Historicist Theories of Scientific Rationality
[Editor's Note: The following new entry by Thomas Nickles replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous authors.]
Many scientists, philosophers, and laypersons have regarded science as the one human enterprise that successfully escapes the contingencies of history to establish eternal truths about the universe, via a special, rational method of inquiry. Historicists oppose this view. In the 1960s several historically informed philosophers of science challenged the then-dominant accounts of scientific method advanced by the Popperians and the positivists (the logical positivists and logical empiricists) for failing to fit historical scientific practice and failing particularly to account for deep scientific change. While several strands of historicism originated in nineteenth-century historiography, this article focuses, first, on the historicist conceptions of scientific rationality that became prominent in the 1960s and 1970s, as the maturation of the field of historiography of science began to suggest competing models of scientific development, and, second, on recent approaches such as historical epistemology.
The “Battle of the Big Systems” of the 1960s and ‘70s, involving historicists such as Thomas Kuhn, Imre Lakatos, Paul Feyerabend, and Larry Laudan, eventually gave way to a realist reaction, as many philosophers rejected the perceived skepticism and potential relativism of the historicist movement, now reinforced by new-wave sociology of science. The 1990s featured the so-called Science Wars, as philosophers attempted to defend truth, rationality, objectivity, and scientific progress (and their own turf) from the perceived threats of rapidly developing, sociology-inspired science and technology studies and (other) postmodern influences. Since then, a group of interdisciplinary scholars have attempted to reimagine ways in which historical and philosophical work can be brought together fruitfully.
- 1. Historicist Conceptions of Rationality: The Battle of the Big Systems
- 2. Rationality and History: Some Basic Questions
- 3. Historicism Then and Now
- 4. Related Developments and Further Challenges
- 5. Integrated HPS and Historical Epistemology: What Good Are They Regarding Scientific Rationality?
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1. Historicist Conceptions of Rationality: The Battle of the Big Systems
What good is appeal to history when it comes to evaluating the rationality of decisions and actions? Since the past is already over, isn’t history simply “bunk”? A couple of everyday locutions suggest otherwise. It is commonly held that “history” (meaning historiography, the disciplined study of what happened in history) is a debunker of myths. And politicians are not the only people worried about “the judgment of history”. Both these ideas came into play in the new historically-oriented philosophy of science that began to emerge at the end of the 1950s. The “new historicists” (as we may call them) included Thomas Kuhn, N.R. Hanson, Mary Hesse, Imre Lakatos, Paul Feyerabend, Stephen Toulmin, Dudley Shapere, Larry Laudan, Ernan McMullin, and Michael Ruse. They claimed that the then-dominant positivist and Popperian accounts of science were themselves bunk—myths about how science is done. Some new historicists claimed to find larger units and a hitherto unnoticed dynamic in the time-series of the historical record—long-term, forward-looking research programs that included evolving series of related theoretical moments. Above all, the historicists stressed the depth of major historical changes and the resulting challenges to cumulative scientific progress. They argued that there was nothing in the traditional “logic of science” that could rationalize such changes. The problem was to produce a new dynamical model of science that would capture these patterns and rationally motivate them.
Historicist philosophers did a convincing job of showing that historical evidence called the received views into question. Most philosophers today accept that verdict of history. Less successful was the attempt to formulate an adequate positive theory of rationality, both at the first-order level of scientific methodological norms (e.g., “Reject a hypothesis that makes clearly false predictions” or “Use double-blind experimental methods when dealing with cognitive agents”) and at the metamethodological level, where they faced the problem of how to rationally select among competing theories of scientific rationality, without circularity. The disagreements here raised the question of whether there is a general theory of scientific rationality to be found, or a need for one.
(For accessible, critical summaries of the “Big Systems” debate, see Suppe 1974, Newton-Smith 1981, McGuire 1992, and Zammito 2004. Space limitations have forced the omission of important developments, including the Marxist dialectical tradition, e.g., Nowak 1980, and recent work on stance and rationality, e.g., van Fraassen 2002, Rowbottom & Bueno 2011.)
1.2 The Historical Turn in Philosophy of Science
Kuhn’s Structure of Scientific Revolutions (1962/1970a) was the original manifesto of historicist philosophy of science and remains the primary reference point. His work thus provides the most useful platform for recounting early historicist efforts—and the difficulties they faced. We shall then take a briefer look at other major contributors. Kuhn had been anticipated in quite diverse ways by Kant, Hegel, William Whewell, Émile Meyerson, Ernst Cassirer, Alexandre Koyré, Philipp Frank, Gaston Bachelard, Ludwik Fleck, Hans Reichenbach, Rudolf Carnap, W.V. Quine, Michael Polanyi, Hesse, Toulmin, and Hanson and was immediately followed by Lakatos, Feyerabend, Shapere, Laudan, and others (see the entry on Thomas Kuhn; also Hoyningen-Huene  1993 and Rheinberger  2010b).
The famous opening sentence of Structure was:
History, if viewed as a repository for more than anecdote or chronology, could produce a decisive transformation in the image of science by which we are now possessed. That image has previously been drawn, even by scientists themselves, mainly from the study of finished scientific achievements as these are recorded in the classics and, more recently, in the textbooks from which each new scientific generation learns to practice its trade. Inevitably, however, the aim of such books is persuasive and pedagogic; a concept of science drawn from them is no more likely to fit the enterprise that produced them than an image of a national culture drawn from a tourist brochure or a language text. This essay attempts to show that we have been misled by them in fundamental ways. Its aim is a sketch of the quite different concept of science that can emerge from the historical records of the research activity itself.
Kuhn modeled the history of a science as a succession of dogmatic periods of “normal science” under a “paradigm”, separated by “revolutionary” transitions to the next paradigm. According to Kuhn such a break from the past rejuvenates a field that had stagnated under the weight of anomalies that it no longer seemed to have the resources to solve. A new paradigm introduces changes at all levels, from established databases and instrumentation to the conceptual framework, goals, standards, institutional organization, and research culture—so much so that some older practitioners can hardly recognize the new paradigm as their field. This disconnect produces “incommensurability” across paradigm change, ranging from communication failure to problems of rational choice between the two, since there exists no fixed measure of success. At his most radical, Kuhn modeled revolutionary decisions on political revolution at the community level and on religious conversion at the individual level, adding that scientists on different sides of a paradigm debate “live in different worlds” ( 1970a: ch. 10). Under critical pressure, he subsequently softened his position. In fact, he sought to clarify the notion of incommensurability to the end of his life (Sankey 1997). Kuhn exemplifies the irony that, while historicists used deep change as a weapon to beat up traditionalists, it presented serious problems for the historicists themselves as well.
Kuhn’s book was his attempt to answer the question posed by the above quotation. This question immediately raised another: How can appeal to history achieve that transformative change? In particular, how can descriptive claims about the past (or present science, for that matter) affect our normative judgments about rational beliefs and behaviors? How can history inform a methodology of science? This is a version of the so-called “is-ought” problem. Can there really be a “judgment” of history?
Over the next decade or two, most philosophers of science came to agree that there was a disconnect between science as historically practiced and the normative models of the received philosophers. The historicists therefore presented the philosophical community with a momentous dilemma: either reject most of science to date as irrational or else accept that science is generally rational and use the historical information to revise our deeply entrenched logical and probabilistic conception of rationality. Some positivists and Popperians attempted to finesse option one by arguing that the history of science approximated the traditional view of rationality closely enough if we treated their sanitized, abstract models of science as regulative ideals. Kuhn and other historicists defended option two, taking the rationality of science to be practically axiomatic. Wrote Kuhn,
I do not for a moment believe that science is an intrinsically irrational enterprise …. I take this assertion not as a matter of fact, but rather of principle. Scientific behavior, taken as a whole, is the best example we have of rationality. (1971: 143f; quoted by Hoyningen-Huhne  1993: 251f.)
What was Kuhn’s revised conception of rationality and how was it based on history (to the degree that it was)? While he provided no explicit, general theory of rationality, Kuhn’s challenge here was greater than many appreciate. The positivists and Popperians had practically invented modern, academic philosophy of science. For them, scientific rationality was wholly a matter of making correct theory acceptance decisions in context of justification, where the hypotheses and test data are already on the table, the data are theory-neutral, and the goals and standards are logically independent of theory. To Kuhn this picture of science was more like a photographic negative in which light and dark are reversed. Let us count the ways.
(1) Although his work deepened the problem of underdetermination by insisting that logic plus data is insufficient to determine theory choice, Kuhn reduced the magnitude of the problem of justifying scientific claims by rejecting traditional realism and the correspondence theory of truth. No longer must scientists justify a theoretical claim as true. Instead, he adopted the Kantian critical position that no enterprise, including science, has the ability to establish the final, metaphysical truth about the world. Instead, science is largely a problem-solving enterprise, and scientists are in position to evaluate the goodness of proposed problem solutions, relative to previous attempts. “[T]he unit of scientific achievement is the solved problem” ( 1970a: 169). What demarcates science from nonscience and pseudoscience is sustained support (over historical time) of a puzzle-solving tradition, not the application of a nonexistent “scientific method” to determine whether the claims are true or false or probable to some degree. With justified truth claims gone, new accounts of scientific discovery, knowledge, explanation, and progress will also be needed.
