Umar Khayyam

First published Tue Sep 6, 2011; substantive revision Tue Apr 18, 2023
Of knowledge naught remained I did not know,
Of secrets, scarcely any, high or low;
All day and night for three score and twelve years,
I pondered, just to learn that naught I know.
    (Rubā‘iyyāt, Sa‘idī 1991, 125)

Umar Khayyam was a polymath, scientist, philosopher, and poet of the 11th century CE. Whereas his mathematical works and poetry have been the subject of much discussion, his recently edited and published philosophical works have remained a largely neglected area of study. In what follows, we shall review and comment on the salient features of Khayyam’s poetry and philosophy, their relationship with one another, and Khayyam’s pioneering views on mathematics.

Traditionally, Umar Khayyam’s significance in the annals of Islamic intellectual tradition is due to his Rubā‘iyyāt (quatrains) and his scientific works, especially those in the field of mathematics. The latter have always been overshadowed by his poetry. In recent years, critical editions of the philosophical works of Khayyam have been published which not only provide us with an insight into his philosophical thought but also provide a context for a more philosophical interpretation of the Rubā‘iyyāt.

In his Rubā‘iyyāt, Khayyam challenged religious doctrines, alluded to the hypocrisy of the clergy, cast doubt on almost every facet of religious belief, and appears to have advocated a type of humanism. It is no wonder that some referred to him as the “Eastern Voltaire” (Dole 1901, 81). This Western image, solidified by the Victorian sense of the exotic, romantic, and often erotic notions attached to the East, was echoed through the rendition of the Rubā‘iyyāt by Edward FitzGerald in the 19th century.

1. The Formative Period

Abu’l Fatḥ ʿUmar ibn Ibrāhīm Khayyām, commonly known as Umar Khayyām, is the best known Iranian poet-scientist in the West. He was born in the district of Shādyakh of Nayshābūr (originally “Nayshāpūr”) in the province of Khorāsān sometime around 439 AH/1048 CE,[1] and died there between 515 and 520 AH/1124 and 1129 CE.[2] The word “Khayyām,” means “tent maker,” and thus, it is likely that his father Ibrāhīm or forefathers were tent makers. Khayyām is said to have been quiet, reserved, and humble. His reluctance to accept students drew criticism from opponents, who claimed that he was impatient, bad tempered, and uninterested in sharing his knowledge. Given the radical nature of his views in the Rubā‘iyyāt, he may merely have wished to remain intellectually inconspicuous.

The secrets which my book of love has bred,
Cannot be told for fear of loss of head;
Since none is fit to learn, or cares to know,
‘Tis better all my thoughts remain unsaid.
    (Rubā‘iyyāt, Tirtha 1941, 266)

Khayyam’s reference to Ibn Sīnā as “his teacher” has led some to speculate that he actually studied with Ibn Sīnā. Although this is incorrect, several traditional biographers indicate that Umar Khayyam may have studied with Bahmanyār, an outstanding student of Ibn Sīnā.[3]

Following a number of journeys to Herat, Ray, and Iṣfahān (the latter being the capital of the Seljuqs) in search of libraries and in pursuit of astronomical calculations, Khayyam’s declining health caused him to return to Nayshābūr, where he died in the district of Shādyākh.

2. The Philosophical Works and Thoughts of Umar Khayyam

Khayyam wrote little, but his works—some fourteen treatises identified to date—were remarkable. They can be categorized primarily in three genres: mathematics, philosophy, and poetry. His philosophical works which have been edited and published recently are (we have not translated risālah (treatise) in the titles):

  1. [Lucid Discourse] “A Translation of Ibn Sīnā’s (Avicenna’s) Lucid Discourse” (Khutbah al-gharrā’).
  2. [On Being and Obligation] “On Being and Obligation” (Risālah fī’l-kawn wa’l-taklīf).
  3. [The Necessity of Contrariety] “The Response to Three Problems: The Necessity of Contrariety in the World, Predeterminism and Persistence” (Al-jawāb ‘an thalāth masā’il: Ḍarūrat al-taḍād fi’l-ʿālam wa’l-jabr wa’l-baqā’).
  4. [The Light of the Intellect] “The Light of the Intellect on the Subject of Universal Knowledge” (Risālah al-ḍiyā’ al-‘aqlī fī mawḍū‘ al-‘ilm al-kullī).
  5. [Principles of Existence] “On the Knowledge of the Universal Principles of Existence” (Risālah dar ‘ilm kulliyāt-i wujūd).
  6. [On Existence] “On Existence” (Risālah fi’l-wujūd).
  7. [A Response] “A Response to Three Problems” (Risālah jawāban lī thalāth masā’il). (3 and 7 are distinct works.)

Except the first work mentioned above which is a free translation and commentary on a discourse by Ibn Sīnā, the other six philosophical treatises represent Khayyam’s own independent philosophical views. It is noteworthy that Khayyam’s philosophical treatises were written in the Peripatetic tradition at a time when philosophy in general and rationalism in particular were under attack by orthodox Muslim jurists—so much that Khayyam had to defend himself against the charge of “being a philosopher.”

“A philosopher I am,” my enemies falsely say,
But God knows I am not what they say;
While in this sorrow-laden nook, I reside
Need to know who I am, and why Here stay
    (translation by Aminrazavi)

Khayyam identifies the main types of inquiry in “philosophy” along the Peripatetic line: “The essential and real inquiries that are discussed in philosophy are three inquiries, [first], ‘is it?’…second, ‘what is it?’…third, ‘why is it?’” (On Being and Obligation, Malik (ed.) 1998, 335). While these are standard Aristotelian questions, for Khayyam they have a wider range of philosophical implications, especially with regard to the following topics:

  1. The existence of God, His attributes and knowledge
  2. Hierarchy of Existents and the problem of multiplicity
  3. Eschatology
  4. Theodicy
  5. Predeterminism and free will
  6. Subjects and predicates
  7. Existence and essence

2.1 The existence of God, His attributes and knowledge

In accordance with the Avicennan tradition, Khayyam refers to God as the “Necessary Existence” (or as it is more common in English translation, “Necessary Existent”) and “that which cannot be conceived unless being existent,” and “the one whose existence is from its essence, from the intellect’s [point of view]” (On Existence, Jamshīd Nijād Awwal (ed.), 112) and then offers cosmological, teleological, and ontological arguments for His existence.[4] The most fundamental principle about the necessary existent is its absolute oneness. Khayyam discusses issues such as unity, necessity, causality, and the impossibility of a chain of causes and effects continuing ad infinitum. In his translation of Avicenna’s treatise, as Malik (ed.) (1998, 307) has rightly pointed out, Khayyam adds short remarks and explications to clarify and support Avicenna’s view after each sub-section. He completely follows Avicenna’s view on God’s existence and His attributes. God, the necessary existent, is neither a substance nor an accident (Principles of Existence, Malik (ed.) 1998, 388). There is no motion in Him, and thus He is not in time. He has no intention (qaṣd), end or goal (gharaḍ), since having an end or a goal indicates not having something [desirable], and this in turn implies imperfection (Lucid Discourse, Malik (ed.) 1998, 313–6). Among other topics pertaining to God which Khayyam discusses are God’s knowledge of universals and particulars, the absolutely simple essence of the Necessary Existent, and that “all His attributes, with regard to Its essence, are [rational] considerations (iʿitbarāt)” (ibid). We will return to this last point, on rational considerations, below.

2.2 Hierarchy of existents and the Problem of Unity and Multiplicity

For Khayyam, one of the most complex philosophical problems is to account for the hierarchy of existents and the manner in which they are ranked in terms of their nobility. In On Being and Obligation, Khayyam asserts:

What remains from among the most important and difficult problems [to solve] is the difference among the existents in their degree of nobility…. Perhaps I, and my teacher, the master of all who have proceeded before him, Avicenna, have thoughtfully reflected upon this problem, and consequently have reached the point of convincing our selves [of its truth]. This conviction is either because of the weakness of our souls, which are convinced by something inwardly faulty and apparently fancy, or because of the strength in that view, which makes us convince ourselves [of its truth], and we will shortly express part of that view symbolically. (On Being and Obligation, Malik (ed.) 1998, 338)

How to read the last sentence of the above quote may be subject to scholarly debate. Particularly, Khayyam’s formulation may suggest that he is not fully satisfied with the Neoplatonic view he is going to present. Nonetheless, in his treatise “On the Knowledge of the Universal Principles of Existence” (Principles of Existence, Malik (ed.) 1998, 381–3), as well as some other works, Khayyam adopts the Neoplatonic scheme of emanation and offers an analysis of a number of traditional philosophical themes within this context. Particularly, he follows the theory of hierarchical intellects and souls associated with the celestial spheres, as interpreted in the Islamic philosophical “emanationist” tradition, to explain creation and celestial motions (ibid, 382).

2.3 Eschatology

Khayyam has been accused of believing in the transmigration of the soul and even corporeal resurrection in this world. This is partially due to some of the inauthentic quatrains attributed to him. Khayyam’s philosophical treatises indicate that he did believe in life after death, and in this regard his views were in line with traditional Islamic eschatological doctrine. Khayyam the poet, however, plays with the notion of life after death in a variety of ways. First, he casts doubt on the very existence of a life beyond our earthly existence; second, he says that based on our very experience in this world, all things seem to perish and not return. Some of his poems play with the idea of the transmigration of the soul (tanāsukh). This can be taken symbolically, rather than literally; in numerous poems he tells us that we turn to dust and it is from our dust that other living beings rise. Khayyam’s comments regarding the possibility of life after death may well have been an indirect criticism of the orthodox jurists who spoke of the intricacies of heaven and hell with certainty.[5]

Khayyam’s ideas about the human soul and its persistence are scarce and scattered in his philosophical writings. Toward the end of The Necessity of Contrariety (Nājī Iṣfahānī (ed.) 2000, 169–70), he explains the notion of persistence as existence through time, and rejects the view that the concept of existence itself implies duration (in time). It seems to follow that if an entity exists atemporally, its ontological status cannot be described as “persisting.” In his translation of Avicenna’s treatise, Khayyam is explicit that “when it [the rational soul] is separated from the matter, it becomes like the angels, in simplicity and apprehension of the intelligible [meanings], till immortal persistence inevitably accompanies it” (Lucid Discourse, Malik (ed.) 1998, 317). Describing the fate of the rational soul as “immortally persisting” suggests that for Khayyam, like Avicenna, the rational soul is an incorporeal entity with temporal existence.

