Although it was only in the first half of the twentieth century that the term ‘personalism’ became known as a designation of philosophical schools and systems, personalist thought had developed throughout the nineteenth century as a reaction to perceived depersonalizing elements in Enlightenment rationalism, pantheism, Hegelian absolute idealism, individualism as well as collectivism in politics, and materialist, psychological, and evolutionary determinism. In its various strains, personalism always underscores the centrality of the person as the primary locus of investigation for philosophical, theological, and humanistic studies. It is an approach or system of thought which regards or tends to regard the person as the ultimate explanatory, epistemological, ontological, and axiological principle of all reality, although these areas of thought are not stressed equally by all personalists and there is tension between idealist, phenomenological, existentialist, and Thomist versions of personalism.
- 1. What is personalism?
- 2. Personalism’s historical antecedents
- 3. European personalism
- 4. American personalism
- 5. Eastern personalism
- 6. Characteristics of personalist thought
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Personalism exists in many different versions, and this makes it somewhat difficult to define as a philosophical and theological movement. Many philosophical schools have at their core one particular thinker or even one central work which serves as a canonical touchstone. Personalism is a more diffused and eclectic movement and has no such common reference point. It is, in point of fact, more proper to speak of many personalisms than one personalism. In 1947 Jacques Maritain could write that there are at least “a dozen personalist doctrines, which at times have nothing more in common than the word ‘person.’” Moreover, because of their emphasis on the subjectivity of the person, some of the more important exponents of personalism have not undertaken systematic treatises of their theories.
It is perhaps more proper to speak of personalism as a “current” or a broader “worldview”, since it represents more than one school or one doctrine while at the same time the most important forms of personalism do display some central and essential commonalities. Most important of the latter is the general affirmation of the centrality of the person for philosophical thought. Personalism posits ultimate reality and value in personhood — human as well as (at least for most personalists) divine. It emphasizes the significance, uniqueness and inviolability of the person, as well as the person’s essentially relational or social dimension. The title “personalism” can therefore legitimately be applied to any school of thought that focuses on the centrality of persons and their unique status among beings in general, and personalists normally acknowledge the indirect contributions of a wide range of thinkers throughout the history of philosophy who did not regard themselves as personalists. Personalists believe that the person should be the ontological and epistemological starting point of philosophical reflection. Many are concerned to investigate the experience, the status, and the dignity of the human being as person, and regard this as the starting-point for all subsequent philosophical analysis.
Personalists regard personhood (or “personality”) as the fundamental notion, as that which gives meaning to all of reality and constitutes its supreme value. Personhood carries with it an inviolable dignity that merits unconditional respect. Personalism has for the most part not been primarily a theoretical philosophy of the person. Although it does defend a unique theoretical understanding of the person, this understanding is in itself such as to support the prioritization of practical or moral philosophy, while at the same time the moral experience of the person is such as to decisively determine the theoretical understanding. For personalists, a person combines subjectivity and objectivity, causal activity and receptivity, unicity and relation, identity and creativity. Stressing the moral nature of the person, or the person as the subject and object of free activity, personalism tends to focus on practical, moral action and ethical questions.
Some personalists are idealists, believing that reality and its sense is constituted by consciousness, while others espouse philosophical realism and argue that the natural order is independent of human consciousness. For taxonomic convenience, the many strains of personalism can be grouped into two fundamental categories: personalism in a strict sense and personalism in a broader sense. Strict personalism places the person at the center of a philosophical system that originates from an “intuition” of the person himself, and then goes on to analyse the personal reality and the personal experience that are the objects of this intuition. The method of the main twentieth-century European version of this strict personalism draws extensively from phenomenology and existentialism, departing from traditional metaphysics and constituting a separate philosophical system. In the idealistic version of personalism, it becomes more obvious, however, that the deeper sources of strict personalism are often to be found in the early critical reception of German idealism and in some aspects of moral sense philosophy. The original intuition is really that of self-awareness, by which one grasps not least values and essential meanings through unmediated experience. The knowledge produced by reflecting on this experience is nothing more than an explicitation of the original intuition, which in turn generates an awareness of a framework for moral action. The intuition of the person as the center of values and meaning is not exhausted, however, in phenomenological or existential analyses. These analyses often point beyond themselves, indicating a constitutive transcendence of the person himself, irreducible either to its specific manifestations or to the sum-total of those manifestations. Despite their differences, both the American school of Bowne and his first followers and the European personalism of Emmanuel Mounier represent personalism in this strict sense.
Personalism in the broader sense does not consider the person as the object of an original intuition, nor does it conceive of philosophical research as beginning with an analysis of immediate personal experience and its context. Rather, in the scope of a general metaphysics the person manifests his singular value and essential role. Thus the person occupies the central place in philosophical discourse, but this discourse is not reduced to an explicitation or development of an original intuition of the person. The person does not justify metaphysics but rather metaphysics justifies the person and his various operations. Instead of constituting an autonomous metaphysics, personalism in the broader sense offers an anthropological-ontological shift in perspective within an existing metaphysics and draws out the ethical consequences of this shift. Perhaps the best known strain of personalism in the broad sense is so-called “Thomistic personalism.” Represented by such figures as Jacques Maritain, Yves Simon, Étienne Gilson, Robert Spaemann, and Karol Wojtyła, Thomistic personalism draws on principles of Thomas Aquinas’s philosophical and theological anthropology in what it sees as a coherent development of inchoate elements of Aquinas’s thought.
As a philosophical school, personalism finds its foundations in human reason and experience, though historically personalism has nearly always been united to Biblical theism. Von Balthasar suggests that “Without the biblical background it [personalism] is inconceivable.” Yet while most personalists are theists, belief in God is not necessary to all personalist philosophies, and some profess an atheist personalism.
Though generally considered a philosophical school, the personalist approach is often applied to other disciplines as well, yielding a plethora of titles such as theological personalism, economic personalism, ecological personalism and psychological personalism (along with their inversions: “personalistic theology,” “personalistic economics,” “personalistic psychology”) and so forth.
The term “personalism” made its world debut in Germany, where “der Personalismus” was first used by F. D. E. Schleiermacher (1768–1834) in his book Über die Religion in 1799. Amos Bronson Alcott seems to have been the first American to use the term, calling it in an 1863 essay “the doctrine that the ultimate reality of the world is a Divine Person who sustains the universe by a continuous act of creative will.” The term “American personalism” was coined by Walt Whitman (1819–1892) in his essay “Personalism,” which was published in The Galaxy in May 1868. In 1903 Charles Renouvier published Le Personnalisme, thereby introducing the word into the French as well. The word “personalism” first appeared as an encyclopedic entry in Volume IX of Hastings’s Encyclopedia of Religion and Ethics in 1915 in an article by Ralph T. Flewelling.
According to Albert C. Knudson, personalism is “the ripe fruit of more than two millenniums of intellectual toil, the apex of a pyramid whose base was laid by Plato and Aristotle.” Catholic personalists emphasize more specifically the decisive role of medieval thought, and in particular scholasticism, for the development of personalism. Étienne Gilson, for instance, has observed that where Plato locates the center of reality in ideas with concrete instantiations of these being merely accidental, and Aristotle places emphasis not on numerical individuals but on the universal specific form, Thomas Aquinas saw the individual person as unique among beings because of reason and self-mastery. Though none goes so far as to call Aquinas a personalist, some suggest that he furnished the necessary soil in which personalistic theory could take root. In this regard, Karol Wojtyła wrote that Aquinas “provided at least a point of departure for personalism in general.”
