Petitionary Prayer

First published Wed Aug 15, 2012; substantive revision Thu Dec 9, 2021

Prayer seems to be a prominent feature of every religion. When people pray, they attempt to contact/communicate with special persons or entities, such as a God or gods, or dead relatives, or exemplary human beings who are believed to occupy some special status.

People pray for all kinds of reasons. Sometimes people pray in order to give thanks, sometimes to offer praise and adoration, sometimes to apologize and seek forgiveness, and sometimes to ask for things. The focus of this article is petitionary prayer, in which a petitioner requests something. Historically, the philosophical puzzles concerning petitionary prayer that have received most attention have arisen in connection with the traditional monotheism shared by Judaism, Christianity, and Islam. According to traditional monotheism, God knows everything that can be known, is perfectly good, impassible (unable to be affected by an outside source), immutable (unchanging), and free. God is also able to do anything compatible with the possession of the qualities just enumerated. In this entry, we will explore the most prominent philosophical puzzles that arise in connection with the idea of offering petitionary prayers to God, as understood along the lines just described, along with the most influential attempts to solve them.

1. The Concept of Answered Prayer

What would it mean to say that a petitionary prayer to God had been answered? Petitionary prayers often make many differences to those who offer them, whether positive or negative (see Phillips 1981 and Brümmer 2008), but the more philosophically interesting question is whether or not such prayers make a difference to God. And the question is not whether God simply hears or notices such prayers—after all, we have assumed that God knows everything that happens in the world and is perfectly good. Typically, when philosophers discuss the effectiveness of petitionary prayer, they wonder whether petitionary prayers ever move God to act in some way. What would it mean to say this?

Philosophers usually assume that a prayer is answered if and only if God brings about the thing requested in part because of the offering of the prayer, so that had the prayer not been offered, the thing in question would not have occurred. If you pray to God for rain tomorrow and it does rain tomorrow, this all by itself is not enough to say that your prayer for rain was effective—it must also be the case that God actually brought about the rain at least in part because of your prayer. If it would have rained anyway, without your prayer for rain, then it doesn’t seem that your prayer for rain was effective. So an effective prayer would be a prayer that made a difference by influencing God to act. (For more on this question, see Flint 1998, chapter 10, Davison 2017, chapter 2, Pruss 2013, Johnson 2020, and Davison 2022, chapter 3.)

2. Divine Immutability and Impassibility

As mentioned above, traditional theists believe that God is immutable (cannot change) and impassible (cannot be affected by anything external). These ideas are related to one another, but not identical: if God is immutable, then God is impassible. But just because God is impassible, it does not follow that God is immutable—God might be able to change without being affected by any external source. If God is both immutable and impassible, then it seems that no petitionary prayers are effective.

A number of responses are open to traditional theists at this point. Some theists have argued that there are independent reasons for saying that God is neither immutable nor impassible. For example, many people have argued that God is both compassionate and forgiving. But to be compassionate or forgiving seems to require being responsive to the actions of others, so perhaps we should not say that God is immutable or impassible after all (see the entry on God and other ultimates).

A different response to the puzzle here would involve characterizing the concepts of divine immutability and impassibility so that they apply to God in a way that does not rule out the effectiveness of petitionary prayers. This is an interesting philosophical project in its own right (see the discussions in Creel 1985 and the entries on God and other ultimates and immutability), but its prospects for success fall beyond the scope of this article.

Finally, a third response would involve claiming that in cases of apparently effective prayer, God is not really responding to the prayer but instead bringing about events as part of a providential plan, a plan that includes both the prayer and the apparent answer to it. Such a position is suggested by the following remark from St. Thomas Aquinas: “We pray not in order to change the divine disposition but for the sake of acquiring by petitionary prayer what God has disposed to be achieved by prayer (quoted and discussed at length in Stump 1979).” Given the way that we have characterized effective prayer above, though, this approach seems to deny that petitionary prayers are effective, so it would not solve the problem at hand.

3. Divine Omniscience

A different puzzle concerning the effectiveness of petitionary prayer arises in connection with divine omniscience, the idea that God knows everything that can be known. If God already knows the future, for instance, then how can petitionary prayer make a difference? The future, after all, is just the set of things that will happen. If God knows the future in all of its detail, then it seems that there is no room for petitionary prayers to be effective: either the thing requested in prayer is something that God already knows will be done, or it isn’t, and either way, it looks like the prayer can make no difference. Like many other questions in theology, this puzzle raises an interesting question about the limits of God’s knowledge. Is it possible for anyone, including God, to know the future in all of its detail? Philosophers disagree sharply about this. Here we will explore briefly three possible answers to this question. (For more on this, see Borland 2006 (Other Internet Resources) and the entries on omniscience and prophecy.)