2.4 Theodicy (The Problem of Evil)

The problem of theodicy, which Khayyam handles both philosophically and poetically, is one of the most prevalent themes in his quatrains, yet his approach differs in each medium. It is an irony that while in his philosophy Khayyam offers a rational explanation for the existence of evil, in his Rubā‘iyyāt he strongly criticizes the presence of evil and finds no justification for it fully satisfying. One may argue that such an inconsistency bears witness to the fact that the philosophical treatises and the Rubā‘iyyāt are not authored by the same person. While this remains a possibility, it is also reasonable that these seemingly contradictory works might belong to the same person. The discrepancy speaks to the human condition that despite our rationalization of the problem of evil, on a practical and emotional level, we remain fundamentally bewildered by the unnecessary presence of so much pain and suffering.

Qāḍī Abū Naṣr, a statesman and scholar from Shirāz, posed the following question to Khayyam:

It is therefore implied that the Necessary Existent is the cause of the occurrence of evil, contrariety and corruption in the world. This is not worthy of the Divine status. So how can we resolve this problem and the conflict, so evil will not be attributed to the Necessary Existent? (The Necessity of Contrariety, Malik (ed.), 1998, 362–3)

The first sentence of the above quote is in fact the conclusion of a short argument, described on the previous page. Here is a slightly revised formulation of that argument:

  1. Evil and contrary events occur in this world.
  2. The evil and contrary events that occur in this world are either necessary existents or contingent existents.
  3. They cannot be necessary existents (because, this implies that multiple things are necessary existents, but it has been demonstrated that there is one and only one Necessary Existent, which is absolutely simple and one in all respects).


  1. The evil and contrary events that occur in this world are contingent existents.


  1. The Necessary Existent is the ultimate cause of all contingent existents.


  1. The Necessary Existent is the ultimate cause of the occurrence of evil and contrary events.
  2. If A is the cause of B and B is the cause of C, then A is the cause of C (Khayyam has formulated this premise explicitly in his response to the question).


  1. The Necessary Existent is (not only the ultimate cause but) the cause of the occurrence of evil and contrary events.

In The Necessity of Contrariety, Khayyam offers an extended argument to exonerate God from being morally blameworthy for the creation of evil (the expression “morally blameworthy” is ours). Some have understood his response in terms of associating evil with non-existence or absence. Accordingly, God has created the essences of all contingent beings, which are good in and of themselves since any being, ontologically speaking, is better than non-being. Evil therefore represents an absence, a non-being for which God cannot be blamed (Nasr, The Poet Scientist Khayyam as Philosopher; Aminrazavi 2007, 172–5).[6]

A closer reading of the text, however, may suggest a different and novel solution. Evil is sometimes introduced as nonexistence (On Existence, Jamshīd Nijād Awwal (ed.) 2000, 118) and sometimes as following from nonexistence (ibid. and The Necessity of Contrariety, Nājī Iṣfahānī 2000, 168), which itself follows from the contrary relations that hold between contingent objects or events. Many instances of evil, according to Khayyam, do exist in reality. Khayyam’s main point is not that evil acts and events are absences or negative facts, as it were. Though he talks about nonexistence and associates evil with absence, the contribution of his argument is not to conceptualize all instances of evil in terms of nonexistence or merely mental existence. Rather, evil is characterized as the concomitant of the contrary relations that obtain between contingent existents, which themselves are essentially created by God. In this formulation, two notions call for clarification. First, the notion of “concomitant” (lawāzim) as a “necessary non-essential predicable”: this notion is well known in the Avicennan school and borrowed from the Aristotelian notion of per se accidents (kath’ hauto sembebêkôs). The second notion is the distinction between essential and accidental causation. This is also rooted in an Aristotelian theory of causation and Avicenna’s reconstruction of that. Evil, as the concomitant of the contrary relations that hold between contingent existents, is only accidentally created by God. Otherwise put, God essentially causes the (“quiddative,” this is our term) contingent beings and only accidentally causes contrary relations, and, as a result, the evil that follows from the co-existence of those essences. Furthermore, Khayyam claims, the problem in this case is whether God is the essential cause of the occurrence of evil. This can be interpreted as a value claim: causing something is not worthy of Divine status only if God essentially and intentionally causes it. (Khayyam immediately modifies this claim, explaining that the First, properly speaking, has no “intention” (qaṣd) but there is eternal guardianship (ʿināya).) Since God does not essentially and intentionally cause evil (in fact, the existence of some contrary relations is a necessary consequence of creating (quiddative) contingent existents), it follows that God accidentally causes evil and this is not morally problematic.

In the appendix to his response to the first question, Khayyam raises another objection: Given that evil is accidentally created by God and assuming that God is omniscient, “Why did God essentially create things, i.e. (quiddative) contingent existents, if He knew their existence would imply contrary relations, nonexistence, and eventually evil?” Khayyam’s response is based on three premises: (1) the existence of evil can be justified if the benefits following from essentially creating (quiddative) contingent beings massively outweigh the harms following from accidentally creating contrary relations (and eventually evil). Furthermore, (2) withholding an act whose benefits massively outweigh the harms following it, given an appropriate principle of proportionality, would imply massive evil. And (3), in fact the benefits following from essentially creating (quiddative) contingent beings massively outweigh the harms following from accidentally creating contrary relations (and eventually evil). These premises are intended to justify God’s essential creation of contingent beings despite His knowledge of the ensuing evil.

2.5 Determinism and Free Will

Both his Western and Eastern expositors consider Khayyam to be a predeterminist (jabrī). However, his views on the subject matter are far more complex. Some (Nasr, The Poet Scientist Khayyam as Philosopher; Aminrazavi 2007, 175) have interpreted “On Being and Obligation” as a treatise on the problem of determinism and free will. According to Aminrazavi (2007, 175), Khayyam uses the term taklīf (translated by Nasr (ibid) and Aminrazavi (ibid) as “necessity” as well) to denote “determinism.” There is a short paragraph in The Necessity of Contrariety that Nasr and Aminrazavi interpret as indicating that Khayyam is inclined to “predeterminism,” or “determinism” as they use the term, provided it is not taken to its extreme:

As to his question [i.e., Qāḍī Nasawī’s question] concerning which of the two groups [pre-determinists or free will theorists] are closer to truth, I say prima facie and at the first sight, perhaps the pre-determinists are closer to truth, provided they do not enter into their nonsensical and absurd [claims], for in this case they verily depart far from truth. (The Necessity of Contrariety, Nājī Iṣfahānī (ed.) 2000, 169)

Aminrazavi (2007, 177–80), then, identifies and explains three types of “determinism” in Khayyam’s view as follows:

  1. Universal-cosmic
  2. Socio-economic
  3. Ontological

In the universal and cosmic sense, our presence in this world and our entry and exit is predetermined, a condition that Khayyam bemoans throughout his Rubā‘iyyāt. The universal-cosmic determinism is the cause of our bewilderment and existential anxiety. Khayyam expresses this when he says:

With Earth’s first Clay They did the Last Man knead,
And there of the Last Harvest sow’d the Seed:
And the first Morning of Creation wrote
What the Last Dawn of Reckoning shall read.
    (Rubā‘iyyāt, FitzGerald 1859, 41)

The second sense of determinism is Socio-economic, which is rarely addressed by Muslim philosophers. Khayyam incidentally refers to this notion, for example, in:

God created the human species such that it is not possible for it to survive and reach perfection unless it is through reciprocity, assistance, and help. Until food, clothes, and a home that are the essentials of life are not prepared, the possibility of the attainment of perfection does not exist. (On Being and Obligation, Hashemipour (ed.) 2000, 143).

Finally there is “ontological determinism,” which relies on a Neoplatonic scheme of emanation which Khayyam considers to be “among the most significant and complex of all questions,” since “the order of the world is in accordance to how the wisdom of God decreed it” (On Being and Obligation, Hashemipour (ed.) 2000, 145). He continues, “obligation (taklīf) is a command issued from God Most High, so people may attain those perfections that lead them to happiness” (ibid, 143). This Greek concept of happiness, restated by Fārābī as “For every being is made to achieve the ultimate perfection it is susceptible of achieving according to its specific place in the order of being,” (al-Fārābī 1973, 224) implies that our ontological status or capacity is (at least to some extent) pre-determined.

Here, we have translated taklīf as “obligation” (not “necessity”) and jabr as “predeterminism” (not “determinism”). This may be justified as follows: “Determinism” as we use it today is considered to be compatible with free will (from the compatibilist point of view) but jabr, both in its historical context and in contemporary usage, is not considered to be compatible with free will. Furthermore, we are not sure how to interpret the short quote in response to the second question in The Necessity of Contrariety (Nājī Iṣfahānī (ed.) 2000, 169). It can be interpreted as a formulation of Khayyam’s dissatisfaction with both predeterminism and the free will view. This is because he says that predeterminism is closer to truth “prima facie and at the first sight” and then suggests that if the view is expanded, or fully applied, it can lead to nonsensical consequences. It is noteworthy that in the same passage he does not attempt to defend the free will view either. The original term for what has been translated as the “free will” view here, is qadariyya (Dānish nāmah-yi Khayyāmī, Malik (ed.) 1998, 344, note 2). The term is associated with different views and problems, one of which is whether humans are the creators (khāliq) of their sinful acts. The term “creator” is important in this context, particularly because it is not necessarily synonymous with “cause” and more importantly, because some, particularly in the early Islamic Kalām tradition, held the view that the only real creator is God. So, the context of this discussion is not just the metaphysics of causation, as we use the term. Finally, the above considerations make reconstructing Khayyam’s view on this matter and mapping it on the contemporary views on “determinism” more difficult than it might initially appear. Khayyam has the concept of “necessitation” (wujūb) and discusses that in his treatises on existence [references 5 and 6 above] at length. Thus, the three notions of “determinism” introduced by Aminrazavi may require further investigation.

2.6 Subjects, Predicates, and Attributes

In a complex discussion, Khayyam presents his views on the relationship between the subject, predicate, and attributes using a mixture of original insight and Aristotelian precedent. Dividing the attributes (al-awṣāf) into two categories, essential and accidental, he discusses both categories and their subdivisions, such as concomitant accidental attributes vs. detachable accidental attributes (and the latter, in turn, is divided into merely detachable in estimation vs. detachable in estimation and in existence) in details (On Existence, Jamshīd Nijād Awwal (ed.), 101–2).

