Atheism and Agnosticism

First published Wed Aug 2, 2017

The purpose of this entry is to explore how atheism and agnosticism are related to theism and, more importantly, to each other. This requires examining the surprisingly contentious issue of how best to define the terms “atheism” and “agnosticism”. Settling this issue, at least for the purposes of this entry, will set the stage for discussing an important distinction between global atheism and local atheism, which in turn will be helpful for distinguishing different forms of agnosticism. Examination of an argument in support of a modest form of agnosticism will ensue, followed by discussion of three arguments for atheism and one argument against a more ambitious form of agnosticism.

1. Definitions of “Atheism”

“Atheism” is typically defined in terms of “theism”. Theism, in turn, is best understood as a proposition—something that is either true or false. It is often defined as “the belief that God exists”, but here “belief” means “something believed”. It refers to the propositional content of belief, not to the attitude or psychological state of believing. This is why it makes sense to say that theism is true or false and to argue for or against theism. If, however, “atheism” is defined in terms of theism and theism is the proposition that God exists and not the psychological condition of believing that there is a God, then it follows that atheism is not the absence of the psychological condition of believing that God exists (more on this below). The “a-” in “atheism” must be understood as negation instead of absence, as “not” instead of “without”. Therefore, in philosophy at least, atheism should be construed as the proposition that God does not exist (or, more broadly, the proposition that there are no gods).

This definition has the added virtue of making atheism a direct answer to one of the most important metaphysical questions in philosophy of religion, namely, “Is there a God?” There are only two possible direct answers to this question: “yes”, which is theism, and “no”, which is atheism. Answers like “I don’t know”, “no one knows”, “I don’t care”, “an affirmative answer has never been established”, or “the question is meaningless” are not direct answers to this question.

While identifying atheism with the metaphysical claim that there is no God (or that there are no gods) is particularly useful for doing philosophy, it is important to recognize that the term “atheism” is polysemous—i.e., it has more than one related meaning—even within philosophy. For example, many writers at least implicitly identify atheism with a positive metaphysical theory like naturalism or even materialism. Given this sense of the word, the meaning of “atheism” is not straightforwardly derived from the meaning of “theism”. While this might seem etymologically bizarre, perhaps a case can be made for the claim that something like (metaphysical) naturalism was originally labeled “atheism” only because of the cultural dominance of non-naturalist forms of theism, not because the view being labeled was nothing more than the denial of theism. On this view, there would have been atheists even if no theists ever existed—they just wouldn’t have been called “atheists”. (Baggini [2003] suggests this line of thought, though his “official” definition is the standard metaphysical one.) Although this definition of “atheism” is a legitimate one, it is often accompanied by fallacious inferences from the (alleged) falsity or probable falsity of atheism (= naturalism) to the truth or probable truth of theism.

Departing even more radically from the norm in philosophy, a few philosophers and quite a few non-philosophers claim that “atheism” shouldn’t be defined as a proposition at all, even if theism is a proposition. Instead, “atheism” should be defined as a psychological state: the state of not believing in the existence of God (or gods). This view was famously proposed by the philosopher Antony Flew and arguably played a role in his (1972) defense of an alleged presumption of “atheism”. The editors of the Oxford Handbook of Atheism (Bullivant & Ruse 2013) also favor this definition and one of them, Stephen Bullivant (2013), defends it on grounds of scholarly utility. His argument is that this definition can best serve as an umbrella term for a wide variety of positions that have been identified with atheism. Scholars can then use adjectives like “strong” and “weak” to develop a taxonomy that differentiates various specific atheisms. Unfortunately, this argument overlooks the fact that, if atheism is defined as a psychological state, then no proposition can count as a form of atheism because a proposition is not a psychological state. This undermines his argument in defense of Flew’s definition; for it implies that what he calls “strong atheism”—the proposition (or belief in the sense of “something believed”) that there is no God—is not really a variety of atheism at all. In short, his proposed “umbrella” term leaves strong atheism out in the rain.

