basis for panentheism with his description of the physical world as an emanation of being from the One making the world part of the Ultimate (2006, 35–39). However, Baltzly finds evidence in the Timaeus of a polytheistic view that can be identified as panentheistic (2010).
From Plato to Schelling (1775–1854 CE), various theologians and philosophers developed ideas that are similar to themes in contemporary panentheism. These ideas developed as expressions of theism. Proclus (412–485 CE) and Pseudo-Dionysus (late Fifth to early Sixth century) drawing upon Plotinus developed perspectives in which the world came from God and understood the relationship between God and the world as a dialectical relationship in which the world came from God and returned to God (J. Cooper 2006, 42–46). In the Middle Ages, the influence of Neoplatonism continued in the thought of Eriugena (815–877 CE), Eckhart (1260–1328 CE), Nicholas of Cusa (1401–1464 CE), and Boehme (1575–1624 CE). Although accused of pantheism by their contemporaries, their systems can be identified as panentheistic because they understood God in various ways as including the world rather than being the world and because they used a dialectical method. The dialectical method involved the generation of opposites and then the reconciliation of the opposition in God. This retained the distinct identity of God in God’s influence of the world (J. Cooper 2006, 47–62). During the early modern period, Bruno (1548–1600 CE) and Spinoza (1631–1677 CE) responded to the dualism of classical theism by emphasizing the relationship between God and the world to the point that the nature of any ontological distinction between God and the world became problematic. Later thinkers such as the Cambridge Platonists (Seventeenth century), Jonathan Edwards (1703–1758 CE) (Crisp 2009), and Friedrich Schleiermacher (1768–1834 CE) thought of the world as in some way in God or a development from God. Although they did not stress the ontological distinction between God and the world, they did emphasize the responsive relationship that humans have to God. Human responsiveness assumed some degree of human initiative if not freedom, which indicates some distinction between God and humans. The assumption of some degree of human initiative was a reaction against the loss of freedom due to Spinoza’s close identification between God and the world (J. Cooper 2006, 64–90).
The nineteenth and twentieth centuries saw the development of panentheism as a specific position regarding God’s relationship to the world. The awareness of panentheism as an alternative to classical theism and pantheism developed out of a complex of approaches. Philosophical idealism and philosophical adaptation of the scientific concept of evolution provided the basic sources of the explicit position of panentheism. Philosophical approaches applying the concept of development to God reached their most complete expression in process philosophy’s understanding of God being affected by the events of the world.
Hegel (1770–1831) and Schelling (1775–1854) sought to retain the close relationship between God and the world that Spinoza proposed without identifying God with the world. Their concept of God as developing in and through the world provided the means for accomplishing this. Prior to this time, God had been understood as unchanging and the world as changing while existing in God (J. Cooper 2006, 90). Schelling’s understanding of God as personal provided the basis for the unity of the diversity in the world in a manner that was more open than Hegel’s understanding. Schelling emphasized the freedom of the creatures in relation to the necessity of God’s nature as love. For Schelling, God’s free unfolding of God’s internal subjective necessity did not result in an external empirical necessity determining the world (Clayton 2000, 474). This relationship resulted in vitality and on-going development. Hartshorne classified this as a dipolar understanding of God in that God is both necessary and developing (1953, 234). J. Cooper describes Schelling’s thought as dynamic cooperative panentheism (2006, 95). Hegel found Schelling inadequate and sought a greater unity for the diversity. He united Fichte’s subjective idealism and Schelling’s objective idealism to provide a metaphysics of subjectivity rather than substance (Clayton 2008a, 125). Hegel’s unification of Fichte and Schelling resulted in a more comprehensive and consistent system still based upon change in God. God as well as nature is characterized by dialectical development. In his rejection of pantheism, Hegel understood the infinite as including the finite by absorbing the finite into its own fuller nature. This retained divine transcendence in the sense of the divine surpassing its parts although not separate from the parts (Whittemore 1960, 141–142). The divine transcendence provided unity through the development of the Absolute through history. Karl Krause (1781–1832) in 1828 labeled Schelling’s and Hegel’s positions as “panentheism” in order to emphasize their differences from Spinoza’s identification of God with the world (Atmanspacher and von Sas 2017, 1032). J. Cooper describes Hegel’s panentheism as dialectical historical panentheism (2006, 107).
As Darwin’s theory of evolution introduced history into the conceptualization of biology, Samuel Alexander (1859–1938), Henri Bergson (1859–1941), and C. Lloyd Morgan (1852–1936) introduced development into the ways in which all of physical reality was conceptualized. They then worked out positions that in a variety of ways understood God and the world as growing in relationship to each other. Although Hartshorne’s classification of “panentheism” did not include Alexander in the category of “panentheism,” only occasionally mentioned Bergson, and made no reference to Morgan, Whitehead referred to all three of these thinkers positively. It may be too strong to claim that they influenced Whitehead (Emmett 1992), but they did provide the background for Whitehead’s and then Hartshorne’s systematic development of process philosophy as an expression of panentheism. Hartshorne popularized the modern use of the term “panentheism” and considered Whitehead to be the outstanding panentheist (Hartshorne 1953, 273). Although Hartshorne made several modifications to Whitehead’s understanding of God, the basic structures of Whitehead’s thought were continued in Hartshorne’s further development of Whitehead’s philosophy (Ford 1973, Cobb 1965). God, for process philosophy, is necessary for any actual world. Without God, the world would be nothing more than an unchanging existence radically different from the actual world of experience. God as both eternal and temporal provides possibilities that call the world to change and develop. God as eternal provides an actual source of those possibilities. However, if God is only eternal, the possibilities would be unrelated to the actual world as it presently exists. Thus, Whitehead and Hartshorne understand the world to be present in God in order for the possibilities that lead to development to be related to the world (Hartshorne 1953, 273). The implication of God’s inclusion of the world is that God is present to the world and the world influences God. Although the presence of the world in God could be understood as a form of pantheism, process philosophy avoids collapsing the world into God or God into the world by maintaining a distinction between God and the world. This distinction is manifest in the eternality of God and the temporality of the world. It is also apparent in the freedom of the events in the world. Although God presents possibilities to the events in the world, each event “decides” how it will actualize those possibilities. The freedom of each event, the absence of divine determination, provides a way for process thought to avoid God being the cause of evil or containing evil as evil. Since God includes the events of the world, God will include the evil as well as the good that occurs in the world and this evil will affect God since the world affects God’s actualization. But, because God does not determine the response of each event to the possibilities that God presents, any event may reject God’s purpose of good through the intensification of experience and actualize a less intense experience. God does take this less intense, evil, experience into God’s self, but redeems that evil by means of relating it to the ways in which good has been actualized. Thus, God saves what can be saved from the world rather than simply including each event in isolation from other events (J. Cooper 2006, 174, 180).