Developing the same line of argument in The Necessity of Contrariety (Nājī Iṣfahānī (ed.) 2000, 164), Khayyam proposes the following characterization of an “essential attribute”:

[An attribute (waṣf)] is essential if [1] it is not possible to conceive the subject (al-mawṣūf) [of the attribution] except by conceiving that as having the attribute in the first place, and it is required for it [2] to belong to the subject [of the attribution] with no [extra] cause, like animality [as an essential attribute] of human, and [3 it is required for it] to be prior to the subject [of the attribution] essentially (bi al-āt), that is, it [i.e. the essential attribute] is the cause of the subject [of the attribution] and not its effect, like animal [as an essential attribute] of human and [also] rational [as an essential attribute of human] (The Necessity of Contrariety, Nājī Iṣfahānī 2000, 164; emphasis is ours).

(We have translated waṣf as attribute and mawṣūf as the subject of attribution.) Khayyam’s explication includes three conditions for an essential attribute (in relation to the subject of attribution): (1) conceptual priority, (2) no causal dependence (or posteriority), and (3) causal priority. First, conceptual priority indicates that Khayyam understands “essential attributes” not merely as metaphysically essential properties; they should satisfy some epistemological condition as well. Second, “no causal dependence” distinguishes essential attributes from all other attributes that do not follow from the essence of something (and thus their attribution to the subject requires a cause distinct from the subject). This is a strong, and well-known, metaphysical condition in the Islamic Aristotelian tradition. Nonetheless, “concomitants” may satisfy “no causal dependence” requirement as well, because their attribution to the subject does not require any extra cause. Third, causal priority is supposed to exclude concomitants. So, no concomitant, even though necessarily predicable of its subject, is an essential attribute in the sense under discussion.

According to Aminrazavi’s interpretation of the above quote, “essential attributes are those which are not possible to conceive of without the preconception of these a priori (badawī) attributes, such as ‘animality which is an essential attribute of man’” (Aminrazavi 2007, 183). The term badawī is not in the original Arabic text, in fact it can only be found in a Persian translation of The Necessity of Contrariety (Nājī Iṣfahānī 2000, 171). Moreover, badawī can be translated in many ways and “a priori” is not its most straightforward translation, if a proper translation in the first place. Finally, the above observations suggest that Khayyam’s notion of “essential attributes” only implies conceptual priority (not a prioricity) of the essential attribute(s) to its subject. Conceiving animal is prior to conceiving human; this does not imply that the attribute animal is a priori (in its Kantian sense). If one could find further pieces of evidence in Khayyam’s philosophy, with regard to a priori concepts or innate ideas, in its Cartesian sense, one might attempt to bolster Aminrazavi’s claim. At present, we are not aware of any such evidence or argument.

Khayyam also divides (essential and accidental) attributes into considerational (i‘tibārī) and existential (wujūdī) (i‘tibārī has also been translated in the literature of Islamic/Arabic philosophy as item of consideration, abstract, secondary, fictional, intentional, mental, and conceptual; see, for example, Online Dictionary of Arabic Philosophical Terms. In this context, these translations may have misleading connotations. Thus, we suggest considerational, and use it in contrast with existential). Khayyam attempts to provide different criteria for this distinction:

And the existential [attribute] is like the attribute black [attributed to a] material object (jism), when [in fact] it is black. Thus, being black is an existential attribute, that is, it is an additional meaning to the essence [to which] black [is attributed], as [it is] existing in re (mawjūdun fī al-a‘yān). Thus, if being black is an existential attribute (waṣf), then black is [called] an existential description (ṣifa). (On Existence, Jamshīd Nijād Awwal (ed.) 2000, 102)

Accordingly, an existential attribute is something that exists in re as an additional attribute of its subject. This point, i.e. being additional to the subject as it exists in re, is crucial to Khayyam’s formulation of existential attributes since considerational attributes are only additional to their subject in intellectu (or, more specifically, in the intellect or in the estimative faculty). Khayyam finds existential attributes easily understandable and then quickly moves to introduce considerational attributes:[7]

If the intellect intellects a meaning (ma‘nā) and details that intelligible [meaning] in an intelligible manner and considers its status/conditions (al-aḥwāl), if that meaning happens/occurs to some simple, not multiple, [meaning] like all existing accidents in re (fī al-a‘yān), and it [i.e., the simple meaning] happens to have some attributes, then [the intellect] knows that all those attributes belong to that [simple meaning] on the basis of consideration, not on the basis of the existence in re. (On Existence, Jamshīd Nijād Awwal (ed.) 2000, 103)

A considerational attribute is an intelligible meaning whose subject of attribution is another intelligible meaning that is simple, not multiple, in re and has multiple attributes. These attributes of the simple meaning are considerational attributes. This is because simple things, with no multiplicity in re, are not hylomorphically composite, that is, they are not composed of matter and form. So, their attributes are not grounded on real multiplicity or composition. And according to the Peripatetic philosophical school, accidents (in the sense of the nine Aristotelian categories) are simple in re, with no matter or form. If black is an accident (quality), being a color is a considerational attribute of that. Likewise, if two is an accident (quantity), being half of four is a considerational attribute of that as well. Let us explain these two examples in more detail.

Considerational attributes, as well as existential ones, come in two varieties: essential and accidental. Khayyam illustrates both cases. An example of an essential considerational attribute is being a color as an attribute of black. Conceiving being a color is conceptually prior to conceiving black and is the cause of black, that is, being a color is essentially prior to black (or white). Furthermore, an existential attribute of a subject is additional to its essence. But black itself is an accident and, here Khayyam seems to assume that, no accident can be the subject (in the metaphysical sense) of another accident. Finally, being a color and black cannot be accidents of the same subject because if this were the case, then black could come apart from being a color, at least in estimation, but this is impossible. So, being a color is an essential considerational attribute of black (On Existence, Jamshīd Nijād Awwal (ed.) 2000, 103–4). An example of an accidental considerational attribute is being half of four as an attribute of two. Conceiving being half of four is not conceptually prior to conceiving two, nor is being half of four the cause of two. So, being half of four is not an essential attribute of two. Hence, being half of four is an accidental attribute of two. Furthermore, an existential attribute of a subject is additional to its essence. If being half of four were something additional (za’id) to two (in re), then two would have infinite meanings added to its essence (in re). But this is impossible, according to Khayyam. Therefore, being half of four is not an accidental existential attribute of two. Therefore, being half of four is an accidental considerational attribute of two (On Existence, Jamshīd Nijād Awwal (ed.) 2000, 102–3). (This example suggests that two, as an accident, is a simple meaning, with no matter or form, even though it is true of two entities.)

By way of analogy, and in some respects, the problem of considerational vs. existential attributes, as Khayyam discusses, is like the problem of non-natural vs. natural properties in contemporary analytic philosophy. This semantic division plays a significant metaphysical role in Khayyam’s metaphysics, to which we shall turn next.

2.7 Existence (wujūd) and Essence (māhiyyah)

Khayyam offers a series of arguments for the thesis that “existence is a ‘considerational’ attribute” (On Existence, Jamshīd Nijād Awwal (ed.) 2000, 106; The Light of the Intellect, Nadvi (ed.) 1933 [2010, 347–9]). In section seventeen of On Existence, entitled “Existence is an added meaning (ma‘nā) to the intelligible essence,” he writes, “And it is as if [the soul/intellect] encounters existence in all things, by way of accidents, and there is no doubt that existence is a meaning added to the intelligible essence” (On Existence, Jamshīd Nijād Awwal (ed.) 2000, 111). By “by way of accidents” Khayyam should mean as a form of accident, and “accident” should be used here in the sense of predicable, not one of the nine Aristotelian categories of accidents. The “additionality” should also mean “being additional in intellectu,” not in re. By relying on reductio ad absurdum, he concludes that if existence were to be an existential attribute, it would have to exist prior to itself, which is impossible. Khayyam states “essence (ḏāt) was non-existent and then became existent.” He goes on to argue that “essence does not need existence [before coming to existence] or a relation to existence because the essence prior to existing was non-existing (ma‛dūm), thus how can something need something else prior to its existence?” (On Existence, Jamshīd Nijād Awwal (ed.) 2000, 110). Towards the end of this treatise he uses the Neoplatonic scheme of emanation to explain the origin of essences and states: “Therefore, it became clear that all essences (ḏawāt) and quiddities (māhiyyāt) emanate from the essence of the First Exalted Origin, in an orderly fashion, may glory be upon Him” (On Existence, Jamshīd Nijād Awwal (ed.) 2000, 118).

In Aminrazavi and Van Brummelen (2017) earlier edition of this entry, as well as in Nasr (The Poet Scientist Khayyam as Philosopher) and Aminrazavi 2007, 168–71), it is suggested that “Clearly Khayyam supports the principality of essence” (i.e., the second view) among the following three views:

  1. The existence of an existent is the same as its essence. This view is attributed to Abu’l-Ḥasan Ash‘arī, Abu’l-Ḥasan Baṣrī, and some of the other Ash‘arite theologians.
  2. Commonly known as the principality of essence (aṣālat al-māhiyyah), this view maintains that essence is primary and existence is added to it. Many philosophers such as Abū Hāshim Jubā’ī and later Suhrawardī and Mīr Dāmād came to advocate this view.
  3. Commonly known as the principality of existence (aṣālat al-wujūd), this view maintains that existence is primary and essence is then added (Aminrazavi 2007, 168).

Nasr (The Poet Scientist Khayyam as Philosopher) who prefers the same reading, that is “Khayyam asserts that for each existent, it is the quiddity that is principal while wujud is a conceptual (i‘tibari) quality,” immediately qualifies his view by adding that “the distinction between the principality of wujud (asalat al-wujud) and the principality of mahiyyah (asalat al-mahiyyah) goes back to the School of Isfahan and especially Mulla Sadra,” and Khayyam “does not use the term asalat al-mahiyyah as was done by Mullā Ṣadrā.” We find Nasr’s comment on the notion of “principality” important and take it to indicate that there may be room to argue that not only the term “principality of quiddity” but also the corresponding concept is absent from Khayyam’s philosophical treatises. What one finds in Khayyam’s work is a series of arguments for the thesis that existence is a considerational (or “secondary” as translated by Aminrazavi) attribute. If one further grants the conditional claim that if existence is a considerational attribute, then quiddity is principal (in the sense at stake in the debate over the principality of existence vs. the principality of quiddity in the post Isfahan school). Thus, one might derive the conclusion that Khayyam supports the principality of quiddity. The latter conditional presumption, however, is in need of a sound argument, and as far we can see, no such argument has yet been provided.