Although Flew’s definition of “atheism” fails as an umbrella term, it is certainly a legitimate definition in the sense that it reports how a significant number of people use the term. Again, there is more than one “correct” definition of “atheism”. The issue for philosophy is which definition is the most useful for scholarly or, more narrowly, philosophical purposes. In other contexts, of course, the issue of how to define “atheism” or “atheist” may look very different. For example, in some contexts the crucial issue may be which definition of “atheist” (as opposed to “atheism”) is the most useful politically, especially in light of the bigotry that those who identify as atheists face. The fact that there is strength in numbers may recommend a very inclusive definition of “atheist” that brings anyone who is not a theist into the fold. Having said that, one would think that it would further no good cause, political or otherwise, to attack fellow non-theists who do not identify as atheists simply because they choose to use the term “atheist” in some other, equally legitimate sense.

If atheism is usually and best understood in philosophy as the metaphysical claim that God does not exist, then what, one might wonder, should philosophers do with the popular term, “New Atheism”? Philosophers write articles on and have devoted journal issues (French & Wettstein 2013) to the New Atheism, but there is nothing close to a consensus on how that term should be defined. Fortunately, there is no real need for one, because the term “New Atheism” does not pick out some distinctive philosophical position or phenomenon. Instead, it is a popular label for a movement prominently represented by four authors—Richard Dawkins, Daniel Dennett, Sam Harris, and Christopher Hitchens—whose work is uniformly critical of religion, but beyond that appears to be unified only by timing and popularity. Further, one might question what is new about the New Atheism. The specific criticisms of religion and of arguments used to defend religion are not new. For example, an arguably more sophisticated and convincing version of Dawkins’ central atheistic argument can be found in Hume’s Dialogues (Wielenberg 2009). Also, while Dennett (2006) makes a passionate call for the scientific study of religion as a natural phenomenon, such study existed long before this call. Indeed, even the cognitive science of religion was well established by the 1990s, and the anthropology of religion can be traced back at least to the nineteenth century. Shifting from content to style, many are surprised by the militancy of some New Atheists, but there were plenty of aggressive atheists who were quite disrespectful to religion long before Harris, Dawkins, and Hitchens. (Dennett is not especially militant.) Finally, the stereotype that New Atheism is religious or quasi-religious or ideological in some unprecedented way is clearly a false one and one that New Atheists reject. (For elaboration of these points, see Zenk 2013.)

Another subcategory of atheism is “friendly atheism”, which William Rowe (1979) defines as the position that, although God does not exist, some (intellectually sophisticated) people are justified in believing that God exists. Rowe, a friendly atheist himself, contrasts friendly atheism with unfriendly atheism and indifferent atheism. Unfriendly atheism is the view that atheism is true and that no (sophisticated) theistic belief is justified. In spite of its highly misleading name, this view might be held by the friendliest, most open-minded and religiously tolerant person imaginable. Finally, although Rowe refers to “indifferent atheism” as a “position”, it is not a proposition but instead a psychological state, specifically, the state of being an atheist who is neither friendly nor unfriendly—that is, who neither believes that friendly atheism is true nor believes that unfriendly atheism is true.

Perhaps an even more interesting distinction is between pro-God atheism and anti-God atheism. A pro-God atheist like John Schellenberg (who coined the term) is someone who in some real sense loves God or at least the idea of God, who tries very hard to imagine what sorts of wonderful worlds such a being might create (instead of just assuming that such a being would create a world something like the world we observe), and who (at least partly) for that very reason believes that God does not exist. Such an atheist might be sympathetic to the following sentiments:

It is an insult to God to believe in God. For on the one hand it is to suppose that he has perpetrated acts of incalculable cruelty. On the other hand, it is to suppose that he has perversely given his human creatures an instrument—their intellect—which must inevitably lead them, if they are dispassionate and honest, to deny his existence. It is tempting to conclude that if he exists, it is the atheists and agnostics that he loves best, among those with any pretensions to education. For they are the ones who have taken him most seriously. (Strawson 1990)

By contrast, anti-God atheists like Thomas Nagel (1997: 130–131) find the whole idea of a God offensive and hence not only believe but also hope very much that no such being exists. Nagel is often called an “antitheist” (e.g., Kahane 2011), but that term is purposely avoided here, as it has many different senses (Kahane 2011: note 9). Also, in none of those senses is one required to be an atheist in order to be an antitheist, so antitheism is not a variety of atheism.