(2) Contrary to most empiricist views, the data are not theory-neutral, hence not cumulative from one period of science to another.
(3) Moreover, Kuhn extended the claim that observation is theory laden to say that all major aspects of a science are laden by the others. Substantive data and theoretical claims, methodological standards, goals, and even the social institutions of science are all bound up in mutual dependence. (The received view had kept them separate and independent in order to avoid mutual contamination allegedly leading to circularity; see Scheffler 1967.) It is this internal feedback that introduces the interesting, nonlinear dynamics into Kuhn’s model, since the feedback produces coupled interaction terms (Kuhn 1977: 336; Nickles 2013b; De Langhe 2014b).
(4) This tight coherence implies that normal science is conservative and closed, in contrast to Popper’s science as an “open society” (Popper 1945). Contrary to tradition, said Kuhn, scientific rationality does not consist in advancing hypotheses and testing them severely. To challenge the constitutive pillars of a scientific field, as Popper and the positivists advocated, would destroy it, for all theories and conceptual frameworks face potentially falsifying anomalies at all times (Kuhn  1970a and 1970b; Lakatos 1970 agreed). Popper’s “critical rationalism”, the key to Popper’s Enlightenment conception of political democracy as well as scientific advance, is actually irrational; for such criticism would undercut the researchers’ reason for being.
(5) Kuhn claimed that Popper and others had missed the existence of key structures in the history of science—the longer-term approaches that he called paradigms and hence both normal and truly revolutionary science. There are different historical scales in play: individual theories, paradigms, and the still longer-term perspective of a succession of paradigms. So Kuhn adopted a two-tiered or double-process conception of science in which there is, first, a constitutive framework (the paradigm), held immune to revision during periods of normal science, and, second, change from one framework to another. For these frameworks are historically contingent and are eventually displaced by others. Kuhn’s two-process account sharply clashed with the one-process account of Popper (1963) and many others. Ironically, given that Kuhn was also attacking positivist positions, and given his greater sympathy for Popper, the two-process account was closer to the “positivists” Reichenbach and Carnap than to Popper (see Reisch 1991; Carnap 1950; De Langhe 2014a,b; Nickles 2013a).
(6) Thus two different accounts of scientific rationality are required, not one: one to cover the relatively smooth change within normal science under a single paradigm and the other to handle radical paradigm change. This immediately implies that there are two basic types of scientific change, hence two problems of scientific change and/or two problems of progress to be solved, hence two accounts of scientific rationality needed to solve them. What were Kuhn’s constructive claims?
(7) We should seek neither a single, neutral method of all science at all times nor an account based on explicit methodological rules. Most normal scientific decisions are based on skilled judgments, not rules (Kuhn  1970a: chs. 5, 10). The appearance of rules in scientific practice is a sign of crisis, of breakdown. Contrary to tradition, neither rationality within a paradigm nor rational choice between paradigms is a matter of following rules. It is not the application of a formal, logic- or probability-based algorithm. In both cases it is a matter of skilled judgment (of different kinds).
(8) Informal scientific judgment depends heavily upon rhetoric and judgments of heuristic fertility in the context of discovery—the very items that had been expressly excluded from the context of rational justification by the dominant tradition. For Kuhn, normal problem solving is a matter of modeling new puzzles solutions on established precedents, the exemplars, where modeling crucially involves judgments of similarity, analogy, or metaphor. (Whereas Popper’s methodology is a learning theory in which we learn only from our mistakes, in Kuhn’s we learn also (mainly) from our successes—the exemplars, which, over time ratchet up our knowledge within normal science.) In paradigm change, the rhetorical tropes used in persuasion are typically more abstract and tenuous than in normal science. Kuhn’s account of the rational acceptance of paradigm change had to remain thin because of incommensurability. Here the justification problem was all the more difficult because new paradigms generally lose some of the successes of their predecessors (so called “Kuhn loss” of problem solutions but also data, theory, goals, and standards).
(9) Kuhn’s novel constructive move in dealing with the rationality of paradigm change was to bring in a prospective dimension of heuristic fertility judgments. From the point of view of key, creative scientists, the old paradigm has exhausted its resources, whereas radical new ideas and practices can not only resolve some old anomalies (retrospective confirmation) but, equally importantly, can reinvent and thereby preserve the field by opening up new frontiers with much interesting new work to be done. For them the field now had a future. To be sure, heuristic guidance was also a feature of normal science, but there it was built in implicitly.
In sum, Kuhn turned the traditional ideas of scientific justification, based on the discovery-justification-context distinction, on their head. Ironically, once we take the research scientists’ points of view, the more interesting forms of scientific cognition, including justification, occur in contexts of discovery. All of this according to Kuhn.
Critics countered that, while the historicist upstarts had scored some damaging critical points, their positive accounts of scientific rationality were underdeveloped, vague, and unconvincing. Political revolution and religious conversion as models of rational behavior?! Clark Glymour (1980: 7, 96ff) called the new approach “the new fuzziness”. Could intuitive judgment really replace standard confirmation theory? And what would be the analogous relation of evidence to theory at the metamethodological level, where now “theory” was the set of methodological rules or theory of rationality itself? (Historicists replied that it is not their fault if real-life decision-making is a messy business that often outruns available formal rules.) Shapere (1984: chs. 3–5) was a severe early critic of Kuhn, and Lakatos (1970: 178) reported that Kuhn had replaced rationality with “mob rule”. Since Shapere and Lakatos were historicists, we see that the historicists could disagree sharply among themselves. Feyerabend will provide the most vivid example.
Kuhn’s insightful treatment of science from the working scientists’ point of view provided a microlevel conception of rational decision-making. But did he have a metamethodological account of how to decide among competing theories of scientific rationality? Again, not an explicit and comprehensive account, only some constructive suggestions. Like all historicists, he said that a rationality theory must fit the history of science and that the traditional accounts failed this history test. An adequate theory must also be progressive and avoid epistemological relativism. Kuhn (and many others) simply built in these norms from the outset. Such a move works well among most friends of historicism but not well for critics, who think these presuppositions simply beg the normativity of history question. Given incommensurability, are not rationality, progressiveness, and denial of relativism key items that must be argued for? In other passages, Kuhn did argue for them, but few critics were convinced.
On the positive side, Kuhn made an epistemological economy claim.
[I]n its normal state … a scientific community is an immensely efficient instrument for solving the problems or puzzles that its paradigms define. ( 1970a: 166; cf. Wray 2011: ch. 7)
It is clear that Kuhn considered science more efficient on his own account than on Popper’s, because the double process enables extreme specialization (Wray 2011; De Langhe 2014c). Indeed, traditional accounts fail Kuhn’s demarcation criterion—that a genuine science supports a puzzle-solving tradition. Given Kuhn’s conviction that science is progressive in terms of problem-solving success, predictive accuracy, simplicity (the reworking and streamlining of problem-solving efficiency over time), and so on, it supposedly follows that his account makes science both rational and non-relativistic. Critics disagreed.
There also seems to be a kind of transcendental argument strategy behind Kuhn’s approach, as a response to the quasi-Kantian question: Given that science, as historically practiced, is largely rational and progressive, but not in the standard way, how are its rationality and progress possible? Supposedly, the study of the historical patterns will show the way.
Kuhn often described his two-process view as “Kant with moveable categories”. Accordingly, there is also a dialectical, quasi-Hegelian reading: from the myriad of micro-decisions by the community of scientists in a given field over time, with lots of fits and starts, a progressive enterprise emerges, although not one that is teleologically converging on the metaphysical truth about the universe or on any other “end”. However, on this view we have abandoned the idea that individual scientific decisions are typically driven by an explicit concern for rationality. In several areas of philosophy there are heated controversies about whether higher-order emergents have genuine causal power and hence genuine explanatory force. To that degree, it remains unclear what role the desire to be rational plays, as opposed to more mundane motives. This problem arises for other historicists as well, as David Hull will note. (See the entries on mental causation and on internalist vs. externalist conceptions of epistemic justification.)
On rationality as socially emergent, we may jump ahead here to note that feminist philosophers of science such as Helen Longino and Miriam Solomon have defended scientific rationality as a socially emergent norm (Longino 1990, 2001; Solomon 2001). They thereby address the question of how a naturalistic, science-as-practiced approach to scientific knowledge can nonetheless have normative implications. However, they do not shy away from making policy proposals for changing (improving) scientific practices and their supporting institutions. On their accounts, some other factors, such as political/ideological ones, also socially emerge and can have top-down causal efficacy on individual practitioners but without negating the agency and autonomy of those individuals. Here familiar issues of “methodological individualism” come into play. (See the entries on feminist epistemology and philosophy of science, feminist perspectives on science, feminist social epistemology, and feminist political philosophy.)