The term person comes from the Latin persona, whose origins are traceable to Greek drama, where the πρόσωπον, or mask, became identified with the role an actor would assume in a given production. Such usage is carried over today in the word “persona,” referring to characters in fictional literature or drama, or second identities which people adopt for behavior in given social contexts. Its introduction into the mainstream of intellectual parlance, however, came with theological discourse during the patristic period, notably the attempts to clarify or define central truths of the Christian faith. These discussions focused primarily on two doctrines: the Trinity (three “persons” in one God) and the incarnation of the second person of the Trinity (the “hypostatic” union of two natures—divine and human—in one “person”). Confusion marred these discussions because of ambiguities in the philosophical and theological terminology, such that, for example, the thesis — ascribed to Sabellius — would be advanced that in God there was one ύπόστασις and three πρόσωπα, where ύπόστασις conveyed the meaning of “person” and πρόσωπα bore the sense of “roles” or “modes” of being. In order to present these mysteries with precision, the concept of person and the relationship of person to nature needed clarification. The debates culminated in the First Council of Nicaea (325) and the First Council of Constantinople (381), and in the drafting and propagation of the Nicene-Constantinopolitan creed.
Though the philosophical concept of person first developed in this theological context, with reference to the persons of the Trinity, the general Greek philosophical concepts involved in these Trinitological origins facilitated its application to human beings as well. Philosophical personalism may or may not appropriate the theological suppositions with which the early usage of the term “person” is laden. The classic, basic, and purely philosophical definition which is still accepted by personalists, as far as it goes, was given early on by Boethius (ca. 480–524): “persona est naturae rationalis individua substantia.” This definition consists of two parts. The essential starting point is a subsistent individual: a singular, existing suppositum or ύπόστασις. Here the adjective “individual” distinguishes an existing substance from common or second substance. The second element of the definition—naturae rationalis—qualifies the notion of individual substance: the person is an individual possessing a rational nature. It is this rational, spiritual nature that gives rise to the different qualities that distinguish the person, qualities to which personalists attach decisive importance.
The Trinitological concept of the person was far from the modern meaning that the term assumes in personalism, and Boethius’ definition too indicates only in the barest abstract outline the deep and comprehensive signification that personalism ascribes to it. As accepted by personalism, it is the result of a long and complex cumulative development, resulting in a rich, if somewhat elusive, concept which in some respects wholly inverts the original connotations of exteriority in the early meanings of “mask” and “role”: person comes rather to denote the innermost spiritual and most authentic kernel of the unique individual, while retaining a radical openness to the external. Already in the course of the Middle Ages, further definitions were provided, and not just by Aquinas. Not least the Augustinian example of experienced interiority and reflexivity, the idea of form as the principle of individuation, and the late medieval and Franciscan emphasis on will and singularity entered into early modern thinking about the person, and combined with the stronger focus on human personality that was characteristic of Renaissance humanism.
Along these lines, the early modern concepts of subjectivity and self-consciousness added new elements to the definition and understanding of the central concept in personalism, or even substantially altered it. Immanuel Kant’s epistemic dualism, underscoring the importance of both subject and object in knowledge, opened the door both to the idealistic form of personalism and to the phenomenology and existentialism that became so important for twentieth-century personalism. Kant also contributed significantly to the personalist understanding of human dignity. Unlike Hobbes, for whom “the worth of a man” is “his price,” and dignity is “the publique worth of a man,” Kant regarded dignity as “intrinsic worth”. He posited a dichotomy between price and dignity, whereby “something that has a price can be exchanged for something else of equal value; whereas that which exceeds all price and therefore admits of no equivalent, has a dignity.” His celebrated practical categorical imperative—Act so as to treat humanity, whether in your own person or in that of another, always as an end and never as a means only—was incorporated nearly verbatim into Karol Wojtyła’s “personalist principle.”
Personalism in the sense of a distinct philosophy or worldview focusing on the full, accumulated import of the concept of the person, however, emerged only in the context of the broad critical reaction against what can be called the various impersonalistic philosophies which came to dominate the Enlightenment and Romanticism in the form of rationalistic and romantic forms of pantheism and idealism, from Spinoza to Hegel. Key figures in this reaction were Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi (1743–1819), the initiator of the so-called Pantheismusstreit in the 1780s, and F. W. J. Schelling (1775–1854), who in his later work rejected the impersonalist positions of his early idealist systems. But these were only the most important figures in a broad movement that included many other philosophers, primarily the so-called speculative theists, as well as theologians, both Catholic and Protestant. The modified idealistic, theistic personalism developed in this counter-movement became decisive, not least via its late German representative, Rudolph Hermann Lotze (1817–81), not only for the American, idealistic personalism of Bowne, but also for the parallel, British idealistic personalism whose leading representative was Andrew Seth Pringle-Pattison (1856-1931). Although the continental European personalists of the twentieth century would reject Hegelian idealism and turn instead to phenomenology, existentialism, and Thomism, the outline of the personalistic criticism of impersonal modes of thought was already clearly and consistently developed by the thinkers here mentioned, ever since the last decades of the eighteenth century.
Personalism thus arose as a reaction to impersonalist modes of thought which were perceived as dehumanizing. The impersonal dynamic of modern pantheism and monism in both their rationalistic and Romantic forms underlie many of the modern philosophies that personalism turns against, idealistic as well as materialistic. The radical idealism of G. W. F. Hegel (1770–1831) held that Kant’s noumenal reality is not an unknowable substratum of appearances, but a dynamic process, which in thought and in reality passes from thesis to antithesis, and finally resolves itself in synthesis. This process is absolute mind, the state, religion, philosophy. Hegel’s idealism saw history as an unfolding of absolute spirit through a necessary dialectical process, and this framework left little room for the freedom or significance of individual persons. Through the Young Hegelians, this impersonalist form of idealism was soon transformed into equally impersonalist forms of materialism, culminating in Marxism, which regards the essence of man as his true collectivity; impersonalist determinism, in the form of Communism, decisively determined twentieth-century political totalitarianism. In other thinkers, idealism tended to merge with increasingly naturalistic forms of nationalism and racialism, giving rise to other new political movements in the twentieth century that elevated alternative collectivities above the person, such as national socialism. Personalism always resisted the absorption of the individual into the collectivity by asserting the inherent worth of the singular person. The person should never be a mere means to an end, subordinated to the will and purposes of another. The state exists for persons, and not persons for the state. In this regard, personalism stands as a foil to totalitarianisms that value persons only for their worth to the community, and insists instead on their inherent dignity. Thus R. T. Flewelling could write that “the person is the supreme essence of democracy and hostile to totalitarianisms of every sort.” Personalism’s insistence on personal freedom and responsibility, self-determination, creativity, and subjectivity all bear out this deep-seated resistance to collectivism.
Parallel to the development and transformation of Hegelianism, other theories of human nature were developed in the course of the nineteenth century that blurred or cancelled the distinction between man and the rest of nature, and downplayed or denied man’s unique individual value, spiritual nature, and free will. These theories too, directly or indirectly, contributed to twentieth-century totalitarianism. The philosophical positivism of Auguste Comte (1798–1857) affirmed as a historical law that every science (and the human race itself) passes through three successive stages, the theological, the metaphysical, and the positive, each superior to the last. Comte insisted so much on the reality and predominance of society that this became for him the true subject, while the individual was regarded as an abstraction. Darwinism, in particular, uprooted the classical understanding of human beings as essentially superior to the rest of creation by offering a theory whereby man would be simply the most advanced life form along an unbroken continuum, and the difference between man and irrational animals would merely be one of degree, not of kind.