2. Definitions of “Agnosticism”

The terms “agnostic” and “agnosticism” were famously coined in the late nineteenth century by the English biologist, T.H. Huxley. He said that he originally

invented the word “Agnostic” to denote people who, like [himself], confess themselves to be hopelessly ignorant concerning a variety of matters, about which metaphysicians and theologians, both orthodox and heterodox, dogmatise with the utmost confidence. (1884)

including of course the matter of God’s existence. He did not, however, define “agnosticism” simply as the state of being an agnostic. Instead, he often used that term to refer to a normative epistemological principle, something similar to (though weaker than) what we now call “evidentialism”. Roughly, Huxley’s principle says that it is wrong to say that one knows or believes that a proposition is true without logically satisfactory evidence (Huxley 1884 and 1889). But it was Huxley’s application of this principle to theistic and atheistic belief that ultimately had the greatest influence on the meaning of the term. He argued that, since neither of those beliefs is adequately supported by evidence, we ought to suspend judgment on the issue of whether or not there is a God.

Nowadays, the term “agnostic” is often used (when the issue is God’s existence) to refer to those who follow the recommendation expressed in the conclusion of Huxley’s argument: an agnostic is a person who has entertained the proposition that there is a God but believes neither that it is true nor that it is false. Not surprisingly, then, the term “agnosticism” is often defined, both in and outside of philosophy, not as a principle or any other sort of proposition but instead as the psychological state of being an agnostic. Call this the “psychological” sense of the term. It is certainly useful to have a term to refer to people who are neither theists nor atheists, but philosophers might wish that some other term besides “agnostic” (“theological skeptic”, perhaps?) were used. The problem is that it is also very useful for philosophical purposes to have a name for the epistemological position that follows from the premise of Huxley’s argument, the position that neither theism nor atheism is known, or most ambitiously, that neither the belief that God exists nor the belief that God does not exist has positive epistemic status of any sort. Just as the metaphysical question of God’s existence is central to philosophy of religion, so too is the epistemological question of whether or not theism or atheism is known or has some other sort of positive epistemic status. And given the etymology of “agnostic”, what better term could there be for a negative answer to that epistemological question than “agnosticism”? Further, as suggested earlier, it is, for very good reason, typical in philosophy to use the suffix “-ism” to refer to a proposition instead of to a state or condition, since only the former can sensibly be tested by argument.

If, however, “agnosticism” is defined as a proposition, then “agnostic” must be defined in terms of “agnosticism” instead of the other way around. Specifically, “agnostic” must be defined as a person who believes that the proposition “agnosticism” is true instead of “agnosticism” being defined as the state of being an agnostic. And if the proposition in question is that neither theism nor atheism is known to be true, then the term “agnostic” can no longer serve as a label for those who are neither theists nor atheists since one can consistently believe that atheism (or theism) is true while denying that atheism (or theism) is known to be true.

When used in this epistemological sense, the term “agnosticism” can very naturally be extended beyond the issue of what is or can be known to cover a large family of positions, depending on what sort of “positive epistemic status” is at issue. For example, it might be identified with any of the following positions: that neither theistic belief nor atheistic belief is justified, that neither theistic belief nor atheistic belief is rationally required, that neither belief is rationally permissible, that neither has warrant, that neither is reasonable, or that neither is probable. Also, in order to avoid the vexed issue of the nature of knowledge, one can simply distinguish as distinct members of the “agnosticism family” each of the following claims about intellectually sophisticated people: (i) neither theism nor atheism is adequately supported by the internal states of such people, (ii) neither theistic belief nor atheistic belief coheres with the rest of their beliefs, (iii) neither theistic nor atheistic belief results from reliable belief-producing processes, (iv) neither theistic belief nor atheistic belief results from faculties aimed at truth that are functioning properly in an appropriate environment, and so on.

Notice too that, even if agnosticism were defined as the rather extreme position that neither theistic belief nor atheistic belief ever has positive epistemic status of any sort, it wouldn’t follow by definition that no agnostic is either a theist or an atheist. Some fideists, for example, believe that neither atheistic belief nor theistic belief is supported or sanctioned in any way at all by reason because reason leaves the matter of God’s existence completely unresolved. Yet they have faith that God exists and such faith (at least in some cases) involves belief. Thus, some fideists are extreme agnostics in the epistemological sense even though they are not agnostics in the psychological sense.

It is also worth mentioning that, even in Huxley’s time, some apophatic theists embraced the term “agnostic”, claiming that all good Christians worshipped an “unknown God”. More recently, some atheists proudly call themselves “agnostic atheists”, although with further reflection the symmetry between this position and fideism might give them pause. More likely, though, what is being claimed by these self-identified agnostic atheists is that, while their belief that God does not exist has positive epistemic status of some sort (minimally, it is not irrational), it does not have the sort of positive epistemic status that can turn true belief into knowledge.