The vigorous attacks on Kuhn as a radical subjectivist and irrationalist who was undermining not only philosophy but the Western intellectual tradition now look exaggerated, but it is fair to say that the five big problem-complexes of normativity, incommensurability (including meaning change), relativism, social knowledge, and deep but rational progressive change are extremely difficult and remain open to debate today. For many philosophers of science, relativism is the big bugaboo that must be defeated at all costs. For them, any view that leads to even a moderate relativism is thereby reduced to absurdity. Historicist philosophers have insisted on relativity to historical context but, with few exceptions, have made a sharp distinction between relativity and outright relativism. Some critics have not found this distinction convincing (see the entry on relativism, Kindi & Arabatzis 2012 and Richards & Daston 2016).
1.3 The Methodology of Scientific Research Programs
Criticism and the Growth of Knowledge (1970), edited by Lakatos and Alan Musgrave, was a second major contribution to the historicism debate. This collection of articles, originating from a 1965 London conference, was in significant respects a reaction to Kuhn; but it is especially important for Lakatos’s own contribution to the volume, “Falsification and the Methodology of Scientific Research Programmes” (MSRP), an attempt to accommodate a broadly Popperian perspective to some of Kuhn’s ideas and thereby to diverge from Popperian orthodoxy. Lakatos had long favored an historical approach to the philosophy of mathematics and science (see his 1976). One of his central concerns was to defend the rational continuity and progressiveness of modern science from the challenge of radical change. Another was to fend off charges of historical relativism.
Like Kuhn’s paradigms and Laudan’s research traditions (see below), the unit of rational appraisal for Lakatos is not a single theory at a point in time; instead, it is a series of theories that are rationally-connected moments in the development of an identifiable research program. In MSRP these theories share a negative heuristic containing inviolable principles and a positive heuristic that both provides a “protective belt” around the negative heuristic and guides future research. The forward-looking heuristic element was, as for Kuhn, an important feature missing from traditional accounts of science. In MSRP, research programs are evaluated as to their progressiveness over historical time, i.e., which grows knowledge fastest. Lakatos’s measure of knowledge growth is novel prediction, the advantage going to which program yields more novel theoretical predictions and more confirmed novel predictions than its competitors. This is a historicist position since determining whether something is a novel prediction requires detailed knowledge of the historical context of discovery in which the predictive theory was produced (Lakatos & Zahar 1976). Unfortunately, however, Lakatos’s falsificationism had become so sophisticated that he could provide no rule for when it was rational to abandon a degenerating research program that was being outstripped by a more progressive one; for scientists, he said, may legitimately make risky choices. In any case, contrary to Kuhn, two or more research programs may exist side-by-side. Lakatosian rationality does not dictate that researchers all join the same program.
What is the relation between a theory of scientific rationality and a general methodology of science? Like the Popperians from which he diverged, Lakatos held that methodologies are theories of scientific rationality (Curtis 1986). Similarly, a metamethodology (tasked with determining which methodology outperforms others) is identical with a metatheory of scientific rationality. Lakatos’s metatheory recapitulates MSRP at the metalevel. According to Lakatos, his meta-MSRP shows that MSRP defeats competing methodologies, because it provides the best fit with the history of science in the sense that it renders the history of science maximally rational. That is, MSRP makes rational sense of both the intuitively rational episodes and some that its competitors have to exclude as externally caused deviations from the rational ideal. Indeed, it predicts that some counterintuitive cases will be seen to be rational when examined closely.
Lakatos’s paper, “The History of Science and Its Rational Reconstructions” (1971: 91) opens with a promising paraphrase of Kant (previously used by Hanson (1962: 575, 580) and by Herbert Feigl (1970: 4): “Philosophy of science without history of science is empty; history of science without philosophy of science is blind”. However, his use of rational reconstructions of supporting historical episodes—the science as it allegedly could have been done or should have been done—made the actual science look more internally correct (according to MSRP) than it was. Historians and philosophical critics replied sharply that this was not genuine history and hence not a fair test (see Arabatzis forthcoming).
Lakatos and his followers (e.g., Worrall 1988, 1989) conceived MSRP as a fixed and final methodology by contrast with Kuhn’s, Toulmin’s, and (eventually) Laudan’s changing methodologies. The idea that all previous history of science was working up to this final methodology that Lakatos was first to divine—the end-of-history for methodology, so to speak—was one of the broadly Hegelian themes in Lakatos’s work. Another was that there is no instant rationality as proposed by the formal approaches of standard confirmation theory. Writes Daniel Little (in the entry on philosophy of history) “Hegel finds reason in history; but it is a latent reason, and one that can only be comprehended when the fullness of history’s work is finished… ”. The owl of Minerva flies out at dusk. For Lakatos rational judgments can only be made retrospectively. For example, one cannot judge an experiment as crucial at the time it occurs, only in historical retrospect (1970: 154ff). Appraisals are made with hindsight. (See the entry on Lakatos.)
1.4 Methodological Anarchism
In his early work Feyerabend (1962) appealed to historical cases to reject Hempel’s account of explanation and Nagel’s parallel account of intertheoretic reduction (traditionally postulated mechanisms of cumulative progress), on the ground that in actual historical practice meaning change occurs from one major theory to its successor. Deducibility thus fails. It also more obviously fails because the two theories are typically mutually inconsistent. Accordingly, one cannot reason by traditional logical argument from one to the other. Feyerabend introduced his own conception of incommensurability into this work. Anticipating his later broad pluralism, early Feyerabend also extended the Popperian line on testing to a full-blown proliferationist methodology. Competing theories should be multiplied and tested against each other, because more empirical content is thereby brought to light than in testing theories in isolation. In his later work, Feyerabend (1975, 1987, 1989) moved vehemently away from the positions of the Popper school. He vigorously rejected the idea of a scientific method that makes science superior to other cultural enterprises. According to his “methodological anarchism”, any so-called methodological rule, including logical consistency, could be fruitfully violated in some contexts. That said, his well-known slogan, “Anything goes”, was widely read as more radical than he intended, given his playful interactions with his friend Lakatos.
This later Feyerabend declared that his primary aim was humanitarian, not epistemological, so it was not his purpose to defend the rationality of science. His attack on dogmatic, scientistic conservatism, both within and without scientific communities, has methodological import, albeit negative import. Feyerabend was one of the first to stress the strong historical contingency of scientific work, in context of justification as well as discovery, and he defended this contingency at the methodological level as well. Thus there is no fixed rationality of science. For example, Galileo (he argued in historical detail) introduced a new sort of methodology, a new kind of rationality, partly via rhetorical deception, partly with arresting applications of mathematics to basic mechanical phenomena. Galileo’s new vision happened to win out, but there is no point in calling it either rational or irrational in any absolute sense.
Philosophers, retreating from concrete detail to their abstract formalisms, make science look far more rational than it is, stressed Feyerabend. “[H]istory, not argument, undermined the gods”, and also undermined Aristotelian science and several later scientific orthodoxies (1989: 397, his emphasis). Feyerabend rejected “the separability thesis”, according to which a highly contingent historical processes can furnish scientific products that are true and non-contingent, products that have achieved escape velocity from history as it were (my expression). However, although not as pronounced as in Lakatos, there remain traces of historicist consequentialism in Feyerabend’s view, as when he wrote that “scientific achievements can be judged only after the event” ( 1993: 2). There is no “theory” of scientific rationality in Feyerabend, only a historicist anti-theory, as it were; but he was not quite the irrationalist that critics took him to be. (See the entry on Feyerabend. For recent work on historical contingency, see Stanford 2006 and Soler et al. 2015.)
Feyerabend embraced the relativism implied by the positions just described. In a late work, Science as Art, influenced by the prominent Viennese art historian Alois Riegl, he spoke of distinct, self-contained scientific styles at different periods that are much like the distinct styles in art (Ginzburg 1998). Such a view fit well with his sometime assertion that there is no scientific progress, just a succession or multiplicity of styles. Here there is a faint connection to Kuhn’s early views, although the two men reportedly did not interact as much as one might expect while both were at Berkeley.