First, according to the view known as “open theism,” God cannot know those parts of the future that are yet to be determined, such as the future free actions of human beings, either because there are no truths to be known yet or because there is no way for anyone, including God, to know them (see Hasker 1989, Rissler 2006, the entry on process theism, Other Internet Resources). This does not mean the God is not omniscient, because God still knows everything that can be known (and that is what it means to be omniscient, according to open theists). So open theists have a way to defuse the puzzle for petitionary prayer involving omniscience concerning the future: if our prayers are free, or God’s decision whether or not to answer them is free (or both), then those things cannot be part of a determined future and God cannot know about them in advance. But open theism is controversial because (among other things: see Rissler 2006) it appears to deny something that theists have affirmed traditionally, namely, that God knows the future in all of its detail.

Second, there is something called the “middle knowledge” view. This position holds that God knows the future in all of its detail as a result of knowing both (1) what everyone and everything would do in any possible situation and (2) which situations everyone and everything will be placed in actually (see Flint 1998). According to this picture, God knows the future in all of its detail, but what God knows about the future free choices of human beings depends on what they would choose—and that is something that is up to the human beings in question, not up to God. Even though God knows what you will do in the future, according to this picture, it is still up to you. In fact, when you make a free choice, you have the ability to do something such that were you to do it, God would have always known something different from what he knows in fact. (This is sometimes described in terms of having so-called “counterfactual power” with respect to God’s knowledge: see Flint 1998.)

According to the proponents of middle knowledge, then, petitionary prayer can still make a difference because God can take into account those prayers that can be offered in the future when God plans how to create the world over time. The mere fact that God knows the future in all of its detail does not mean that this future is determined. So the proponents of middle knowledge have a way to answer the puzzle concerning omniscience. But the theory of middle knowledge is very controversial; critics wonder whether there are truths about what everyone and everything would do in every situation, and even if there were, how God could know such things (see the entry on prophecy and Zagzebski 2011).

Defenders of a view called “timeless eternity” hold that God knows all of history at once, from a point of view outside of time altogether (see the entry on eternity.) Like the proponents of middle knowledge, the defenders of timeless eternity will say that just because God knows the future, this does not mean that God determines it. They will also say that God’s single act of creation from outside of time has many effects in time, including, perhaps, answers to prayers that God anticipates from the point of view of eternity. In this way, the defenders of timeless eternity can answer the puzzle concerning omniscience. But like open theism and the theory of middle knowledge, the idea that God is timelessly eternal is controversial too; for one thing, if God can tell from the point of view of eternity what people will pray in the future, God should also be able to tell what God will do (if anything) in that same future, so it is hard to see how such knowledge could inform divine choices (see Hasker 1989, Flint 1998, Pruss 2007, Hunt 2009, and Zagzebski 2011).

It is worth noting, in this section, the view known as "theological determinism," according to which God determines everything in every detail, and so knows the past, present, and future on this basis. Although theological determinism raises other questions about creaturely responsibility and the problem of evil, it certainly explains how God could know about future prayers in a way that permits God to answer them. (For more on these questions, see Hasker 1989, Timpe and Speak 2016, White 2019, and Furlong 2019.)

It is also worth noting, in this section, that some philosophers have argued that not only does it make sense to pray for the future if God exists, but also it makes sense to pray for the past as well—such prayers could be effective, depending on the extent of God’s knowledge. For example, given the way we have described effective petitionary prayer, it could be possible for a prayer for something to have happened yesterday to be effective, as long as the thing in question actually did happen yesterday. This is because God could know that I would offer the prayer in the future, and could have taken this into account yesterday, as long as God can know the future. So defenders of middle knowledge and timeless eternity can say that prayers for the past might be effective (but open theists, it seems, cannot say this: for more on this question, see Timpe 2005).

4. Divine Moral Perfection

Theists have traditionally recognized a number of limits on God’s actions. For instance, it is common to insist that God’s omnipotence does not imply that God can do impossible things, such as create stones that are too heavy for God to lift. It is also common to insist that God cannot do that which is intrinsically evil, because God is morally perfect. (For a discussion of petitionary prayers for bad things, see Smilansky 2012.) Since God is provident, one might also suspect that God would not answer petitionary prayers for things that would interfere with God’s providential plans for the world. Within these limits, one might wonder whether there is enough room among the space of God’s reasons for petitionary prayers to make a difference, and what kinds of reasons such prayers could provide for God.

Some have argued that God’s moral perfection implies that petitionary prayers cannot make a difference because God will do what is best for everyone whether or not anyone ever offers petitionary prayers for those things. If this were so, then it would seem that petitionary prayers are never answered in the sense described above.