Aminrazavi and Van Brummelen (2017) then explain that “a more careful reading reveals an interesting twist: namely, that Khayyam’s understanding of how essences came to be casts doubt on his belief in the principality of essence” (Note: we have translated al-māhiyyah as “quiddity,” not “essence”). This comment may strengthen our hypothesis that Khayyam does not support the principality of quiddity in the first place, at least in the sense rejected by Mullā Ṣadrā and his followers. Perhaps Khayyam does not offer an argument against it either (if he does not work with the notion of principality in question). Aminrazavi and Van Brummelen (2017) then continue: “Towards the end of the Risālah fi’l-wujūd he uses the Neoplatonic scheme of emanation to explain the origin of essences [...] Khayyam replaces essence with existence here and the question is whether he equates them and thereby deviates from his teacher Ibn Sīnā. [...] It appears that Khayyam equates existence and essence as having emanated from God in an orderly fashion, but there is no explanation of how essence becomes primary and existence secondary. In fact, if existence did not exist how could essences come to be?” After discussing all these “problems,” they conclude: “Although the distinction between the principality of wujūd (aṣālat al-wujūd) and the principality of māhiyyah (aṣālat al-māhiyyah) can be found among early Muslim philosophers, the subject matter became particularly significant in later Islamic philosophy, especially through the School of Iṣfahān and the work of its most outstanding figure, Mullā Ṣadrā. This is important for our discussion since Umar Khayyam may simply have presented the arguments for and against the priority and posterity of essence and existence without attaching much significance to their philosophical consequences, as was the case in later Islamic philosophy” (Aminrazavi and Van Brummelen 2017).

The above concerns and the ensuing questions are based on the assumption that Khayyam supports the principality of quiddity, which in turn stems from casting a post Iṣfahān school conceptual framework on Khayyam’s philosophy. This latter interpretational strategy, however, requires proper doctrinal and textual justification. In the absence of such evidence, Khayyam’s view that existence is a considerational attribute does not seem to imply the principality of quiddity and hence may not be subject to the above criticisms.

In The Light of the Intellect, Khayyam offers three reasons why existence is not added to essence in re. A summary of his reasons goes as follows:

  1. Existence cannot be added to essence in re; otherwise an infinite regress will follow, which is untenable.
  2. Existence is not added to essence in re; otherwise essence should have existed prior to its existence, and this is absurd.
  3. With regard to the Necessary Existence, existence clearly is not added to essence in re, for dualism would follow.

Some have also read The Light of the Intellect as providing an argument for the principality of essence (or quiddity); we believe such readings face problems similar to the ones discussed above. This treatise reconfirms the view that Khayyam believes that existence, oneness, and many other key metaphysical and scientific attributes (e.g., color), are considerational, not existential, attributes.

Khayyam’s philosophical works are the least studied aspects of his thought, and were not even available in published form until a few years ago. They permit a fresh look at overall Khayyamian thought and prove indispensable to an understanding of his Rubā‘iyyāt. In his philosophical works, Khayyam writes as a Muslim philosopher and treats a variety of traditional philosophical problems in a careful manner; but in his Rubā‘iyyāt, our Muslim philosopher morphs into an agnostic Epicurean, or so it seems. A detailed study of Khayyam’s philosophical works reveals several explanations for this dichotomy, the most likely of which is the conflict between pure and practical reasoning. Whereas such questions as theodicy, the existence of God, soul and the possibility of life after death may be argued for philosophically, such arguments hardly seem relevant to the human condition, given our daily share of suffering.

It is in light of the distinction between “is” and “ought,” the “ideal” and the “actual,” that discrepancies between Khayyam’s Rubā‘iyyāt and his philosophical views should be understood. Khayyam’s Rubā‘iyyāt are the works of a sober philosopher and not those of a hedonistic poet. Whereas Khayyam the philosopher-mathematician justifies theism based on the existing order in the universe, Khayyam the poet, for whom suffering in the world remains insoluble, does not talk about theism, or any type of eschatological doctrine, as a solution to the problem of the meaning of human existence.

3. The Rubā‘iyyāt (Quatrains)

Here with a Loaf of Bread beneath the Bough,
A Flask of Wine, a Book of Verse—and Thou
Beside me singing in the Wilderness—
And Wilderness is Paradise enow.
    (Rubā‘iyyāt, FitzGerald 1859, 30; 2009, 21)

Although Umar Khayyam’s Rubā‘iyyāt have been admired in the Persian speaking world for many centuries, they have only been known in the West widely since the mid 19th century, when Edward FitzGerald rendered the Rubā‘iyyāt into English.

The word Ruba‘ī (plural: Rubā‘iyyāt), meaning “quatrain,” comes from the word al-Rābi‘, the number four in Arabic. It refers to a poetic form which consists of a four-lined stanza and two hemistiches for a total of four parts. Tarānah (snatch) and dobaītī (two-liner) are very similar to quatrains; they differ from each other in terms of rhyme scheme and themes or message. They all have a short and simple form that provides a type of “poetic punch line.”

The overwhelming majority of the literary works on the Rubā‘iyyāt have been devoted to the monumental task of determining the authentic Rubā‘iyyāt from the inauthentic ones. In our current discussion, we shall bypass that controversy and rely on the most authoritative Rubā‘iyyāt in order to provide a commentary on Khayyam’s critique of the fundamental tenets of organized religion(s). The salient features of his critique address the following:

  1. Impermanence and the quest for the meaning of life
  2. Theodicy
  3. The here and now
  4. Epistemology
  5. Eschatology
  6. Determinism and free will
  7. Philosophical wisdom

3.1 Impermanence and the quest for the meaning of life

The Rubā‘iyyāt’s overarching theme is the temporality of human existence and the suffering that one endures during a seemingly senseless existence. Clearly, such a view based on his observation of the world around him is in sharp contrast with the Islamic view presented in the Quran: “I (Allah) have not created the celestial bodies and the earth in vain” (Quran, 38:27). Umar Khayyam was caught between the rationalistic tradition of the Peripatetics deeply entrenched in the Islamic religious universe and his own failure to find any meaning or purpose in human existence on a more immediate and experiential level. Khayyam the poet criticizes the meaninglessness of life whereas Khayyam the philosopher remains loyal to the Islamic Peripatetic tradition which adheres to a theocentric world view.

Using the imagery of a kuzah (“jug”) and clay throughout the Rubā‘iyyāt, Khayyam alludes to the temporality of life and its senselessness:[8]

I saw the potter in the market yesterday
Pounding and pounding upon a piece of clay
“Behold,” said the clay to the potter
Treat me gently for once like you, now I am clay
    (translation by Aminrazavi)

The above verse, for example, may be read as suggesting that Khayyam does not see a profound meaning in human existence; his existential anxiety is compounded by the fact that we are subject to our daily share of suffering, a concept that runs contrary to that of the all merciful and compassionate God of Islam.

3.2 Theodicy and Justice

The problem of suffering has an ominous presence in the Rubā‘iyyāt, which contains both Epicurean and Stoic themes. On theodicy, Khayyam remarks:

In what life yields in this Two-door monastery
Your share in the pain of heart and death will tarry
The one who does not bear a child is happy
And he not born of a mother, merry
    (translation by Aminrazavi)

And also:

Life is dark and maze-like, it is
Suffering cast upon us and comfort in abyss
Praise the Lord for all the means of evil
Ask none other than He for malice
    (translation by Aminrazavi)

(It is an irony that while Khayyam complains about theodicy and human suffering throughout his Rubā‘iyyāt, in his philosophical works he offers a treatise almost entirely devoted to a philosophical justification of the problem of evil.) It might seem that theodicy as a theological and philosophical problem in Islam never received the attention it did in Western intellectual tradition; however, a series of problems associated with evil have been discussed under different names in this tradition. In the discussion of Tawḥīd, absolute oneness and unity of God in Islam, the problem of existence of evil, particularly the manner in which evil is created by God, is discussed (see section 2.4 above). In the debate over God’s attribute of justice, between the Asharites and the Muʿtazilites, some aspects of the problem of evil, e.g., whether our morally wrong actions are ultimately created by God or attributed to him, are carefully examined as well. Also, in the discussion of relative and negative (privative) attributes, the question of the nature of evil is raised again. Khayyam’s poem seems to acknowledge both the reality and malicious nature of evil and the ensuing suffering, on the one hand, and God’s role in allowing evil and his “answerability,” on the other hand. This makes questioning God on the existence of evil not illegitimate: “Ask none other than He for malice.”

3.3 Here and Now

For Khayyam the poet, “the tale of the seventy-two nations,” by which he refers to organized branches of Islam, and of religions in general, and traditional metaphysical beliefs (mainly Platonic and neo-Platonic), are merely flight of fancy, for the human condition, which he describes as a “sorrow laden nest,” at least in part contradicts many such beliefs. The art of living in the present, a theme dealt with in Sufi literature, is a type of wisdom that must be acquired, since living for the hereafter and heavenly rewards is conventional wisdom, and more suitable for the masses. On this point, Khayyam asserts:

Today is thine to spend, but not to-morrow,
Counting on morrow breedeth naught but sorrow;
Oh! Squander not this breath that heaven hath lent thee,
Nor make too sure another breath to borrow
    (Whinfield 2001, 30; modified by Aminrazavi)

And also:

What matters if I feast, or have to fast?
What if my days in joy or grief are cast?
Fill me with Thee, O Guide! I cannot ken
If breath I draw returns or fails at last.
    (Whinfield 2001, 144)

Khayyam’s emphasis on living in the present, or as Sufis say, “Sufi is the son of time,” along with his use of other Sufi metaphors such as wine, intoxication and love making, have been interpreted by some scholars as merely mystical allegories.[9] Although a mystical interpretation of the Rubā‘iyyāt has been advocated by some, it remains the view of a minority of scholars.

The complexity of the world according to Khayyam the mathematician-astronomer necessitates the existence of a creator and sustainer of the universe; and yet on a more immediate and existential level, he finds no reason or meaning for human existence. He seems to want to hold both the idea of “a necessary existence” and what necessarily follows from it (as a divine character is always present and sometimes critically addressed in his quatrains) and the immediate intuition of the presence of apparently unexplainable suffering, evil, and meaninglessness in this world. This leads to the theme of doubt and bewilderment. A practical response to this existential crisis opens room for a number of Epicurean and Stoic themes in Khayyam’s view, such as being “the son of time,” or the art of living in presence.