3. Contemporary Expressions
Although recent developments of panentheism tend to continue the German Idealist tradition or the tradition of process philosophy, contemporary panentheism demonstrates great diversity (see Michael Brierley 2004, 3). Many of these contemporary expressions of panentheism involve scientists and protestant theologians or philosophers. But, articulations of forms of panentheism have also developed among feminists, in the Roman Catholic tradition, in the Orthodox tradition, and in religions other than Christianity.
Utilizing resources from the tradition of German Idealism, Jürgen Moltmann developed a form of panentheism in his early work, The Crucified God in 1974 (1972 for the German original), where he said that the suffering and renewal of all humanity are taken into the life of the Triune God. He explicated his understanding of panentheism more fully in The Trinity and the Kingdom in 1981. Theological concerns motivate Moltmann’s concept of panentheism. Panentheism avoids the arbitrary concept of creation held by classical theism and the loss of creaturely freedom that occurs in Christian pantheism (J. Cooper 2006, 248). Moltmann understands panentheism to involve both God in the world and the world in God. The relationship between God and the world is like the relationship among the members of the Trinity in that it involves relationships and communities (Molnar 1990, 674). Moltmann uses the concept of perichoresis to describe this relationship of mutual interpenetration. By using the concept of perichoresis, Moltmann moves away from a Hegelian understanding of the trinity as a dialectical development in history (J. Cooper 2006, 251). The relationship between God and the world develops because of God’s nature as love that seeks the other and the free response of the other (Molnar 1990, 677). Moltmann does not consider creation necessary for God nor the result of any inner divine compulsion. Instead creation is the result of God’s essential activity as love rather than the result of God’s self-determination (Molnar 1990, 679). This creation occurs in a process of interaction between nothingness and creativity, contraction and expansion, in God. Because there is no “outside” of God due to God’s infinity, God must withdraw in order for creation to exist. Kenosis, or God’s self-emptying, occurs in creation as well as in the incarnation. The nothing in the doctrine of “creation from nothing” is the primordial result of God’s contraction of God’s essential infinity (J. Cooper 2006, 247). Moltmann finds that panentheism as mutual interpenetration preserves unity and difference in a variety of differences in kind such as God and human being, person and nature, and the spiritual and the sensuous (Moltmann 1996, 307).
In his process panentheism, David Ray Griffin assumes that scientific understandings of the world are crucial and recognizes the implications of scientific understanding for theology. However, his concept of panentheism builds on the principles of process philosophy rather than scientific concepts directly. Griffin traces modern atheism to the combination of understanding perception as exclusively based on physical sensations, accepting a naturalistic explanation of reality, and identifying matter as the only reality. But, the emergence of mind challenges the adequacy of this contemporary worldview (2004, 40–41). He claims that the supernaturalistic form of theism with its emphasis upon the divine will does not provide an adequate alternative to the atheism of the late modern worldview because God becomes the source of evil. Griffin argues that supernaturalistic theism makes God the source of evil because God’s will establishes the general principles of the universe (2004, 37). Process panentheism provides a way to avoid the problems of both materialistic naturalism and classical theism (2004, 42). Griffin’s panexperientialism bases sensory perception on a non-sensory mode of perception in order to explain both the mind-body interaction and the God-world interaction. God and the world are different entities but both are actual. They are numerically distinct but ontologically the same, in Griffin’s terms, avoiding dualism and supernaturalism. God and events in the world interact through non-sensory perception (2004, 44–45). Through this interaction, God can influence but not determine the world, and the world can influence God’s concrete states without changing God’s essence. Process panentheism recognizes two aspects of the divine, an abstract and unchanging essence and a concrete state that involves change. Through this dipolar concept, God both influences and is influenced by the world (2004, 43–44). Griffin understands God as essentially the soul of the universe although distinct from the world. The idea of God as the soul of the world stresses the intimacy and direct relationship of God’s relationship to the world, not the emergence of the soul from the world (2004, 44). Relationality is part of the divine essence, but this does not mean that this specific world is necessary to God. This world came into existence from relative nothingness. This relative nothingness was a chaos that lacked any individual that sustained specific characteristics over time. However, even in the chaos prior to the creation of this world, events had some degree of self-determination and causal influence upon subsequent events. These fundamental causal principles along with God exist naturally since these causal principles are inherent in things that exist including the nature of God. The principles cannot be broken because such an interruption would be a violation of God’s nature. An important implication of the two basic causal principles, a degree of self-determination and causal influence, is that God influences but does not determine other events (2004, 43). Griffin’s understanding of naturalism allows for divine action that is formally the same in all events. But this divine action can occur in a variable manner so that some acts are especially revelatory of the divine character and purpose (2004, 45).