The emerging personalist philosophy, however, rejected impersonalism not only in the form of idealistic or materialistic determinism and collectivism, but also in the form of the radical individualism that was equally a product of modern rationalism and romanticism, and which, through, for instance, certain forms of liberalism and anarchism, was also characteristic of the nineteenth century. From the beginning, personalism proclaimed in its own way the communitarian values of solidarity and inter-relation. In their insistence on inviolable dignity, personalists resisted a utilitarianism which would make one person merely “useful” for another. Whereas individualism tends to seek the self above all and often views others as means to one’s own profit, personalism seeks to make of the self a gift to another. “Thus,” Emmanuel Mounier later wrote, “if the first condition of individualism is the centralization of the individual in himself, the first condition of personalism is his decentralization, in order to set him in the open perspectives of personal life.” Where individualism hopes to find personal realization in self-interest, personalism asserts the need for relational openness to others, even as a condition for one’s own realization.
Karol Wojtyła characterized the two extremes of individualism and collectivism in the following way: “On the one hand, persons may easily place their own individual good above the common good of the collectivity, attempting to subordinate the collectivity to themselves and use it for their individual good. This is the error of individualism, which gave rise to liberalism in modern history and to capitalism in economics. On the other hand, society, in aiming at the alleged good of the whole, may attempt to subordinate persons to itself in such a way that the true good of persons is excluded and they themselves fall prey to the collectivity. This is the error of totalitarianism, which in modern times has borne the worst possible fruit.”
The existentialism that gave such important impulses to much continental European personalism in the twentieth century developed in certain respects in the line of the later Shelling’s philosophy, and traces even of Jacobi’s criticism of impersonal pantheism can be found in it. With Schelling, Søren Kierkegaard (1813–1855) opposed Hegel’s idealism and underscored the value of the individual person, both for philosophy and for life in general. He accused idealism of emptying life of meaning by neglecting the reality of human existence. Whereas Kierkegaard and some later existentialists (Marcel, Sartre, Camus, Blondel) focused on issues central to the meaning of human existence (love, marriage, death, faith, morality, etc.), other thinkers continued to focus on the more direct exploration of the meaning and nature of the person himself, and it was these thinkers that came to be known as, and to call themselves, personalists.
The philosophy of Friedrich W. Nietzsche (1844–1900) gave its own, distinct expression to these themes, showing, as many of the romantic poets and philosophers had done before him, and despite his criticism of romanticism, that the new individualism was in reality closely interrelated with the general impersonalism of the dominant strain of romanticism: from the exaltation of the individualist ego, the step was never far to its extinction in a larger impersonal whole of any of the many available varieties. Modern individualism represented no real challenge to the intellectual environment in which man tended to be seen as a mere phenomenal being, easily assimilated into nature, the impersonal principle of idealism, the unconscious, the cosmic will, or the collectivities of the family, the state, the nation, the social class. Man was a product of external forces, an insignificant piece in a cosmic puzzle, without dignity, freedom, responsibility, or fundamental existential significance. It was this overall, many-faceted intellectual climate and development that produced the personalist counter-movement throughout the nineteenth century, a movement which, by drawing on other, alternative resources in the thought of the Enlightenment and Romanticism as well as on the classical, medieval Christian, and early modern legacy, sought to rescue the unique position and status of the singular human person.
The personalist Jean Lacroix is justified in declaring personalism to be an “anti-ideology,” awoken by social and political situations that are alienating to the human person; in the face of such impersonalist forces, personalism reaffirms the absolute dignity and interrelationality of the human person. Maritain, too, wrote of personalism as “a phenomenon of reaction” against the “two opposite errors” of totalitarianism and individualism. Contrary to Hegelian collectivism and the fierce individualism of Nietzsche’s superman, these thinkers stressed both the inviolable dignity of the individual person and at the same time his social nature and essential relationality.
In the twentieth century personalists gathered especially around three European centers of higher learning: Paris, Munich, and Lublin. Until recently, the best known and most prolific of these three schools was the Parisian group. Between the First and Second World Wars the French personalist movement revolved around a monthly journal, Esprit, founded by Emmanuel Mounier (1905–1950) and a group of friends in 1932. In the face of economic collapse and political and moral disorientation, these French personalists proposed the human person as the criterion according to which a solution to the crisis was to be fashioned. The new, irreducible key to thought, especially regarding social organization, was to be the human person. In his programmatic essay Refaire la Renaissance, which appeared in the first issue of Esprit, Mounier proposed the need to disassociate the spiritual world from the debased, materialistic bourgeoisie. In substance much in line with the late eighteenth- and early nineteenth-century origins of personalism, Mounier, before the Second World War, turned sharply against the impersonalistic development of individualistic, parliamentary democracy and the mass culture that had come to shape the countries of Western Europe. Both personalism’s nineteenth-century background and this fact about the leading twentieth-century European personalist indicate that for personalism, a simple, uncritical endorsement of liberal democracy is not a sufficient guarantee against totalitarianism, since liberal democracy too tends to absorb the impersonalist ideas and the deep, historical impersonalist dynamic clearly perceived and analysed by personalistic thinkers long before Mounier.
Political and traditionalist religious reaction was not an alternative for Mounier. There had to be a real revolution, consisting in the creation of a new humanism, where the bourgeois ideal of “having” would yield to Christian “being,” a being in communion with others. The spiritual revolution envisioned by Mounier was to be above all the work of committed witnesses to the truth, who through their own interior renewal and living faith would galvanize the masses into a new communal structure. Such a revolution entailed a triple commitment: denunciation, meditation, and technical planning. Underlying this program was Mounier’s bold conception of Christian experience, an experience of “tragic optimism,” colored both by the drama of Christian existence and by the certainty of eschatological victory. The Christian’s most important virtue is that of the heroic witness, far from the evasiveness or sentimentality of other, eviscerated strains of Christianity. Thus Mounier’s idea of the Christian as the watchful athlete engaged in spiritual combat provided a stark response to Nietzsche’s criticism of Christianity as a religion of the weak. His assertion that there is no true progress without the dimension of transcendence countered the Marxist search for an earthly paradise through class struggle. His acceptance of the importance of psychology while reemphasizing man’s freedom and responsibility furnished an answer to Freud’s instinct-centered psychoanalysis.
Mounier’s work attracted the attention of important French thinkers such as Gabriel Marcel, Denis de Rougemont, and Jacques Maritain, who through their research, lectures, and writings helped develop French personalist thought. Maritain, who worked with Mounier for a number of years, was responsible for bringing French personalism to the United States. After the war, European personalism, led by Mounier himself, adapted to and took a more uncritical view of liberal democracy, and Maritain played a role in drafting the 1948 United Nations Universal Declaration of Human Rights. Like other Thomistic personalists, Maritain criticized the frailty of certain widespread strains of Scholasticism, and appealed to the important role of intuitive experience in philosophy.
The French philosopher Paul Ricoeur (1913–2005), whose philosophy was profoundly influenced by Husserlian phenomenology, while never identifying himself as a personalist, shared many of the concerns and interests dear to personalists, and both benefited from and contributed to the development of personalistic thought in France. Gabriel Marcel was one of Ricoeur’s philosophical mentors, and Ricoeur was also deeply influenced by his contact with Emmanuel Mounier, especially in the postwar years, 1946-1951. He contributed essays to Esprit as well as the journal Le Christianisme social. Ricoeur drew on many of the themes most precious to Mounier, such as the nature of human freedom and the centrality of the human person vis-à-vis the state, though his own later development of these themes departed considerably from Mounier’s. He also shared personalism’s rejection of materialism and of Cartesian dualism, and a rejection of abstractions in favor of concrete human reality. Perhaps the single greatest element of Mounier’s personalism adopted by Ricoeur, in fact, was the impermissibility of withdrawal from political and social engagement.