3.4 Doubt and Bewilderment

Humans, Khayyam tells us, are thrown into an existence they cannot make sense of:

The sphere upon which mortals come and go,
Has no end nor beginning that we know;
And none there is to tell us in plain truth:
Whence do we come and whither do we go.
    (Whinfield 2001, 132)

Again, the vivid and apparent inconsistency between a seemingly senseless existence and a complex and orderly world leads to existential and philosophical doubt and bewilderment. The tension between Khayyam’s philosophical writings in which he embraces the Islamic Peripatetic philosophical tradition and his Rubā‘iyyāt where he expresses his profound skepticism stems from this paradox. In his Rubā‘iyyāt Khayyam embraces, or comes very close to embracing, humanism and agnosticism, leaving the individual human being disoriented, anxious and bewildered; whereas in his philosophical writings he operates within a theistic world where the most fundamental questions, like the existence of God and explanation of evil, find (relatively) decisive solutions. Lack of certainty with regard to religious truth leaves the individual in an epistemologically suspended state where one has to live in the here and now, irrespective of the question of truth:

Since neither truth nor certitude is at hand
Do not waste your life in doubt for a fairyland
O let us not refuse the goblet of wine
For, sober or drunken, in ignorance we stand
    (translation by Aminrazavi)

This skepticism towards organized religions runs deep in Khayyam’s quatrains; he explicitly questions the orthodoxy and how the final disclosure of ultimate truth might be surprising to all “believers,” and perhaps “nonbelievers” (note: your reward is neither here nor there):

Alike for those who for To-day prepare,
And those that after a To-morrow stare,
A Muezzín from the Tower of Darkness cries
“Fools! your Reward is neither Here nor There!”
    (Rubā‘iyyāt, FitzGerald 2009, 28)

3.5 Eschatology

The Rubā‘iyyāt casts doubt on Islamic eschatological and soteriological views. Once again the tension between Khayyam’s poetic and philosophical modes of thought surfaces; experientially there is evidence to conclude that death is the end:

Behind the curtain none has found his way
None came to know the secret as we could say
And each repeats the dirge his fancy taught
Which has no sense-but never ends the lay
    (Whinfield 2001, 229)

In the Rubā‘iyyāt, Khayyam portrays the universe as a beautiful ode which reads “from dust we come and to dust we return,” and “every brick is made from the skull of a man.” While Khayyam does not explicitly deny the existence of life after death, perhaps for political reasons and fear of being labeled a heretic, there are subtle references throughout his Rubā‘iyyāt that the hereafter should be taken with a grain of salt. In contrast, in his philosophical writings we see him argue for the incorporeality of the soul, which paves the path for the existence of life after death. The irreconcilable conflict between Khayyam’s observation that death is the inevitable end for all beings, and his philosophical reflections in favor of the possibility of the existence of life after death, remains an insoluble riddle.[10]

3.6 Free Will, Determinism and Predestination

Khayyam is known as a determinist in both the East and the West, and deterministic themes can be seen in much of the Rubā‘iyyāt. But if we read his Rubā‘iyyāt together with his philosophical writings, the picture that emerges may be more rightly called “soft determinism.” One of Khayyam’s best known quatrains in which determinism is clearly conveyed asserts:

The Moving Finger writes; and, having writ,
Moves on: nor all your Piety nor Wit
Shall lure it back to cancel half a Line,
Nor all your Tears wash out a Word of it
    (Rubā‘iyyāt, FitzGerald 1859, 20)

Again, in his philosophical treatise The Necessity of Contrariety, Khayyam adheres to three types of determinism. On a universal or cosmic level, our birth is determined in the sense that we had no choice in this matter. Ontologically speaking, our essence and our place on the overall hierarchy of beings appears also to be predetermined. However, the third category of determinism, socio-economic determinism, is man-made and thus changeable. Our attempt to face this determined end of our life, however, will again lead us to nowhere but bewilderment:

At first they brought me perplexed in this way
Amazement still enhances day by day
We all alike are tasked to go but Oh!
Why are we brought and sent? This none can say
    (Rubā‘iyyāt, Tirtha 1941, 18)

Thus a reading of the Rubā‘iyyāt in conjunction with Khayyam’s philosophical reflections bring forward a more sophisticated view of free will and determinism, indicating that Khayyam believed in free will within a form of cosmic determinism and did not support a full-blown predeterminism.

3.7 Philosophical Wisdom

Khayyam uses the concept of “wine and intoxication” throughout his Rubā‘iyyāt in three distinct ways:

  1. The intoxicant wine
  2. The mystical wine
  3. The wine of wisdom

The pedestrian use of wine in the Rubā‘iyyāt, devoid of any intellectual significance, emphasizes the need to forget our daily suffering. The mystical allusions to wine pertain to a type of intoxication which stands opposed to discursive thought. The esoteric use of wine and drinking, which has a long history in Persian Sufi literature, refers to the state of ecstasy in which one is intoxicated with Divine love. Those supporting the Sufi interpretation of Rubā‘iyyāt rely on this literary genre. While Khayyam was not a Sufi in the traditional sense of the word, he includes the mystical use of wine among his allusions.

Khayyam’s use of wine in the profound sense in his Rubā‘iyyāt is a type of Sophia that provides a sage with philosophical wisdom, allowing one to come to terms with the temporality of life and to live in the here and now:

Those imprisoned by the intellect’s need to decipher
Humbled; knowing being from non-being, they proffer
Seek ignorance and drink the juice of the grape
Those fools acting as wise, scoffer.
    (translation by Aminrazavi)

Khirad is the type of wisdom that brings about a rapprochement between the poetic and discursive modes of thought, one that sees the fundamental irony in what appears to be a senseless human existence within an orderly and complex physical universe. For Khayyam the mathematician-astronomer, the universe cannot be the result of a random chance; on the other hand, Khayyam the poet fails to find any purpose for an individual human existence in this orderly universe.

As Spring and Fall make their appointed turn,
The leaves of life one aft another turn;
Drink wine and brood not—as the Sage has said:
“Life’s cares are poison, wine the cure in turn.”
    (Rubā‘iyyāt, Sa‘idī 1994, 58)

4. Khayyam the Mathematician and Scientist

And the part of philosophy known as mathematics is the easiest of its parts to grasp both as to conception and as to assent. As to the numerical part of it, it is a very evident matter. And as to the geometrical, likewise hardly anything of it will be unknown to someone who has an unimpaired constitution, a sharp view, an excellent intuition. (Commentary on the Difficulties of Certain Postulates of Euclid’s Work, Rashed and Vahabzadeh, 2000, 217–218).

In several respects Khayyam’s mathematical writings are similar to his texts in other genres: they are relatively few in number, but deal with well-chosen topics and carry deep implications. Some of his mathematics relate in passing to philosophical matters (in particular, reasoning from postulates and definitions), but his most significant work deals with issues internal to mathematics and in particular the intersection between geometry and algebra.

Khayyam’s mathematical works with recent editions and publications are:

  1. “Treatise on the division of a quadrant of a circle” (Risāla fī taqsīm rub‘ al-dā‘ira) in Hakim Omare Khayyam as an Algebraist, Arabic text and Persian translation in Mossaheb, 1960, 59–74, 251–291; English translation and critical edition in Rashed and Vahabzadeh, 2000, 165–180.
  2. “Treatise on Algebra” (Risāla fi’l-barāhīn ‘alā masāil al-jabr wal-muqābala) in Hakim Omare Khayyam as an Algebraist, Persian translation in Mossaheb, 1960, 159–250; English translation and critical edition in Rashed and Vahabzadeh, 2000, 111–164.
  3. “Commentary on the Difficulties of Certain Postulates of Euclid’s Work” (Sharḥ mā ashkal min muṣādirāt al-uqlidis) in Dānish nāmah-yi Khayyāmī, Malik (ed.) 1377 (A.H.s.), 71–112; English translation and critical edition in Rashed and Vahabzadeh, 2000, 217–255.
  4. “Problems of Arithmetic” (Mushkilāt al-ḥisāb), (only the title page is extant at the University of Leiden library collection Cod. or. 199, but Khayyam references the work in his Algebra).

4.1 Solutions of Cubic Equations

Khayyam seems to have been attracted to cubic equations originally through his consideration of the following geometric problem: in a quadrant of a circle, drop a perpendicular from some point on the circumference to one of the radii so that the ratio of the perpendicular to the radius is equal to the ratio of the two parts of the radius on which the perpendicular falls. In the short “Treatise on the division of a quadrant of a circle,” Khayyam leads us from one case of this problem to the equation \(x^3 + 200x = 20x^2 + 2000\).[11] Khayyam states that an exact solution is not possible and provides an approximation. Khayyam also generates a direct geometric solution: he uses the numbers in the equation to determine intersecting curves of two conic sections (a circle and a hyperbola) and demonstrates that the solution \(x\) is equal to the length of a particular line segment in the diagram.

Solving algebraic problems using geometric tools was not new; in the case of quadratic equations these geometric methods date back as far as the Greeks and even to the Babylonians. Khayyam’s predecessors such as al-Khwārizmī (early 9th century) and Thābit ibn Qurra (late 9th century) already had solved quadratic equations using the straightedge and compass geometry of Euclid’s Elements. Since negative numbers were avoided in Arabic mathematics, Muslim mathematicians needed to solve several different types of quadratic equations with positive coefficients: for instance, \(x^2 = mx + n\) was fundamentally different from \(x^2 + mx = n\). For cubic equations, fourteen distinct types of equations cannot be reduced to a linear or quadratic form after dividing by \(x\) or \(x^2\). In his “Treatise on Algebra”[12] Khayyam notes that four of these fourteen types had been solved and says that al-Khāzin (ca. 900–971) had solved a problem from Archimedes’ treatise On the Sphere and Cylinder that al-Māhānī (fl. ca. 860) had previously converted into a cubic equation and solved using conic sections. Khayyam also states that al-Layth (fl. 10th century) had not treated these cubic forms exhaustively.