The context of the science and religion discussion responds to the early modern concept of an unchanging natural order which posed a challenge to understandings of divine action in the world. The current discussion draws on the development of scientific information about the natural world that can contribute to religious efforts to explain how God acts in the world. Arthur Peacocke and Paul Davies have made important contributions as scientists interested in, and knowledgeable about, religion. Peacocke developed his understanding of panentheism beginning in 1979 and continuing through works in 2001, 2004, and 2006. Peacocke starts with the shift in the scientific understanding of the world from a mechanism to the current understandings of the world as a unity composed of complex systems in a hierarchy of different levels. These emergent levels do not become different types of reality but instead compose a unity that can be understood naturally as an emergentist monism. At the same time, the different levels of complexity cannot be reduced to an explanation of one type or level of complexity. The creative dynamic of the emergence of complexity in hierarchies is immanent in the world rather than external to the world (Peacocke 2004, 137–142). Similarly, Paul Davies describes the universe by talking about complexity and higher levels of organization in which participant observers bring about a more precise order (2007). An important scientific aspect of this concept of complexity and organization is the notion of entanglement especially conceptual level entanglement (Davies 2006, 45–48). Again, the organization, which makes life possible, is an internal, or natural, order rather than an order imposed from outside of the universe (Davies 2004). Peacocke draws upon this contemporary scientific understanding of the universe to think about the relationship between God and the natural world. He rejects any understanding of God as external to nature whether it is a theistic understanding where God intervenes in the natural world or a deistic understanding where God initiates the natural world but does not continue to be active in the world. For Peacocke, God continuously creates through the processes of the natural order. God’s active involvement is not an additional, external influence upon events. However, God is not identified with the natural processes, which are the action of God as Creator (Peacocke 2004, 143–144). Peacocke identifies his understanding of God’s relation to the world as panentheism because of its rejection of external interactions by God in favor of God always working from inside the universe. At the same time, God transcends the universe because God is more than the universe in the sense of God being unlimited by the world. This panentheistic model combines a stronger emphasis upon God’s immanence with God’s ultimate transcendence over the universe by using a model of personal agency (Peacocke 2004, 147–151). Davies also refers to his understanding of the role of laws in nature as panentheism rather than deism because God chose laws that give a co-creative role to nature (2004, 104).
Philip Clayton begins with contemporary scientific understandings of the world and combines them with theological concepts drawn from a variety of sources including process theology. He describes God’s relationship with the world as an internal rather than an external relationship. Understanding God’s relationship as internal to the world recognizes the validity of modern scientific understandings that do not require any external source in order to account for the order in the world. At the same time, God’s internal presence provides the order and regularity that the world manifests (2001, 208–210). Clayton agrees that the world is in God and God is in the world. Panentheism, according to him, affirms the interdependence of God and the world (2004a, 83). This affirmation became possible as a result of the rejection of substantialistic language in favor of personal language in thinking of God. Substantialistic language excludes all other actualities from any one actuality. Rejection of substantialistic language thus allows for the interaction of beings. Clayton cites Hegel’s recognition that the logic of the infinite requires the inclusion of the finite in the infinite and points towards the presence of the world in God (Clayton 2004a, 78–79). Clayton, along with Joseph Bracken (1974, 2004), identifies panentheism as Trinitarian and kenotic (Clayton 2005, 255). It is Trinitarian because the world participates in God in a manner analogous to the way that members of the Trinity participate in each other although the world is not and does not become God. God freely decides to limit God’s infinite power in an act of kenosis in order to allow for the existence of non-divine reality. The divine kenotic decision results in the actuality of the world that is taken into God. But, for Clayton, God’s inclusion of finite being as actual is contingent upon God’s decision rather than necessary to God’s essence (2003, 214). Clayton affirms creation from nothing as a description of creaturely existence prior to God’s decision. The involvement of the world in an internal relationship with God does not completely constitute the divine being for Clayton. Instead, God is both primordial, or eternal, and responsive to the world. The world does constitute God’s relational aspect but not the totality of God (2005, 250–254). The best way to describe the interdependence between God and the world for Clayton is through the concept of emergence. Emergence may be explanatory, epistemological, or ontological. Ontological understandings of emergence, which Clayton supports, hold (1) monism but not physicalism, (2) properties emerge in objects from the potentiality of an object that cannot be previously identified in the object’s parts or structure, (3) the emergence of new properties giving rise to distinct levels of causal relations, and (4) downward causation of the emergent level upon prior levels (2006a, 2–4). Emergence recognizes that change is important to the nature of the world and challenges views of God as unchanging (Clayton 2006b, 320).
A number of feminists advocate panentheism by critiquing traditional understandings of transcendence for continuing dualistic ways of thinking. Feminist panentheists conceive of the divine as continuous with the world rather than being ontologically transcendent over the world (Frankenberry 2011). Sallie McFague’s use of metaphors in both theology and science led her to describe the world as God’s body. McFague bases the metaphorical nature of all statements about God upon panentheism (2001, 30). Furthermore, for McFague, panentheism sees the world as in God which gives priority to God’s name but includes each person’s name and preserves their distinctiveness in the divine reality (2001, 5). God’s glory becomes manifest in God’s total self-giving to the world so that transcendence becomes immanence rather than being understood as God’s power manifest in distant control of the world. Grace Jantzen also uses the metaphor of the world as God’s body. Additionally, Jantzen (1998) and Gloria Schaab (2007) have proposed metaphors about the womb and midwifery to describe God’s relation to the world. Anna Case-Winters challenges McFague’s metaphor of the world as God’s body. Case-Winters acknowledges that this metaphor maintains God’s personal nature, offers a coherent way to talk about God’s knowledge of and action in the world, recognizes God’s vulnerable suffering love, and revalues nature and embodiment. But at least McFague’s early use of the world-as-God’s-body metaphor tended towards pantheism and even her later introduction of an agential role for the divine still retains the possibility of the loss of the identity of the world. Case-Winters uses Jay McDaniel’s (1989) distinction between emanational, arising out of the being of the One, and relational, present through relationship, understandings of God’s immanence in the world to establish a form of panentheism with a clearer distinction between God and the world. The world is an “other” in relation to God rather than being a direct expression of God’s own being through emanation for Case-Winters (30–32). Nancy Frankenberry contrasts McFague’s and Case-Winter’s two concepts of transcendence to the traditional hierarchical concept of transcendence. McFague’s concept is one of total immanence while Case-Winters holds a dialectic between individual transcendence and immanence (2011). Frankenberry suggests that pantheism may provide a more direct repudiation of male domination than panentheism provides (1993).
