Henry David Thoreau

First published Thu Jun 30, 2005; substantive revision Fri Mar 3, 2017

Henry David Thoreau (1817–1862) was an American philosopher, poet, and environmental scientist whose major work, Walden, draws upon each of these identities in meditating on the concrete problems of living in the world as a human being. He sought to revive a conception of philosophy as a way of life, not only a mode of reflective thought and discourse. Thoreau’s work was informed by an eclectic variety of sources. He was well-versed in classical Greek and Roman philosophy, ranging from the pre-Socratics through the Hellenistic schools, and was also an avid student of the ancient scriptures and wisdom literature of various Asian traditions. He was familiar with modern philosophy ranging from Descartes, Locke and the Cambridge Platonists through Emerson, Coleridge, and the German Idealists, all of whom are influential on Thoreau’s philosophy. He discussed his own scientific findings with leading naturalists of the day, and read the latest work of Humboldt and Darwin with interest and admiration. His philosophical explorations of self and world led him to develop an epistemology of embodied perception and a non-dualistic account of mental and material life. In addition to his focus on ethics in an existential spirit, Thoreau also makes unique contributions to ontology, the philosophy of science, and radical political thought. Although his political essays have become justly famous, his works on natural science were not even published until the late twentieth century, and they help to give us a more complete picture of him as a thinker. Among the texts he left unfinished was a set of manuscript volumes filled with information on Native American religion and culture. Thoreau’s work anticipates certain later developments in pragmatism, phenomenology, and environmental philosophy, and poses a perennially valuable challenge to our conception of the methods and intentions of philosophy itself.

1. Life and Writings

Thoreau was born in Concord, Massachusetts in 1817 and died there in 1862, at the age of forty-four. Like that of his near-contemporary Søren Kierkegaard, Thoreau’s intellectual career unfolded in a close and polemical relation to the town in which he spent almost his entire life. After graduating from Harvard in 1837, he struck up a friendship with fellow Concord resident Ralph Waldo Emerson, whose essay “Nature” he had first encountered earlier that year. Although the two American thinkers had a turbulent relationship due to serious philosophical and personal differences, they had a profound and lasting effect upon one another. It was in the fall of 1837 that Thoreau, aged twenty, made his first entries in the multivolume journal he would keep for the rest of his life. Most of his published writings were developed from notes that first appeared on these pages, and Thoreau subsequently revised many entries, so his journal can be considered a finished work in itself. During his lifetime he published only two books, along with numerous shorter essays that were first delivered as lectures. He lived a simple and relatively quiet life, making his living briefly as a teacher and pencil maker but mostly as a land surveyor. Thoreau had intimate bonds with his family and friends, and remained unmarried although he was deeply in love at least twice. His first book, A Week on the Concord and Merrimack Rivers, was still a work in progress in 1845, when he went to live in the woods by Walden Pond for two years and two months. This “experiment” in living on the outskirts of town was an intensive time of examination for Thoreau, as he drew close to nature and contemplated the final ends of his own life, which was otherwise at risk of ending in quiet desperation. Thoreau viewed his existential quest as a venture in philosophy, in the ancient Greek sense of the word, because it was motivated by an urgent need to find a reflective understanding of reality that could inform a life of wisdom. This is because, according to the view of philosophy as a way of life, that very way of life “will necessarily be deliberative and reflective”; accordingly, for Thoreau, “thinking about his life in the woods is central to his life in the woods” (Bates 2012, 29).

His experience bore fruit in the 1854 publication of his literary masterpiece Walden, a work that almost defies categorization: it is a work of narrative prose which often soars to poetic heights, combining philosophical speculation with close observation of a concrete place. It is a rousing summons to the examined life and to the realization of one’s potential, while at the same time it develops what might be described as a religious vision of the human being and the universe. Walden has been admired by a larger world audience than any other book written by an American author, and—whether or not it ought to be called a work of philosophy—it contains a substantial amount of philosophical content, which deserves to be better appreciated than it has been. Stanley Cavell has argued that Thoreau is an embarrassment to “what we have learned to call philosophy,” since his work embodies “a mode of conceptual accuracy” that is “based on an idea of rigor” somewhat foreign to the academic establishment (Cavell 1988, 14). Yet, as Cavell also notes, philosophical authors have more than one way to go about their business, and Thoreau—like Descartes in the Meditations—begins his argument by accounting for how he has come to believe that certain questions need to be addressed. In other words, his method is predicated on the belief that it is philosophically worthwhile to clarify the basis of your own perplexity and unrest (see Reid 2012, 46). And this is only one way of explaining how a significant part of the challenge in coming to terms with Thoreau is that his philosophy, like Nietzsche’s, has a literary and poetic quality. The reader is charged with finding the coherence of Thoreau’s whole philosophical outlook. Accordingly, this entry attempts to sort out and delineate the main themes of Thoreau’s project, in the hope of serving as an aid and stimulus to further study. It draws upon Thoreau’s entire corpus, including the works he left in manuscript that were published after his death.