No doubt both senses of “agnosticism”, the psychological and the epistemological, will continue to be used both inside and outside of philosophy. Hopefully, context will help to disambiguate. In the remainder of this entry, however, the term “agnosticism” will be used in its epistemological sense. This makes a huge difference to the issue of justification. Consider, for example, this passage written by the agnostic, Anthony Kenny (1983: 84–85):

I do not myself know of any argument for the existence of God which I find convincing; in all of them I think I can find flaws. Equally, I do not know of any argument against the existence of God which is totally convincing; in the arguments I know against the existence of God I can equally find flaws. So that my own position on the existence of God is agnostic.

It is one thing to ask whether Kenny’s inability to find arguments that convince him of God’s existence or non-existence justifies him personally in suspending judgment about the existence of God. It is quite another to ask whether this inability (or anything else) would justify his believing that no one (or at least no one who is sufficiently intelligent and well-informed) has a justified belief about God’s existence.

If agnosticism (in one sense of the word) is the position that neither theism nor atheism is known, then it might be useful to use the term “gnosticism” to refer to the contradictory of that position, that is, to the position that either theism or atheism is known. That view would, of course, come in two flavors: theistic gnosticism—the view that theism is known (and hence atheism is not)—and atheistic gnosticism—the view that atheism is known (and hence theism is not).

3. Global Atheism Versus Local Atheisms

Jeanine Diller (2016) points out that, just as most theists have a particular concept of God in mind when they assert that God exists, most atheists have a particular concept of God in mind when they assert that God does not exist. Indeed, many atheists are only vaguely aware of the variety of concepts of God that there are. For example, there are the Gods of classical and neo-classical theism: the Anselmian God, for instance, or, more modestly, the all-powerful, all-knowing, and perfectly good creator-God that receives so much attention in contemporary philosophy of religion. There are also the Gods of specific Western theistic religions like Christianity, Islam, Judaism, and Sikhism, which may or may not be best understood as classical or neo-classical Gods. There are also panentheistic and process theistic Gods, as well as a variety of other God-concepts, both of Western and non-Western origin, that are largely ignored by even the most well-informed atheists. (Philosophically sophisticated theists, for their part, often act as if refuting naturalism establishes the existence of the particular sort of God in which they believe.) Diller distinguishes local atheism, which denies the existence of one sort of God, from global atheism, which is the proposition that there are no Gods of any sort—that all legitimate concepts of God lack instances.

Global atheism is a very difficult position to justify (Diller 2016: 11–16). Indeed, very few atheists have any good reason to believe that it is true since the vast majority of atheists have made no attempt to reflect on more than one or two of the many legitimate concepts of God that exist both inside and outside of various religious communities. Nor have they reflected on what criteria must be satisfied in order for a concept of God to count as “legitimate”, let alone on the possibility of legitimate God concepts that have not yet been conceived and on the implications of that possibility for the issue of whether or not global atheism is justified. Furthermore, the most ambitious atheistic arguments popular with philosophers, which attempt to show that the concept of God is incoherent or that God’s existence is logically incompatible either with the existence of certain sorts of evil or with the existence of certain sorts of non-belief [Schellenberg 2007]), certainly won’t suffice to justify global atheism; for even if they are sound, they assume that to be God a being must be omnipotent, omniscient, and perfectly good, and as the character Cleanthes points out at the beginning of Part XI of Hume’s Dialogues (see also Nagasawa 2008), there are religiously adequate God-concepts that don’t require God to have those attributes.

Global atheists might object that, even if atheism and (metaphysical) naturalism are not identical, a belief in the former can be based on a belief in the latter; in other words, if one has good arguments for the view that nature is a closed system, then that removes any burden to consider each God-concept separately, so long as all legitimate concepts of God imply that God is a supernatural entity—that is, an entity that is not natural, yet affects nature. Whether or not this strategy for justifying global atheism works depends on whether it is possible to define “naturalism” narrowly enough to imply the non-existence of all Gods but not so narrowly that no convincing arguments can be given for its truth. This is no easy task, especially given recent work on naturalist forms of theism (e.g., Bishop 2008; Buckareff & Nagasawa 2016: Part V; Diller & Kasher 2013: Part X; and Ellis 2014). Nor is it obvious that evidential arguments from evil can be extended to cover all legitimate God concepts, though if all genuine theisms entail that ultimate reality is both aligned with the good and salvific (in some religiously adequate sense of “ultimate” and “salvific”), then perhaps they can. The crucial point, however, is that no one has yet made that case.