Although much of the development of panentheism takes place in the context of the Christian tradition, connections between other world religions and panentheism have been identified. These connections range from explicitly panentheistic traditions, to similarities to specific beliefs and practices of a tradition, to beliefs and practices that could be developed into panentheistic positions. Hartshorne in his discussion of panentheism included a section on Hinduism (1953). Lorilai Biernacki considers Hinduism to be one of the most panentheistic traditions (Biernacki 2014b). The concept of the world as the body of the divine offers a strong similarity to Western panentheism. The Gita identifies the whole world, including all the gods and living creatures, as the Divine body. But the Divine Being has its own body that contains the world while being more than the world. While the Upanishads acknowledge the body of the Divine at times, the body of the divine is never identified as the cosmos. Most of the Tantrics hold a pantheistic view in which the practitioner is a manifestation of the divine. Abhinavagupta, in the tenth century, provided the first panentheistic understanding of the world as God’s body. For him, differentiation is Shiva concealing his wholeness. Abhinavagupta also insisted that Shiva transcends the cosmos (Bilimoria and Stansell 2010, 244–258; Clayton 2010, 187–189; and Barua 2010, 1–30. See also Hardy 2016; Silberstein 2017; and Stavig 2017). Other traditions where connections to panentheism have been found include Judaism (Artson 2014 and Langton 2016), Jainism (Chapple 2014), Confucianism (Lee 2014), Buddhism (Samuel 2014), and Sufism (Sharify-Funk and Dickson 2014). While these connections might imply a universalistic theology, panentheism affirms the importance of all religions and supports inter-religions dialogue (Biernacki 2014a, 6, 10).
4. The Nature of the God/world Relation
The use of metaphors to describe the relationship between God and the world has been challenged in the broader panentheistic discussion about how to describe the relationship between God and the world. McFague argues that any attempt to do theology requires the use of metaphor (2001, 30) and for Peacocke the limitation of language requires the use of models and metaphors in describing both God and the cosmos (Schaab 2008, 13). The primary objection to the dominant metaphor in panentheism of the world as God’s body is the substantialistic implications of the term “body” that lead either to an ontological separation between the world and God or to a loss of identity for God or the world. Clayton proposes different levels of metaphor as the most adequate way to reconcile the conflict between divine action and the integrity of the created realm (2003, 208). Further, Bracken finds that the soul–body metaphor lacks clarity about the freedom and self-identity of the creatures in relations to God (1992, 211). Case-Winters faults the soul–body metaphor for tending to see the soul as dominating the body and failing to recognize the world as a unified organism (1995, 251, 254).
Further, describing the God–world relation by use of the term “in” lacks precision in understanding the ontological nature of the relation due to the variety of meanings of “in”. Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph Schelling used the phrase “Pan+en+theism” in his “Essay on Freedom” in 1809 where the “en” meant inherence as strong ontological dependence and referred to participation as a relation to the divine (Clayton 2008a, 169). Karl Krause (1781–1832) created the German term translated as “panentheism” seeking to overcome the split between humanity and nature that was expressed both in the supernaturalist theism epitomized by Leibniz and the naturalism of Spinoza’s pantheism (Gregersen 2004, 28). Metaphysical understandings of God’s relation to the world have been proposed that are more precise than metaphors or “in”. Schelling’s German idealism understood God as freely unfolding emanation by introducing subjectivity. Emanation avoids ontological separation between God and the world because the world participates in the infinite as its source (Clayton 2000, 477–481). Krause understood the world’s participation in God both ontologically and epistemically. The particularity of each existent being depends upon the Absolute for its existence as what it is (Göcke 2013a, 372). Keller offers another metaphysical understanding by arguing for creation out of chaos. She rejects substance metaphysics and describes the relation between God and the world as a complex relationality involving an active indeterminacy and past realities (2003, 219). Finally the science and religion discussion provides another metaphysical understanding by drawing upon scientific concepts of supervenience, emergence, downward causation, and entanglement to provide a ground for theological concepts of God’s relation to the world.
The nature of a panentheistic mutual relationship between the infinite and the finite is crucial to the claim by panentheism to be a creative alternative to classical Christian theism and pantheism. Unlike classical Christian theism which prioritizes transcendence by deriving divine immanence from divine transcendence, panentheism balances divine transcendence and immanence (Clayton 2020). In the classical Christian understanding, divine transcendence is based on the ontological difference in substance between God and the world making interaction between the two distinct substances impossible (Schaab 2006, 547, 548). The panentheistic mutual relation also differs from pantheism which prioritizes divine immanence by identifying the infinite with the finite. The nature of this mutual relationship basically depends upon the understanding of the ontology of each member of the relationship. The issue is the nature of being for God and for the world as the basis for mutual influence between God and the world. A variety of attempts have sought to describe the nature of God’s being and the world’s being in their relationship. Thomistic thought utilizes a concept of analogy as it wrestles with the nature of the being of God and the being of the world (Malloy 2014). Others in considering God’s action in the world posit the necessity of ontological difference between God and finite reality (M. Leidenhag 2014, 219). Process thought directly addresses the issue of ontology by calling for an ontology that does not consider substance as the basic type of existence because substance does not allow for internal relations (Bracken 2014, 10). According to Wesley Wildman the relations between entities are ontologically more fundamental than the entities themselves for relational ontology in contrast to substantivist ontology where entities are ontologically primary and relations derivative (2010, 55).