2. Nature and Human Existence

In his essay “Nature,” Emerson asserts that there can be found in the natural world “a sanctity which shames our religions.” Thoreau would agree completely with this statement. But in the same essay Emerson also inclines toward Platonism, stating that nature is “emblematic” of higher truths, and suggesting that the material world has value by virtue of being a subsidiary product of mental reality: each natural object is therefore “a symbol of some spiritual fact.” For the most part, Thoreau recoils from the idea that we could find some kind of higher reality by looking beyond nature: in the “Friday” chapter of A Week on the Concord and Merrimack Rivers, he asks: “Is not Nature, rightly read, that of which she is commonly taken to be the symbol merely?” As he sees it, the realm of spirit is the physical world, which has a sacred meaning that can be directly perceived. Accordingly, he seeks “to be always on the alert to find God in nature” (Journal, 9/7/51), and to hear “the language which all things and events speak without metaphor” (Walden, IV). Thoreau’s metaphysical convictions compel him to “defend nature’s intrinsic value,” in a way that situates him philosophically in a place “far removed from Emerson and most transcendentalists” (Cafaro 2004, 132–133). In his journal, Thoreau reports that his goal is to “state facts” in such a way that “they shall be significant,” rather than allowing himself to be blind to “the significance of phenomena” (Journal, 11/9/51 & 8/5/51). Evidently, he does not accept that whatever we register through our aesthetic and emotional responses ought to be viewed as unreal. Indeed, Thoreau would argue that the person who is seldom moved by the beauty of things is the one with an inadequate conception of reality, since it is the neutral observer who is less well aware of the world as it is.

To say that nature is inherently significant is to say that natural facts are neither inert nor value-free. Thoreau urges his reader not to “underrate the value of a fact,” since each concrete detail of the world may contain a meaningful truth (“Natural History of Massachusetts”). Note the phrase: the value of a fact. Thoreau does not introduce an artificial distinction between facts and values, or between primary and secondary qualities, since he understands the universe as an organic whole in which mind and matter are inseparable. When we perceive sights, sounds, and textures, we are not standing as disembodied consciousness apart from a world of inanimate mechanisms; rather, we are sentient beings immersed in the sensory world, learning the “essential facts of life” only through “the perpetual instilling and drenching of the reality that surrounds us” (Walden, II). The philosopher who seeks knowledge through experience should therefore not be surprised to discover beauty and order in natural phenomena. However, these properties are not projected onto nature from an external perspective—rather, they emerge from within the self-maintaining processes of organic life. And the entire environment, the “living earth” itself, has something like a life of its own, containing but not reducible to the biotic existence of animals and plants (Walden, XVII). This is what he elsewhere describes as the “slumbering subterranean fire in nature which never goes out” (“A Winter Walk”).

Thoreau remarks upon the “much grander significance” of any natural phenomenon “when not referred to man and his needs but viewed absolutely” (Journal, 11/10/51). The world is rich with value that is not of our making, and “whatever we have perceived to be in the slightest degree beautiful is of infinitely more value to us than what we have only as yet discovered to be useful and to serve our purpose” (Faith in a Seed, 144). It is when we are not guilty of imposing our own purposes onto the world that we are able to view it on its own terms. One of the things we then discover is that we are involved in a pluralistic universe, containing many different points of view other than our own. And when we begin to realize “the infinite extent of our relations” (Walden, VIII), we can see that even what does not at first seem to be good for us may have some positive value when considered from a broader perspective. Rather than dismissing squirrels as rodents, for instance, we should see them as “planters of forests,” and be grateful for the role they play in the distribution of seeds (Journal, 10/22/60). Likewise, the “gentle rain which waters my beans and keeps me in the house to-day is not drear and melancholy, but good for me too. Though it prevents my hoeing them, it is of far more worth than my hoeing. If it should continue so long as to cause the seeds to rot in the ground and destroy the potatoes in the low lands, it would still be good for the grass on the uplands, and, being good for the grass, it would be good for me” (Walden, V). Our limited view often keeps us from appreciating the harmonious interdependence of all parts of the natural world: this is not due to “any confusion or irregularity in Nature,” but because of our own incomplete knowledge (Walden, XVI). Thoreau declares that he would be happy “if all the meadows on the earth were left in a wild state,” since in tampering with nature we know not what we do and sometimes end up doing harm as a result (Walden, X). In many cases we find that “unhandselled nature is worth more even by our modes of valuation than our improvements are” (Journal, 11/10/60).

In nature we have access to real value, which can be used as a standard against which to measure our conventional evaluations. An example of the latter is the value that is “arbitrarily attached” to gold, which has nothing to do with its “intrinsic beauty or value” (Journal, 10/13/60). So it is a mistake to rush to California “as if the true gold were to be found in that direction,” when one has failed to appreciate the inherent worth of one’s native soil (Journal, 10/18/55). In the economy of nature, a seed is more precious than a diamond, for it contains “the principle of growth, or life,” and has the ability to become a specific plant or tree (Journal, 3/22/61). The seed not only provides evidence that nature is filled with “creative genius” (Journal, 1/5/56), but it also reminds us that a spark of divinity is present in each human being as well. One of Thoreau’s favorite analogies—not only a metaphor, as he sees it—is that between the ripening of a seed and the development of human potential. “The finest qualities of our nature, like the bloom on fruits, can be preserved only by the most delicate handling” (Walden, I). What he calls “wildness” is not located only in the nonhuman world; the same creative force is also active in human nature, so that even a literary work of art can reasonably be praised as a manifestation of wildness (see “Walking”). There is “a perfect analogy between the life of the human being and that of the vegetable” (Journal, 5/20/51), and thoughts “spring in man’s brain” in just the same way that “a plant springs and grows by its own vitality” (Journal, 11/8/50 & 4/3/58). Thoreau’s exhortations to follow the promptings of one’s genius are based on the idea that by obeying our own wild nature we are aligning ourselves with a sacred power. What inspires us to realize our highest potential is “the primitive vigor of Nature in us” (Journal, 8/30/56), and this influence is something we are able neither to predict nor to comprehend: as he describes it in the “Ktaadn” chapter of The Maine Woods, nature is “primeval, untamed, and forever untamable,” a godlike force but not always a kind one.