Concerning the issue of what exactly counts as a legitimate or religiously adequate concept of God, various approaches might be taken. One general strategy is to identify the religious role or roles that anything deserving of the name or title “God” must play and then distinguish legitimate or illegitimate concepts of God depending on whether anything falling under the concept in question could or would successfully play that role. (See, for example, Le Poidevin 2010: 52; and Leftow 2016: 66–71.)

A second approach (compatible with the first) assumes plausibly that the word “God” is a title instead of a proper name and then asks what qualifications are required to bear that title (Pike 1970). The fact that most titles indicate either rank or function suggests that the meaning of “God” has something to do either with occupying a position in a hierarchy or performing some function. For example, the common dictionary definition of “God” as the Supreme Being and the Anselmian idea of God as the greatest possible being suggest that the title “God” is rank-indicating, while the definition of “God” as “ruler of the universe” fits well with the view that “God” is function-indicating and explains why the ordinary class noun, “god”, might be defined as “ruler of some part of the universe or of some sphere of human activity” (e.g., Neptune, god of the sea, and Mars, god of war).

A third approach (compatible with the first two) is to start from the close connection in meaning between “God” and “worship”. Worship appears to be essential to theistic religions and thus an essential role that any being must play to qualify for the title “God” is to be an appropriate object of worship. Indeed, although there is risk of circularity here if “worship” is defined in terms of the actions or attitudes appropriately directed towards “God”, it would not be obviously mistaken to claim that being worthy of some form of religious worship is not just necessary for divinity but sufficient as well, especially if worthiness of worship entails worthiness of allegiance. Of course, forms of worship vary widely from one religion to another, so even if worthiness of worship is the sole defining feature of a God, that doesn’t mean that beliefs about what these Gods are like won’t vary widely from one religion to another. In some religions, especially (but not only) certain Western monotheistic ones, worship involves total devotion and unconditional commitment. To be worthy of that sort of worship (if that is even possible when the pool of potential worshipers are autonomous agents like most adult humans) requires an especially impressive God, though it is controversial whether or not it requires a perfect one.

If the ambiguity that results from defining “God” in terms of worthiness of worship is virtuous, then one might be tempted to adopt the following account of global atheism and its opposite, “versatile theism”:

global atheism: there are no beings worthy of religious worship.

versatile theism: there exists at least one being that is worthy of some form of religious worship.

Notice that on this account of “global atheism”, the atheist only denies the existence of beings that are worthy of worship. Thus, not even a global atheist is committed to denying the existence of everything that someone has called a god or “God”. For example, even if the ancient Egyptians worshipped the Sun and regarded it as worthy of such worship, the global atheist need not deny the existence of the Sun. Instead, the global atheist can claim that the ancient Egyptians were mistaken in thinking that the Sun is worthy of religious worship.

Similarly, consider this passage at the beginning of Section XI of David Hume’s Natural History of Religion:

If we examine, without prejudice, the ancient heathen mythology, as contained in the poets, we shall not discover in it any such monstrous absurdity, as we may at first be apt to apprehend. Where is the difficulty in conceiving, that the same powers or principles, whatever they were, which formed this visible world, men and animals, produced also a species of intelligent creatures, of more refined substance and greater authority than the rest? That these creatures may be capricious, revengeful, passionate, voluptuous, is easily conceived; nor is any circumstance more apt, among ourselves, to engender such vices, than the license of absolute authority. And in short, the whole mythological system is so natural, that, in the vast variety of planets and world[s], contained in this universe, it seems more than probable, that, somewhere or other, it is really carried into execution. (Hume [1757] 1956: 53, emphasis added)

There is much debate about whether Hume was an atheist or a deist or neither, but no one uses this passage to support the view that he was actually a polytheist. Perhaps this is because, even if there are natural alien beings that, much like the ancient Greek and Roman gods, are far superior in power to humans but quite similar in their moral and other psychological qualities, presumably no one, at least nowadays, would be tempted to regard them as worthy of religious worship.