Historically, participation, Hegelian dynamic ontology, and process dynamic ontology have been utilized to describe the ontological basis for the relations between God and the world. Participation has philosophical antecedents in Plato and Aristotle and was utilized in Augustinian and Orthodox Christian traditions. In participation, the existence of the world somehow takes part in God’s being. Early modern usage of the concept of participation appears in the thought of Krause (1781–1832) and Sergei Bulgakov (1871–1944). Krause identifies the character of every thing as the result of its participation in the original unity of the Absolute. But the Absolute is still different in its internal constitution from its parts (Göcke 2013a, 372). Bulgakov describes participation as the inclusion of the finite by the Absolute (Gavrilyuk 2015, 453). Hegelian dynamic ontology describes an Infinite which gives rise to the finite through a dialectical process of negation. The finite through a second reciprocal negation of its finitude brings about union and return in transformation to both the Infinite and the finite (Williams 2010, 143). Process dynamic ontology understands God as dipolar with a primordial nature that is eternal and a consequent nature that includes the actualizations achieved by the world. God presents possibilities to the events of the world which then make decisions bringing about actualities that are then included in God.
Bracken and Cazalis seek to make the ontological nature of the relation more precise. Bracken proposes a Trinitarian field theory to explain the world’s presence in God. The world is a large but finite field of activity within the all-comprehensive field of activity constituted by the three divine persons in ongoing relations with each other and with all the creation (2009, 159). Bracken’s Trinitarian field theory draws on systems theory from science, Whitehead’s concept of society, and Christian Trinitarian doctrine. A society as a type of system is a group of entities with an organizing principle. Basically, reality is an all-encompassing society in which subsocieties operate in their own ways as distinct. God functions as the regnant subsociety and receives the richness of the information from the world of creation (Bracken 2014, 80). Bracken summarizes this system understanding of panentheism in three conclusions: (1) systems are social rather than individual, can be combined horizontally and vertically, change over time due to changes in constituents, and do not make decisions; (2) the three divine persons and all their creatures are together constituent members of an expanded divine life-system; and (3) the relationships of the various levels of societies involve both bottom-up causation and an objective formal top-down causation of the constraints of higher order systems on lower order systems (2015a, 223). Although not as fully developed as Bracken’s society explanation, Cazalis uses category theory and the concept of adjunction in order to offer an internal law that gives specificity to panentheism. In this approach relations go both ways between two categories and the link carries the universal property from one element of a given category to another category (Cazalis 2016, 210).
5. Criticisms and Responses
Panentheism continues to grow and change. Much of this growth has taken place as a result of advances in science and conversations with science. This growth has led to diverse forms of panentheism such as soteriological, revelational or expressivist, and dipolar (Gregersen 2004, 21). The variety of forms of panentheism has also resulted in different degrees of panentheism ranging from explicit fully developed panentheism to vague and underdeveloped forms of panentheism and to expressions of theism that share certain concepts with fully developed forms of panentheism. Michael Brierley lists three premises as distinctive to panentheism: God is not separate from the cosmos, God is affected by the cosmos, and God is more than the cosmos (2006, 639–640). Fully developed panentheism includes thinkers such as Charles Hartshorne, Phillip Clayton, Leonardo Boff, Peter Hodgson, John Macquarrie, Sallie McFague, Jürgen Moltmann, and Arthur Peacocke who have identified themselves as panentheists. Other thinkers such as Paul Tillich have rarely self-identified as panentheists but share concepts with panentheism (Burch 1998, 251). And finally, especially through world religions and early theologies various forms of theism offer diversity sharing certain concepts with panentheism.
Another impetus for development has been criticisms of panentheism. These criticisms have taken two forms. One form, by major alternatives to panentheistic understandings of the God-world relation, has criticized the adequacy of panentheism. Panentheism faces challenges both from those who resist any lessening of the emphasis upon divine transcendence and from those who find pantheism more adequate than any system distinguishing between God and the world. Recently, an important criticism, especially from Analytic theology, has been that panentheism lacks the distinctiveness needed to identify it precisely enough to distinguish it from other forms of theism, critique it, and further its development. Finally, the variety of the versions of panentheism has led to an active internal discussion among the various versions.
Criticisms of panentheism from major alternatives such as pantheists and scientists working with naturalist assumptions criticize panentheism for its metaphysical claim that there is a being above or other than the natural world. At times, this criticism has been made by claiming that a thorough-going naturalism does not need a transcendent, individualized reality. Robert Corrington describes the development of his thought as a growing awareness that panentheism unnecessarily introduces a being above nature as well as in nature (2002, 49). William Drees expresses a similar criticism by arguing that all contemporary explanations of human agency, including non-reductionist explanations, are naturalistic and do not require any reference to a higher being. For panentheists to claim that divine agency is analogous to human agency fails both to recognize that human agency requires no additional source or cause and to explain how a divine source of being could act in the realm of physical and mental processes (1999). Frankenberry makes this objection more specific. Panentheism offers a more complex relationship between God and the world than is necessary. This unnecessary complexity is revealed by the problems that panentheism has with the logic of the freedom of parts in wholistic relations, the possibility of the body-soul analogy relapsing into gender inflected ideas of the soul as the male principle, the problem with simultaneity of events in the divine experience in relation to the principle of the relativity of time, the necessity of the everlasting nature of value, and finally the use of the ontological argument to establish the necessity of the abstract pole of the divine nature (1993, 36–39). Carl Gillett points out that panentheism lacks an explanation for a causal efficacy higher than the causal efficacy realized by microphysical causation (2003, 19). Generally, panentheists respond to these criticisms by claiming the inadequacy both scientifically and metaphysically of any type of reductionistic naturalism. Such a naturalism whether articulated in scientific categories or religious categories fails to recognize the emergence of levels of complexity in nature. The emergence of higher levels of organization that cannot be completely explained in terms of lower levels renders non-differentiated accounts of being inadequate. Panentheists often argue that the emergence of higher levels of order makes possible downward causation. Davies describes the difficulties in coming to a clear description of downward causation and concludes that the complexity of systems open to the environment makes room for downward causation but has not yet provided an explanation of how downward causation works (2006, 48). The concepts of entanglement and divine entanglement may offer a new perspective on causation and especially the role of the divine in natural causation (Wegter-McNelly 2011).
