Naturalistic Approaches to Social Construction

First published Mon Nov 10, 2008; substantive revision Wed Jun 5, 2024

Social “construction,” “constructionism” and “constructivism” are terms in wide use in the humanities and social sciences, and are applied to a diverse range of objects including the emotions, gender, race, sex, homo- and hetero-sexuality, mental illness, technology, quarks, facts, reality, and truth. This sort of terminology plays a number of different roles in different discourses, only some of which are philosophically interesting, and fewer of which admit of a “naturalistic” approach—an approach that treats science as a central and successful (if sometimes fallible) source of knowledge about the world. If there is any core idea of social constructionism, it is that some object or objects are grounded in, or caused, constituted, or controlled by, social or cultural factors rather than natural factors, and if there is any core motivation of such research, it is the aim of showing that such objects are or were under our control: they could be, or might have been, otherwise.

Determination of our representations of the world (including our ideas, concepts, beliefs, and theories of the world) by factors other than the way the world is may undermine our faith that any independent phenomena are represented or tracked, undermining the idea that there is a fact of the matter about which way of representing is correct. And determination of the non-representational facts of the world by our theories seems to reverse the “direction of fit” between representation and reality presupposed by our idea of successful epistemic activity. For both of these reasons, proponents and opponents of constructionist thought have held it to embody a challenge to the naturalism endemic in contemporary philosophy. But social constructionist themes can be and have been picked up by naturalists who hope to accommodate the interesting and important cultural phenomena documented by constructionist authors while denying more radical anti-scientific and anti-realist theses widely associated with social constructionism.

I begin by discussing social constructionism, and I then discuss some threads of contemporary naturalism. I go on to consider two different sorts of objects of social construction—representations and human kinds or traits—and discuss naturalistic, constructionist approaches to them.

1. What is Social Construction?

While constructionist claims often take the passive form of a declaration that “Y is socially constructed,” it is more useful to think of social constructionist claims as having the form of a two-part relation:

X socially constructs Y.

We can then think of different accounts of social construction as differing in their accounts either of the relation itself, or of one or both relata.

1.1 What Constructs?

While philosophers have carefully engaged various constructionist claims over the last several decades, much of the attention has been paid to various objects of construction (e.g., ideas? knowledge? facts? human nature?). In contrast, comparatively little attention has been paid to distinguishing different sorts of agents of construction. Many of the agents in social constructionist claims can be neatly divided into two groups: those that view the agents as primarily impersonal agents, and those that view the agents as personal agents (i.e., persons or groups).

Work in the first group emphasizes a causal role for impersonal causes like conventions, cultures, institutions, or social structures in producing some phenomenon. For example, the claim that what we perceive is determined by our background theories emphasizes an impersonal causal agent—culture—in determining some phenomena. Perhaps the most influential version of this claim came in Thomas Kuhn’s suggestion that, “what a man sees depends both upon what he looks at and also upon what his previous visual-conceptual experience has taught him to see” (1962/1970, 113), a suggestion with some foundation in “New Look” psychology (e.g. Briner, Postman, and Rodrigues 1951). This view was subsequently taken up by a range of other authors across disciplines. For example, the historian Thomas Laqueur writes that, “powerful prior notions of difference or sameness determine what one sees and reports about the body” (1990, 21).[1] Provocative claims like Kuhn’s and Laqueur’s suggest that perception is so dependent upon the background theories that the observational data becomes compromised as an independent constraint on empirical inquiry. Impersonal cultural accounts of construction are also found in explanations of nonrepresentational phenomena, for example, of sex-differentiated behavior. Here a core claim might admit that there is sex difference, but claim that the cause of difference is rooted in different conceptions of sex (and the practices caused by those conceptions) rather than biological facts (see the entry on feminist perspectives on sex and gender).

A second group of constructionist claims emphasizes personal social agents that construct through their choices. For example, Andrew Pickering’s (1984) influential work Constructing Quarks emphasizes the role of scientists’ judgments in a variety of roles in scientific process including, e.g., theory selection, experiment evaluation, assessments of research fecundity, and so forth, and such an emphasis on apparently highly contingent choices by researchers and scientific institutions is a mainstay of the social studies of knowledge literature. In emphasizing personal choices, some constructionist work (including some of Pickering’s) seems primarily aimed at emphasizing the contingency of the scientific theory that we come to accept (cf. Hacking 1999).[2] Other constructionists—those we might call critical constructionists—emphasize personal choices not just to establish the contingency of the acceptance of some representation as to emphasize the role of an agent’s interests or power relations in determining the content of an accepted representation. For example, Charles Mills suggests that the borders of American racial categories were determined in such a way as to “establish and maintain the privileges of different groups. So, for example, the motivation for using the one-drop rule to determine black racial membership is to maintain the subordination of the products of ‘miscegenation’” (1998, 48). And a range of constructionist research, especially research on human classifications like “race” and “gender,” documents shifts in human classification in response to shifts of interests or power.