Personalism in Germany was closely wedded to another philosophical school, phenomenology, developed by Austrian-born Edmund Husserl (1859-1938). Like existentialism and French personalism, phenomenological realism was partly a response to German idealism, though it bore a distinctive focus on epistemological questions. In his Logische Untersuchungen, published in 1900, as well as his later Ideen zu einer reinen Phänomenologie und phänomenologischen Philosophie (1913), Husserl laid out his phenomenological method, and through it he attracted the first students of his school. The distinguishing characteristic of phenomenology is not doctrinal, but methodological. Seeking to avoid the imposition of preconceived notions or structures on reality, phenomenology goes “back to the thing” (zurück zum Gegenstand) by bracketing (epoché) all philosophical presuppositions about the world, man, and the rest of reality. This direct observation and consultation of reality eschews the problems of deductive reasoning by focusing on the intellectual act of intuition, or direct apprehension of reality. The eidetic reduction focuses on the essential structures of what appears (phenomenon), so that one is dealing neither with empirical observation nor with a description of Platonic forms, but with the phenomenon’s meaning. Phenomenologists identified the object of intuition as the essences of things, ideal objects, and structures of intentionality and consciousness. In so doing, they sought to overcome the Kantian noumenon/phenomenon dichotomy as well as the errors of positivism and nominalism.
Though in his later life Husserl leaned toward philosophical idealism, in his earlier life and in Logische Untersuchungen he embraced philosophical realism. A realist phenomenology stresses phenomenology’s contribution to perennial philosophy, and seeks to explore through experience the ultimate structures of being. By going back to the thing itself, phenomenology aimed at eluding the errors of both empiricism (reducing reality to the measurable) and idealism (rarefying reality into abstraction and subjectivism). Among Husserl’s students were Max Scheler (1874–1928), Dietrich von Hildebrand (1889–1977), Roman Ingarden (1893–1970) and Edith Stein (1891–1942), all of whom influenced the development of personalist thought. Husserl’s later turn to Idealism, which came about in the 1920s, precipitated a break with many of his disciples, who came to believe that he had abandoned his original commitment to reconnect philosophical reflection and objective reality. They therefore struck out on their own, each creating an original body of work in pursuit of Husserl’s original intention. Stein, for instance, looked to phenomenological method as a complement to Thomism, and von Hildebrand introduced phenomenology into ethics in a personalistic synthesis.
The third and youngest of the three centers of European personalistic thought grew up around the Catholic University of Lublin. After studying with Husserl, Roman Ingarden took phenomenology and interest in personalist topics back to his native Poland in the early 1940s, and there he met a young priest by the name of Karol Wojtyła, whom he encouraged to read Max Scheler. Wojtyła became interested in Scheler’s phenomenology and ended up doing his doctoral dissertation on Scheler’s ethics of values, which he presented in 1953. Having previously received an Aristotelian-Thomistic formation, Wojtyła drew from his studies of the phenomenological method to develop a creative and original personalistic synthesis, complementing Thomistic metaphysics and anthropology with insights from phenomenology. He subsequently took a post as professor of ethics at the Theological Faculty of Krakow and Lublin’s Catholic University, where he founded the Polish personalist school. Wojtyła, who was also influenced by the writings of another of Husserl’s disciples, von Hildebrand, produced two significant personalist books, Love and Responsibility (1960) and The Acting Person (1962), as well as numerous essays, lectures and articles. His later election as pope contributed strongly to the spread of personalist thought, especially among Catholic thinkers. As Pope he continued to employ personalist arguments in his magisterial teaching, and spurred new interest in personalist theories. John Paul called for “theological renewal based on the personalistic nature of man” and explicitly invoked the personalist argument in his encyclical letters Laborem Exercens (1981) and Ut Unum Sint (1995) as well as his 1994 Letter to Families.
Personalism has also been represented, to varying degrees, in many other European countries.
American personalism, best known as represented by such figures as Borden Parker Bowne (1847–1910), George H. Howison (1834–1916), and Edgar Sheffield Brightman (1884–1953), took a different tack from continental European personalism in that instead of a reaction to idealism, it is often actually a form of idealism, wherein being is defined as personal consciousness. Howison preferred the term “personal idealism.” Contrary to twentieth-century continental European personalism, American personalism, in particular in its early representatives, is a direct continuation of the development of more or less personalistic philosophy and theology in nineteenth-century Europe and its analysis and refutation of various impersonalistic forms of thought. The American and the stricter personalist twentieth-century school in Europe agreed in taking the person as their point of departure for understanding the world and in referring all moral truth to the absolute value of the person, but while the latter derived these insights primarily from existentialism, phenomenology, and Thomism, the American school, while in some respects adding to them and developing them further, basically took them over from the European “speculative theists”.
Boston University was long considered the hub of American personalism, under the auspices of philosophy professor Borden Parker Bowne. Bowne was a Methodist minister who had studied under Rudolf Hermann Lotze in Germany. Lotze, a student of the speculative theist Christian Hermann Weisse (1801–66) who assimilated much of the later Schelling’s criticism of Hegel, sought, like the speculative theists, to modify Hegelian idealism by maintaining that the real is always concrete and individual, transforming Hegel’s absolute idealism into a personal idealism. Adding elements also from recent trends in psychology, Bowne developed a distinct and explicitly personalist position, which assumed the character of a philosophical school. His late book Personalism, published in 1908, is a popular summary of his philosophy which introduced the term ‘personalism’ into American philosophical and theological discourse.
Bowne gathered a group of talented disciples who carried on his work in a second generation. The most important among these were Edgar Sheffield Brightman, Albert C. Knudson (1873–1953), Francis J. McConnell (1871–1953), George Albert Coe (1861–1951), and Ralph T. Flewelling (1871–1960). While Howison had established the personalist tradition at the University of California, Berkeley, Flewelling took personalism to the University of Southern California, which became the second important twentieth-century center of personalist thought in the United States. Flewelling also founded The Personalist, the journal that would serve as the forum for American personalism. In 1915, he published Personalism and the Problems of Philosophy: An Appreciation of the Work of Borden Parker Bowne. At Boston University, Brightman continued the studies in personalism, in time holding the Borden Parker Bowne chair of philosophy, while Knudson, having first taught classes in the Old Testament, moved into personalist theology. Meanwhile Walter George Muelder (1907-), professor of social ethics and Christian theology at Boston University and the University of Southern California, helped bridge the gap between the Bostonian and Californian schools, calling his doctrine “Communitarian Personalism.”
The Boston personalist school has continued to influence American culture, sometimes in unexpected ways. A third generation of American personalists, represented by such figures as Peter A. Bertocci (1910–1989) and W. Gordon Allport of Harvard, a student of William Stern, further developed the psychological dimension of personalism. Martin Luther King studied under the personalists at Boston University, and credited the experience with shaping his worldview: “I studied philosophy and theology at Boston University under Edgar S. Brightman and L. Harold DeWolf…It was mainly under these teachers that I studied Personalistic philosophy—the theory that the clue to the meaning of ultimate reality is found in personality. This personal idealism remains today my basic philosophical position. Personalism’s insistence that only personality—finite and infinite—is ultimately real strengthened me in two convictions: it gave me metaphysical and philosophical grounding for the idea of a personal God, and it gave me a metaphysical basis for the dignity and worth of all human personality.”