At one point in Walden, Thoreau quips that he usually does not count himself among the “true idealists” who are inclined to reject “the evidence of [their] senses” (Walden, XIV). On the other hand, he has nothing but scorn for the sort of materialism that fails to penetrate the inner mystery of things, discovering “nothing but surface” in its mechanistic observations (Journal, 3/7/59). Instead, he argues that we must approach the world as “nature looking into nature,” aware of the relation between the form of our own perception and what we are able to perceive (Correspondence, 7/21/41). There are reasons for classifying Thoreau as both a naturalist and a romantic, although both of these categories are perhaps too broad to be very helpful. His conception of nature is informed by a syncretic appropriation of Greek, Roman, Indian, and other sources, and the result is an eclectic vision that is uniquely his own. For this reason it is difficult to situate Thoreau within the history of modern philosophy, but one plausible way of doing so would be to describe him as articulating a version of transcendental idealism. If Thoreau is indeed “the American heir to Kant’s critical philosophy,” as he has been called (Oelschlaeger 1991, 136), it is because his investigation of “the relation between the subject of knowledge and its object” builds upon a Kantian insight that Emerson, who viewed the senses as illusory, arguably did not grasp (see Cavell 1992, 94–95). Yet in order to understand why this might be an accurate categorization, we must proceed from Thoreau’s metaphysics to his epistemology.

3. The Ethics of Perception

If one were asked to name the cardinal virtue of Thoreau’s philosophy, it would be hard to identify a better candidate than awareness. He attests to the importance of “being forever on the alert,” and of “the discipline of looking always at what is to be seen” (Walden, IV). This exercise may enable one to create remarkably minute descriptions of a sunset, a battle between red and black ants, or the shapes taken by thawing clay on a sand bank: but its primary value lies in the way it affects the quality of our experience. “It is something to be able to paint a particular picture, or to carve a statue, and so to make a few objects beautiful; but it is far more glorious to carve and paint the very atmosphere and medium through which we look” (Walden, II). Awareness cannot be classified as exclusively a moral or an intellectual virtue, either, since knowing is an inescapably practical and evaluative activity—not to mention, an embodied practice. Thoreau portrays himself not from a presumably neutral or impersonal vantage point, “but from an embodied point of view” in which his somatic sensory experience puts him “knowingly in touch with” his surroundings (Goodman 2012, 36). For such reasons as these, he has sometimes been interpreted as a “philosopher of the senses” (Mooney 2009, 195), who offers an original response to the central problem of modern philosophy as a consequence of recognizing that knowledge is “dependent on the individual’s ability to see,” and that “the world as known is thus radically dependent on character” (Tauber 2001, 4–5).

One of the common tenets of ancient philosophy which was abandoned in the period beginning with Descartes is that a person “could not have access to the truth” without undertaking a process of self-purification that would render him “susceptible to knowing the truth” (Foucault 1997, 278–279). For Thoreau, it was the work of a lifetime to cultivate one’s receptivity to the beauty of the universe. Believing that “the perception of beauty is a moral test” (Journal, 6/21/52), Thoreau frequently chastises himself or humanity in general for failing in this respect. “How much of beauty—of color, as well as form—on which our eyes daily rest goes unperceived by us,” he laments (Journal, 8/1/60); and he worries that “Nature has no human inhabitant who appreciates her” (Walden, IX). Noticing that his sensory awareness has grown less acute since the time of his youth, he speculates that “the child plucks its first flower with an insight into its beauty and significance which the subsequent botanist never retains” (Journal, 7/16/51 & 2/5/52). In order to attain a clear and truthful view of things, we must refine all the faculties of our embodied consciousness, and become emotionally attuned to all the concrete features of the place in which we are located. We fully know only those facts that are “warm, moist, incarnated,” and palpably felt: “A man has not seen a thing who has not felt it” (Journal, 2/23/60). In this way, Thoreau outlines an epistemological task that will occupy him for the rest of his life; namely, to cultivate a way of attending to things that will allow them to be experienced as elements of a meaningful world.

Since our ability to appreciate the significance of phenomena is so easily dulled, it requires a certain discipline in order to become and remain a reliable knower of the world. Like Aristotle, Thoreau believes that the perception of truth “produces a pleasurable sensation”; and he adds that a “healthy and refined nature would always derive pleasure from the landscape” (Journal, 9/24/54 & 6/27/52). Nature will reward the most careful attention paid by a person who is appropriately disposed, but there is only “as much beauty visible to us in the landscape as we are prepared to appreciate,—not a grain more. The actual objects which one person will see from a particular hilltop are just as different from those which another will see as the persons are different” (Journal, 11/4/58). One who is in the right state to be capable of giving a “poetic and lively description” of things will find himself “in a living and beautiful world” (Journal, 10/13/60 & 12/31/59). Beauty, like color, does not lie only in the eye of the beholder: flowers, for example, are indeed beautiful and brightly colored. Nevertheless, beauty—and color, for that matter—can exist only where there is a beholder to perceive it (Journal, 6/15/52 & 1/21/38). From his experience in the field making observations of natural phenomena, Thoreau gained the insight “that he, the supposedly neutral observer, was always and unavoidably in the center of the observation” (McGregor 1997, 113). Because all perception of objects has a subjective aspect, the world can be defined as a sphere centered around each conscious perceiver: wherever we are located, “the universe is built around us, and we are central still” (Journal, 8/24/41). This does not mean that we are trapped inside of our own consciousness; rather, the point is that it is only through the lens of our own subjectivity that we have access to the external world.