1.2 What is Constructed?

Social constructionist claims are made about so many different objects that it is perhaps not surprising to find that such claims have different implications depending upon the different objects at which they are directed. Most uses of “construction”-talk (and related talk to the effect that that objects are, surprisingly, “invented” or “made up”) are directed at three very different sorts of entities: representations (e.g. ideas, theories, concepts, accounts, taxonomies, and so forth), (non-representational) facts quite generally, and a special sort of non-representational fact: facts about human traits.

Most philosophical discussion of social constructionism has been concerned with the so-called “science wars” which means that they have been concerned with evaluating the inference from the numerous and complex social influences operating in the production of scientific theories to the social construction of the facts those theories purport to represent, or to the failure of accounts of scientific rationality, or scientific realism, or scientific process (e.g. Laudan 1981, Nelson 1994, Fine 1996, Kukla 2000).

But “construction” talk has a more or less independent, but equally contentious life in the “human nature wars” where it labels the position that human traits (for example the emotions) or human kinds (which we can think of categories whose members share traits or clusters of traits, including, especially, dispositions to think and behave) are produced by culture rather than by biology or nature.

This kind constructionist view contrasts with the view that human kinds or traits are to be explained in terms of non-cultural mechanisms – especially internal, biological or natural states of the organism. The most pronounced disputes are prima facie concerned with whether the clustering of traits in, for example, sex difference, emotional behavior, or mental illness, are caused by a cultural practice of differentiating persons or are instead caused by natural processes operating in relative independence from culture.

But this kind constructionist view has also (especially in the philosophy of race) come to contrast with the skeptical view that a kind does not exist. In the context of race, constructionism amounts to the positive assertion that race is real even though it is not constituted by, or grounded in, biological facts such as genetic difference. (See, e.g., Haslanger 2012, Taylor 2013, Sundstrom 2002, Outlaw 1995, and the section “Race: Do Races Exist? Contemporary Philosophical Debates” in the entry on race.)

We consider naturalistic approaches to the construction of representations and human traits in more detail below, but it is useful to first distinguish global constructionist claims that hold that every fact is a social construction, from local constructionist claims that hold that only particular facts are.[3] Because of their provocative nature, many philosophers associate the term “social construction” with a global thesis, and a standard argument against global constructionism concerns whether such a program is sustainable in the face of the regress such a global thesis engenders regarding the thesis of constructionism itself (e.g. Boghossian 2006, Kukla 2000). Philosophers may have focused on these more radical claims in part because of the recognition that, relying on something like the general idea of construction sketched above, claims that are relatively global in scope are quite provocative and surprising while claims that would count as locally socially constructionist are quite familiar in many areas of philosophy, perhaps most importantly in meta-ethics, aesthetics, and social ontology. The domain of social ontology is especially interesting because here many facts are widely recognized as social constructions: for example, facts about being a U.S. Senator or a licensed dog are social constructions.[4] Call such constructions overt constructions.[5]

But even local constructionist claims can be interesting to the extent that they try to show some object may be produced by unacknowledged social practices—when they are covert constructions. This is the role that they play in the philosophy of psychiatry (Hacking 1995a, Scheff 1984, Showalter 1996, cf. Murphy 2006), the philosophy of the emotions (Averill 1980a, 1980b, Armon-Jones 1986, Harré 1986, cf. Griffiths 1997), the philosophy of race (e.g. Outlaw 1990, 1995; Mills 1998; Taylor 2013), and the philosophy of gender (see the section on gender as socially constructed in the entry on feminist theories of sex and gender). Here the local claim that some kind (for example mental illness, emotion, race, or gender) is explained by received culture or practice retains its interest because it offers a metaphysical alternative to other explanations (biological, religious, etc.) of the differential features of the kind members as well as an alternative to skepticism about the reality of the kind.[6]

1.3 What is it to Construct?

We have already suggested that the core idea of constructionism is that some social agent produces or controls some object. Of course, “construction” talk is meant to evoke a variety of connotations that attend more paradigmatic construction: intentional activity, engaged in step-by step fashion, producing a designed, artifactual product. While different objects lead constructionist talk to be interpreted in different ways, we can distinguish two different sorts of relationship.[7] On the first, X constructs Y if Y is caused to come to exist, to continue to exist, or to have the properties that it does by X. On the second, Y is constructed if it is constituted by, or grounded in, X’s conceptual or social activity (perhaps even independently of X’s causal influence on Y).