1.5 The Pragmatic, Problem-Solving Approach
Laudan opened Progress and Its Problems (1977) with the claim that providing an adequate model of rationality is the primary business of the philosopher of science but that no extant methodologies fit actual science. In this book his idea of good fit was fit with a selection of intuitively strong historical instances that any adequate theory must explain. (Laudan 1984 and 1996: ch. 7, later rejected the intuitionistic elements that gave normative punch to this model.) His response to the rationality question was to propose a thoroughgoing, explicitly pragmatic, problem-solving account of science. Problem-solving had been an important element in previous accounts, notably those of Kuhn and Popper, but Laudan reversed the usual account of scientific progress as a temporal succession of atemporal rational decisions. Instead of defining progress in terms of rationality, we should define rationality in terms of progress. We cannot measure progress in terms of approach to an unknowable, final, metaphysical truth, but we do have reliable markers of progress in terms of numbers and relative importance of both empirical and conceptual problems solved by long-term “research traditions”. Just as Lakatos’s research programs were a compromise between Popper and Kuhn, we can read Laudan’s “research traditions” as incorporating elements of his major historicist predecessors, while departing sharply from other tenets of their work.
Many analysts have played with possible relationships between the sciences’ assumed rationality and assumed progressiveness. The central issue for them is analogous to the question in Rodgers and Hammerstein’s Cinderella: Is science progressive because it’s rational, or is it rational because it’s progressive? (Kuhn  1970a: 162, had asked: Does a field make progress because it is a science, or is it a science because it makes progress?”) The underlying question is whether rationality is basic and fundamental rather than derivative to something else. Those like Laudan who make it derivative need to defend their position against the objection that they are committing a verificationist fallacy of confusing rationality itself (its constitutive nature) with the criteria for applying the term ‘rational’. Are momentary success or longer-term progress constitutive of rationality or merely consequential indicators of it (or neither)?
Be that as it may, since progress is a historical (history-laden) concept, so is rationality on Laudan’s conception, as it was on Lakatos’s. The temporality of his account led Laudan to introduce an important distinction between acceptance of a theory and pursuit that would explain how rational transitions to a new research tradition are possible. Scientists should accept the theory that, pro tem, has the greatest overall problem-solving success, but pursue the tradition that now enjoys a higher rate of success. Nearly everyone today accepts a distinction of this sort, although not necessarily Laudan’s criteria of success.
Like Structure and MSRP, Laudan’s model of science received much discussion, both constructive and critical. It faced the usual difficulties of how we are to count and weigh the importance of problems in order to have a viable accounting scheme. Historicists can reply that it is not their fault if this is a messy task, since that is just historical reality, a reality that, if anything, favors expert judgment over tidy decision algorithms.
Laudan (1984) agreed with Kuhn that the goals, standards, and methods of science change historically as well as the theoretical and observational claims, but his “reticulationist model” rejected as historically inaccurate Kuhn’s claim that sometimes they all change together to constitute a (Kuhnian) revolution. Dramatic change in one place need not seriously disturb fixity elsewhere and rarely or never does. Hence, incommensurability is a pseudo-problem. Moreover, Laudan contended, his reticulationist model overcomes the hierarchical problem that has led thinkers such as Poincaré and Popper to make the goals of science arbitrary (the top of the hierarchy and hence the unjustified justifier of what comes below), e.g., mere conventions. These authors have no way to rationally appraise the goals themselves, leaving their positions stuck with an account of merely instrumental reason: efficiency relative to a given, arbitrary goal. By contrast, in Laudan’s model, the elements are mutually constraining, mutually adjusting, an idea prominent in Dewey’s attack on hierarchy in his 1939. None takes absolute precedence over the others. Thus, some goals are irrational because present and foreseeable knowledge and methods have no way to achieve them or to measure progress toward them. (Laudan thereby rejected strong realist goals as irrational.) An advance in substantive or methodological expertise can make it rational to embrace new standards and also new goals.
The debate between Laudan and Worrall over the value of a fixed methodology of science wonderfully exemplifies the persistence of the ancient problem of change (Laudan 1989; Worrall 1989). How is it possible to explain, or even to measure, change except in terms of an underlying fixity? Doesn’t allowing change at all three of Laudan’s levels—matters of scientific fact and theory, method and standards, and goals—leave us with a damaging relativism? Worrall defends the fixity of Lakatos’s MSRP but agrees that it cannot be established a priori. Laudan’s reticulated model retains a more piecemeal and historically contingent fixity, as described above.
With all that said, the threat of relativism remains, for how can a good, non-whiggish historicist have a trans-historical measure of progress? Laudan’s answer was that we can whiggishly measure scientific progress by our own standards, regardless of what the goals of the historical investigators were. This sounds right about what we do. But if the reasons why the historical scientists in the trenches made the decisions they did do not really matter to us (or to any given generation), retrospectively, then how is rationality providing a methodological guide or causal explanation why historical scientists made the decisions they did? Their individual rationality would seem to become irrelevant. And why, then, is rationality the central problem of philosophy of science?
Departing sharply from traditional, non-naturalistic treatments of norms, Laudan addressed the is-ought problem head-on by advancing an important and influential, pragmatic “normative naturalism” whereby the acceptable norms are those best supported by successful historical practice—where, again, success is as we judge it today. On this view, norms have empirical content. They are winnowed from the history of successful practice, again a broadly Deweyan idea (e.g., Dewey 1929). At Virginia Tech Laudan and colleagues initiated a program to test the individual norms present in various philosophical models of science against the history of science (Laudan 1977: 7; Donovan et al. 1988). Like every major philosophical proposal, this one came under critical fire, in this case, e.g., for isolating individual methodological rules from their historical contexts and for reverting to a traditional, positivistic, hypothetico-deductive model of testing. In short, critics complained that Laudan’s metatheory of rationality did not match his first-order, problem-solving-progress theory of rationality. And professional historians did not welcome this invitation to cooperation, since the project implied a division of labor that regarded philosophers as the theoreticians proposing rules to test, while the historians were relegated to fact-grubbing handmaidens doing the testing. To be fair, as a historicist philosopher, Laudan himself had done a good deal of historical work.
On another front, Laudan’s (1981) attempt to “confute” scientific realism on the basis of historical examples of major scientific change stimulated much discussion, since the status of realism had become a central issue in philosophy of science. Indeed, Laudan’s article helped to make it so.
1.6 Evolutionary Models of Scientific Development
Toulmin (1972) produced an evolutionary model of scientific development in terms of populations of concepts, a gradualist account of scientific change that he considered more historically accurate and philosophically defensible than Kuhn’s discontinuous model. Toulmin’s “concepts” are historically malleable, yet they are characterized by historicity. He quotes Kierkegaard: “Concepts, like individuals, have their histories, and are just as incapable of withstanding the ravages of time as are individuals” (1972: frontispiece). Toulmin held that biological, social, and conceptual evolution, including scientific development, are all instances of the same generalized variation-selection-transmission schema, albeit with quite different concrete implementations. For Toulmin, disciplines (specialties) are analogous to biological species. He touted his model as naturalistic, indeed ecological, but not in a way that excludes rationality. Rationality enters primarily at the selection level, determining which families of concepts (including methodological ones) get selected and reproduced. Rationality is not a matter of “logicality”, i.e., of sticking to a given logical or Kuhnian framework through thick and thin. Rather, it is a matter of adapting appropriately to changing circumstances. Like Newtonian force, rationality has to do with change, not maintenance of the same state. Thus no Kuhnian revolution is needed in order to break out of an old conceptual framework.
As for the descriptive-normative problem, thinkers from Kuhn to Robert Brandom (e.g., 2002: 13, 230ff) have appealed to the common law tradition as an instructive analogy, and Toulmin was no exception. Published legal cases provide legal precedents that later legal argumentation can cite for support. Over time, normative traditions emerge. Explicit rules may be formulated by reflecting on the history of precedents, but the practices typically remain implicit. There is a whiff of Hegelian, retrospective reconstruction in this idea of extracting norms from patterned historical practices that embody them implicitly and contingently. The main trouble with Toulmin’s account, said critics, is that it is so vague and abstract that it tells us little about how science works. It would seem to apply to just about everything.
Donald Campbell (1960, 1974) had previously defended the generalized variation plus selective retention schema, which he traced back to William James. Popper regarded his own evolutionary account of scientific development as similar to Campbell’s (1974). Ditto for David Hull (1988) with his more detailed evolutionary model. However, Hull rejected evolutionary epistemology, as such, and denied that he was doing epistemology at all. (Evolutionary epistemologies face the problem of why we should expect a contingent selectionist process to be truth-conducive: see the entry on evolutionary epistemology. Assuming that it is can also tempts one to fall into whiggism regarding the past in a social Darwinist sort of way.) Hull rejected Toulmin’s biological species analogy, as based only on feature-similarity rather than on the historical-causal continuity of genuine biological species. Hull’s book reflected his own deep involvement in the controversy between cladists, evolutionary systematicists, and pheneticists over biological classification. (He served terms as president of both the Society for Systematic Biology and the Philosophy of Science Association.) Hull generalized his important biological concepts of replicator (gene) and interactor (organism) to scientists and communities. His central unit of and for analysis was the deme, or research group, in its competition with others.