What we are able to perceive, then, depends not only upon where we are physically situated: it is also contingent upon who we are and what we value, or how our attention is focused. “Objects are concealed from our view, not so much because they are out of the course of our visual ray as because we do not bring our minds and eyes to bear on them…. A man sees only what concerns him” (“Autumnal Tints”). In other words, there is “no such thing as pure objective observation. Your observation, to be interesting, i.e. to be significant, must be subjective” (Journal, 5/6/54). Subjectivity is not an obstacle to truth, according to Thoreau. After all, he says, “the truest description, and that by which another living man can most readily recognize a flower, is the unmeasured and eloquent one which the sight of it inspires” (Journal, 10/13/60). A true account of the world must do justice to all the familiar properties of objects that the human mind is capable of perceiving. Whether this could be done by a scientific description is a vexing question for Thoreau, and one about which he shows considerable ambivalence. One of his concerns is that the scientist “discovers no world for the mind of man with all its faculties to inhabit”; by contrast, there is “more humanity” in “the unscientific man’s knowledge,” since the latter can explain how certain facts pertain to life (Journal, 9/5/51, 2/13/52). He accuses the naturalist of failing to understand color, much less beauty, and asks: “What sort of science is that which enriches the understanding, but robs the imagination?” (Journal, 10/5/61 & 12/25/51) For Thoreau, the most reliable observer is one who can “see things as they are, grand and beautiful” (Journal, 1/7/57)—in other words, the beauty and grandeur of the world really are there to be seen, even if we are not always capable of seeing them. We can easily fail to perceive the value of being if we do not approach the world with the appropriate kind of emotional comportment.

Thoreau sometimes characterizes science as an ideal discipline that will enrich our knowledge and experience: “The true man of science will know nature better by his finer organization; he will smell, taste, see, hear, feel, better than other men. His will be a deeper and finer experience” (“Natural History of Massachusetts”). He observes that scientific terminology can provide the means of apprehending something that we had utterly missed until we had a name for it (see Walls 2012, 108). Yet he also gives voice to the fear that by weighing and measuring things and collecting quantitative data he may actually be narrowing his vision. The scientist “studies nature as a dead language,” and would rather study a dead fish preserved in a jar than a living one in its native element (Journal, 5/10/53 & 11/30/58). In these same journal entries, Thoreau claims that he seeks to experience the significance of nature, and that “the beauty of the fish” is what is most worthy of being measured. On the other hand, when he finds a dead fish in the water, he brings it home to weigh and measure, covering several pages with his statistical findings (Journal, 8/20/54). This is only one of many examples of Thoreau’s fascination with data-gathering, and yet he repeatedly questions its value, as if he does not know what to make of his own penchant for naturalistic research. At the very least, scientific investigations run the risk of being “trivial and petty,” so perhaps what one should do is “learn science and then forget it” (Journal, 1/21/53 & 4/22/52). But Thoreau is more deeply troubled by the possibility that “science is inhuman,” since objects “seen with a microscope begin to be insignificant,” and this is “not the means of acquiring true knowledge” (Journal, 5/1/59 & 5/28/54). Overall, his position is not that a mystical or imaginative awareness of the world is incompatible with knowledge of measurable facts, but that an exclusive focus on the latter would blind us to whatever aspects of reality fall outside the scope of our measurement.

One thing we can learn from all of Thoreau’s comments on scientific inquiry is that he cares very much about the following question: what can we know about the world, and how are we able to know it? Although he admires the precision of scientific information, he wonders if what it delivers is always bound to be “something less than the vague poetic” (Journal, 1/5/50). In principle, a naturalistic approach to reality should be able to capture its beauty and significance; in practice, however, it may be “impossible for the same person to see things from the poet’s point of view and that of the man of science” (Journal, 2/18/52). In that case, the best we can do is try to convey our intimations of the truth about the universe, even if this means venturing far beyond claims that are positivistically verifiable: “I desire to speak somewhere without bounds; like a man in his waking moment, to men in their waking moments; for I am convinced that I cannot exaggerate enough even to lay the foundation of a true expression… . The words which express our faith and piety are not definite; yet they are significant and fragrant like frankincense to superior natures” (Walden, XVIII). We should not arbitrarily limit our awareness to that which can be described with mathematical exactitude: perhaps the highest knowledge available to us, Thoreau suggests, consists in “a sudden revelation of the insufficiency of all that we called Knowledge before … it is the lighting up of the mist by the sun” (“Walking”). And perhaps this is not a regrettable fact: “At the same time that we are earnest to explore and learn all things, we require that all things be mysterious and unexplorable, that land and sea be infinitely wild, unsurveyed and unfathomed by us because unfathomable” (Walden, XVII). By acknowledging the limits of what we can know with certainty, we open ourselves up to a wider horizon of experience.