The first, and more straightforward idea is causal construction:

X causally constructs Y if and only if X causes Y to exist or to persist or X controls the kind-typical properties of Y.[8]

There is no special problem posed by the claim that human social and linguistic activities cause certain things to exist or persist, or to cause certain facts to be. More obscure has been the idea that X’s construction of Y is some sort of noncausal relationship. Many constructionist claims seem to involve the idea that the world is itself “made up” by social and cultural activities in ways that suggest our socio-linguistic behaviors are at least necessary to the object in question. This suggests a relationship such as:

X constitutively constructs Y if and only if X’s conceptual or social activity regarding an individual y is metaphysically necessary for y to be a Y.

In this vein, most discussions of social construction have thus distinguished causal from constitutive forms of determination. However, it should be noted that, following a more general shift in philosophical metaphysics, some social ontologists have shifted away from thinking of noncausal determination by socio-conceptual activity in terms of constitution towards thinking of it in terms of metaphysical grounding (e.g. Epstein 2015; Schaffer 2017; Griffith 2017). Here, I’ll continue to discuss such noncausal determination using the older notion of constitution.

Consider the ways in which causal and constitutive claims might pull apart in a case of a socially produced artifact. Representations expressing the concept watch are normally causally necessary for some materials to come to have the intrinsic features of a watch, but they are not metaphysically necessary. It is metaphysically possible, however unlikely, that we could walk across a heath and find (something with the intrinsic features of) a watch that had “always been there.”

In contrast, the best candidates for constitutive construction are social facts:

For social facts, the attitude that we take toward the phenomenon is partly constitutive of the phenomenon … Part of being a cocktail party is being thought to be a cocktail party; part of being a war is being thought to be a war. This is a remarkable feature of social facts; it has no analogue among physical facts. (Searle 1995, 33–34)

On Searle’s view, a particular gathering of persons can be a cocktail party only with the conceptual and social recognition of those gathered. A similar idea has been influential in constructionist discussions. For example, the provocative claims that there were no homosexuals before the concept homosexual came to be expressed in Western culture in the nineteenth century (e.g. Foucault 1978, Halperin 1990) or that race is a modern invention (e.g Taylor 2004) seem to make sense if we see sexual or racial kinds as in part constituted by our concepts of them.

But Searle is right that there is something remarkable here, at least in the case of social facts: somehow our conceptual scheme or practice are necessary to make it true that some event instantiates cocktail party or war. What is wanted is, at a minimum, a model of this production—a model of exactly how the conceptual practice constitutes the fact. Perhaps the most obvious model to explain such constitutive claims is to hold that the relevant necessity is analytic, it holds in virtue of the meaning of the relevant term or concept. It is a fact about the meaning of “cocktail party” and perhaps “homosexual” and “race”) that it does not apply to a thing unless it is recognized to do so.

Whether any such meaning claims can be accommodated has been a contentious question since Quine (1953), but it is a question we can put aside for now (see the analytic/synthetic distinction). Instead, we should ask whether such model of constitutivity as analyticity is plausible for objects of social construction.

On the one hand, if Searle’s general account of social facts is correct, there may be many terms that operate like “cocktail party” in that the participants produce them only when they share certain intentional states about what they are doing. On the other hand, this does not seem plausible for the objects of many social constructionist claims. Remember, it is a mainstay of constructionist research to claim that social influence is exercised in surprising and provocative ways, especially on objects that we take to be produced naturally. But just this feature suggests that it cannot be part of our ordinary concepts of covertly constructed kinds that instances require our social-conceptual imprimatur to be members of these kinds (Machery 2014, Mallon 2017). This point is highlighted in a more general way by Paul Boghossian’s query:

isn’t it part of the very concept of an electron, or of a mountain, that these things were not constructed by us? Take electrons, for example. Is it not part of the very purpose of having such a concept that it is to designate things that are independent of us? (2006, 39)

If this is right, constructionists who view construction as a constitutive relation need another account of the necessity of our conceptual practice: it is implausible and inconsistent to claim that the necessity arises out of concept or word meanings in cases of covert construction.

There is a different model of necessity for the constructionist, however, which is to hold that the necessity in question is revealed a posteriori by our investigations of the phenomenon in question. Saul Kripke (1980), Hilary Putnam (1975) and others defended a causal theory of reference on which some terms (notably natural kind terms) referred to some sort of stuff or essence underlying the central uses of the term (see the section on causal theories in the entry on reference). Crucially, however, because the reference relation is external, competent users of a term can be radically mistaken about what the term refers to and still successfully refer. In the case of water, for example, Putnam suggests that “water” picks out the sort of stuff that bears the appropriate causal-historical relation to paradigmatic instances in our own causal history (viz. H2O), and this was true even when we did not know what sort of stuff that was (i.e. before we knew the chemical structure). Kripke, Putnam, and others emphasized that claims such as “water=H2O” express necessary though a posteriori truths.