Hull (1988) argued that the success of science can be explained by an invisible hand mechanism rather than in terms of rational decision-making. He did not deny that most scientists regard themselves as rational truth seekers, but on his account the primary motivation is the drive for professional recognition and credit via positive citation by others, and avoidance of violations of institutionalized standards. The term ‘rationality’ does not even appear in the book’s index. Nonetheless, the institutional incentive structure of science works to produce generally reliable results and scientific progress, so that, to rationality-minded philosophers, science looks as if it is driven by the intentional rationality of its practitioners. We might say that, for Hull, rationality explains nothing without causal backing, but once we bring the causal mechanisms into play, there is no longer a need to foreground rationality, at least not intentional rationality.
The better [scientists] are at evaluating the work of others when it is relevant to their own research, the more successful they will be. The mechanism that has evolved in science that is responsible for its unbelievable success may not be all that “rational”, but it is effective, and it has the same effect that advocates of science as a totally rational enterprise prefer. (1988: 4)
Like Adam Smith’s view of the invisible hand regarding altruism and the public good, rationalists can interpret Hull’s account as broadly Hegelian in the sense that the rationality of science emerges (insofar as it does) from the complex social interactions of scientists and groups of scientists going about their normal business in ordinary ways that satisfy community norms and incentive structures, not from their explicit intentions to make rational decisions. While Hull gave close attention to these social interactions and to the institutions that enable them, he claimed that his appeal to social factors was internal to science rather than external.
1.7 New-Wave Sociology of Science and the Realist Reaction
Left relatively untouched by historicist philosophers during the Battle of the Big Systems was the internal/external distinction. The philosophers, consonant with traditional sociology of science (e.g., Merton 1973) and sociology of knowledge more generally, defended a kind of “inertial principle” (Fuller 1989: xiii et passim): social and psychological factors such as economic and political interests and psychological dispositions should be brought into play only to explain deviation from the rational path. This distinction began to erode already in Kuhn, who stressed the social factors internal to the organization of science itself: science education, the strong role of scientific communities with their distinctive cultures, etc. (See also Lakatos on comprehensive theories of rationality that can turn apparent external considerations into internal ones, and Hull 1988 on career advancement.)
In the 1970s, new-wave sociologists of science quickly rejected the division of labor implied by the inertial principle and took sociology far beyond where Kuhn had left it (much to his chagrin). These sociologists insisted that sociology, via social interests and other social motivational causes, had much to say about the internal, technical content of science—so much, in fact, that it was not clear that there was any room left for the rational explanations of the philosophers. The Edinburgh Strong Programme founded by David Bloor and Barry Barnes (see Bloor 1976), the Bath relativist school of Harry Collins and Trevor Pinch (Collins 1981), and later constructivist work of Bruno Latour and Steve Woolgar (1979), Karin Knorr-Cetina (1981), Steve Shapin (1982), Shapin and Simon Schaffer (1985), and Andy Pickering (1984) were important early developments. (See Shapin 1982 for a helpful discussion.)
Since the new sociology of science was also heavily based on historical case studies, we find more radical historicisms challenging less radical ones. Although the sociologists often disagreed among themselves, as the philosophers did, the general thrust of their work was that the philosophical historicists had failed to take socio-political context into account and thus were still too much wedded to the old, abstract, acausal ideals of rationality, objectivity, and progress toward truth. Much sociological work was explicitly anti-realist and relativist, at least as a methodology.
Most philosophers of science strongly rejected the new sociology as relativist and irrationalist, the non-historicists among them adopting versions of strong realism, according to which mature science can knowingly, on internalist grounds, arrive at theoretical truth and genuine reference to theoretical entities, or closely enough. The eventual upshot was “the Science Wars” of the 1990s. By now (2017), the sides in this dispute have mellowed, fruitful conversations are taking place, and some degree of reconciliation has occurred (see Labinger & Collins 2001). Work by feminists in science studies such as Donna Haraway (2004) and feminist philosophers of science such as Helen Longino (1990, 2001) and Miriam Solomon (2001) have rejected assumptions common to both sides in the debate, thereby opening the way to their more pluralistic, interactive, and less hierarchical options. Distinct prominent approaches to social epistemology by philosophers include Fuller 1988, Goldman 1999, and Rouse 2002. (See the entries on social epistemology, scientific method, scientific realism, and the social dimensions of science as well as the feminist entries referenced above.)
Some of the sociological work had a postmodern cast, and so did contributions by some philosophers. For example, Richard Rorty’s version of historicist pragmatism rejected correspondence theories of truth and the related idea that we humans have some naturalized-theological obligation faithfully to represent metaphysical nature with our science. He spoke suggestively but vaguely of major transformations in the sciences (or anywhere else in culture), such as that achieved by Galileo, as the invention of a new “vocabulary” that worked well enough for certain purposes to catch on, but not as new truths established by logical reasoning. As for rationality itself, it is a matter of maintaining an honest, civil “conversation”:
On a pragmatist view, rationality is not the exercise of a faculty called “reason”—a faculty which stands in some determinate relation to reality. Nor is [it] the use of a method. It is simply a matter of being open and curious, and of relying on persuasion rather than force. (1991: 62).
So rationality is not the key to scientific success, and it has as much to do with rhetoric as with logic. Pragmatists, he said, prefer to speak of the success or failure of problem-solving efforts, rather than rationality or irrationality (1991: 66).
A view sometimes ascribed to Rorty’s hero Dewey is that rationality is not an a priori, universal method of thinking and acting properly; rather, it is like a box of intellectual tools, each of which, as humans have learned from craft experience, work better than others in various situations, the result being what might be called a “teleonormative” conception of rationality.
2. Rationality and History: Some Basic Questions
Many of the issues raised by and about historicist conceptions of rationality remain unresolved, but the approach has the merit of bringing back into discussion several interrelated questions.
- What is it to be rational, anyway, once we situate agents in real-life socio-cultural situations?
- Is an account of rationality something discovered rather than humanly constructed?
- Is a theory of rationality something that can be fixed a priori, or can it (must it?) be naturalized, in whole or in part, i.e., shaped by a broadly empirical mode of inquiry?
- Is there just one, unique, correct conception or theory of rationality, of universal applicability?
- Can (should) our concept of rationality be relativized to specifically human capabilities and to specific kinds of decision-action situations, or could it turn out, by some universal standard, perhaps realized by future artificial intelligence or by (other) aliens, that we are all terribly non-rational, scientists included?
- Is scientific rationality special in some way, as distinct from rationality in general?
- Is a theory of specifically scientific rationality the same as an account of scientific method? (If so and there is no unique scientific method, then there is no single, general account of scientific rationality either.)
- Is second-order rationality possible, i.e., rational changes in scientific goals and standards of rationality themselves?
- Should a metatheory of scientific rationality match the theory of first-order methodological rules?
- Do we even need a theory of scientific rationality, either to explain research at the microlevel or scientific development at the macrolevel? If so, precisely how does appeal to rationality explain? Does it provide a causal mechanism?
- How is the individual rationality of a researcher related to the rationality of the working group and to the community of specialists as a whole? In other words, how does (or should) the distribution of cognitive labor affect the discussion of rationality?
- Are rationality assessments instantaneous (given the logical or mathematical relations of the available information) or do they (at least sometimes) require historical retrospect or prospect?
- What good is the historical study of how basic categories of description such as ‘fact’, ‘experiment’, ‘objective’, ‘replication’, and ‘novel prediction’ change over time? What does such history tell us, if anything, about human inquiry or epistemology?
- What does ‘historicism’ mean in this context, and what could a constitutively historicist theory of rationality be?
3. Historicism Then and Now
Nineteenth-century philosophers and (especially) historians are commonly credited with the modern “discovery” of history, especially political history, via developing the discipline of evidence-based, interpretive and explanatory historiography. Hegel historicized Kant at the beginning of that century, but it was primarily German historians such as Ranke, Droysen, Windelband, Dilthey, Rickert, and Weber who developed competing conceptions of what is required for rigorous historical research. (For an in-depth survey, see Beiser 2011.) These historians were concerned to develop historiography as wissenschaftlich but autonomous from the natural sciences, where positivism reigned. They also rejected the grand, Hegel-type philosophies of history. Toward the end of the century, this opposition produced the Methodenstreit, the vehement debate over differences between the natural sciences (Naturwissenschaften) and the socio-historical sciences (Geisteswissenschaften). Historicists saw naturalism and materialistic mechanism as threats.
The connection of the historicization of philosophy of science in the 1960s to the German historicist tradition is indirect, given the time-gap of decades. However, the historicists of scientific rationality discussed in this article did (or do) agree to several of the following (overlapping) tenets, most of them traceable to nineteenth-century antecedents. There exist tensions among the following claims, so internal disagreement among historicists is to be expected.
1. The historicity of all things. Virtually all things come into existence and pass away in historical time. Nothing is guaranteed to be fixed and permanent, written in the stone of the universe.