As one commentator points out, Thoreau’s categories—so to speak—are dynamic, since they are constantly being redefined by what we perceive, even as they shape our way of seeing (Peck 1990, 84–85). Every now and then “something will occur which my philosophy has not dreamed of,” Thoreau says, which demonstrates that the “boundaries of the actual are no more fixed and rigid than the elasticity of our imaginations” (Journal, 5/31/53). Since the thoughts of each knowing subject are “part of the meaning of the world,” it is legitimate to ask: “Who can say what is? He can only say how he sees” (11/4/52 & 12/2/46). Truth is radically perspective-dependent, which means that insofar as we are different people we can only be expected to perceive different worlds (Walls 1995, 213). Thoreau’s position might be described as perspectival realism, since he does not conclude that truth is relative but celebrates the diversity of the multifaceted reality that each of us knows in his own distinctive way. “How novel and original must be each new man’s view of the universe!” he exclaims; “How sweet is the perception of a new natural fact,” for it suggests to us “what worlds remain to be unveiled” (Journal, 4/2/52 & 4/19/52). We may never comprehend the intimate relation between a significant fact and the perceiver who appreciates it, but we should trust that it is not in vain to view nature with “humane affections” (Journal, 2/20/57 & 6/30/52). With respect to any given phenomenon, the “point of interest” that concerns us lies neither in the coolly independent object nor in the subject alone, but somewhere in between (Journal, 11/5/57). Witnessing the rise of positivism and its ideal of complete objectivity, Thoreau attempts “to preserve an enchanted world and to place the passionate observer in the center of his or her universe” (Tauber 2001, 20). It is an admirable goal, and one that remains quite relevant in the philosophical climate of the present day.

4. Friendship and Politics

Thoreau’s ethic of personal flourishing is focused upon the problem of how to align one’s daily life in accordance with one’s ultimate ideals. What was enthusiasm in the youth, he argues, must become temperament in the mature person: the “mere vision is little compared with the steady corresponding endeavor thitherward” (Journal, 11/1/51 & 11/24/57). Much of our time ought to be spent “in carrying out deliberately and faithfully the hundred little purposes which every man’s genius must have suggested to him… . The wisely conscious life springs out of an unconscious suggestion” (Wild Fruits, 166). Character, then, can be defined as “genius settled”—the promptings of conscience in themselves are only potentially moral, until we have integrated them into the fabric of our everyday existence and begun to hold ourselves responsible for living up to them (Journal, 3/2/42). Hence, we need to cherish and nurture our capability to discern the difference between the idea and the reality, between what is and what ought to be. It is when we experience dissatisfaction with ourselves or with external circumstances that we are stimulated to act in the interest of making things better.

It follows that the greatest compliment we can pay to another person is to say that he or she enhances our life by inciting us to realize our highest aspirations. So Thoreau views it as deplorable that “we may love and not elevate one another”; the “love that takes us as it finds us, degrades us” (“Chastity and Sensuality”). He speaks of “love” and “friendship” as closely related terms which are tainted by the “trivial dualism” which assumes that the one must exclude the other (Journal, undated 1839 entry). Clearly, what he is concerned about is the kind of love the Greeks called philia—and in his sustained consideration of friendship, as in so many other respects, Thoreau is “squarely in the virtue ethics tradition” (Cafaro 2004, 127). In his ethical writings, the notion of wishing good on behalf of another person is often taken to a severe extreme, as if he does not think it possible to ask too much of love and friendship. In A Week on the Concord and Merrimack Rivers, he says: “I value and trust those who love and praise my aspiration rather than my performance” (A Week, “Wednesday”). This is fair enough, but Thoreau may be going too far when he proclaims that a friend should be approached “with sacred love and awe,” and that we profane one another if we do not always meet on religious terms; it is no wonder that he finds himself doubting whether his “idea of a friend” will ever actually be instantiated (Journal, 6/26/40). Nonetheless, as a recent interpreter of Thoreau has pointed out, the “exalted and rarefied ideal” of friendship that he upholds does not imply that a friend is merely instrumental to one’s own self-realization (see Hodder 2010, 129–142). Above all, Thoreau’s discussion of love and friendship provokes us to reflect upon what we can and cannot expect from our closest human relationships, and on their role in a good life.

It would be a mistake to consider Thoreau’s political views in isolation from other aspects of his thought. It is, for example, his understanding of wild nature that informs his sociopolitical ideas. As was noted above, nature is a point of reference outside the polis which can provide valuable moral guidance, reminding us that society is not the measure of all things. Considering the human being as “an inhabitant, or a part and parcel of Nature,” rather than a cultural artifact merely (“Walking”), he looks to the nonhuman natural world and to our inherent “wildness” as a source of evaluation which can empower us to discover that the standards of our civilization are profoundly flawed. His conviction that nature provides us with “a different, truer, and more significant moral reality” than what we find in society provides the “crucial and often overlooked political core” to what has been called his “pastoral environmentalism” (Taylor 1992, 12-24). Withdrawing into the natural world allows us to view the state in a broader context and to conceive of ways in which social values and political structures could be improved radically. This includes unjust laws that ought to be reformed, about which more will be said in a moment, as well as the unwritten rules embodied in prevailing expectations about how one ought to live and what matters. Anticipating Heidegger’s critique of Das Man in section 27 of Being and Time, Thoreau describes the source of these culturally prevalent attitudes as the “They” (Walden, I; see also Bennett 1994, 18-19) and is critical of their pervasive and corrupting influence, their way of making people content with distorted values. For instance, most of his fellow citizens of Massachusetts are able to greet each other politely on the street and in church, thinking of themselves as morally decent while remaining complacent to uphold and perpetuate the institution of slavery in America (see “Slavery in Massachusetts” and “A Plea for Captain John Brown”). In denouncing a specific pernicious attitude that is widespread among his contemporaries, Thoreau also seeks to identify and analyze the general tendency it exemplifies to defer to public opinion: for this reason, his project of social critique is not relevant only to his parochial context but has universal implications. He is acutely conscious of the threat that shared modes of discourse can pose to authentic intersubjectivity.