While the causal theory of reference (and its correct interpretation) remains controversial, in many quarters of philosophy it has become accepted wisdom. It is thus an option for interpreters of social constructionism to claim that certain terms—for example, “race”—actually refer to a kind that is produced by our socio-linguistic behavior, even if that fact is revealed only a posteriori.[9] Such a constitutive constructionist could grant, then, that it is part of our ordinary conception of the concept (e.g. of race) that – like electron – it refers to an independent, natural fact about the world, but such a constructionist would insist that further exploration of the world reveals that conventional features of our practice produce the object of our study. As with the case of “water” before modern chemistry, the conception widely associated with “race” (viz. that it is a biological kind) is wrong, but the term successfully refers all the same. Ideally, for such an approach to work, the constitutive constructionist would like an independent characterization of the sorts of social objects that investigation reveals to be identical with the kinds in question (e.g. Ásta 2016; Bach 2012; Mallon 2003, 2016), but they also need to fend off critics of applying the causal theory of reference in the context of reference to socially produced objects (e.g. Thomasson 2003) as well as more general critiques of employing theories of reference as premises in arguments with philosophically significant conclusions (Mallon et al. 2009). Still, if it can be made to work, this strategy would make sense of constitutive constructionist claims while respecting Boghossian’s idea (one that is also central to constructionism) that these kinds are ordinarily believed to be natural and independent of us. For this reason, this strategy has been suggested in the case of race, gender, and other human kinds (Haslanger 2003, 2005; Mallon 2003, 2016), and more generally for scientific facts (Boyd 1992).

Of course, there may well be other models of necessity available. For example, it is sometimes suggested that a neo-Kantian interpretation of social constructionism is possible, an interpretation on which our socio-linguistic activities could provide a transcendental basis for any knowledge of the world. Such an interpretation might allow certain apparently radical constitutive claims, but the challenge would remain to reconcile the view with a naturalistic conception of ourselves, something such a proposal may fail to do (e.g. Boyd 1992, Rosen 1994).

2. Naturalism and Social Construction

Any discussion of naturalistic approaches to social construction is complicated by the fact that “naturalism” itself has no very widespread and uniform understanding (see naturalism). Still, the prospect seems provocative, in part, because social construction has come to be associated with a critical anti-realist attitude towards science.

Above, we identified naturalism with a certain attitude towards science, and for present purposes, we develop this idea by identifying three naturalistic attitudes toward science that have been picked up by naturalists addressing social constructionist themes.

  1. Epistemological Fundamentalism
    1. Accommodating Science: Most contemporary naturalists take science to be an enormously successful enterprise, and so other knowledge claims must either cohere with the findings of our best science or explain those findings away.
    2. Empiricism: Knowledge comes from careful study of the world, not a priori theorizing.
    3. Causal Modeling: The world is a set of entities related by natural laws. In attempting to understand it, we produce causal models that idealize these relationships to varying degrees.
  2. Metaphysical Fundamentalism
    1. Supervenience: There are more and less fundamental entities, and the less fundamental depend on the more fundamental. Naturalists understand (at least) these fundamental entities to be natural (as opposed to supernatural). Naturalists typically hold these fundamental entities to be physical entities.
    2. Reduction: The regularities in which less fundamental entities participate are explained by natural laws governing the more fundamental entities upon which they supervene.
  3. Human Naturalism:
    1. Nonanomalism: Human beings and their products (e.g. culture or society) are natural things within the world that science explains. They are not metaphysically anomalous.
    2. Methodological Naturalism: In studying human nature, human culture, and social life, the methods of the natural sciences are to be employed.

These features characterize substantial threads of contemporary naturalist thought—threads that arise repeatedly in discussions of constructionism. Still, it is worth noting that something may be naturalistic in one sense but not another, and that the various threads we have characterized may sometimes be at odds. For example, rational choice explanations in economics might count as naturalist in that they attempt to reduce complex macro-level phenomena to simple, micro-level phenomena at the level of individuals (exhibiting some variety of metaphysical fundamentalism), and in the sense that they employ idealized causal modeling to do so (as in 1c). But they seem nonnaturalist insofar as they offer a highly idealized account of human behavior, one that seems frequently contradicted by the psychological facts about human reasoning (see, e.g., Nisbett and Ross 1980, Tversky and Kahneman, 1974) (against, perhaps, 1a and b, and 3). This sort of idealization has recently inspired increasing attention to more empiricist “nonideal” approaches to social ontology (Burman 2023).