2. History vs. a priori reason or logic alone. Human beings do not possess a faculty of a priori reason capable of surveying the space of all logical possibilities. The emergence of non-Euclidean geometry illustrates this point. Human inconceivability is not an adequate criterion of either logical or historical possibility.
3. Our historical boundedness: anti-whiggism and the principle of no privilege. We inquirers are also historically situated. While we are not slaves to our cultural context, we can escape it only partially and with difficulty. Our horizons sometimes prevent us from recognizing our own presuppositions, not to mention future possibilities. Wrote Mary Hesse: “our own scientific theories are held to be as much subject to radical change as past theories are seen to be” (1976: 264). Although we have good reason to hold that our science is superior to that of the past, this does not confer an absolute, ahistorical privilege on our science. Rather than succumb to this perspectival illusion, we must imagine that our successors may look at us as we see our predecessors. We, too, are just a transitional stage into a future that is likely to include much that is beyond our present horizon of imagination. We must avoid the flat future illusion that sees the future a tame continuation of the present (Nickles forthcoming).
4. History as endlessly creative, thus an endless frontier. Strong historicists think an endless frontier is likely, history as open, and productive of perpetual novelty (no agency intended).
5. Historical content of theory of justification: The complexity of history. History is too complex and too subtle to be captured by a fixed, formal system or in terms of the dynamical relationships of a set of “state variables”. Logical and probabilistic systems alone are crude tools for capturing the reasoning of real people, scientists included. Besides the subtle, contextual reasons, innovative scientists work at moving research frontiers (“context of discovery”) and, so, must make many decisions under uncertainty (not only under mere risk). Rationality has more to do with appropriate response to change than with sticking rigidly to one’s initial standpoint. This challenge strikes at the heart of traditional accounts of context of justification, hence at the heart of traditional philosophy of science. Thinkers from Kuhn to van Fraassen (2002: 125) have taken a dim view of confirmation theory, although Bayesians have made valiant attempts to capture historicist insights. (For examples, see Salmon 1990 and Howson & Urbach 1993).
6. Consequentialism and history as a judge. Frontier epistemology teaches that we can often only learn which modes of action are successful via historical experience of the consequences. (Non-historicists can reply that the eventual judgment is not itself historical but only delayed, because based on evidence gathered over time.) In its strongest form, historical judgment replaces “the Last Judgment”, the judgment of God, as reflected in the common expression “the judgment of history”. (Of course, this view is itself anti-historicist in its conception of finality.)
7. Genetic, genealogical understanding. Since nearly everything is the product of historical development or disintegration, studying its historical genesis and dissolution is key to understanding it. Genetic fallacies are avoidable by including development and maintenance as part of the narrative, since development can be transformative. Today many writers are exploring the biological and socio-cultural evolutionary origins of human rationality, going far deeper, historically, than to recent historical developments such as the so-called Scientific Revolution.
8. Historical skepticism, incommensurability, and relativism. One role of historiography is to debunk myths. As such, it can be liberating, as when we see that institutions and conceptual frameworks are, to a large degree, human constructions with a historical origin, not things irremediably fixed in the foundation of the universe. For that very reason it produces a degree of skepticism toward all human things. Although the natural world shapes human cultures, including scientific ones, it far from dictates a single, fixed culture. Historiography discloses that human enterprises, including the sciences, are imbedded in deep cultures with their distinctive norms. There is no “God’s-eye”, history-neutral set of meta-norms, no “Archimedean point” from which these cultures can be objectively compared. Thus it is difficult or impossible to evaluate all science with a single standard. Here lurks the problems of cultural incommensurability and relativism.
9. Pluralism. Methodological pluralism is a natural consequence of historicist approaches. Historical study discloses that the various sciences employ quite different methods and often harbor competing research programs. The emergence of philosophy of biology as a specialty area in the wake of the 1959 Darwin centennial added substance to this claim. (For entries into the pluralism literature, see Dupré 1993; Galison & Stump 1996; Mitchell 2003; and Kellert et al. 2006.)
10. Science as a model of rationality. On this theme, historicists are divided. Some strong historicists, especially Feyerabend, Hull, and thoroughgoing social constructivists, deny that science is rationally or methodologically special among human enterprises.
11. Science as a model of progress. This, too, is practically axiomatic among philosophers of science. The idea of history “itself” as progressive came in with the Enlightenment and was severely challenged by the world wars.
12. Historicism as half-naturalistic. Historicist accounts do not appeal to supernatural factors or to factors beyond the possibility of human cognition such as clairvoyance or the metaphysical truth about reality. Historicists usually take a second step toward naturalism in considering humans as biologically limited beings, but they resist reduction to the natural science brand of naturalism. Philosophical historicists also reject the reduction of norms to facts. (But, late in life, R.G. Collingwood may have come to hold a strong version of historicism according to which philosophy reduces to history: see the entry on Collingwood. Some new-wave sociologists may have held a parallel reductionist view about philosophy and sociology, insofar as philosophy was worth saving.)
13. Major historical change as emergent—against intelligent design and the conscious model. Many historical developments are not deliberately chosen or designed but emerge from numbers of people carrying out their individual and collective activities. The rise of the nation-state and of the international capitalist economic system were not the products of centralized, rational planning, nor were modern science and technology, although there were, of course, many micro-instances of such planning. This point applies to the idea of scientific method, which tradition often depicted as clairvoyantly, intelligently guiding scientific innovation. But as Hume already anticipated, no method is guaranteed in advance to work in a novel domain. Methodological innovation typically follows rather than precedes innovative work (Hull 1988; Dennett 1995; Nickles 2009, forthcoming). This is a broadly Hegelian idea.
14. Strong historical determinism is mistaken. A controversy among historicists of various stripes is whether there are “iron laws of historical development”. Hegel and Marx, in quite different but related ways, believed in a teleological conception of history, that “it” was working its way inevitably through known stages toward a final goal that would amount to “the end of history” in the sense that deep historical change would now cease. This is the view that Popper termed “historicism” in The Poverty of Historicism (1957; see also his 1945). Popper vehemently rejected this version of historicism, as do virtually all historicist philosophers of science today. For them, history is non-teleological and highly contingent. This includes Kuhn’s ( 1970a) model, although the latter does posit an almost inevitable, unending alternation of normal and revolutionary periods—a final pattern without end, as it were.
15. Hermeneutic interpretation. The received, covering-law model of explanation is inadequate to explain historical action, including that of scientists and communities of scientists. Kuhn described his method as hermeneutic, but few historicist philosophers of science are full-blown hermeneuticists or as fully committed to empathic understanding as were some of the classic German historicists. Most or all historicists are somewhat partial to narrative forms of explanation. (See the entry on scientific explanation.)
4. Related Developments and Further Challenges
The battle of the big systems seems to be over, and likewise for the heyday of interdisciplinary departments and programs of history and philosophy of science (but see below). So are historicist conceptions of rationality dead? Despite claims that historicist philosophy of science has been “withering on the vine” (Fuller 1991), it is fair to say that historicist influences remain important, but in a subtler way. Most philosophers of science are more historically sensitive than before, whether or not they identify as historicists. Historicist interests have expanded into “the naturalistic turn”, “the models turn”, and “the practice turn”, which includes interest in contemporary practices, and, to a lesser degree, in future history (Nickles forthcoming).
Moreover, in parallel developments, the classical conception of rationality is under attack on many fronts. Herbert Simon (1947) introduced the ideas of bounded rationality and satisficing. Simon later championed the need for a heuristic approach to problem solving by humans and computers (Newell & Simon 1972). Various flavors of artificial intelligence then led the way in the methodology of problem solving, with heuristics as a central topic and no longer the temporary scaffolding of positivism and Popper. Simon’s program in adaptive, “ecological rationality” is now being expanded by Gerd Gigerenzer and the Adaptive Behavior and Cognition group in Berlin (Gigerenzer et al. 1999). Simon’s approach and the “heuristics and biases” program of Daniel Kahneman and Amos Tversky (Kahneman et al. 1982), plus work by the latter on prospect theory, triggered the emergence of behavioral economics, which rejects the neo-classical homo economicus rationality model. Philosopher Christopher Cherniak’s Minimal Rationality (1986) also brought out sharply how idealized were traditional philosophical assumptions about rationality. In other directions, some computer scientists are challenging the anthropocentrism of received conceptions of rational inference by asking why artificial intelligence, including deep learning, should be restricted to human forms of reasoning. Meanwhile, biologists and philosophers are studying the evolution of rationality (Okasha & Binmore 2012), and ethologists ask why we should withhold attributions of rationality to animals from chimps and elephants to octopuses, simply because they seem to lack a human sort of conceptual language.