In the Algebra, Khayyam claims to be the first to deal systematically with all fourteen types of cubic equations. He solves each one in turn, again through the use of intersecting conic sections. Khayyam also considers circumstances when certain cubic equations have multiple solutions. Although he does not handle this topic perfectly, his effort nonetheless exceeds previous efforts. In an algebra where powers of \(x\) corresponded to geometrical dimensions, the solution of cubic equations was the apex of the discipline. Nevertheless, even here Khayyam advanced algebra by considering its unknowns as dimension-free abstractions of continuous quantities.[13]

A geometric solution to a polynomial equation may seem peculiar to modern eyes, but the study of cubic equations (and indeed much of medieval algebra) was motivated by geometric problems. Khayyam was explicitly aware that the algebraic solution of the cubic equation remained to be solved. He never produced such a solution, nor did anyone else until Scipione del Ferro, Niccolò Fontana Tartaglia, and Gerolamo Cardano in the mid-16th century.

Khayyam’s work intersecting algebra and geometry is a precursor to the analytic geometry popularized in Descartes’ La Géométrie published in 1637. Descartes’ La Géométrie refines and generalizes Khayyam’s methods and forms a bridge from the medieval mathematics of Khayyam to the modern mathematics of Newton and Leibniz (Rashed and Vahabzadeh, 2000, 20–29).

4.2 The Parallel Postulate and the Theory of Ratios

The process of reasoning from postulates and definitions has been basic to mathematics at least since the time of Euclid. Islamic geometers were well versed in this art, but also spent some effort examining the logical foundations of the method. They were unafraid to revise and improve upon Euclid’s starting points, and they rebuilt Euclid’s Elements from the foundation in several ways. Khayyam’s “Commentary on the Difficulties of Certain Postulates of Euclid’s Work​​​​”​[14] deals with the two most important issues in this context, the parallel postulate and the definition of equality of ratios.

Euclid’s fifth “parallel” postulate states that if a line falls on two given lines such that the two interior angles add up to less than two right angles, then the given lines must meet on that side. This statement is logically equivalent to several more easily understood assertions, such as: there is exactly one parallel to a given line that passes through a given point not on the given line; or, the angles of a triangle sum to two right angles. It has been known since the early 19th century that non-Euclidean geometries violate these properties; indeed, it is not yet known whether the space in which we live satisfies them.

The parallel postulate, however, was not subject to doubt at Khayyam’s time, so it is more appropriate to think of Islamic efforts in this area as part of the tradition of improving upon Euclid rather than as the origin of non-Euclidean geometry. Khayyam’s reconstruction of Euclid is one of the better ones: he does not try to prove the parallel postulate. Rather, he replaces it with two statements, which he attributes to Aristotle,[15] that are both simpler and more self-evident: two lines that converge must intersect, and two lines that converge can never diverge in the direction of convergence. Khayyam then replaces Euclid’s 29th proposition, the first in which the parallel postulate is used, with a new sequence of eight propositions. Khayyam’s insertion amounts to determining that the so-called Saccheri quadrilateral (one with two equal sides perpendicular to the base) is in fact a rectangle. As Giovanni Girolamo Saccheri published this quadrilateral in his book Euclides ab omni naevo vindicatus in 1733, it is also known as the Khayyam-Saccheri quadrilateral. Khayyam believed his approach was an improvement on that of his predecessor Ibn al-Haytham (ca. 965–1040) because his method does not rely on the concept of motion, which Khayyam said should be excluded from geometry. Apparently Naṣīr al-Dīn al-Ṭūsī agreed, since he followed Khayyam’s path in the next century (Rashed and Vahabzadeh, 2000, 186).

Book II of “Commentary on the Difficulties of Certain Postulates of Euclid’s Work” takes up the question of the proper definition of ratio. This topic is obscure to the modern reader, but it was fundamental to Greek and medieval mathematics. If the quantities joined in a ratio are whole numbers, then the definition of their ratio poses no difficulty. If the quantities are geometric magnitudes, the situation is more complicated because the two line segments might be incommensurable (in modern terms, their ratio corresponds to an irrational number). Euclid, following Eudoxus, asserts that \(A/B = C/D\) when, for any magnitudes \(x\) and \(y\), the magnitudes \(xA\) and \(xC\) are both (i) greater than, (ii) equal to, or (iii) less than the magnitudes \(yB\) and \(yD\) respectively. There is little wonder that Khayyam and others were unhappy with this definition, for while it is clearly true, it does not get at the heart of what it means for ratios to be equal.

An alternate approach, which may have existed in ancient Greece but certainly existed in the 9th century, is the “anthyphairetic” definition (Hogendijk 2002). The Euclidean algorithm is an iterative process that is used to find the greatest common divisor of a pair of numbers. The algorithm may be applied equally well to find the greatest common measure of two geometric magnitudes, but the algorithm will never terminate if the ratio between the two magnitudes is irrational. A sequence of divisions within the algorithm results in a “continued fraction” that corresponds to the ratio between the original two quantities. Khayyam, following several earlier Islamic mathematicians, defines the equality of \(A/B\) and \(C/D\) according to whether their continued fractions are equal.

One may wonder why the proponents of the anthyphairetic definition felt that it was more natural than Euclid’s approach. There is no doubt, however, that it was preferred; Khayyam even refers to the anthyphairetic definition as the “true” nature of proportionality. Part of the explanation might be simply that the Euclidean algorithm applied to geometric quantities was much more familiar to medieval mathematicians than to us. Khayyam’s preference is due to the fact that the anthyphairetic definition allows a ratio to be considered on its own, rather than always in equality to some other ratio. Khayyam’s achievement in this topic was not to invent a new definition, but rather to demonstrate that each of the existing definitions logically implies the other. Thus Islamic mathematicians could continue to use ratio theorems from the Elements without having to prove them again according to the anthyphairetic definition.

Book III continues the discussion of ratios; Khayyam sets himself the task of demonstrating the seemingly innocuous proposition \(A/C = (A/B) (B/C)\), a fact which is used in the Elements but never proved. During this process Khayyam sets an arbitrary fixed magnitude to serve as a unit, to which he relates all other magnitudes of the same kind. This arrangement allows Khayyam to incorporate both numbers and geometric magnitudes within the same system. Thus Khayyam thinks of irrational magnitudes as numbers themselves, which effectively defines the set of “real numbers” that we take for granted today which is composed of rational numbers together with irrational numbers. This revolutionary step to consider irrational numbers as mathematical entities in their own right was one of the most significant advances of conception to occur between ancient Greek and modern mathematics (Youschkevitch and Rosenfeld 1973, 327).

4.3 Root Calculations and the Binomial Theorem

We know that Khayyam wrote a treatise, now lost, titled “Problems of Arithmetic,” involving the determination of \(n\)-th roots (Youschkevitch and Rosenfeld 1973, 325–326). In his Algebra Khayyam writes that methods for calculating square and cube roots come from India, and that he is the first to extend these methods to the determination of roots of any order (Rashed and Vahabzadeh 2000, 6). Even more interestingly, Khayyam states that he has demonstrated the validity of his methods using proofs that “are only numerical demonstrations based on the arithmetical Books of the Elements” (Rashed and Vahabzadeh 2000, 116–117). If both of these statements are true, then it is hard to avoid the conclusion that Khayyam had used the binomial theorem

\[(a + b)^n = a^n + na^{n-1}b + \cdots + nab^{n-1}+ b^n\]

in his method, improving on and extending Abū Bakr al-Karajī’s (ca. 953–1029) work on binomial expansions. “Pascal’s” celebrated arithmetic triangle is a triangular arrangement of the binomial expansion terms’ coefficients. Scholars such as Chāvoshī advocate renaming Pascal’s triangle as “al-Kharajī-Khayyam’s” triangle, given how European mathematicians adopted the same method of extracting roots as Khayyam’s (Chāvoshī 1380 A.H.s., 262–273).

The history of Pascal’s triangle appears to originate in India with Acharya Pingala’s (ca. 200 BCE) study of meter and sound combinations in Sanskrit poetry. The Indian commentator Halayudha wrote a commentary on Pingala’s Chandahsutra at the end of the 10th century CE giving the first appearance of a triangular arrangement of the binomial coefficients, solely as a means of finding the number of combinations of short and long syllable patterns. Meanwhile in China, Jia Xian (ca. 1050) had also discovered the method of finding \(n\)-th roots with Pascal’s triangle, as relayed by the 13th century mathematician Yang Hui. However, Jia Xian’s work is not extant. Thus, we rely on two lost manuscripts, over approximately the same time period, to determine the Islamic and Chinese origins of Pascal’s triangle as a means for finding \(n\)-th roots (Joseph 2011, 247, 270–281, 354–355).

4.4 Astronomy and Other Works

Khayyam moved to Iṣfahān in 1074 to help establish a new observatory under the patronage of Jalāl al-Din Malik-shāh, the Seljuk sultan, and his vizier, Niẓām al-Mulk. Undoubtedly, Khayyam played a major role in the creation of the Malikī or Jalali calendar, the observatory’s most significant project. Khayyam succeeded in devising a calendar more accurate than the current Western Gregorian calendar, needing correction of one day every 5,000 years compared to every 3,333 years respectively. In addition to the calendar, the Iṣfahān observatory produced the Zīj Malik-shāhī (of which only a fragment of its star catalogue survives), apparently one of the more important astronomical handbooks (Youschkevitch and Rosenfeld 1973, 324).

Remaining works attributed to Khayyam in other fields are:

  1. “Treatise on the Difficulties of the ‘Book of Music’ (by Euclid)” (Sharḥ al-mushkil min kitāb al-musiqī). Only one chapter titled “Discussion on Genera Contained in a Fourth” (Al-Qawl ‘alā ajnās allatī bi’l-arba‘a) is extant. For a critical edition see Chāvoshī, “Omar al-Khayyam wa’l-musiqī al-naḍariyyah,” translated into English by M.M. ‘Abd al-Jalil, Farhang, vol. 1, 14 (1378 A.H.s.): 29–32 and 203–214.
  2. “The Balance of Wisdoms” (Mizān al-ḥikmah), “Two Treatises on the Level Balance” (Fil-qusṭas al-mustaqīm), and “On the Art of Determination of Gold and Silver in a Body Consisting of Them” (Risālah fi’l- iḥtiyāj lima​‘rifat miqdāṛī al-dhahab wa’l-fiḍah fī jism murakkab minhā) in Dānish nāmah-yi Khayyāmī, Malik (ed.) 1377 A.H.s., 293–300, and Persian trans., 301–304.
  3. “On discovering the truth of Norūz” (Risālah dar kashf ḥaqiqat Norūz) in Dānish nāmah-yi Khayyāmī, Malik (ed.) 1377 A.H.s., 424–438.