Thoreau is only half-joking when he tells us that, after becoming frustrated with society, he turned “more exclusively than ever to the woods, where I was better known” (Walden, I). Not only is it true that a degree of solitude and distance from our neighbors may actually improve our relations with them, but by moving away from the center of town we liberate ourselves from a slavish adherence to prevailing attitudes. “The greater part of what my neighbors call good I believe in my soul to be bad,” he claims, providing this kind of example: “If a man walk in the woods for love of them half of each day, he is in danger of being regarded as a loafer; but if he spends his whole day as a speculator, shearing off those woods and making earth bald before her time, he is esteemed an industrious and enterprising citizen” (Walden, I and “Life Without Principle”). This warped sense of value is all too common amidst the desperation of modern life, with its “restless, nervous, bustling, trivial” activity (Walden, XVIII). Thoreau builds a critique of American culture upon his conviction that “the mind can be permanently profaned by the habit of attending to trivial things, so that all our thoughts shall be tinged with triviality” (“Life Without Principle”): his polemic aims at consumerism, philistinism, mass entertainment, vacuous applications of technology, and the herd mentality that conforms to the dictates of an anonymous “They.” During his life Thoreau spoke out against the Mexican War and the subjugation of Native America, and campaigned aggressively in favor of bioregionalism and the protection of animals and the natural environment. (It is outrageous that he is often stereotyped as a lifelong recluse and hermit.) Above all, the political issue that aroused his indignation more than any other was slavery. Because Thoreau understood philosophy as a way of life, it is only fitting that philosophical ideals would lead him into political action.

He was an activist involved in the abolitionist movement on many fronts: he participated in the Underground Railroad, protested against the Fugitive Slave Law, and gave support to John Brown and his party. Most importantly perhaps, he provides a justification for principled revolt and a method of nonviolent resistance, both of which would have a considerable influence on revolutionary movements in the twentieth century. In his essay on “Civil Disobedience,” originally published as “Resistance to Civil Government,” Thoreau defends the validity of conscientious objection to unjust laws, which he claims ought to be transgressed at once. Political institutions as such are regarded by him with distrust, and although he arguably overestimates the extent to which it is possible to disassociate oneself from them, he convincingly insists that social consensus is not a guarantee of rectitude or truth. One of the most valuable points he makes against the critics of John Brown is that a person should not be dismissed as “insane” by virtue of dissenting from the majority: Brown’s anger is grounded upon an awareness of the fact that slavery is a violation of human rights, and Thoreau berates the law-abiding citizens of Massachusetts for looking the other way (“A Plea for Captain John Brown”). Passively and quietly allowing an unjust practice to continue is tantamount to collaborating with evil, he claims, articulating a principle of noncompliance that would inspire the philosophically informed nonviolent resistance of Gandhi and Martin Luther King, among others.

When Thoreau argues that all of Brown’s actions were justified because he was an inspired reformer with a sacred vocation, he is appealing to something like the notion of natural right. His essay in this respect has a more general pertinence to debates about the individual moral reformer in relation to community norms. It also raises the issue of whether political violence can be justified as the lesser of evils, or in cases where it may be the only available way of ending injustice. Usually, he prefers nonviolent forms of advocacy such as creating “counter friction to stop the machine” by opposing, and acting in defiance of, practices and laws that are not righteous (“Civil Disobedience”). Speaking about the act of protest that led him to spend a night in jail, he expresses characteristic irony by saying that “I might have resisted forcibly with more or less effect, might have run amok against society; but I preferred that society should run amok against me, it being the desperate party” (Walden, VIII). Although at times it sounds as though Thoreau is advocating anarchy, what he demands is a better government, and what he refuses to acknowledge is the authority of one that has become so morally corrupt as to lose the consent of those governed. “There will never be a really free and enlightened State, ” he argues, “until the State comes to recognize the individual as a higher and independent power, from which all its own power and authority are derived, and treats him accordingly” (“Civil Disobedience”). There are simply more sacred laws to obey than the laws of society, and a just government—should there ever be such a thing, he adds—would not be in conflict with the conscience of the ethically upright individual.

5. Locating Thoreau

Thoreau has somewhat misleadingly been classified as a New England transcendentalist, and—even though he never rejected this label—it does not fit in many ways. Some of his major differences from Emerson have already been discussed, and further differences appear when Thoreau is compared to such figures as Orestes Brownson, Margaret Fuller, and Bronson Alcott. A history of transcendentalism in New England which appeared in the late nineteenth century mentions Thoreau only once, in passing (Frothingham 1886, 133). And a more recent history of the movement concludes that Thoreau had little in common with this group of thinkers, who were for the most part committed to some version of Christianity, to a dualistic understanding of mind and matter, and to the related idea that sense experience is unreliable (Boller 1974, 29–35 & 176). A crucial step in Thoreau’s intellectual development occurred when he “disassociated himself from Emerson’s Transcendentalist view of nature as symbol” (Slicer 2013, 181), as a current scholar notes. It was suggested above that a better way of situating Thoreau within the Western philosophical tradition is to consider him a kind of transcendental idealist, in the spirit of Kant. For reasons that ought to be obvious by now, he should be of interest to students of Kant, Fichte, and Schelling—all of whom he studied at first or second hand—and possibly Schopenhauer. Thoreau was a capable and enthusiastic classicist, whose study of ancient Greek and Roman authors convinced him that philosophy ought to be a lived practice: for this reason, he can profitably be grouped with other nineteenth-century thinkers, such as Kierkegaard and Nietzsche, who were critics of philosophy in the early modern period. Yet he also has the distinction of being among the first Western philosophers to be significantly influenced by ancient Chinese and Indian thought. He anticipates Bergson and Merleau-Ponty in his attention to the dynamics of the embodied mind, and shares with Peirce and James a concern for problems of knowledge as they arise within practical experience.