It is important to note, however, that American personalism cannot be reduced to the Boston University school. It flourished also at Harvard University. Not only is this where Howison came from, but the work of leading Harvard philosophers such as William James (1842–1910), Josiah Royce (1855–1916), William Ernest Hocking (1873–1966), and Charles Hartshorne (1897–2000) displays strong personalist elements. All of them, with the sole exception of Royce, even called themselves personalists.
In some respects close parallels to or equivalents of Western personalism are present in Islamic, Buddhist, Vedantic, and Chinese thought, although comparative work in this field is confronted with often formidable problems of translation and interpretation.
With regard to Islam, it should first of all be pointed out that classic Islamic philosophy, with its roots in classical Greek philosophy, is not Eastern in the same sense as Buddhist, Vedantic, Chinese, and Japanese thought. It shares roots with Augustinianism and Thomism, and thus with some of the traditions that have been central to the development of personalism in the West. On the other hand, it has been observed that there is no conceptual equivalent of the Western philosophical concept of “person” in Arabic and in classic Islamic philosophy, something which would seem to confirm the importance of the specifically Christian, to a considerable extent Trinitological, terminological and conceptual origins of the term. But as there are other sources of personalism than the Trinitological thought that was decisive for the early formation of the concept (when, it should also be remembered, it was not yet fully personalistic in the modern sense), and as these sources have also produced Jewish versions of personalism, the historical absence of a conceptual equivalent in Arabic has not precluded the development of Islamic personalism. Themes with regard to the self and the nature of God which are very similar to those of Western personalists are found in a modern Muslim thinker like Muhammad Iqbal (1877–1938). Mohammed Aziz Lahbabi (1922–1993) explicitly sought to develop a Muslim version of personalism, and was influenced not least by Mounier.
No precise conceptual counterpart of “person” is found in the more properly Eastern traditions of thought either, traditions which do not share the Greek philosophical roots. When we speak of personalism in the case of these traditions, it is in the sense of themes and positions, elaborated in terms of other concepts, closer to such Western ones as “self” and “individual”, which are part of Western personalism and enter into the definition of the modern concept of person.
The term ‘personalism’ has, for instance, been applied to the early Buddhist school called puggalavada, which takes positions with regard to the identity and continuity of the individual self which differ from what has traditionally been considered the orthodox ones of Theravada Buddhism. Other versions of these positions are found later in some of the currents of Mahayana thought.
More unambiguous parallels are found, however, in Vedanta. The vishishtadvaita (qualified non-dualism) school turned against advaita’s radical non-dualism, and insisted not only on what in English works by representatives of this school and later schools which are similarly critical of advaita, is often explicitly termed the personal concept of brahman or the absolute, but also on a personal understanding of the individual beings that are conceived as fragmentary selves (jivatmas) that are “parts” — at the same time one with and distinct transformations — of brahman. As the different classical darshanas of Indian thought are not wholly isolated and receive influences from each other, elements of Samkhya thought are also taken up in personalistic Vedanta, as are still further elements of Yoga, and of the traditional Hindu scriptural legacy. It is the clarity, the traditional primordiality, and the fundamental nature of the teaching of the permanent self, the atman, in Vedanta, and not least in the schools critical of advaita, which make this personalism more unambiguous than puggalavada’s in Buddhism.
A striking feature of the debates within Vedanta between the non-dualist, impersonalist schools and the theistic, personalist ones is the partial similarities with and parallels to the opposition between nineteenth-century representatives absolute idealism and personalistic idealism in the West, despite the distance between them in time and space, the mutual independence, and the different conceptual contexts. But while there is a long-standing scholarly tradition of comparative work on advaita Vedanta and absolute idealism (not least in F. H. Bradley’s version), only very little such work has as yet been done on the vishishtadvaita and similar personalist Vedantic schools and the early, idealistic personalists in the West.
What most clearly distinguishes Vedantic personalism from Western personalism is that the former builds on the fundamental teaching of all Vedanta that the true self exists beyond the limitations of the transient body and the mind, and beyond the tendency — called in Sanskrit the ahamkara, literally, the “I-maker” — to identify with these, whereas Western personalism is often characteristically defined in terms which from the perspective of Vedanta must be seen as pertaining to the mental level, or sometimes, in particular in the twentieth century, to the physical body.
This does not mean, however, that according to personalistic Vedanta the body should be ignored or devalued. It is from its perspective primarily the erroneous identification with the mind that is harmful to the body, as it indeed is to the proper use of the mind itself. The actualization of our true and higher nature as consciousness, as the sat-cit-ananda (being/eternity, knowledge, and bliss) that are the nature of the atman-brahman, brings light to both the body and the mind, including all the faculties so closely analysed by Western personalists, like will, imagination, and reason. Thus it at least indirectly supports, to the extent it is needed, the moral character-formation on the humanistic level which is emphasized by Western personalism.
Most traditional Chinese and Japanese thought shares with personalism an emphasis on the need for concrete, practical transformation of character as a prerequisite for insight. In the Chinese and Japanese versions of Buddhism, the Indian tradition of devising specific practices and exercises for this purpose was continued, but gradually disconnected from the parallel and very strong theoretical and metaphysical legacy of India. This development can be said to culminate in Zen. But the emphasis on the practical is found also in Taoism, which contributed to the development of Zen. At the same time all of these schools share an understanding of the ultimate or true reality as rather impersonal than personal, which makes them further removed from personalism than Vedanta.
Confucianism shares with the other Chinese and Japanese traditions the emphasis on the practical. Contrary to them, however, it is focused much more exclusively on the “humanistic” level, on moral character-formation, and the requirements of the social order. While its humanistic orientation is in line with personalism, Confucianism is, however, more concerned with the practical attainment of the general ideals of true humanity and gentlemanliness as understood in traditional China, than with the personal individuality and uniqueness which Western personalists stress as related to, and often indeed as inseparable from, a true understanding and affirmation of universal values. Neo-Confucianism, as developed by Chu Hsi (1130-1200), introduced strong metaphysical elements, but the understanding of the metaphysical principles or laws, li, was still a generalist one. Other Neo-Confucians differed to some extent in this respect, and, as Confucianism is a living tradition in today’s China, new thinkers keep developing versions of it which are closer to personalism. This, and the importance of humanist character-formation, speaks in favour of the designation of Confucianism in general as a personalistic philosophy. But there are also some considerations that speak against it, both general ones regarding some aspects of historical Chinese society, and, in view of Chu Hsi’s version of Neo-Confucianism, metaphysical ones.
Though personalism comprises many different forms and emphases, certain distinctive characteristics can be discerned that generally hold for personalism as such. These include an insistence on the radical difference between persons and non-persons and on the irreducibility of the person to impersonal spiritual or material factors, an affirmation of the dignity of persons, a concern for the person’s subjectivity and self-determination, and particular emphasis on the intersubjective (relational) nature of the person.
Personalists have generally insisted on the falsity of Darwin’s claim that man’s difference from other terrestrial beings is one of degree and not of kind. Human exceptionalism has defined most personalist thought. Obviously, such exceptionalism is not exclusive to personalism, but represents, rather, a standard assumption of classical philosophical anthropology. In 1625, for instance, Grotius wrote: “Man is, to be sure, an animal, but an animal of a superior kind, much farther removed from all other animals than the different kinds of animals are from one another” (De iure belli ac pacis, Prolegomena, 11).