Traditional Christian theists raise different critiques of panentheism. Experiential critiques question the ability of panentheism to provide a God worthy of worship (Nash 1983, 117). One response to this critique is to question the definition of “worthy of worship”. Brian Leftow suggests that any definition of God as meriting worship includes a conceptually appropriate object that is aware of the world and being superior to the world in some way (2016, 70). A closely related experiential critique is that the panentheistic God is unable to guarantee a future good. While panentheists agree that human freedom logically precludes God’s prevention of future evil that results from human choice, many affirm that God’s response to unpreventable evil is that God suffers with the person suffering evil. However God’s suffering with a person does not offer any guarantee that evil will be overcome. But, the support of a relationship with God may offer a basis for the hope of overcoming evil.
These experiential criticisms express underlying theological critiques. The dominant theological criticism of panentheism is that God is unable to guarantee the defeat of evil. Clayton and Bracken respond by maintaining that the world does influence God but God’s will, expressed through the decisions that God makes, protects God’s ability to save (Clayton 2005). Moltmann describes God’s essence as directing God’s activity in order to maintain the reliability of God as love acting on behalf of creation. Moltmann does not find it necessary to protect divine freedom by giving it priority over divine love but rather understands freedom as acting according to the divine nature of love (Moltmann 1981, 98, 99). J. Cooper challenges this response by criticizing panentheism for holding a concept of God that can save through the general processes of nature but not in any distinctive way. Kevin Vanhoozer’s concern about divine freedom is based on a similar concern (1998, 250). But, Griffin’s discussion of divine variable action does allow for specific and distinctive manifestations of divine love (2004, 45). Alexander Jensen also criticizes the ability of the panentheist concept to save by distinguishing between salvation by God and salvation through agents of their own salvation (2014, 12–13). For him, a process panentheist’s God can only draw and persuade rather than save (Jensen 2014, 128). Kenneth Pak concludes that an open future makes any ultimate victory over evil impossible (Pak 2014, 223–224). In response, B. Cooper lists five ways in which a process theology supports God’s power over other realities: (1) ontological priority in providing definition, (2) universality to all actuality, (3) as the ground of novelty, (4) as the ground and preserver of all value, and (5) the unconditioned character of God’s integrity as seeking to increase value in the world and love towards the world (1974, 102). Palmyre Oomen finds three similar elements in Whitehead’s thought that relate to God’s governing and sustaining the world: (1) God originates all occasions by presenting the initial aim which provides some direction against evil, (2) God preserves all that can be preserved, and (3) God as everlasting means that no occasion can overcome God forever (2015, 287–288). An additional criticism is that since God and the world are interdependent in the classic panentheism of Hegel and Whitehead, God is not free to choose to create and to save. The necessity of the world for God loses grace as the source of creation and redemption. God’s provision of salvation then becomes necessary rather than free. While Roger Olson questions whether or not a classic panentheist can hold to creation from nothing (Olson 2012, in Other Internet Resources), Clayton affirms creation from nothing as consistent with panentheism (2008). Ultimately the panentheist response is that God’s nature as love directs God’s actions bringing salvation. God’s nature as love is the crucial aspect of divine action rather than a causal efficacy. The emphasis of classical theism on divine will misses that the divine will is directed by divine love (Oord 2015; Molnar, 1990, 679).
Metaphysical critiques of panentheism provide a basis for both the theological and experiential criticisms made by Christian theists. Four types of metaphysical critiques have been made. One criticism is that panentheism fails to maintain an ontological distinction between God and the world (M. Leidenhag 2014, 215, 219, 220). While panentheism identifies differences between God and the world, the distinction is one of characteristics rather than one of being. Although different forms of panentheism understand similarities and differences between God and the world in different ways, both Hegel and Whitehead refer to differences between God and the world that are important. Hegel’s dialectical panentheism distinguishes between God prior to creation and creation in God (Tabaczek 2013, 151). Whitehead describes God as non-temporal and events composing the world as temporal (Bracken 2015, 542). Clayton identifies the difference between God and creation as differences in essence and function (2001,210). The modal status of the world in relation to God provides a related challenge to panentheism. Göcke concludes that the significant difference between panentheism and classical theism is that according to panentheism the world is an intrinsic property of God while classical theism holds that the world is an extrinsic property of God (2013b, 74). A third type of critique is that panentheism holds an inadequate concept of transcendence. According to J. Cooper, if God’s transcendence does not infinitely exceed God’s immanence, God’s presence, knowledge, and power are limited rather than complete, immediate, and unconditioned (2006, 322–328). Whitehead’s understanding of God’s transcendence is limited because God only influences events before or after the decisions of the events. God cannot be present simultaneously with the event. Likewise, Hegel’s denial of divine simplicity makes ontological difference between God and the world impossible thus limiting God’s transcendence (Tabaczek 2013, 151, 154). While Clayton and others have identified top-down causation as indicating God’s vertical transcendence, Jensen finds this inadequate because they are unable to identify clearly God’s presence in the causal nexus of the world (2014, 131). However, Bracken rejects the necessity of a causal joint when both top-down and bottom-up causation take place (2014, 10). Also, Clayton counters that few process panentheists accept a full equality between finite actual occasions and the divine actual occasion or occasions. God being the chief exemplification of creativity indicates a difference between God and actual occasions and thus a vertical transcendence (Clayton 2015b, 27). Finally, Bracken’s field understanding of panentheism gives priority to God as the regent subsociety (2014, 79–80). The fourth metaphysical criticism grows out of a technical aspect of Whitehead’s cosmology, the relation between creativity and God. Whitehead attributes metaphysical ultimacy to creativity and understands God as the primordial manifestation of creativity. This appears to leave God in a secondary position (Hosinski 2015, 275). John B. Cobb, Jr. resolves the problem of the priority of creativity by identifying creativity as an abstract metaphysical principle rather than an actuality more important than God (1982, 126 and see Nobharu 2015, 499). Bracken considers creativity to be the systematic whole rather than a greater reality than God (1992, 216, 214).