Contemporary philosophers are increasingly discovering how much Thoreau has to teach—especially, in the areas of knowledge and perception, and in ethical debates about the value of land and life. His affinities with the pragmatic and phenomenological traditions, and the enormous resources he offers for environmental philosophy, have also started to receive more attention—and Walden itself continues to be encountered by readers as a remarkable provocation to philosophical thought. Still, it remains true that the political aspect of Thoreau’s philosophy has come closer to receiving its due than any of these others: whether or not this is because such prominent figures as Gandhi and Martin Luther King cited Thoreau as an inspiration, it has resulted in a disproportionate focus on what is only one part of an integral philosophy, a part that can hardly be understood in isolation from the others. Even if it is a sign of Thoreau’s peculiar greatness that subsequent American philosophy has not known what to make of him, it is a shame if his exclusion from the mainstream philosophical canon has kept his voice from being heard by some of those who might be in a position to appreciate it. Then again, as Thoreau himself notes, it is never too late to give up our prejudices. Others have observed (see Slicer 2013, 182–183) that, based on the amount of prominent work on Thoreau as a philosopher which has recently appeared, his profile seems to be ever so gradually rising on the American philosophical landscape.


Works By Thoreau

  • Walden; or, Life in the Woods, ed. Jeffrey Cramer, New Haven: Yale University Press, 2004. Originally published in 1854. Parenthetical citations indicate with roman numerals which of Walden’s 18 chapters is the source of each quotation.
  • The Journal of Henry D. Thoreau, 14 volumes, ed. B. Torrey and F. Allen, New York: Dover, 1962. Originally published in 1906. Parenthetical citations give the date of each entry.
  • The Correspondence of Henry David Thoreau, ed. Walter Harding and Carl Bode, New York: New York University Press, 1958. Citations give the date of the letter quoted.
  • Consciousness in Concord: The Text of Thoreau’s Hitherto “Lost Journal” (1840–1841), ed. Perry Miller, Boston: Houghton Mifflin, 1958. Citations give the date of each entry.
  • The Indians of Thoreau: Selections from the Indian Notebooks, ed. Richard Fleck, Albuquerque: Hummingbird Press, 1974.
  • Early Essays and Miscellanies, ed. Joseph Moldenhauer et al., Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1975.
  • A Week on the Concord and Merrimack Rivers, ed. C. Hovde et al., Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1980. Originally published in 1849.
  • The Maine Woods, New York: Penguin Books, 1988. Originally published in 1864.
  • Cape Cod, ed. J. Moldenhauer, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1988. Originally published in 1865.
  • Faith in a Seed: The Dispersion of Seeds and Other Late Natural History Writings, ed. Bradley Dean, Washington, DC: Island Press, 1993.
  • Wild Fruits, ed. Bradley Dean, New York: W. W. Norton, 2000.
  • Collected Essays and Poems, ed. Elizabeth Hall Witherell, New York: Penguin / Library of America, 2001. Contains “Natural History of Massachusetts” (originally published in 1842), “A Winter Walk” (1843), “Civil Disobedience” (1849), “Slavery in Massachusetts” (1854), “A Plea for Captain John Brown” (1860), “Walking” (1862), “Autumnal Tints” (1862), “Life Without Principle” (1863), and “Chastity and Sensuality” (1865).