We now review various naturalistic approaches to social construction, considering different sorts of entities in turn.

3. Naturalizing Social Construction

As we noted above, the production of facts by social agents poses no special problem for the naturalist where that production is understood causally, though naturalists of many stripes may want to produce causal models to show how the macro-level social phenomena of interest to many social theorists and social scientists are causally realized given what we know about, e.g. human nature or the causal structure of the universe. In contrast, constitutive claims of construction seem difficult to make sense of (except on an account of construction on which social activity involving a representation comes to produce and causally sustain an object that is referred to by that representation).

In recognition of this state of affairs, many naturalist approaches to constructed phenomena have involved attempts to causally model matters of interest to constructionists in ways that engage more or less completely with existing scientific knowledge. By way of illustrating such naturalistic approaches, I’ll discuss the social construction of representations and of human nature in more detail.

3.1 The Social Construction of Representations

In talking about the construction of representations, we address the range of mental states, group beliefs, scientific theories, and other representations that express concepts or propositions. Such representations are, among other things, the vehicles of our thought as well as the means by which we store, organize, and further our knowledge of the world, and we do this in virtue of their role as bearers of meaning. A number of commentators have noted that many provocative constructionist claims are, in the first instance, claims that some sort of representation is constructed (e.g. Andreasen 1998, Hacking 1999, Haslanger 2012). Specifically, these are claims that social causes produce or control the selection of some representations with some meanings rather than others: for example, when Pickering (1984) writes of the construction of quarks or Laqueur (1990) suggests that sex is “made up,” they seem to be most directly addressing the process by which the theories of the quark or theories of sex are produced, viz. they are showing how a theory with one meaning was selected or endorsed rather than another theory or no theory at all. Where we limit the objects of constructionist claims to representations (such as theories), the claims cease to be particularly metaphysically provocative though detailed constructionist accounts of how certain representations came to be selected may still teach us much about science (e.g. Latour and Woolgar 1979l Collins and Pinch 2012).

In light of this, philosophers may be wont to diagnose some constructionist talk as a careless (or even an intentionally provocative) error of talking about the object of construction using a representation when one should be mentioning it (thereby expressing a view about the referent of the representation rather than the representation itself). When Claudius Ptolemy offered a geo-centric theory of the universe in the second century CE, he thereby contributed to the social construction of something: namely, a geocentric theory of the universe. We can talk about how and when that theory arose, and how it changed over time, but in doing so we are simply talking about a representation (or perhaps a lineage of related representations). It would be a mistake simply to slip from those claims into saying that in constructing this theory he thereby constructed a geocentric universe. Hence, charity in interpretation alone may suggest attributing only the weaker claim to a constructionist author.[10]

Still some constructionists endorse a stronger claim as well—that in constructing the theories, the facts described by those theories are thereby made to be. But if we leave at least the global versions of these additional claims aside as impossible to reconcile with naturalism, the distinctive feature of social constructionist explanations of representations is that they explain how we came to have those representations not by reference to the facts in the world they represent (as in realism), nor by reference to associations among our sensations (as in some forms of empiricism), nor by reference to innate knowledge or concepts (as in rationalism), nor by reference to the conditions of our thought or experience (as in transcendental arguments) but rather by reference to social and cultural background facts.

Naturalist work on constructionist approaches to representations can be grouped according to the debate the naturalist is addressing. Naturalists addressing the challenge posed by social construction to the authority of science have attempted to respond to this challenge in a variety of ways that pit various versions of realism and empiricism against constructionism (e.g. Boyd 1992; see the entry on social dimensions of scientific knowledge). Because naturalists are typically committed to science as a central, if fallible, avenue of knowledge about the world (i.e. some variety of epistemic fundamentalism), naturalists will want to explain how this can be if, as social constructionists about scientific representations note, empirical observation is theory-laden and scientific theories are themselves subject to massive social influences.