One possible flaw in the proposed account of global atheism is that it seems to imply overlap between deism and atheism. Of course, it wasn’t that long ago when all deists were widely regarded as atheists. These days, however, the term “deistic atheist” or “atheistic deist” has an oxymoronic ring to it. Of course, not all deists would count as atheists on the proposed account, but some would. For example, consider a deist who believes that, while a supernatural person intentionally designed the universe, that deity did not specifically intend for intelligent life to evolve and has no interest whatsoever in the condition or fate of such life. Such a deity would not be worthy of anyone’s worship, especially if worthiness of worship entails worthiness of allegiance, and so would arguably not be a (theistic) god, which implies that an atheist could on the proposed definition consistently believe in the existence of such a deity. Perhaps, then, “global atheism” should be defined as the position that both versatile theism and (versatile) deism are false—that there are no beings worthy of religious worship and also no cosmic creators or intelligent designers whether worthy of worship (and allegiance) or not. Even this account of “global atheism”, however, may not be sufficiently inclusive since there are religious roles closely associated with the title “God” (and thus arguably legitimate notions of God) that could be played by something that is neither an appropriate object of worship nor a cosmic designer or creator.

4. An Argument for Agnosticism

According to one relatively modest form of agnosticism, neither versatile theism nor its denial, global atheism, is known to be true. Robin Le Poidevin (2010: 76) argues for this position as follows:

  • (1)There is no firm basis upon which to judge that theism or atheism is intrinsically more probable than the other.
  • (2)There is no firm basis upon which to judge that the total evidence favors theism or atheism over the other.
It follows from (1) and (2) that
  • (3)There is no firm basis upon which to judge that theism or atheism is more probable than the other.
It follows from (3) that
  • (4)Agnosticism is true: neither theism nor atheism is known to be true.

Le Poidevin takes “theism” in its broadest sense (which I call to refer to the proposition that there exists a being that is the ultimate and intentional cause of the universe’s existence and the ultimate source of love and moral knowledge (2010: 52). (He doesn’t use the term “versatile theism”, but this would be his account of its meaning.) By the “intrinsic probability” of a proposition, he means, roughly, the probability that a proposition has “before the evidence starts to come in” (2010: 49). This probability depends solely on a priori considerations like the intrinsic features of the content of the proposition in question (e.g., the size of that content).

Le Poidevin defends the first premise of this argument by stating that, while intrinsic probability plausibly depends inversely on the specificity of a claim (the less specific the claim, the more ways there are for it to be true and so the more probable it is that it is true), it is impossible to show that versatile theism is more specific or less specific than its denial. This defense appears to be incomplete, for Le Poidevin never shows that the intrinsic probability of a proposition depends only on its specificity, and there are good reasons to believe that this is not the case (see, for example, Swinburne 2001: 80–102). Le Poidevin could respond, however, that specificity is the only uncontroversial criterion of intrinsic probability, and this lack of consensus on other criteria is all that is needed to adequately defend premise (1).

One way to defend the second premise is to review the relevant evidence and argue that it is ambiguous (Le Poidevin 2010: chapter 4; and Draper 2002). Another way is to point out that atheism, which is just the proposition that theism is false, is compatible with a variety of very different hypotheses, and these hypotheses vary widely in how well they account for the total evidence. Thus, to assess how well atheism accounts for the total evidence, one would have to calculate a weighted average of how well these different atheistic hypotheses account for the total evidence, where the weights would be the different intrinsic probabilities of each of these atheistic hypotheses. This task seems prohibitively difficult (Draper 2016) and in any case has not been attempted, which supports the claim that there is no firm basis upon which to judge whether the total evidence supports theism or atheism.

So-called “Reformed epistemologists” (e.g., Plantinga 2000) might challenge the second premise of the argument on the grounds that many beliefs about God, like many beliefs about the past, are “properly basic”—a result of the functioning of a basic cognitive faculty called the “sensus divinitatis”—and so are, in effect, a part of the total evidence with respect to which the probability of any statement depends. The agnostic, however, might reply that this sense of the divine, unlike memory, operates at most sporadically and far from universally. Also, unlike other basic cognitive faculties, it can easily be resisted, and the existence of the beliefs it is supposed to produce can easily be explained without supposing that the faculty exists at all. Thus, the analogy to memory is weak. Therefore, in the absence of some firmer basis upon which to judge that beliefs about God are properly a part of the foundation of some theists’ belief systems, premise (2) stands.