Nonetheless, there is wide agreement that historicist accounts of scientific rationality cannot fully supplant traditional views. For example, there surely does exist some “instant rationality” even at research frontiers. One finds a wide variety of decision contexts there, and some of these decisions will be uncontroversially warranted at that time and in that context, while others will not be. Hesse (1980) and many others (see Radnitzky & Andersson 1978) raised the issue of how to generalize from historical case studies, for citing case studies can be like citing the Bible. One can cherry-pick one’s case studies to support most any position. In any case it is fallacious to generalize from a few, highly contextualized case studies to conclusions about all science at all times. Early historical work in social studies of science faced the same problem. Ironically, such generalization abstracts away from the historicity of the case studies themselves. The attempt to replace inductive generalization by testing via an H-D model also runs into trouble, as we noted in connection to the Virginia Tech project. And why should case studies from two or three hundred years ago be taken seriously when science itself has changed significantly in the meantime? Partly for this reason Ronald Giere (1973) contended that it was necessary to study only today’s scientific practices, that philosophers had no special need of consulting historians.
Late in life, Kuhn himself, surprisingly, rejected the case-study method as too wedded to the traditional view of science as a direct search for the truth about the universe. The first generations of historical inquiry by philosophers and sociologists so shockingly revealed the presence of many non-epistemic factors and the general failure of any method fully to justify scientific beliefs, he said, that skepticism was the result. The more people learned about how science is actually done, the more skeptical they became. Declared Kuhn, we can more securely derive historical patterning “from first principles” and “with scarcely a glance at the historical record itself” (1991: 111ff). This is not a complete departure from history, however, for it begins from what he termed “the historical perspective”, a non-whiggish understanding of the decisions actually available to the historical actors in their own context. Kuhn’s main point is that such decisions should be considered comparative (“Is this item better than that one, given the contextual knowledge and standards?”), not as judgments of truth or probability. This move reduces the problem of understanding behavior in rational terms to something manageable, he explained. Developing this point, Kuhn said, will bring the only defensible sort of rationality back into scientific practice in a way that largely avoids the old problems of incommensurability. It will also provide a defensible concept of scientific progress and of scientific knowledge (almost by definition)—knowledge as what the scientific process produces. This historical perspective was part of Kuhn’s project of developing a biological analogy for the development of science, wherein disciplinary speciation events correspond to revolutions. Kuhn held that his approach applied to all human enterprises, not just science (Kuhn 2000).
Recently, Rogier De Langhe (2014a,b,c, 2017) has been developing a broadly Kuhnian, two-process account of science from an economics standpoint. Instead of doing a series of historical cases, De Langhe and colleagues are developing algorithms to detect subtle patterns in the large citation databases now available. In sum, both late Kuhn and early De Langhe are now appealing to the history of science in a more abstract, or perhaps comprehensive, manner, a manner complementary to the two-process approach of Michael Friedman (below).
Another general challenge for historicists and others concerned with the rationality of science is how to factor the division of labor in science into a model of scientific rationality. How does individual rationality (the traditional focus of economists as well as philosophers) relate to the collective rationality of working groups or entire specialist communities? (See Sarkar 1983; Kitcher 1993; Mirowski 1996; Downes 2001; De Langhe 2014b; Latour 1987 and later for his actor-network theory; and the entry on social epistemology.) Feminist philosophers such as Longino (1990, 2001) and Solomon (2001) have proposed more thoroughgoing social epistemologies of science that go beyond the problem of division of labor, which, in their view, is still often treated individualistically.
5. Integrated HPS and Historical Epistemology: What Good Are They Regarding Scientific Rationality?
The attempt to integrate historiography and philosophy of science has a troubled history. Several joint departments and programs were formed in the heady 1960s, just as much historiography of science was turning away from internalist approaches. As professional historians and philosophers came to realize that their interests differed, many of these programs did wither.
In the meantime, several philosophers have engaged in serious internalist studies for philosophical purposes, usually focusing on “big names” such as Galileo, Newton, Lavoisier, Darwin, and Einstein, or big developments such as the route to the double helix. More recently, scholars such as Nancy Nersessian with her “cognitive history” project (1995) have employed new resources from the cognitive sciences in this regard, a move neglected by Kuhn himself and resisted by sociologists concerned by the philosophers’ neglect of the social basis of the knowledge enterprise. (See also Giere 1988; Bechtel & Richardson 1993; Darden 2006; Andersen et al. 2006; Thagard, e.g., 2012.) Historians, meanwhile, have focused on social history and, more recently, on social microhistory and lesser-known figures, including women, rather than on the internalist moves of big-name scientists. Consequently, historicists today still feel the need to respond to Giere’s (1973) question of whether history and philosophy of science can be an intimate marriage.
Since 1990 promising new movements have emerged that bring together philosophy of science and historiography of science. First, philosophers of science became interested in the historical emergence and professionalization of their own field. Early work quickly destroyed some myths about the Vienna Circle, for example. The primary organization here is the International Society for the History of Philosophy of Science (HOPOS), with its own journal and regular meetings. More recently, the Integrated History and Philosophy of Science (&HPS) organization has sponsored several conferences with the goal of maintaining the standards of both fields rather than compromising one for the supposed advantage of the other. (For background, see Schickore 2011, 2017. Consult the &HPS website for other contributors.)
Theodore Arabatzis (forthcoming) distinguishes two ways of integrating history and philosophy of science: the familiar “historical philosophy of science” (HPS), usually based on “historical” case studies; and the less familiar “philosophical history of science” (PHS). It is well known that historians have found most philosophical work of little use, and Arabatzis aims to help correct the asymmetric relationship between history and philosophy.
[P]hilosophical reflection on these concepts can be historiographically fruitful: it can elucidate historiographical categories, justify historiographical choices and, thereby, enrich and improve the stories that historians tell about past science as a knowledge-producing enterprise.
Labels for movements can be arbitrary and misleading, but several of the authors cited by Arabatzis have been identified with a movement usually called “historical epistemology”, the goal of which is to combine excellent history of science with philosophical sophistication or excellent philosophy with more historical sophistication than is usually found in case-studies approaches. Given the epistemological focus, here is where we might expect to find the greater concentration of work relevant to questions of scientific rationality. The epicenter of the movement is the Max Planck Institute for the History of Science in Berlin, whose directors over the years, Lorenz Krüger (who died before he could assume the post), Lorraine Daston, Hans-Jörg Rheinberger, and Jürgen Renn, have promoted historical epistemology. A recent, special issue of Erkenntnis (Sturm & Feest (eds.) 2011) on historical epistemology derives from a conference at the Institute. In their introductory essay to the special issue, the co-editors, Uljana Feest and Thomas Sturm, ask “What (Good) is Historical Epistemology?” (Feest & Sturm 2011). The special issue includes a baker’s dozen authors who develop and/or critique various approaches to historical epistemology. The participants range from older hands such as Philip Kitcher, Michael Friedman, and Mary Tiles to more recent contributors such as Jutta Schickore and Feest. (See Tiles & Tiles 1993 for an early philosophical introduction to the field.)
Feest & Sturm (2011) divide the movement into three streams. One stream studies historical changes in epistemology-laden concepts such as objectivity, observation, evidence, experimentation, explanation, and probability. How do new concepts emerge? How are they stabilized? At what point do they become conscious rather than remaining implicit in practice? How do they shift over time and how well do they travel to different scientific contexts (cf. Howlett & Morgan 2011)? Insofar as they are initially metaphorical, how do they become dead metaphors? How do they fade out of use? Lorraine Daston’s work is a good example of this approach (e.g., 1988, 1991; Daston & Galison 2007; Daston & Lunbeck 2011). This means looking at the evolution of concepts or organizing “categories” of action and thought within a historically confined project, however interdisciplinary it might be—something between the eternal, global, and maximal often favored by philosophers and the evanescent, local, and contingent favored by many historians. Gone is the old-fashioned “conceptual history” of the sort exemplified by Max Jammer’s (1957), which traces “the concept” of force from ancient Egypt to the twentieth century. Wrote Daston in an early paper:
To my mind, the most able practitioners of historical epistemology these days are philosophers rather than historians—I think of the remarkable recent work of Ian Hacking and Arnold Davidson—although I think they, intellectual historians, and historians of science might well make common cause in such a venture. (1991: 283, footnote omitted; see also Davidson 2002)
Daston then asks, “What good is historical epistemology?” Her opening (but later qualified) suggestion is that it goes part way toward “releasing us from our bondage to the past by hauling that past into conscious view”, although we must recognize that calling attention to the contingent origins of something is not sufficient to debunk it, upon pain of committing a genetic fallacy. Nor can we simply reject something without having an alternative to put in its place. “That is, historicizing is not identical to relativizing, much less to debunking”.
The second strand of historical epistemology identified by Feest and Sturm in their introduction to the special issue focuses on the trajectories of the objects of research—“epistemic things”—rather than on concepts, and here the well-known work of Rheinberger (1997,  2010a,  2010b) is emblematic. Renn (1995, 2004) represents the third approach, an attempt to understand the longer-term dynamics of science. For example, Renn attempts to solve several mysteries about how Einstein was able to accomplish the relativity revolution. His answer takes into account the long history of developments in distinct fields that Einstein was able to bring together, partly because of his wide philosophical and other cultural interests. Renn looks at long-term developments by analogy with biological development. Norton Wise (2011) also brings biological metaphor into play. He observes that historical narrative as a form of explanation is now making serious incursions into physics, in the physics of complex or highly nonlinear systems. “Covering law” explanations are not available there, he says, and sometimes we must resort to simulations in order to understand how systems evolve. “We know what we can grow”.