For example, Jerry Fodor’s account of the modularity of perception (e.g. 1983, 1984, 1988) is, in part, a response to the implication that perception is so theory-laden that it lacks the independence required to constrain belief (see above for this implication in such diverse thinkers as Kuhn 1962/1970 and Laqueur 1990; cf. the entry on modularity of mind). Fodor suggests that sensory perception is modular by which he means (in part) “mandatory” and “informationally encapsulated” in its operations—i.e., it operates independently of our will and of our background theories and expectations. Fodor illustrates this effect by pointing to cases of optical illusions like the Muller-Lyer illusion (Fodor 1984). Here, two parallel line segments continue to appear to be different lengths even when one knows them be the same length, suggesting the independence of the process that produces sensory phenomena from one’s background theoretical beliefs. And while some philosophers (e.g. Churchland 1988, cf. Fodor 1988) have resisted this conclusion, some social scientists of knowledge have attempted to restate a constructionist view in ways that allow that Fodor may be correct. Barry Barnes, David Bloor and John Henry, for example, shift from emphasis on the determination of perceptual experience by culture to an emphasis on the underdetermination of belief by perceptual experience (a view which leaves room for cultural determination of belief) (1996, Ch. 1). More generally, epistemologists and philosophers of science have taken up the project of accommodating social influence in the production of knowledge, and this project is well underway in contemporary social epistemology and philosophy of science (e.g. Boyd 1992; Kitcher 1993, 2001). These issues are taken up elsewhere (social epistemology) so we address them no further here. Instead, I focus on attempts by naturalists to accommodate the cultural and personal processes at the heart of constructionist phenomena in naturalistic terms.

In contrast to naturalistic responses to the threat of scientific anti-realism, naturalistic responses to constructionist claims about representations (including beliefs) understood as human traits have been far more sympathetic to constructionist approaches. Indeed, an emphasis on the cultural and social causes of belief is quite amenable to range of naturalists, and naturalistic approaches to these causes are well represented in constructionist precursors, including such luminaries as Karl Marx, Friedrich Nietzsche (see the section on the critique of the descriptive component of MPS in the entry on Nietzsche’s moral and political philosophy), and Karl Mannheim (1936). In contemporary naturalistic philosophy of science and psychology, the naturalistic explanation of culturally produced cognition is picked up by at least three distinct strands of work taking up constructionist themes of culture. The first is centered on the idea that culture can be understood by analogy with population genetics, and that cultural items might be understood to be more or less successful based upon their success in spreading in a population. Various versions of this sentiment find expression in such diverse thinkers as Robert Boyd and Peter Richerson (1985, 2005a, 2005b), D.T. Campbell (1960), Luca Cavalli-Sforza and Marcus Feldman (1981), David Hull (1988), Jesse Prinz (2007, Ch. 6), Daniel Sperber (1996), and one version of it has a substantial popular following (Richard Dawkins’s (1976) widely read discussion of “memes”). While only some of these thinkers link the project to the understanding of constructionist research themes, the project in every case is to formally model cultural processes, understanding these complex processes as depending on simpler ones (See also the entry on cultural evolution.)

The second, overlapping strand of naturalistic inquiry also views culture as a system of representations upon which selection acts, but attempts to integrate this idea with the idea, common in evolutionary cognitive psychology, that the mind is comprised of a great many domain-specific mental mechanisms, and uses these as the selective mechanisms that act as a primary mechanism of selection (so called “massive modularity”; see section on massive modularity in the entry on evolutionary psychology; cf. Carruthers 2006), and it is most firmly represented among cognitive anthropologists and psychologists like Scott Atran (1998), Pascal Boyer (1994, 2001), Laurence Hirschfeld (1996), and Daniel Sperber (1996). Such an approach represents naturalism in most (or perhaps all) of the above senses, and it is finding its way into the work of naturalist philosophers of science and psychology (Machery and Faucher 2005, Mallon 2013, Nichols 2002, Prinz 2007, Sripada 2006, Sterelny 2003).

A third, philosophically underdeveloped strand naturalizes crucial elements of critical constructionist approaches by suggesting the influence of sometimes implicit evaluations on judgments and theoretical activities. For example, a growing body of empirical evidence on so-called “motivated cognition” (cf. Kunda 1999) suggests mechanisms for (and some empirical validation of) the critical social constructionist tradition of explaining the content of accepted theories in part by appeal to the interests of the theorists.

3.2 Construction, Human Kinds and Human Traits

Any sort of human trait could be an object of social construction, but many of the most interesting and contested cases are ones in which clusters of traits—traits that comprise human kinds—are purported to co-occur and to correlate with mental states, including dispositions to think and behave in particular ways.[11]

Because discussion of kinds of persons with dispositions to think and behave quickly gives rise to other questions about freedom of the will and social regulation, debates over constructionism about kinds are central to social and political debates regarding human categorization, including debates over sex and gender, race, emotions, hetero- and homo-sexuality, mental illness, and disability. Since the constructionist strategy explains a trait by appeal to highly contingent factors (including culture), partisans of these debates often inquire whether a trait or cluster of traits is culturally specific or can be found across cultures.