Of course, even if the two premises of Le Poidevin’s argument are true, it doesn’t follow that the argument is a good one. For the argument also contains two inferences (from steps 1 and 2 to step 3 and from step 3 to step 4), neither of which is obviously correct. Concerning the first inference, suppose, for example, that even though there is no firm basis upon which to judge which of theism and atheism is intrinsically more probable (that is, Le Poidevin’s first premise is true), there is firm basis upon which to judge that theism is not many times more probable intrinsically than some specific version of atheism, say, reductive physicalism. And suppose that, even though there is no firm basis upon which to judge which of theism and atheism is favored by the total evidence (that is, Le Poidevin’s second premise is true), there is firm basis upon which to judge that the total evidence very strongly favors reductive physicalism over theism (in the sense that it is antecedently very many times more probable given reductive physicalism than it is given theism). Then it follows that both of Le Poidevin’s premises are true and yet (3) is false: there is a firm basis (that includes the odds version of Bayes’ theorem applied to theism and reductive physicalism instead of to theism and atheism) to judge that reductive physicalism is more probable or even many times more probable than theism and hence that theism is probably or even very probably false. Arguably, no similar strategy could be used to show that theism is probably true in spite of Le Poidevin’s premises both being true. So it may be that Le Poidevin’s premises, if adequately supported, establish that theistic gnosticism is false (that is, that either agnosticism or atheistic gnosticism is true) even if they don’t establish that agnosticism is true.

5. An Argument for Global Atheism?

Almost all well-known arguments for atheism are arguments for a particular version of local atheism. One possible exception to this rule is an argument recently made popular by some New Atheists, although it was not invented by them. Gary Gutting (2013) calls this argument the “no arguments argument” for atheism:

  • (1)The absence of good reasons to believe that God exists is itself a good reason to believe that God does not exist.
  • (2)There is no good reason to believe that God exists.
It follows from (1) and (2) that
  • (3)There is good reason to believe that God does not exist.

Notice the obvious relevance of this argument to agnosticism. According to one prominent member of the agnosticism family, we have no good reason to believe that God exists and no good reason to believe that God does not exist. Clearly, if the first premise of this argument is true, then this version of agnosticism must be false.

Can the no arguments argument be construed as an argument for global atheism? One might object that it is not, strictly speaking, an argument for any sort of atheism since its conclusion is not that atheism is true but instead that there is good reason to believe that atheism is true. But that is just a quibble. Ultimately, whether this argument can be used to defend global atheism depends on how its first premise is defended.

The usual way of defending it is to derive it from some general principle according to which lacking grounds for claims of a certain sort is good reason to reject those claims. The restriction of this principle to claims “of a certain sort” is crucial, since the principle that the absence of grounds for a claim is in all cases a good reason to believe that the claim is false is rather obviously false. One might, for example, lack grounds for believing that the next time one flips a coin it will come up heads, but that is not a good reason to believe that it won’t come up heads.

A more promising approach restricts the principle to existence claims, thereby turning it into a version of Ockham’s razor. According to this version of the principle, the absence of grounds supporting a positive existential statement (like “God exists”—however “God” is understood) is a good reason to believe that the statement is false (McLaughlin 1984). One objection to this principle is that not every sort of thing is such that, if it existed, then we would likely have good reason to believe that it exists. Consider, for example, intelligent life in distant galaxies (cf. Morris 1985).

Perhaps, however, an even more narrowly restricted principle would do the trick: whenever the assumption that a positive existential claim is true would lead one to expect to have grounds for its truth, the absence of such grounds is a good reason to believe that the claim is false. It might then be argued that (i) a God would be likely to provide us with convincing evidence of Her existence and so (ii) the absence of such evidence is a good reason to believe that God does not exist. This transforms the no arguments argument into an argument from divine hiddenness. It also transforms it into at best an argument for local atheism, since even if the God of, say, classical theism would not hide, not all legitimate God-concepts are such that a being instantiating that concept would be likely to provide us with convincing evidence of its existence.

6. Two Arguments for Local Atheism

6.1. How to Argue for Local Atheism

The sort of God in whose non-existence philosophers seem most interested is the eternal, non-physical, omnipotent, omniscient, and omnibenevolent (i.e., morally perfect) creator-God worshipped by many theologically orthodox Muslims, Jews, and Christians. Let’s call the proposition that a God of this sort exists “omni-theism”. One interesting question, then, is how best to argue for atheism understood locally as the proposition that omni-theism is false.