Running through much historical epistemology is a century-long line of neo-Kantian thinking, from Ernst Cassirer and the Marburg school to Reichenbach and Carnap and then to Kuhn, Ian Hacking, Michael Friedman, Daston, Renn, and others. Theirs are diverse versions of the two-process view introduced in Section 1.2 above. On this view, there are long-term socio-cognitive stabilities (not necessarily the paradigms or research programs discussed above) that have a beginning, middle, and end in historical time. They are historicized Archimedean points or platforms that organize human experience, rather than fixed Kantian categories. But, like Kant’s categories, they are presuppositions that define how coherent perception and the formation of true or false propositions are possible.
Friedman speaks of these as “historically contingent but constitutive a prioris”. His 2011 takes first steps beyond the two-process dynamic of his 2001 to address the problem of changing conceptions of rationality (i.e., intersubjective objectivity) and to bring in a wider social dimension. Like Renn, Friedman makes philosophical reflection a key to understanding changes so rapid that they amount to discontinuities. Up to a point he defends Kuhn on the existence of scientific revolutions and incommensurability. Kuhn ran into trouble with incommensurability and relativism, he says, for failing to include the history of scientific philosophical reflection that parallels the first-order, technical scientific work itself. Friedman’s leading example is also the relativity revolution.
Why do philosophers need to appeal to serious history of science? From the beginning, Friedman has answered this question by insisting on the importance of the history of science to locate the emergence of philosophical ideas in their historical scientific context and vice versa—thus to understand the interaction between what is commonly called scientific work and philosophical work (Domski & Dickson 2010: 4). For example, Newton’s mechanical system of the world was shaped by philosophical and theological interests that Newton and his contemporaries considered directly relevant (internal not external), as well as socio-political interests. And likewise for Kant and Poincaré and Einstein and many other thinkers, great and small. To the degree that we retain an internal/external distinction, it is historically relative. Unlike most other historical philosophers, Friedman furnishes the intricate technical and contextual detail to support such claims.
Inspired by Friedman’s approach is the rich collection, Discourse on a New Method: Reinvigorating the Marriage of History and Philosophy of Science (2010), edited by Mary Domski and Michael Dickson, and containing a book-length response (Friedman 2010). Their introduction to the volume is a “manifesto” for “synthetic history” (2010: 11ff, 572ff). This sense of ‘synthetic’ is not opposed to ‘analytic’, they insist. For example, rather than separating out the mathematical, physical, philosophical, theological and other social-contextual constituents of Newton’s work for separate disciplinary treatment, synthetic history follows Friedman in exploring the ways these relate to one another to achieve an outcome with a satisfying convergence (2010: 15ff). Although inspired by Friedman’s work, the manifesto denies that Friedman’s two-process view is essential to synthetic history. (See also the extensive discussion of Friedman by Menachem Fisch (forthcoming), a work centered on George Peacock’s struggle with rational consistency that helped produce a transformation in nineteenth-century mathematics.)
A somewhat different sort of two-levels position is the “historical ontology” of Ian Hacking. Hacking (2002, 2012) cites Foucault’s “discursive formations” (epistèmes) and Alistair Crombie’s “styles of scientific thinking” (Crombie 1994) as inspirations. Examples of such styles are the Greek discovery or invention of axiomatic geometry, the laboratory science that emerged in the Scientific Revolution (Shapin & Schaffer 1985), and modern probability theory and statistical inference (Hacking 1975). Hacking returns to Kant’s “how possible?” question, the answer to which establishes the necessary conditions for a logical space of reasons in which practitioners can make true or false claims about objects and pose research questions about them. And Hacking also historicizes the Kantian conception.
The historical a priori points at conditions whose dominion is as inexorable, there and then, as Kant’s synthetic a priori. Yet they are at the same time conditioned and formed in history, and can be uprooted by later, radical, historical transformations. T.S. Kuhn’s paradigms have some of the character of a historical a priori. (Hacking 2002: 5)
[S]cientific styles of thinking & doing are not good because they find out the truth. They have become part of our standards for what it is, to find out the truth. They establish criteria of truthfulness. … Scientific reason, as manifested in Crombie’s six genres of inquiry, has no foundation. The styles are how we reason in the sciences. To say that these styles of thinking & doing are self-authenticating is to say that they are autonomous: they do not answer to some other, higher, or deeper, standard of truth and reason than their own. To repeat: No foundation. The style does not answer to some external canon of truth independent of itself. (2012: 605; Hacking’s emphasis)
As in early Kuhn, there is a kind of circularity here that is perhaps not vicious but, quite the contrary, bootstraps the whole enterprise. Hacking describes changes in historical a prioris as “significant singularities during which the coordinates of ‘scientific objectivity’ are rearranged” (2002: 6).
Unlike Kuhnian paradigms, several of Hacking’s styles of thinking and doing can exist side by side, e.g., the laboratory and hypothetical modeling traditions. Yet people living before and after the historical crystallization of a style would find each other mutually unintelligible. Hacking recognizes that Kuhnian problems of relativism lurk in such positions. “Just as statistical reasons had no force for the Greeks, so one imagines a people for whom none of our reasons for belief have force” (2002: 163). This sort of incommensurability is closer to Feyerabend’s extreme cases (as in the ancient Greek astronomers versus their Homeric predecessors) than to Kuhn’s “no common measure” (2002: chap. 11). Writes Hacking,
Many of the recent but already “classical” philosophical discussions of such topics as incommensurability, indeterminacy of translation, and conceptual schemes seem to discuss truth where they ought to be considering truth-or-falsehood. (2002: 160)
For an illuminating exposition and critique of Hacking’s position, see Kusch (2010, 2011).
A still more integrative role for historical epistemology is articulated by Hasok Chang (2004, 2012). Chang is a nonrealist who boldly goes beyond the case-study genres of both philosophers and professional historians to propose what he terms “complementary science”, a fully integrated historical and philosophical approach that does not stop with pointing out historical contingencies but also investigates them scientifically, e.g., by repeating and extending historical experimental practices. Chang’s idea is that complementary science can preserve previously gained knowledge and unanswered questions now in danger of becoming lost, and can even build upon them as a complement to today’s highly specialized scientific disciplines. The results can be published as genuine, if non-mainstream, scientific contributions. For example, in his own work he tries to bring the debate over phlogiston to life as well as that over the nature of water and the question of its boiling point. For his work, Chang leaves both his armchair and the library, for he needs scientific equipment and laboratory space in addition to the usual scholarly materials.
Historical epistemology faces a variety of criticisms, including some inherited from the Battle of the Big Systems, e.g., whether rationality and objectivity can be locally preserved during major transformations and how to have thoroughgoing historicity, including historical relativity, without full-blown relativism. Generalization problems still lurk at the meso-scale of historical epistemology. Some critics question whether historical epistemology is anything new, sometimes complaining that it just revives traditional history of ideas. Some would question its neo-Kantian underpinnings. For example, how can we really identify and individuate the “categories” employed by scholars such as Hacking and Daston? (See Kusch 2010, 2011 and Sciortino 2017.) Skeptics ask what difference historical epistemology makes to science, history, or philosophy of science. Is it more than a faddish relabeling of work already well underway? Are new historical and/or philosophical methods required to conduct such a study? Given its different strands, is it coherent as a movement? Various adherents disagree on what it includes and even what to call it. Although Daston declares that Hacking’s work provided much of her original inspiration, Hacking denies that he is doing historical epistemology, preferring “meta-epistemology”. He also says that he is doing whiggish “history of the present”. Scholars such as Nersessian, ABC (Andersen, Barker, & Chen 2006), and Renn rely heavily on recent work in cognitive science, whereas sociologists still tend to shun cognitive psychology.
How significant can we expect historical epistemology to be in the longer run? History will be the judge!
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
- Matheson, Carl and Justin Dallmann, “Historicist Theories of Scientific Rationality,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2017 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/spr2017/entries/rationality-historicist/>. [This was the previous entry on historicist theories of rationality in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy — see the version history.]
- The Integrated History and Philosophy of Science (&HPS) website
- Hasok Chang 2015 Royal Society Wilkins-Bernal-Medawar Lecture, “Who cares about the history of science?”, (YouTube video, 65 minutes)
I am indebted to Carl Matheson and Justin Dallmann, for their work in the previous SEP entry on this topic. Thanks also to the SEP editors and to Miriam Solomon, Theodore Arabatzis, and Ken Westphal for helpful advice.