Selected Works by Other Authors

  • Andersen, Nathan, 2010, “Exemplars in Environmental Ethics: Taking Seriously the Lives of Thoreau, Leopold, Dillard and Abbey,” Ethics, Place and Environment, 13: 43–55.
  • Arsic, Branka, 2016, Bird Relics: Grief and Vitalism in Thoreau, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Bates, Stanley, 2012, “Thoreau and Emersonian Perfectionism,” in Furtak, Ellsworth, and Reid 2012, 14–30.
  • Bennett, Jane, 1994, Thoreau’s Nature: Ethics, Politics, and the Wild, London: Sage Publications.
  • Blakemore, Peter, 2000, “Reading Home: Thoreau, Nature, and the Phenomenon of Inhabitation,” in Thoreau’s Sense of Place, ed. Richard Schneider, Iowa City: University of Iowa Press, 115–132.
  • Borjesson, Gary, 1994, “A Sounding of Walden’s Philosophical Depth,” Philosophy and Literature, 18: 287–308.
  • Buell, Lawrence, 1995, The Environmental Imagination, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Cafaro, Philip, 2004, Thoreau’s Living Ethics: Walden and the Pursuit of Virtue, Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press.
  • Callicott, J. Baird, 1999, Beyond the Land Ethic, Albany: SUNY Press.
  • Cavell, Stanley, 1988, In Quest of the Ordinary, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • –––, 1992, The Senses of Walden, expanded edition, Chicago: University of Chicago Press. Originally published in 1972.
  • –––, 2000, “Night and Day: Heidegger and Thoreau,” in Appropriating Heidegger, ed. J. Faulconer and M. Wrathall, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 30–49.
  • Chapman, Robert L., 2002, “The Goat-stag and the Sphinx: The Place of the Virtues in Environmental Ethics,” Environmental Values, 11: 129–144.
  • Dull, Carl J., 2012, “Zhuangzi and Thoreau: Wandering, Nature, and Freedom,” Journal of Chinese Philosophy, 39: 222–239.
  • Eldridge, Richard, 2003, “Cavell on American Philosophy and the Idea of America,” in Stanley Cavell, ed. Richard Eldridge, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 172–189.
  • Emerson, Ralph Waldo, 1993, “Nature,” in Essays: First and Second Series, ed. John Gabriel Hunt, New York: Gramercy / Library of Freedom, 282–297. Originally published in 1836.
  • Foucault, Michel, 1997, Ethics: Subjectivity and Truth, ed. Paul Rabinow, New York: The New Press.
  • Frothingham, Octavius B., 1886, Transcendentalism in New England: A History, New York: G. P. Putnam’s Sons.
  • Furtak, Rick Anthony, 2003, “Thoreau’s Emotional Stoicism,” Journal of Speculative Philosophy, 17: 122–132.
  • –––, 2007, “Skepticism and Perceptual Faith: Henry David Thoreau and Stanley Cavell on Seeing and Believing,” Transactions of the Charles Sanders Peirce Society, 43: 542–561.
  • Furtak, Rick Anthony; Ellsworth, Jonathan; and Reid, James D., editors, 2012, Thoreau’s Importance for Philosophy, New York: Fordham University Press.
  • Garber, Frederick, 1977, Thoreau’s Redemptive Imagination, New York: New York University Press.
  • Goodman, Russell B., 2012, “Thoreau and the Body,” in Furtak, Ellsworth, and Reid 2012, 31–42.
  • Hahn, Stephen, 2000, On Thoreau, Belmont, CA: Wadsworth.
  • Harding, Walter, 1962, The Days of Henry Thoreau: A Biography, New York: Dover.
  • Heidegger, Martin, 1996, Being and Time, Joan Stambaugh (trans.), Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Hodder, Alan D., 2001, Thoreau’s Ecstatic Witness, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • –––, 2010, “’Let Him Be to Me a Spirit’: Paradoxes of True Friendship in Emerson and Thoreau,” in Lysaker and Rossi (eds.) 2010, 127–147.
  • Jolley, Kelly Dean, 1996, “Walden: Philosophy and Knowledge of Humankind,” Reason Papers, 21: 36–52.
  • Kuklick, Bruce, 2001, A History of Philosophy in America: 1720–2000, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Lysaker, John T.; and Rossi, William (eds.), 2010, Emerson and Thoreau: Figures of Friendship, Bloomington and Indianapolis: Indiana University Press.
  • McGregor, Robert Kuhn, 1997, A Wider View of the Universe: Henry Thoreau’s Study of Nature, Urbana: University of Illinois Press.
  • McKenzie, Jonathan, 2016, The Political Thought of Henry David Thoreau, Lexington: University of Kentucky Press.
  • Milder, Robert, 1995, Reimagining Thoreau, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Mooney, Edward, 2009, Lost Intimacy in American Thought: Recovering Personal Philosophy from Thoreau to Cavell, London: Continuum.
  • –––, 2015, Excursions with Thoreau: Poetry, Philosophy, Religion, London: Bloomsbury Academic.
  • Moran, Michael, 1967, “Henry David Thoreau,” in The Encyclopedia of Philosophy, ed. Paul Edwards, New York: Free Press, 8: 121–123.
  • Nagley, Winfield, 1954, “Thoreau on Attachment, Detachment, and Non-Attachment,” Philosophy East and West, 3: 307–320.
  • Norton, Bryan G., 1999, “Pragmatism, Adaptive Management, and Sustainability,” Environmental Values, 8: 451–466.
  • Oelschlaeger, Max, 1991, The Idea of Wilderness, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Peck, H. Daniel, 1990, Thoreau’s Morning Work, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Reid, James D., 2012, “Speaking Extravagantly: Philosophical Territory and Eccentricity in Walden,” in Furtak, Ellsworth, and Reid 2012, 43–67.
  • Richardson, Robert, 1986, Henry Thoreau: A Life of the Mind, Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press.
  • Saito, Naoko, 2012, “Is Thoreau More Cosmopolitan than Dewey?,” Philosophy and Literature, 7: 71–85.
  • Sattelmeyer, Robert, 1988, Thoreau’s Reading, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Sayre, Robert, 1977, Thoreau and the American Indians, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Slicer, Deborah, 2013, “Thoreau’s Evanescence,” Philosophy and Literature, 37: 179–198.
  • Slovic, Scott, 1992, Seeking Awareness in American Nature Writing, Salt Lake City: University of Utah Press.
  • Tauber, Alfred, 2001, Henry David Thoreau and the Moral Agency of Knowing, Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press.
  • Taylor, Bob Pepperman, 1992, Our Limits Transgressed: Environmental Political Thought in America, Lawrence: University Press of Kansas.
  • –––, 1994, “Henry Thoreau, Nature, and American Democracy,” Journal of Social Philosophy, 25: 46–64.
  • Vilhauer, Benjamin, 2008, “The Theme of Time in Thoreau’s Cape Cod,” The Concord Saunterer, 16: 33–44.
  • Walls, Laura Dassow, 1995, Seeing New Worlds: Henry David Thoreau and Nineteenth-Century Natural Science, Madison: University of Wisconsin Press.
  • –––, 2012, “Articulating a Huckleberry Cosmos: Thoreau’s Moral Ecology of Knowledge,” in Furtak, Ellsworth, and Reid 2012, 91–111.
  • Ward, Andrew, 2007, “Ethics and Observation: Dewey, Thoreau, and Harman,” Metaphilosophy, 38: 591–611.
  • Wilshire, Bruce, 2000, The Primal Roots of American Philosophy, University Park, PA: Penn State Press.
  • Wilson, Jeffrey, 2004, “Autobiography as Critique in Thoreau,” Journal of Philosophical Research, 29: 29–46.

Other Internet Resources

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