According to a typical personalist conception, the fundamental classification of all beings is the distinction between persons and non-persons. For many personalists, what makes man “unlike” other animals is different from what makes a baboon different from a giraffe, or even from what makes a baboon different from a rock. Thus, in the words of Jacques Maritain: “Whenever we say that man is a person, we mean that he is more than a mere parcel of matter, more than an individual element in nature, such as is an atom, a blade of grass, a fly or an elephant…Man is an animal and an individual, but unlike other animals or individuals.” Or as William Stern wrote, in his introduction to Person und Sache (vol. 2): “Despite any similarities by which persons are identified as members of humankind, a particular race or gender, etc., despite any broad or narrow regularities which are involved in any personal events, a primal uniqueness always remains, through which every person is a world of its own with regard to other persons.”
Here personalists react not only to the main forms of idealism, the materialism, and the determinism of the nineteenth century, but even to the objectivism of Aristotle. Following his methodology for defining a species in terms of its proximate genus and specific difference, Aristotle had defined man as a rational animal (ho anthropos zoon noetikon) (Aristotle, Hist. Anim. I, 1: 488a7; Nichomachean Ethics I, 5: 1097b11; VIII, 12: 1162a16; IX, 9: 1169b18; Politics, I, 2: 1253a3). Personalists, while accepting this definition, as far as it goes, see such a construction as an unacceptable reduction of the human person to the objective world. This objective, cosmological view of man as an animal with the distinguishing feature of reason—by which man is primarily an object alongside other objects in the world to which he physically belongs—would be only partly valid, and insufficient. In an effort to interpret the subjectivity that is proper to the person, personalism expresses a belief in both the non-material dimension and the primordial uniqueness of the human being, and thus in the basic irreducibility of the human being to the natural world.
Many personalists see human beings as dealing with all other realities as objects (something related intentionally to a subject), but affirm a substantive difference between the human person and all other objects. The person alone is “somebody” rather than merely “something”, and this sets him apart from every other entity in the visible world. No precise and general position specific to personalists with regard to the nature of animals can be discerned. But the sharp distinction between “somebody” and “something,” in particular as applied to such other sentient beings, reflects both the influence on personalism of the Judaeo-Christian tradition and at least some of the general impact or spirit of distinctly modern, Cartesian rationalism, which latter is of course not unaffected by inherited Christian dualisms. Only the human being is typically conceived by personalism as simultaneously object and subject, while at the same time this is held to be true for all persons, irrespective of age, intelligence, qualities, etc. For personalists, personal subjectivity assures that the human being’s proper essence cannot be reduced to and exhaustively explained by the proximate genus and specific difference. Subjectivity becomes, then, a kind of synonym for the irreducible in the human being.
But the broader, realist personalism does posit, in the classical and scholastic tradition, the essential difference between man and all other objects on man’s ability to reason (and its corollary of language), which differentiates a person from the whole world of objective entities. Since it is precisely his intellectual and spiritual nature that makes subjectivity possible, one can say that in the subjectivity of the human person is also something objective. Yet these personalists insist on the clear separation between non-personal beings and this subjectivity of the person which is derivative of his rational nature in a broader or higher sense. Regardless of how, more precisely, animals are to be understood, the person differs from even the most advanced among them by a specific kind of inner self, an inner life, which, ideally, revolves around his pursuit of truth and goodness, and generates person-specific theoretical and moral questions and concerns.
Other strains of personalism, such as that represented by the dialogical philosophy of Martin Buber, pay less attention to the difference between persons and non-persons and underscore instead the way one relates to all of reality. Buber separates the way of dealing with other realities into two, which he terms “I-Thou” and “I-It” relationships, the first reflecting a fundamental openness to the reality of the other and the latter reflecting an objectivization and subordination of the other to oneself. According to Buber, we engage others either as an It, forming an I-It primary word, or as a Thou, forming the I-Thou primary word. Yet whereas some personalists would assert that such an I-Thou relationship is the only appropriate way of dealing with persons, and the I-It relationship the only appropriate way of dealing with things, Buber presents the I-Thou relationship as the ideal for the human person’s dealing with all reality, personal and non-personal alike. And though this I-Thou relation will take on different characteristics according to the sphere in which the relation arises (nature, men, spiritual beings), for Buber the fundamental difference lies within the human person himself and in the attitude with which he engages reality.
Some personalists have come to take a critical view of the starkly formulated human exceptionalism, and to go further than Buber in not just reconsidering the attitude of the human being, but also the rigid dualism involved in the view of everything that is not human (and divine) persons as just soulless, impersonal “objects”. The Czech philosopher Erazim Kohák is an example of an in important respects personalist thinker who has tried to rethink both our attitude to and our understanding of nature in this respect. The various effort to overcome the impersonal objectification of nature and other life-forms, and to conceive of a more thoroughgoingly personal universe, partly resemble the positions of some of the early idealistic personalists in the nineteenth century. Just like these personalists had sometimes incorporated the accumulated and interrelated insights of self-consciousness, subjectivity, interiority, individuality/singularity, will, imagination, and historicity in a way which the still in some respects often somewhat one-sidedly generalist Thomistic currents of personalism had not, they also came closer to a view of nature that rectifies the overly rigid dualisms of a created world at such distance from its creator as to be almost independent, and man as almost equally sharply separated from the rest of creation. The human form of life is clearly exceptional in that it allows a much higher degree of development of personality in every respect, but to regard as a corollary of this insight the position that plants and even animals are mere impersonal objects, without consciousness and their own kind of subjectivity, seems to be regarded as increasingly problematic among personalists.
A not unimportant part of personalism’s human exceptionalism reflects these cleavages of a world in which the presence of the divine is no longer sensed and perceived in nature. The modern desacralized world, as articulated by Cartesianism but prepared by Ockham and even in some respects by Aquinas, is also in reality in important respects an impersonalized world. While guarding against the new impersonalism and moral ambiguity of the romantic pantheists, the early personalists of the nineteenth century at least perceived clearly the problems with the stark dualisms of much Christian theology as well as of modern rationalism, the Enlightenment, and scientism.
In stressing the uniqueness of persons vis-à-vis all other entities, personalists influenced by Thomism designate the essential dividing line of reality as that which separates personal and non-personal being. Dealings with persons, therefore, require a different ethical paradigm from that used to describe dealings with non-personal realities. The “rules” of dealing with non-personal reality do not hold when dealing with persons, and vice-versa. This radical dichotomy between persons and non-persons is essentially ontological, or transcendental-constitutive, but produces immediate consequences on the ethical level.
At the center of this personalism stands an affirmation of the dignity of the person, the quality, insisted on already by medieval thinkers, which constitutes the unique excellence of personhood and which gives rise to specific moral requirements. Dignity refers to the inherent value of the person, as a “someone” and not merely “something,” and this confers an absoluteness not found in other beings. Here classical-realist personalists reject the Hobbesian notion of dignity as the price set on an individual by the commonwealth, and ally themselves rather with Kant in his assertion that dignity is inherent and sets itself beyond all price. The language of dignity rules out the possibility of involving persons in a trade-off, as if their worth were a function of their utility. Every person without exception is of inestimable worth, and no one is dispensable or interchangeable. The person can never be lost or assimilated fully into the collectivity, because his interrelatedness with other persons is defined by his possession of a unique, irreplaceable value. The agreement with Kant in this regard can be said to constitute a bridge between personalism in the broader sense and personalism in the narrow sense.