Book III of “Commentary on the Difficulties of Certain Postulates of Euclid’s Work” shows Khayyam discussing how compounding ratios in music composition are numerical. In this discussion, Khayyam refers to his earlier commentary of Euclid’s “Book of Music” (Rashed and Vahabzadeh, 2000, 251–252). However, only one chapter “Discussion on Genera Contained in a Fourth” of Khayyam’s commentary discussing tetrachords (a series of four notes separated by three intervals) survives (Aminrazavi 2007, 198–199).

Khayyam’s treatise “On the Art of Determination of Gold and Silver in a Body Consisting of Them” appears in the book Mizān al-ḥikmah written by his student Abd’l-Raḥmān Khāzeni (fl. 1115–1130). Khāzeni attributes this article, as well as the “Two Treatises on the Level Balance,” to Khayyam. Techniques for determining the proportions of gold and silver in a compound date back to Archimedes, and Khayyam’s contribution appears to be the precision of his method along with the intricate designs of his level balance (Hall 1981, 341–343).

Another treatise titled “On discovering the truth of Norūz” is apocryphal, where only one of its three parts is believed to have been written by Khayyam. Khayyam allegedly writes of the history and mythology of the Persian new year at the beginning of the spring equinox, although the style and errors of the text lend doubt to Khayyam’s authorship (Aminrazavi 2007, 38).

As with his philosophical and mathematical writings, Khayyam’s texts in other disciplines appear to have been taken seriously by his contemporaries and later scholars.

5. Khayyam in the West

5.1 Orientalism and the European Khayyam

The earliest extant translation of the Rubā‘iyyāt was produced by Thomas Hyde in the 1760s when his translation of a single quatrain appeared in the Veterum Persarum et Parthorum et Medorum Religionis. It was not until the 19th century, however, that the Western world and literary circles discovered Umar Khayyam in all his richness.

The voyage of the Rubā‘iyyāt to the West began when Sir Gore Ouseley, the British ambassador to Iran, presented his collection to the Bodleian Library at Oxford University upon his return to England. In the 1840s Professor Edward Byles Cowell of Oxford University discovered a copy of the Ruba‘iyyat of Khayyam and translated several of the Rubā‘iyyāt. Amazed by their profundity, he shared them with Edward FitzGerald, who took an immediate interest and published the first edition of his own translation in 1859. Four versions of FitzGerald’s Rubā‘iyyāt were published over his lifetime as new quatrains were discovered. Realizing the free nature of his work in his first translation, FitzGerald chose the word rendered to appear on the title page in later editions instead of “translation” (Lange 1968).

5.2 The Impact of Khayyam on Western Literary and Philosophical Circles

While the connection between the Pre-Raphaelites and Umar Khayyam should not be exaggerated, the relationship that Algernon Charles Swinburne, George Meredith, and Dante G. Rossetti shared with Edward FitzGerald and their mutual admiration of Khayyam cannot be ignored. The salient themes of the Rubā‘iyyāt became popular among the Pre-Raphaelites and their circle (Lange 1968). Khayyam’s popularity led to the formation of the “Omar Khayyām Club of London” (Conway 1893, 305) in 1892, which attracted a number of literary figures and intellectuals. The success of the Club soon led to the simultaneous formation of the Omar Khayyām Clubs of Germany and America.

In America, Umar Khayyam was well received in the New England area where his poetry was propagated by the official members of the Omar Khayyām Club of America. The academic community discovered Khayyam’s mathematical writings and poetry in the 1880s, when his scholarly articles and translations of his works were published. Some, such as William Edward Story, praised Umar as a mathematician and compared his views with those of Johannes Kepler, Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz, and Isaac Newton, while others drew their inspiration from his literary tradition and called themselves “Umarians.” This new literary movement soon attracted such figures as Mark Twain, who composed forty-five burlesque versions of FitzGerald’s quatrains and integrated them with two of FitzGerald’s stanzas entitled AGE-A Ruba‘iyat (Twain, 1983, 14). The movement also drew the attention of T.S. Eliot’s grandfather William Greenleaf Eliot (1811–1887), two of T.S. Eliot’s cousins, and T.S. Eliot himself. Umar Khayyam’s Rubā‘iyyāt seems to have elicited two distinct responses among many of his followers in general and the Eliot family in particular: admiration for a rational theology on the one hand, and concern with the rise of skepticism and moral decay in America on the other.

Among other figures influenced by the Rubā‘iyyāt of Umar Khayyam were certain members of the New England School of Transcendentalism, including Henry Wadsworth Longfellow, Ralph Waldo Emerson, and Henry David Thoreau (Aminrazavi 2013; for a complete discussion on Umar Khayyam in the West see Aminrazavi 2007, 204–278).

6. Conclusion

In the foregoing discussion, we have seen that Umar Khayyam was a philosopher-sage (ḥakīm) and a spiritual-pragmatist whose Rubā‘iyyāt should be seen as a philosophical commentary on the human condition. The salient features of Umar Khayyam’s pioneering work in various branches of mathematics were also discussed. Khayyam’s mathematical genius not only produced the most accurate calendar to date, but the issues he treated remained pertinent up until the modern period.

For Khayyam, there are two discourses, each of which pertains to one dimension of human existence: philosophical and poetic. Philosophically, Khayyam defended rationalism against the rise of orthodoxy and made an attempt to revive the spirit of rationalism which was so prevalent in the first four centuries in Islam. Poetically, Khayyam represents a voice of protest against what he regards to be a fundamentally unjust world. Many people found in him a voice they needed to hear, and centuries after he had died, his works became a venue for those who were experiencing the same trials and tribulations as Khayyam had.


Primary Works

Khayyam’s works:

  • [The Necessity of Contrariety] Al-jawāb ‘an thalāth masā’il: Ḍarūrat al-taḍād fi’l-‘ālam wa’l-jabr wa’l-baqā’ (The Response to Three Problems: The Necessity of Contrariety in the World, Predeterminism and Persistence), Hāmid Nājī Iṣfahānī (ed. and trans.), Farhang 29–32, (2000/1378 A.H.s.): 157–180 (pp. 157–63 include the editor’s introduction and 171–80 a Persian translation of the treatise). A Persian translation by Shajare, in Dānish nāmah-yi Khayyāmī, Malik (ed.) 1998, 353–60; a Persian translation by Durri, in Dānish nāmah-yi Khayyāmī, Malik (ed.) 1998, 362–68; English translation, in Aminrazavi 2007, 292–299.
  • [Lucid Discourse] Khutbah al-gharrā’ (A Translation of Ibn Sīna’s (Avicenna’s) Lucid Discourse), R.R.Z. Malik (ed.), Dānish nāmah-yi Khayyāmī, Tehran, 1998, 1377 A.H.s., 305–19.
  • Mizān al-ḥikmah (The Balance of Wisdoms), R.R.Z. Malik (ed.), Dānish nāmah-yi Khayyāmī, Tehran, 1998, 1377 A.H.s., 293–300, and Persian trans., 301–304.
  • The Nectar of Grace: Omar Khayyām’s Life and Works, S. G. Tirtha (ed.), Allahabad: Government Central Press, 1941.
  • The Quatrains of Omar Khayyām, E. H. Whinfield (ed. and trans.), 1882; republished. London: Routledge, 2001.
  • Risāla fī taqsīm rub‘ al-dā‘ira (Treatise on the division of a quadrant of a circle), R. Rashed and B. Vahabzadeh (ed. and trans.), Omar Khayyām, the Mathematician, New York: Bibliotheca Persica Press, 2000: 165–180.
  • Risāla fi’l-barāhīn ‘alā masāil al-jabr wal-muqābala (Treatise on Algebra), R. Rashed and B. Vahabzadeh (ed. and trans.), Omar Khayyām, the Mathematician, 2000: 111–164, New York: Bibliotheca Persica Press.
  • [The Light of the Intellect] Risālah al-ḍiyā’ al-‘aqlī fī mawḍū‘ al-‘ilm al-kullī (The Light of the Intellect on the Subject of Universal Knowledge), R.R.Z. Malik (ed.), Dānish nāmah-yi Khayyāmī, Tehran, 1998, 1377 A.H.s., 371–5. English translation, in Aminrazavi 2007, 299–303. This treatise is also called “The First Treatise on Existence” (Al-Risālah al-ūlā fi’l-wujūd), see Sayyid Sulaiman Nadvi (1933/2010, 336).
  • [Principles of Existence] Risālah dar ‘ilm kulliyāt-i wujūd (On the Knowledge of the Universal Principles of Existence), R.R.Z. Malik (ed.), Dānish nāmah-yi Khayyāmī, Tehran, 1998, 1377 A.H.s., 381–390. English translation, in Aminrazavi 2007, 303–10.
  • Risālah dar kashf ḥaqiqat Norūz (On discovering the truth of Norūz), R.R.Z. Malik (ed.), Dānish nāmah-yi Khayyāmī, Tehran, 1998, 1377 A.H.s., 424–438.
  • [On Being and Obligation] Risālah fi’l-kawn wa’l-taklīf (On Being and Obligation), Behnaz Hashemipour (ed.), Farhang 29–32, (2000/1378 A.H.s.): 131–56 (pp. 131–7 include the editor’s introduction). An earlier edition based on Sayyid Sulaiman Nadvi (1933/2010), in Dānish nāmah-yi Khayyāmī, Malik (ed.) 1998, 322–33; a different Persian translation, in Dānish nāmah-yi Khayyāmī, Malik (ed.) 1998, 334–42; English translation, in Aminrazavi 2007, 284–92.
  • [On Existence] Risālah fi’l-wujūd (On Existence), Gholāmrezā Jamshīd Nijād Awwal (ed. and trans.), Farhang 29–32, (2000/1378 A.H.s.): 85–130 (pp. 85–100 include the editor’s introduction and 119–30 a Persian translation of the treatise); Sadegh Nokohan Ahvazi and Babak Alikhani (eds.), (2021/1400 A.H.s.): Sophia Perennis: The Semiannual Journal of Sapiential Wisdom and Philosophy, 18(2): 203–228. English translation, in Aminrazavi 2007, 310–21. This treatise is also called “The second Treatise on Existence”; see Sayyid Sulaiman Nadvi (1933/2010, 352).
  • [A Response] Risālah jawāban lī thalāth masā’il (A Response to Three Problems), R.R.Z. Malik (ed.), Dānish nāmah-yi Khayyāmī, Tehran, 1998, 1377 A.H.s., 412–422. English translation, in Aminrazavi 2007, 321–7. (Note: this work is different from The Response to Three Problems: The Necessity of Contrariety in the World, Predeterminism and Persistence, though the first parts of their names sound similar: “response to three problems”).
  • The Rubaiyat of Omar Khayyam, ed. and trans. Edward FitzGerald, London: Quaritch, 1859 (1st edition); 1868 (2nd), 1872 (3rd), 1879 (4th), 1889 (5th, posthumous).
  • Rubai‘yyat of Omar Khayyām, Ahmad Sa‘idī (trans.), Berkeley: Asian Humanities Press, 1991.
  • Sharḥ al-mushkil min kitāb al-musiqī (Treatise on the Difficulties of the “Book of Music” (by Euclid)), J.A. Chāvoshī (ed.), M.M. ‘Abd al-Jalil (trans.), Farhang 1(14) (1378 A.H.s.): 29–32 and 203–214.
  • Sharḥ mā ashkal min muṣādirāt al-uqlidis (Commentary on the Difficulties of Certain Postulates of Euclid’s Work), R. Rashed and B. Vahabzadeh (ed. and trans.), Omar Khayyām, the Mathematician, New York: Bibliotheca Persica Press, 2000: 217–255.
  • Umar-e-Khayyam, Sayyid Sulaiman Nadvi (ed. and trans.), Uttar Pradesh: Darul Musannefin Shibli Academy, 1933 [2010].