3.2.1 The Conceptual Project

These issues can quickly come to generate more heat than light, and so one role that philosophers in general, and naturalists in particular, have played is to carefully analyze constructionist positions and their alternatives. For example, in reflecting on debates over cultural specificity or universality, a number of commentators have noted that constructionist claims of cultural specificity often hinge not on genuine empirical disagreement about what is or is not found through history and across cultures, but also on a strategy of individuating the phenomena in question in ways that do or do not involve contextual features that vary across cultures (Mallon and Stich 2000; Boghossian 2006, 28; Pinker 2003, 38).

Philosophers have also distinguished claims of social construction from the possibility of cultural control (Mallon 2007a, Stein 1999), disentangled claims of social construction from claims of voluntariness and nonessentialism (Stein 1999), set out alternate forms of constructionism or anti-constructionism (Griffiths 1997, Mallon 2007b, Andreasen 1998), disentangled questions regarding the neural basis of a human kind from the innate/constructed dichotomy (Murphy 2006, Ch. 7) and so forth.

This conceptual project is a philosophical project par excellence, and it has contributed a great deal to clarifying just what conceptual and empirical issues are at stake in constructionist work.

3.2.2 Explaining the Development and Distribution of Human Traits

Naturalist interpretations of constructionism have also taken up the distinct, open-ended, empirical project of defending substantive claims regarding the development and distribution of human traits via the suggestions that human socio-linguistic behaviors shape human traits (including behavior) via different avenues, both developmental and situational.

One “social role” family of theories emphasizes the way that our socio-linguistic practices produce social roles that structure and shape human life and behavior. Perhaps the most influential philosophical project in this area has been Ian Hacking’s work on “making up people” (1986, 1992, 1995a, 1995b, 1998). In a series of papers and books, Hacking argues that the creation and promulgation of bureaucratic, technical, and medical classifications like “child abuse,” “multiple personality disorder,” and “fugue” create “new ways to be a person” (1995b, p. 239). The idea is that the conception of a certain kind of person shapes both a widespread social response (e.g. one that exculpates and perhaps encourages kind-typical behaviors), while at the same time, the conception shapes individual “performances” of the behavior in question (by suggesting highly specific avenues of behavior). On Hacking’s model, one he calls “the looping effect of human kinds,” the conception of the behavior may be part of an epistemic project of understanding a human kind that in turn gives rise to the clusters of traits that the theory represents (thereby providing epistemic support for the conception).[12] Much of Hacking’s own recent work has been aimed at providing detailed historical and cultural evidence that suggests that looping effects really are a feature of (at least modern) human social life, e.g. for the American epidemic of multiple personality disorder that started in the 1980s (Hacking 1995) or the European epidemic of fugue in the late nineteenth century (Hacking 1998). Hacking makes further claims about the “looping effect,” for example, that looping effects mark “a cardinal difference between the traditional natural and social sciences” because “the targets of the natural sciences are stationary” while “the targets of the social sciences are on the move” (1999, 108) ),claims that themselves have spurred lively discussions over the nature of looping effects (e.g. Cooper 2004, Laimann 2020) and of their mechanisms in human groups (e.g. Mallon 2016, Kuorikoski and Pöyhönen 2012).

Others have drawn on Hacking’s account to offer similar accounts of constructed kinds of person, including K. Anthony Appiah (1996) on racial identities, and Paul Griffiths (1997) on performed emotional syndromes. Together with Hacking’s work, these accounts provide partial, causal interpretation of even quite radical claims about kinds of person. For example, Judith Butler has provocatively claimed that the sex-differentiated behavior is a performance, writing, “That the gendered body is performative suggests that it has no ontological status apart from the various acts which constitute its reality. … In other words, acts and gestures, articulated and enacted desires create the illusion of an interior and organizing gender core…” (1990, 136). Following on the work of Hacking, Appiah, Griffiths, and others, we can naturalistically (re)interpret Butler’s claim as one that explains gender differences in actions, gestures, desires, and so on by reference to the social role that a person occupies. Such a causal model of the way in which social roles might shape behavior is at least arguably naturalistic in all of the above senses.

This “social role project” amounts to only one way of developing constructionist ideas in the service of explaining the development of human kinds, traits, or behaviors. For example, constructionist ideas find diverse manifestations in the theory of emotions (e.g. Armon-Jones 1986, Barrett 2017, Harré 1986, cf. Griffiths 1997 and Prinz 2004 for discussion). Because social constructionism offers a general set of explanatory approaches, constructionist approaches can be expected to reemerge in a variety of ways in the attempt to explain a wide range of human phenomena.