Attributing a unique dignity or worth to the human person also throws light on the cardinal virtue of justice. Rendering “to each his due” hinges on one’s understanding of what each deserves, and this cannot be correctly ascertained without taking into account the dignity and worth that are at the same time general qualities of all persons, and inseparable from the singularity of each of them. Personalists in the broader sense therefore lay special stress on what persons deserve by the very fact of their personhood, and on the difference between acting toward a person and acting toward any other reality. When the person is the object of one’s action, a whole ethical structure enters into play that is absent when the object of one’s action is a thing. How persons should be treated forms an independent ethical category, separate in essence and not only in degree from how non-persons (things) are to be treated. Whereas traditional ethical systems stress the internal mechanisms of the moral agent (conscience, obligation, sin, virtue, etc.) and the effect that free actions have on moral character, personalists add to this a particular concern for the transcendent character of human action and the dignity of the one being acted upon. The person’s absolute character provides for the possibility of absolute moral norms when dealing with persons.
For personalists, human dignity as such does not depend on variables such as native intelligence, athletic ability or social prowess. Nor can it result merely from good conduct or moral merit. It must rather be rooted in human nature itself, so that on the deepest level, despite the variations of moral conduct and the resultant differences in moral character, all members of the species share this dignity. The difference between being something and someone has been seen as so radical that it does not admit of degrees. Most personalists have denied that personhood is something that can be gradually attained. It is like a binary function (1 or 0) or a toggle switch (on or off), that admits no middle ground.
But as we have seen, these positions can be related to a not wholly unproblematic view of non-human nature. Personalists in the narrow sense accept, as far as it goes, the view of the dignity of man as found in Kant’s ethics or practical philosophy, but modify and add to it not least from the perspective of a more thoroughgoingly personalist understanding of the importance of individual uniqueness. And since they do not merely emphasize the importance of the person within the framework of a pre-existing metaphysics and a philosophical and theological anthropology, there is available to them a theoretical space for conceiving of the non-human world of “somethings” in a less objectifying and exploitative manner. The early, idealistic personalists were much more inclined to see external nature too as ultimately expressive of personal reality, and to account for its impersonal appearance in terms of the limitations of finite perception.
Personalists assert that only persons are truly “subjects.” This is not to say that in the syntactic sense other entities do not “act” or “produce” or “cause,” but properly speaking they do not possess subjectivity. In the modern sense, subjectivity depends primarily on the unity of self-consciousness, and on interiority, freedom, and personal autonomy. Though non-personal beings may “act” in the syntactic sense, they are not truly subjects of action since the cause of their action is extrinsic to them. Despite the difference with regard to the ultimate nature of the “non-personal” between some personalists in the narrow sense and personalists in the broader sense, there is in this area a considerable overlap between the two forms of personalism. For theistic personalists, personal subjectivity embraces the moral and religious dimensions, which are part and parcel of the person’s nature as a conscious, intelligent, free, willing subject in relation with God and others. As free, thinking subjects, persons also exercise creativity through their thought, imagination, and action, a creativity which affects both the surrounding world and the person himself. Furthermore, personalists have observed that the lived experience of the human person, as a conscious and self-conscious being, discloses not only actions but also inner happenings that depend upon the self. These experiences, lived in a conscious way, go into the makeup and uniqueness of the person as well. As regards the ethical question, not only are persons free and responsible moral subjects, but their subjectivity also conditions others’ ethical responsibility toward them.
What we perceive as “things” can be examined and known from the outside, as what is regarded as “objects”. In a sense, they stand in front of us, they present themselves to us, but always as outside of us. They can be described, qualified, and classified. Classical-realist personalists accept the legitimacy, even necessity, of knowing man too in this way. From this objective viewpoint it is possible to discern some of the superiority of the human being to the rest of reality. Yet in the human person, a thoroughly unique dimension presents itself, a dimension not found in the rest of reality. Human persons experience themselves first of all not as objects but as subjects, not from the outside but from the inside, and thus they are present to themselves in a way that no other reality can be present to them. But here the influence and value of the phenomenological method, as well as of aspects of the earlier idealistic tradition, often makes itself especially felt in personalism and adds to the classical-realist analysis. The essence of the person is explored as an intuition from the inside, rather than as a deduction from a system of thought or through empirical observation in the ordinary sense. The human being must be treated as a subject, must be understood in terms of the modern view of specifically human subjectivity as determined by consciousness. But this contribution is not conceived by personalists as simply replacing in every respect earlier, more objectivist notions of man, but quite as much as complementing them.
This conscious self-presence is the interiority of the human person, and it is so central to the meaning of the concept of person that one can say that personality signifies interiority to self. Because of the person’s subjectivity, he is not only acted upon and moved by external forces, but also acts from within, from the core of his own subjectivity. Since he is the author of his actions, he possesses an identity of his own making, which cannot be reduced to objective analysis and thus resists definition. This resistance to definition, this irreducibility, do not mean that the person’s subjectivity and lived experience are unknowable, but rather that we must come to know them differently, by a method that merely reveals and discloses their essence. In lived experience of self-possession and self-governance, one experiences that one is a person and a subject, and through sympathy and empathy one experiences the personhood of others. To apply the early terminology with some added modern meanings, the person comprises both an objective subsistence (ύπόστασις) and a subjective subsistence (πρόσωπον).
A conclusion of personalism is that the experience of the human being cannot be derived by way of cosmological reduction. We must pause at the irreducible, at that which is unique and unrepeatable in each human being, that by virtue of which he or she is not just a particular human being—an individual of a certain species—but a personal subject. This is the only way to come to a true understanding of the human being. Obviously the framework of the irreducible is not exhaustive of the human condition, and such an understanding must be supplemented by a cosmological perspective. Nevertheless, personalists would say it is impossible to come to a true understanding of the person while neglecting his subjectivity.
The focus on the subjectivity of persons explains many personalists’ insistence on the difference between the concept of “person” and that of “individual.” Gilson wrote that “every human person is first an individual, but he is much more than an individual, since one only speaks of a person, as of a personage, when the individual substance under consideration possesses in his own right a certain dignity.” The major distinction is that an individual represents a single unit in a homogenous set, interchangeable with any other member of the set, whereas a person is characterized by his uniqueness and irreplaceability.
Von Balthasar, for example, wrote: “Few words have as many layers of meaning as person. On the surface it means just any human being, any countable individual. Its deeper senses, however, point to the individual’s uniqueness which cannot be interchanged and therefore cannot be counted.” In this deeper sense persons cannot, properly speaking, be counted, because a single person is not merely one in a series within which each member is identical to the rest for all practical purposes and thus exchangeable for any other. One can count apples, because one apple is as good as another (i.e., what matters is not that it is this apple, but simply that it is an apple), but one cannot count persons in this way. One could count human beings, as individuals of the same species, but the word person emphasizes the uniqueness of each member of the human species, his incommensurability and incommunicability. Von Balthasar goes on to say: “If one distinguishes between individual and person (and we should for the sake of clarity), then a special dignity is ascribed to the person, which the individual as such does not possess…We will speak of a ‘person’…when considering the uniqueness, the incomparability and therefore irreplaceability of the individual.”
As valid as these philosophical distinctions are, whether one speaks of a human individual or a human person, these are simply two names applied to the same reality. Personalists are quick to assert that personality is not superadded to humanity, but is inherent to the essence of every human being, since it is rooted in human nature itself. “Human person” and “human individual,” while underscoring different dimensions of a human being, are synonymous in everyday language and have the same referent. Some thinkers have proposed a real distinction between a human person and a human individual. From their perspective, personhood would be an acquired “extra” for a human being, a status reached not simply by being an individual of the species, but by entering into certain relationships with other persons in a conscious, intentional way. In other words, while all human persons would be human individuals, the reverse would not be true.