In response to this worry, a number of authors have suggested that it would be better, in some cases, for God to bring certain things about in response to petitionary prayers than to bring about those same things independently of any such requests. In order to explore this idea, it is helpful to draw a distinction. Sometimes people pray for themselves, and sometimes they pray for others. Let’s call the first kind of prayer “self-directed,” and let’s call the second kind of prayer “other-directed.”

First, consider self-directed prayers. Eleonore Stump argues that in some cases, God waits for us to ask for something before granting it in order to avoid spoiling or overwhelming us. We could be spoiled by God if God answered all of our prayers automatically, and we could be overwhelmed by God if God provided everything good for us without waiting for us to ask first (Stump 1979). In a similar vein, Michael Murray and Kurt Meyers argue that by making the provision of certain things dependent on petitionary prayer, God helps us to avoid idolatry, which is a sense of complete self-sufficiency that fails to recognize God as the source of all good things. They also say that requiring petitionary prayer in some cases helps us to learn about God’s will as we recognize the patterns in prayers answered (and not answered: see Murray and Meyers 1994 and section 5 below).

Second, consider other-directed prayers. Murray and Meyers argue that if God makes the provision of certain things for others dependent on our prayers for them, then this can help to build interdependence and community (Murray and Meyers 1994). By contrast, Richard Swinburne and Daniel and Frances Howard-Snyder argue that by requiring petitionary prayers in some cases, God gives us more responsibility for the well-being of ourselves and others than we would enjoy otherwise (Swinburne 1998, Howard-Snyder and Howard-Snyder 2011). Critics of this approach have wondered whether this involves God using others as a means to an end (Basinger 1983) or whether this really extends our responsibility for others (Davison 2017, chapter 7).

Finally, some philosophers (for example, Basinger 2004) note that there are a number of ways to understand God’s obligations toward created persons, only some of which suggest that God’s goodness would be compromised if God withheld things because petitionary prayers were not offered. So there are a number of responses that theists can make to the puzzle of petitionary prayer that stems from divine moral perfection. (For more on this question, see Davison 2017, chapter 6, and Davison 2022, chapter 4.)

5. Epistemology

Would it ever be possible to know or reasonably believe that God has answered a particular petitionary prayer? As one might expect, philosophers disagree about this question. Some theists think that for all we know, for any particular event that happens, God may have had independent reasons for bringing that event about, so we cannot know whether or not God brought it about because of a prayer (as opposed to bringing it about for other reasons—for more on this argument, see Basinger 2004, Davison 2017, chapter 4, Choi 2016, and Davison 2022, chapter 4). This line of thought is especially interesting in light of the recent popularity of so-called skeptical theism, which responds to the problem of evil by claiming that we can never know exactly how particular events are connected with each other and with good or bad consequences, some of which may be beyond our understanding (see McBrayer 2010, Other Internet Resources). Others argue that as long as people are justified in believing, in general terms, that God sometimes answers prayers, then it is possible to believe reasonably that one’s petitionary prayer has been answered when one knows that the thing requested has come to pass (see Murray and Meyers 1994, Murray 2004, and Choi 2016).

A number of people have tried to conduct statistical studies to determine whether or not petitionary prayer is effective. These studies try to measure the differences between groups of people, one of which is the subject of petitionary prayers, and the other of which is not. Although some earlier studies suggested a positive correlation between patient recovery and petitionary prayer (see Byrd 1998; Harris, et al. 1999; and Leibovici 2001), more recent studies have suggested that the offering of petitionary prayer (and the knowledge that such prayers were offered) is not positively correlated with patient recovery (see Benson et al. 2006).

Some have suggested, though, that these kinds of studies are flawed from the outset (see Brümmer 2008 and Davison 2017, chapter 5). It would be difficult to to ensure that some group of people is the subject of no petitionary prayers, for instance, since it is impossible to prevent people from praying for those whom they know. Also, God is typically assumed to be a free person, not a natural force that acts automatically in all similar cases, so we cannot assume that God will simply ignore those people for whom petitionary prayers have not been offered. This means that even if a study showed some statistically significant difference between the two groups of people, we could not be sure that it was due to the offering of petitionary prayers alone, as opposed to some other factor or factors.


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Other Internet Resources

  • Prayer, in The Catholic Encyclopedia.
  • Borland, Tully, 2006, “Omniscience and Divine Foreknowledge,” in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
  • McBrayer, Justin P., 2010, “Skeptical Theism,” in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
  • Rissler, James, 2006, “Open Theism,” in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
  • Timpe, Kevin, 2006, “Free Will,” in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

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