Other Primary Sources:

  • Bayhaqī, Abu’l Ḥasan, Tatimah ṣiwān al-ḥikmah, Mohammed Shafiʿ (ed.), Lahore, Pakistan, 1932/1351 A.H.
  • al-Fārābī, Philosophy of Plato and Aristotle, Philosophy in the Middle Ages, A. Hyman and J. Walsh (eds.), and M. Mahdi (trans.), New York, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Co., 1973, 224.
  • Iji, Aḍud al-Din, Al-Mawāqif, Cairo: Maktabat al-Mutanabbi, 1983.
  • Malik, Rahīm Riżā Zādih (ed.), Dānish nāmah-yi Khayyāmī, Tehran, 1998, 1377 A.H.s.
  • Rashed, R. and B. Vahabzadeh, Omar Khayyām, the Mathematician, New York: Bibliotheca Persica Press, 2000.
  • al-Rāzi. Fakhr al-Din, Al-Mabāḥith al-mashraqiyyah, M. Al-Muʿtasim al-Baghdadi (ed.), Cairo: Dar al-Ilm, 1990.

Secondary Works

  • Aminrazavi, M., 2007, The Wine of Wisdom, The Life, Poetry and Philosophy of Omar Khayyām, Oxford: Oneworld Press.
  • Aminrazavi, M. (ed.), 2013, Sufism and American Literary Masters. New York: SUNY Press.
  • Amir-Móez, A., 1959, “Discussion of difficulties in Euclid,” Scripta Mathematica, 24: 275–303.
  • Amir-Móez, A., 1963, “A Paper of Omar Khayyam,” Scripta Mathematica, 26: 323–327.
  • Arberry, A. J., 1959, The Romance of the Rubaiyat, London: G. Allen & Unwin.
  • Barontini, M., and Tonietti, M., 2010, “Umar al-Khayyām’s contribution to the Arabic mathematical theory of music,” Arabic Sciences and Philosophy, 20: 255–279.
  • Berggren, J. L., 1986, Episodes in the Mathematics of Medieval Islam, New York: Springer.
  • Broad, C. D., 1906, “The Philosophy of Omar Khayyām and Its Relation to that of Schopenhauer,” Review, 166 (November): 544–556.
  • Brown, E. G., 1899, “Yet More Light on ‘Umar-i Khayyām,” Royal Asiatic Society, 8: 409–420.
  • Burrage, C. D., 1921, Twenty Years of the Omar Khayyām Club of America, Boston: Rosemary Press.
  • Chāvoshī, J.A., 1378 A.H.s., “Omar al-Khayyam wa’l-musiqī al-naḍariyyah,” trans. by M.M. ‘Abd al-Jalil, Farhang, 1 (14): 29–32 and 203–214.
  • Chāvoshī, J.A., 1380 A.H.s., “Omar Khayyam and the Arithmetical Triangle,” trans. by M. Boozarjmehr, Farhang, 2 (14): 262–273.
  • Conway, Moncure Daniel, 1893, “The Omar Khayyām Cult in England,” in Nation, 57 (October): 305.
  • Dashtī, A., 1971, In search of Omar Khayyām, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Dinānī, Gh., 2002 (1380 A.H.s.), “Hakim Omar Khyyam wa masʿalih-yi wāhid wa kathīr,” Daftar-i ‘aql wa āyat-i ‘ishq., Vol. I, Tehran: 229–230.
  • Djebbar, A., 2000 (1378 A.H.s), “Omar Khayyām et les Activités Mathématiques en pays d’Islam aux XIe-XIIe Siècles,” Farhang, 12: 1–31.
  • Dole, Nathan, 1901, The Persian Poets, New York: Thomas Y. Crowell & Co.
  • Foūlādvand, M. M., 2000 (1378 A.H.s.), Khayyām shināsī, Tehran: Alast-i Farda Press.
  • Furūgh. O., 1964 (1342 A.H.), “Abu’l-‘Alā Ma‘rrī wa Khayyām,” H. Khadivjan (trans.), Yaghmā, 16: 173–177.
  • Gittleman, S., 1961, The Reception of Edward FitzGerald’s ‘Rubaiyyat of Omar Khayyām’ in England and Germany, Ph.D. Dissertation, University of Michigan.
  • Hall, R.E., 1981, “al-Khāzinī,” in Dictionary of Scientific Biography (Volume 7), C. Gillispie (ed.), New York: Charles Scribner’s Sons, pp. 335–351.
  • Hogendijk, J., 2002, “Anthyphairetic Ratio Theory in Medieval Islamic Mathematics,” in From China to Paris: 2000 Years Transmission of Mathematical Ideas, Y. Dold-Samplonius, J. Dauben, M. Folkerts, and B. van Dalen (eds.), Stuttgart: Steiner, pp. 187–202.
  • Holland, B., 1899, “The Popularity of Omar,” National Review, 33 (June): 643–652.
  • Joseph, G.G., 2011, The Crest of the Peacock: Non-European Roots of Mathematics, 3rd ed., Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Kasir, D., 1931, The Algebra of Omar Khayyam, New York: Teachers College Press.
  • Khalil, R., 2008, Omar al-Khayyam, Algebra wa al-Muqabala: An Essay by the Uniquely Wise ‘Abel Fath Omar bin al-Khayyam on Algebra and Equations, Reading: Garnet.
  • Lange, C. Y. (ed.), 1968, The Pre-Raphaelites and Their Circle, Boston: Houghton Mifflin.
  • Mossaheb, C.H., 1960, Hakim Omare Khayyam as an Algebraist, Society for the National Heritage of Iran, Teheran.
  • Nājī Iṣfahānī, H., 2002 (1380 A.H.s.), “Hastī shināsī-yi ḥakīm Omar Khayyām” in Farhang, 14 (3–4): 113–117.
  • Nasr, S. H. and M. Aminrazavi, 1988, An Anthology of Philosophy in Persia (Volume 1), New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Nasr, S. H., 2001, “The Poet-Scientist Khayyām as Philosopher,” Mélanges Luce López-Baralt, Series 9, No. 8: 535–53.
  • Netz, R., 2004, The Transformation of Mathematics in the Early Mediterranean World: From Problems to Equations, Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press.
  • Oaks, J. A., 2011, “Al-Khayyām’s scientific revision of algebra,” Suhayl, 10: 47–75.
  • Rashed, R., 1994, The Development of Mathematics: Between Arithmetic and Algebra, Dordrecht/Boston/London: Kluwer.
  • Rashed, R., and B. Vahabzadeh, 1999, Al-Khayyām Mathématicien, Paris: Blanchard.
  • Rosenfeld, B., and A. Youschkevitch, 1965, Omar Khaiiam, Moscow: Nauka.
  • Sayili, A., 1980, The Observatory in Islam and its Place in the General History of the Observatory, New York: Arno Press.
  • Smith, D., 1935, “Euclid, Omar Khayyam and Saccheri,” Scripta Mathematica, 3: 5–10.
  • Ṭabātabā’ī, M., 1950 (1370 A.H.), Khayyām yā khayyāmī, Tehran: Qoqnus Press.
  • Twain, Mark, 1983. Mark Twain’s Rubáiyát. Kevin B. MacDonnell and Alan Gribben (eds.), Austin: Jenkins.
  • Vahabzadeh, B., 1997. “Al-Khayyām’s Conception of Ratio and Proportionality,” Arabic Sciences and Philosophy, 7: 247–263.
  • Winter, H. J. J., and W. ‘Arafat, 1950, “The Algebra of ‘Umar Khayyam,” Journal of the Royal Asiatic Society of Bengal, 16: 27–70.
  • Woepcke, F., 1851, L’Algèbre d’Omar Alkhayyāmī, Paris: B. Duprat.
  • Yohannan, J. D., 1971, “Fin de Siècle Cult of FitzGerald’s Rubaʿiyat of Omar Khayyām,” Review of National Literature, 4: 85.
  • Youschkevitch, A., and B. Rosenfeld, 1973, “al-Khayyāmī,” in Dictionary of Scientific Biography (Volume 7), C. Gillispie (ed.), New York: Charles Scribner’s Sons, pp. 323–334.
  • Zhukovski, V. A., 1898, “ ‘Umar Khayyām and the ‘Wandering’ Quatrains,” E.D. Ross (trans.), Journal of the Royal Asiatic Society, 30: 349–366.

Other Internet Resources

  • Omar Khayyam”, Encyclopaedia Iranica Online. By Ḥosayn Maʿṣumi Hamadāni, EIr., Sayyed ʿAli Mirafżali, Jos Biegstraaten, Austin O’Malley, William H. Martin, Sandra Mason, Agnès Lenepveu-Hotz, Hamid Tafazoli, Mario Casari et al. © Trustees of Columbia University in the City of New York.
  • PDF of FitzGerald’s translation, Mideast and Islamic Studies Collection, Cornell University.
  • The Poet Scientist Khayyam as Philosopher, by Seyyed Hossein Nasr.

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