Analytic theology (Jeanine Diller and Asa Kasher, eds. 2013; Andrei A. Buckareff and Yujin Nagasawa, eds. 2016) offers a different type of critique of panentheism. Analytical approaches to panentheism critique panentheism as lacking a distinctive identity making careful identification, research, and development of a distinctive position impossible. Two responses to this challenge to identify the distinctiveness of panentheism have developed. One response seeks to identify a defining characteristic. The second response affirms the richness of diversity and suggest certain commonalities distinguish panentheism from other forms of theism.
Benedikt Göcke’s effort to identify a specific characteristic of panentheism notes the similarities of classical theism and panentheism and concludes that the crucial difference is a modal difference in that the world is not necessary for God in classical theism while the world is necessary for God in panentheism (2013). Raphael Lataster challenges Göcke’s limitation of the distinction between classical theism and panentheism by claiming that panentheism’s rejection of divine immutability distinguishes panentheism from classical theism (2014). Göcke rejects this distinction as failing to recognize that spatial references are not adequate in dealing with metaphysical rather than physical or logical necessity (2014). Göcke makes the requirements for the distinction between classical theism and panentheism more specific by calling for a consistent definition of “in” by panentheists and by noting the presence of logically contradictory but self-consistent interpretations of key notions by various panentheists (2015). Yujin Nagasawa develops the concept of modal panentheism by describing modal panentheism as holding that God is the totality of all possible worlds and that all possible worlds exist to the same extent that the actual world exists. Thus, God includes all possible worlds and any actual worlds. But Nagasawa also notes that modal panentheism has some similarities to classical theism which limits any modal distinction between classical theism and panentheism (2016). R. T. Mullins provides further evidence and refinement in identifying the distinctiveness of panentheism by pointing out similarities among panentheism, open theism, and neo-classical theism and by critiquing Göcke’s modal distinction as failing to say anything unique about God. Both modal distinctions and considering the world as God’s body fail because they do not say anything unique about the nature of God (2016). Mullins offers an analytic response to the challenge regarding the distinctiveness of panentheism by suggesting that panentheism can distinguish itself from classical theism by making absolute space and time attributes of God and by recognizing the distinction between absolute time and space and physical and temporal realities contained within absolute time and space. Such a distinction offers a literal understanding of “in” in contrast to classical theism (2016). Oliver Crisp critiques Mullins’s identification of absolute space and time as attributes of God because that appears to make God spatial and temporal (2019, 30–31). Pfeifer finds that Mullins’s identification of absolute time and space is helpful but lacks clarity as to whether absolute time and space are attributes of God or the substance of God (2020, 130).
One type of response to the challenge that panentheism lacks a distinctive characteristic suggests a symmetrical, mutual relation between God and the universe as the crucial characteristic of panentheism (Griffin 2004, 43–44; Keller 2008, 73; Clayton 215a, 189; Gregersen 2004, 20, 22, 23; J. Cooper 2006, 29; Olson 2013, 330; Meister 2017, 5; Henriksen 2017, 1084; Stenmark 2019, 27; Gasser 2019, 50).
A variety of terms have been used to describe a mutual relation between God and the universe. Daniel Dombrowski (1996, 32) described God’s relation to the universe as an organic relation in that God and the universe influence each other. Niels Gregersen (2004, 20), cited by Stenmark (2019, 29), uses the phrase “bilateral relations”. Stenmark calls God’s relation to the world an “ontological symmetrical” relation in comparison to classical theism’s “asymmetrical” ontological dependence. The basic nature of a mutual relation between God and the universe involves an influence of each member of the relationship on the other member and assumes some degree of independence or freedom of each member.
A mutual relation differs from the more specific understanding of the God/world relation in classical Christian theism. Panentheism and classical Christian theism both distinguish between God and the world. Classical theism identifies this as an ontological difference. God’s being differs from the being of the world. Göcke calls this a model difference in which God’s existence is necessary while the world’s existence is contingent (2013b). Stenmark describes this as God being ontologically distinct from the world in classical theism and contrasts that with panentheism as holding that God ontologically includes the world (2019, 19, 27; Göcke 2017, 5–6). At times, classical Christian theism maintains the ontological difference between God and the world while allowing for the influence of the world upon God by distinguishing between God’s ontological nature and God’s conceptual knowledge of the world or God’s compassion for the world (Göcke 2017, 3). Classical Christian theism recognizes that biblical statements (see I Kings 21 and Jonah 3) can be found indicating that God has changed because of something that happened in the world, but such statements are identified as anthropomorphism that try to communicate God’s actions without indicating any change in either God’s nature or will. God’s knowledge may change as the world changes and God’s care may respond to different events in the world, but God’s existence or essence is not changed (Stenmark 2019, 30). While God is immanent and active in the world as well as transcendent for classical Christian theism, the relationship between God and the universe is asymmetrical in that God influences the universe, but the universe does not affect God (J. Cooper, 2006, 18, 22 and Stenmark 2019, 30). The world changes because of God’s presence in the world, but this dynamic relationship does not indicate any change in God’s nature or will.