3.2.3 Formal Approaches to the Social Construction of Kinds

Still a different way of developing naturalistic constructionist accounts of kinds involves using various formal methods to model such kinds. Among recent work in social ontology, Francesco Guala has distinguished “rules-based” approaches to social institutions from “equilibrium-based” approaches (2016, xxv). The former attempts to understand social structure as emerging from the collective adoption of rules, while the latter sees it as emerging along with various solutions to coordination and cooperation problems. As an example of the former, Searle (1995) influentially argues that we can understand social institutions as brought into being by collective endorsement of rules of the form:

X counts as Y in C.

Here, “X” is a specification of the individual or type to which the status “Y” applies. And “C” specifies the context in which this imposition occurs. For instance, it might specify that tokens of a certain type produced by the U.S. mint count as money in the United States. Such statuses obtain in virtue of collective acceptance of one or more status functions. (See the entry on social ontology.)

In contrast, the latter family of approaches attempts to understand social structure by using the tools of economic and evolutionary game theory to understand culture (e.g. Bicchieri 2006, 2016; Guala 2016; O’Connor 2017). Here, norms, behaviors, and social regularities are seen as produced and stabilized by the preferences of individual actors making decisions in a social context of other actors. For example, Richard McElreath, Robert Boyd, and Peter Richerson (2003) have argued that ethnic group “markers” (e.g. things like styles of dress or other indicators of membership in an ethnic group) culturally evolved because they allowed actors to differentially interact with those who shared common norms, thus reaping the benefits of coordination and cooperation with greater efficiency.

While rules-based approaches have been much discussed across a range of philosophical fields (including metaphysics, social philosophy, empirically-informed philosophy of mind), equilibrium-based approaches have so far received comparatively little philosophical attention.

3.2.4 Human Kinds and Normativity

Many constructionist projects concerning human kinds are, or are pursued as part of, normative projects. Thinkers interested in gender, race, mental illness and disability, are often motivated not only by concern with the metaphysics of these categories, but with questions of social morality and justice that connect with them. For instance, Sally Haslanger’s work on the construction of gender and race (Haslanger 2012), or Elizabeth Barnes’s (2016) constructionist account of disability seem to essentially incorporate normative concepts. This connection, in turn, raises a number of further questions about why they are connected, and how we ought to understand their relationship.

One answer to these questions is simply that, once we understand the constructed nature of some category or phenomena, different normative conclusions will follow. For instance, some have emphasized that because constructionist explanations highlight the role of agents in the production or the sustenance of phenomena, they make those agents subject to moral evaluation (Kukla 2000; Mallon 2016, forthcoming).

A different approach might be that normative considerations ought to drive us towards certain metaphysical explanations. For instance, Esa Diaz-Leon (2015) has argued that constitutive constructionist explanations are politically better than causal constructionist ones, on the grounds that constitutive constructions are more tightly connected to our socio-conceptual practices:

revealing the constitutive connections between instantiating a certain category and standing in a certain relation to certain social practices, opens a clear path for social change: just change those social practices, and social change will automatically follow. (2015, 1145)

In contrast, Theresa Marques (2017) has argued that a focus on causal social construction is more relevant to projects of social justice. But if we see constructionism as a kind of explanation, then this debate can seem to put the cart before the horse. The correctness of an explanation is given by some facts in the world. Deciding what we would like those facts to be, given our aims, seems to fail to appreciate the reality of our socio-conceptual practices and their consequences.

More generally, while normative constructionist projects can be deeply engaged with our best scientific understanding, many naturalists will be tempted to attempt to distinguish descriptive and normative elements in order to engage them separately.

At the same time, ongoing naturalist work on human cooperation and coordination suggests the future possibility of more thoroughgoing naturalist approaches to construction that integrate naturalistic approaches to norms and normativity (e.g., Bicchieri 2016, Sripada 2006, and the entry on social norms) with accounts of the human kinds that our socio-conceptual behaviors structure and shape.

4. Conclusion

The metaphor of “social construction” has proven remarkably supple in labeling and prompting a range of research across the social sciences and humanities, and the themes of personal and cultural causation taken up in this research are themselves of central concern. While most philosophical effort has gone towards the interpretation and refutation of provocative accounts of social construction arising especially out of studies in the history and sociology of science, social constructionist themes emerge across a host of other contexts, offering philosophical naturalists a range of alternate ways of engaging constructionist themes. Philosophical naturalists as well as working scientists have begun to take up this opportunity in ways that use the methods of philosophy and science to both state and evaluate social constructionist hypotheses (though not always under that label). Because of the powerful and central role culture plays in shaping human social environments, behaviors, identities and development, there is ample room for continuing and even expanding the pursuit of social constructionist themes within a naturalistic framework.


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