Personalists typically reject this, and insist that each living human being normally possesses—actually and not merely potentially, although the importance of further development or actualization is strongly stressed—the definitional and constitutive consciousness, intentionality, will etc., the radical capacity to reason, laugh, love, and choose. These are not just some abstractly conceivable common characteristics of a species, but aspects of the unique, individual, organic functioning of every human being. In this way, personalists see personhood as subsisting even while its operations come and go with many changing factors such as immaturity, injury, sleep, and senility.
Man’s intellectual nature, which according to Boethius is the distinguishing characteristic of personhood, is also the font of freedom, subjectivity, immortality, and man’s cognitive and moral life. It is as a rational being, and therefore as a person, that the individual can distinguish true from false and good from evil. Therefore science and morality are proper to persons. Because the person possesses a spiritual nature, the source of its action is internal to itself and not extrinsic.
Personalists insist that in his contact with the world the human person acts not in a purely mechanical or deterministic way, but from the inner self, as a subjective “I,” with the power of self-determination. Possession of free will means that the human person is his own master (sui iuris). Self-mastery and freedom characterize personal beings; a free being is a person. The person’s power of self-determination explains the non-transferable nature of personality. His incommunicability does not only refer to the person’s uniqueness and unrepeatability. What is incommunicable or inalienable in a person is intrinsic to that person’s inner self and to the power of self-determination. No one can substitute his act of will for another’s.
In what does self-determination consist? A classic distinction separates “human acts” (actus humani) from so-called “acts of man” (actus hominis). An act of man describes something that “happens” in the subject whereas a properly human act ascribes free and responsible authorship of the act to the subject. The element of interior causality is referred to as self-determination. This self-determination involves a sense of efficacy on the part of the acting subject, who recognizes that “I act” means that “I am the efficient cause” of my action. One’s sense of efficacy as an acting person in relation to the action performed is in turn closely connected to one’s sense of responsibility for the activity. This experience on the phenomenological level draws attention to the will as the person’s power of self-determination, while at the same time making clear that self-determination is a property of the person himself, and not just of the will. It is the freedom of the person as such, through his will.
Yet self-determination does not only describe the causality of the action, but also of the one acting. In acting, the person not only directs himself toward a value, he determines himself as well. He is not only the efficient cause of his actions, but is also in some sense the creator of himself, especially his moral self. By choosing to carry out good or bad actions, man makes himself a morally good or bad human being. Action is organically linked to becoming. By free moral action the personal subject becomes good or bad as a human being. When a person acts, he acts intentionally toward an object, a value which attracts the will to itself. At the same time, self-determination points inward toward the subject himself. As a result of this, the human being is capable of existing and acting “for itself,” or is capable of a certain autoteleology. This means that the person determines not only his own ends but also becomes an end for himself. The person is not only responsible for his actions, he is also responsible for himself, for his moral character and identity. Freedom means that one is responsible for one’s choices but also for one’s self.
Freedom and self-determination also bear a close relation to another characteristic of the person’s spiritual nature: creativity. Freedom as a property of the person allows the person to create through thought and action. The will is not simply the executor of the intellect’s reasoned conclusions. The intellect presents a variety of goods to be realized, none of which imposes itself in such a way as to be necessarily desired or chosen above the others. The person himself decides spontaneously and freely, and thus determines his own moral value and identity. “This particular good I am choosing has value for me according to the ‘me’ that I freely desire and choose to be.”
Personalists stress the person’s nature as a social being. According to personalists, the person never exists in isolation, and moreover persons find their human perfection only in communion with other persons. Interpersonal relations are never superfluous or optional to the person, but are indicated by his nature and an essential component of his fulfillment.
Relation is proper only to the person. Personalism has endeavored to highlight this aspect of personhood and bring it to the fore. It is central to personalism’s reaction against and endeavor to overcome the polarization of individualism on the one hand and collectivism on the other. Personalists consider human beings as a “beings for others” or “beings with others.” Relationship is not an optional accessory for the human person, but is essential to his personhood. He is a being-for-relation.
Personalists recognize that as much as he may strive for independence, the human person necessarily relies on others. He depends on other persons for his survival and development, and this interdependence is a hallmark of human existence. Beyond this, the human person also tends toward society as a basic human value. Such society is not only a matter of utility or convenience but reflects an innate tendency of the person to seek out his fellows and enter into spiritual association with them. The trait of sociableness has been observed since the earliest philosophers, and reflects both man’s dependence on other people for his subsistence and development and his natural tendency to deeper communion.
Some personalists note that man’s social nature and his vocation to inter-personal communion are not the same thing. Their capacity for rational community and friendship is one of the things that make human beings social. But the person’s capacity for communion is according to these personalists deeper than mere sociability. “Society,” in fact, is sometimes analogously applied to non-personal beings that live and interact as a group rather than in isolation from one another, whereas the word ‘communion’ could never be understood in this way. Communio does not simply refer to something common, but rather to a mode of being and acting in common through which the persons involved mutually confirm and affirm one another, a mode of being and acting that promotes the personal fulfillment of each of them by virtue of their mutual relationship. This mode of being and acting is an exclusive property of persons.
Personalists see the human person’s vocation to communion as rooted in rational nature, through the person’s subjectivity and self-determination. Far from closing the person in on himself, these characteristics of the person’s spiritual nature dispose him to communication with other persons. For most personalists, the subjectivity of the person has nothing in common with the isolated unity of the Leibnizian monad but requires the communication of knowledge and love.
This communication, in turn, depends on the person’s self-determination with its distinctive structure of self-possession and self-governance. As a free, willing subject, the person cannot be possessed by another, unless he chooses to make a gift of himself to another. Personalists assert that the person belongs to himself in a way that no other thing or animal can. Self-possession does not imply isolation. On the contrary, both self-possession and self-governance imply a special disposition to make “a gift of oneself.” Only if one possesses oneself can one give oneself and do this in a disinterested way. And only if one governs oneself can one make a disinterested gift of oneself. This vocation to self-giving is so essential to the constitution of the person that it is precisely when one becomes a gift for others that one most fully becomes oneself. Without a disinterested gift of self man cannot achieve the finality that is proper to a human being by virtue of his being a person, and cannot fully discover his true self.
For personalists, this “law of the gift” shows that the relation and the society of which the person alone is capable, and which are necessary for his realization as a person, consist not only in association, but in love. They consist in a love which gives and gives itself, which receives not only things but other persons as well. Only persons can give love and only persons can receive love.
- Bowne, Borden Parker, 1908, Personalism, Boston: Houghton Mifflin Company.
- Brightman Edgar S., 1932, Is God a Person?, New York: Association Press.
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
- Bowne, Borden Parker, Personalism.
- Buford, Thomas O. and Harold H. Oliver, Personalism Revisited: Its Proponents and Critics.
- Burrow, Rufus Jr., Personalism: A Critical Introduction.
- Chazarreta Rourke, Rosita A., A Theory of Personalism.
- McLean, George F. (ed.), Personalist Ethics and Human Subjectivity.
- Williams, Thomas D., Who Is My Neighbor? Personalism and the Foundations of Human Rights.
- Berdyaev, N.A., Personalism and Marxism, manuscript.
- Buford, Thomas O., Personalism, manuscript in PDF.
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- DeMarco, Donald, The Christian Personalism of Jacques Maritain, manuscript.
- Personalism, entry in the Encyclopædia Britannica Online.
- Personalism, entry by Thomas Buford, in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
- De Tavernier, Johan, The Historical Roots of Personalism, paper (PDF) in Ethical Perspectives, 16(3) (2009): 361–392.
- Williams, Thomas D., What Is Thomistic Personalism?, paper (PDF) in Alpha Omega, VII/2 (2004): 163–197.