The balance between God’s transcendence and God’s immanence further refines the distinctiveness of panentheism’s mutual relation between God and the universe in distinction from both classical Christian theism and pantheism. By deriving divine immanence from divine transcendence, classical Christian theism prioritizes God’s transcendence (J. Cooper 2006, 328; Coman 2016, 82). In contrast, Gregersen (2004, 19) balances transcendence and immanence. Thus, panentheism affirms the basic role of divine immanence. Likewise, in contrast to pantheism’s derivation of divine transcendence from divine immanence, panentheism affirms God’s transcendence from the world. David Nikkel recognizes the importance of this balance even within panentheism. He warns against an overemphasis upon transcendence leading to the loss of the indeterminacy needed for growth that occurs in panentheism overly influenced by German idealism and an overemphasis on immanence leading to the loss of God as the source of existence that occurs in panentheism overly influenced by process thought (2016). The classical Christian tradition due to a variety of influences such as Platonic influence that stressed the reality of the forms in contrast to matter shaped by the forms (see Straus 2010) has tended to understand God as an unrelated Other to ordinary existence. Prioritizing divine transcendence by calling for a deity unlimited by events in the world as seen in the doctrine of creation from nothing limits creation’s freedom to impact divine actions. While the biblical tradition describes God as creator and sustainer of the creation, many assumed that the ability to create and sustain depended upon the otherness of God in comparison to creation. While divine immanence is not denied by the classical Christian tradition, divine immanence derives from divine transcendence. Transcendence over all specific relations enables the immanence of the divine relation to all of reality. God is present to all of reality because God exists independently from all other reality and is uninfluenced by other reality. This separation of divine reality from ordinary, created reality makes the relationship of the divine to all of created reality an external relationship. The external nature of this relationship become apparent in deviations from the classical Christian tradition such as deism. Because of the assumed external nature of God’s relation to creation, God cannot logically be conceived of as being affected by created reality. God’s freedom is only possible if God is not affected in any way by created reality. God then does not respond in any way to the created order but acts without consideration of the events of the world. An understanding of God’s transcendence in balance with God’s immanence enables a positive relation between science and theology (Clayton 2020, “Nature: And Beyond?”) and provides a basis for morality and ethics (Ciocan 2016, 175). J. Leidenhag critiques the panentheistic claim to balance divine transcendence and immanence (2016, 873).
If divine immanence rather than transcendence is stressed, even when that includes the influence of other realities, it fails to retain a robust concept of divine transcendence. The postmodern theological tradition offers an alternative understanding of the divine-created relationship that considers God as wholly immanent (see Barber 2014, 41–76). This emphasis upon divine immanence seeks to affirm the presence of God in the world. While some forms of this interest lead to pantheism and the identity of God with the creation, the emphasis upon immanence can acknowledge the need for a source of newness and novelty that is not limited by, or to, the past. The basis for this novelty is internal to created reality rather than an external reality providing novelty. However, the question about the adequacy of the novelty for the present situation must be considered. The transcendence involved in the emphasis upon immanence is a horizontal rather than a vertical transcendence. A horizontal transcendence involves beings of the same ontological status. For example, a person differs from other persons and thus in a sense transcends the limitation of other peoples’ experiences just as they are not limited to the first person’s experiences. Newness and novelty then arise from the unrealized potentials in the original situation. However, this limitation risks making radical novelty impossible because the context always limits the possibilities. In response to an emphasis upon transcendence, the emphasis upon immanence clearly affirms the value and importance of the creation. But at the same time that it affirms the value an importance of creation, the creation is a limited creation incapable of being more than what is already in some way present in the creation.
Another response to the challenge that panentheism lacks a distinctive characteristic recognizes the diversity of types of panentheism and similarities between some other forms of theism and panentheism (Olson 2020 [Other Internet Resources]; Birch 1998; Gustafson 2011). This diversity of panentheism and the similarities to other forms of theism requires identifying panentheism by means of more than single characteristic (Lataster and Bilimoria 2018, 57–58). Several suggestions about ways to identify the commonality among the diverse expressions of panentheism and similar forms of theism have been made. Michael Brierley finds eight common themes in panentheism although all eight themes may not be present in each expression of panentheism (2004, 6–8). Gregersen identifies a core common to all forms of panentheism, God contains the world so that the world belongs to God and there is a feeding back from the world into divine life (2017, 582). This common then is expressed in a variety of forms of panentheism as particular theologies (Gregersen 2017, 583). Stenmark describes panentheism as having core doctrines and extension claims (2019, 23). Panentheism and classical theism share extension claims that God is the creator of the world and that continued existence of the world depends upon God’s ongoing creative activity. Both panentheism and classical theism maintain the immanence of God, but they differ in that panentheism holds that God ontologically includes the world while classical theism maintains an ontological distinction between God and creation. For Stenmark, the core claims of panentheism are that God ontologically includes the world and that God depends on the world for God’s own existence (2019, 25–26). Clayton suggests that panentheism be considered a philosophical research program which may include sub-research programs. The panentheistic research program affirms the pervasiveness of change with real change taking place in the divine experience but not in the divine nature. Since panentheists differ on whether creation is from nothing or is necessary this is a sub-research program within panentheism (Clayton 2019, 9–10).
While the idea of panentheism may not be a philosophically stable concept in itself, that instability makes possible respecification in light of particular theologies (Gregersen 2017, 583). Thus the term “panentheism” pointed to a balance between classical theism and pantheism in the early twentieth century with its use of “in”. The growth of the influence of scientific thought upon theology leads to a more specific understanding of the balance in the relation between God and the world that emphasizes the mutual interaction of God and the world and moves on from the usefulness of “in”.
The varieties of panentheism participate in internal criticism. Clayton (2008, 127) and Steven Crain (2006) emphasize the dependence of the world upon God rather than the dependence of God upon the world although they maintain that God is influenced, and changed, by the world. They criticize understandings of God that limit God by making God subject to metaphysical principles. Griffin emphasizes the regularity provided by metaphysical principles. This regularity recognizes the order in reality that the reliability of God’s love provides. Panentheists also caution that the emphasis upon the ontological nature of the relation between God and the world can lead to a loss of the integrity of the world. Richardson warns against losing the discrete identity of finite beings in God (2010, 345). Case-Winters calls for maintaining a balance between the distinction between God and the world and God’s involvement with the world. Over-emphasis upon either side of the balance leads to positions that are philosophically and theologically inadequate (Case-Winters 2007, 125).
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
- Davis, Andrew M., 2019, “Ambiguities in Panentheism: Definitions, Distinctions, and Demarcations”, unpublished manuscript.
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- Paul Davies’s web pages at Arizona State University
- Center for Process Studies
- Emergence, by Joseph Bracken, with a response from Philip Clayton.
R.T. Mullins suggested several sources that increased the coverage of this article and through careful reading provided helpful challenges to increase the clarity of this article without being responsible for any remaining lack of clarity.