It is often claimed that a good argument for atheism is impossible because, while it is at least possible to prove that something of a certain sort exists, it is impossible to prove that nothing of that sort exists. One reason to reject this claim is that the descriptions of some kinds of objects are self-contradictory. For example, we can prove that no circular square exists because such an object would have to be both circular and non-circular, which is impossible. Thus, one way to argue for the nonexistence of the God of omni-theism (or “omni-God” for short) is to argue that such a God is an impossible object like a circular square.

Many attempts have been made to construct such arguments. For example, it has been claimed that an omnibenevolent being would be impeccable and so incapable of wrongdoing, while an omnipotent being would be quite capable of doing things that would be wrong to do. There are, however, sophisticated and plausible replies to arguments like these. More importantly, even if such an argument succeeded, omni-theists could plausibly claim that, by “omnipotent”, they mean, not maximally powerful, but optimally powerful, where the optimal degree of power may not be maximal if maximal power rules out possessing the optimal degree of some other perfection like moral goodness.

Similar problems face attempts to show that omni-theism must be false because it is incompatible with certain known facts about the world. Such arguments typically depend on detailed and contested interpretations of divine attributes like omnibenevolence.

A very different approach is based on the idea that disproof need not be demonstrative. The goal of this approach is to show that the existence of an omni-God is so improbable that confident belief in the non-existence of such a God is justified. Two such arguments are discussed in detail below: the “low priors argument” and the “decisive evidence argument”. Each of these arguments employs the same specific strategy, which is to argue that some alternative hypothesis to omni-theism is many times more probable than omni-theism. This doesn’t imply that the alternative hypothesis is probably true, but it does imply that omni-theism is very probably false. In the case of the second argument, the alternative hypothesis (aesthetic deism) is arguably a form of theism, and even in the case of the first argument it is arguable that the alternative hypothesis (source physicalism) is compatible with some forms of theism (in particular ones in which God is an emergent entity). This is not a problem for either argument, however, precisely because both are arguments for local atheism instead of global atheism.

6.2 The Low Priors Argument

The basic idea behind the low priors argument is that, even if the agnostic is right that, when it comes to God’s existence, the evidence is ambiguous or absent altogether, what follows is not that theism has a middling probability all things considered, but instead that theism is very probably false. This is said to follow because theism starts out with a very low probability before taking into account any evidence. (“Evidence” in this context refers to factors extrinsic to a hypothesis that raise or lower its probability.) Since ambiguous or absent evidence has no effect on that prior or intrinsic probability, the posterior or all-things-considered probability of theism is also very low. If, however, theism is very probably false, then atheism must be very probably true and this implies (according to the defender of the argument) that atheistic belief is justified. (This last alleged implication is examined in section 7.)

This sort of argument is very relevant to the issue of which of atheism and theism is the appropriate “default” position. If theism has a sufficiently low intrinsic probability, then atheism is arguably the correct default position in the sense that ambiguous or absent evidence will justify, not suspending judgment on the issue of God’s existence, but instead believing that God does not exist. This is why Le Poidevin’s argument for agnosticism includes, not just a premise asserting that the relevant evidence is ambiguous, but also one asserting that, at least in the case of versatile theism, we are in the dark when it comes to the issue of which of theism and atheism has a higher intrinsic probability. Unfortunately, much discussion of the issue of which position is the correct “default position” or of who has the “burden of proof” gets sidetracked by bad analogies to Santa Claus, flying spaghetti monsters, and Bertrand Russell’s ([1952] 1997) famous china teapot in elliptical orbit around the sun (see Garvey 2010 and van Inwagen 2012 for criticism of some of these analogies). The low priors argument implicitly addresses this important issue in a much more sophisticated and promising way.

In the version of the low priors argument formulated below, the basic approach described above is improved by comparing omni-theism, not simply to its denial, but instead to a more specific atheistic hypothesis called “source physicalism”. Unlike ontological physicalism, source physicalism is a claim about the source of mental entities, not about their nature. Source physicalists, whether they are ontological physicalists or ontological dualists, believe that the physical world existed before the mental world and caused the mental world to come into existence, which implies that all mental entities are causally dependent on physical entities. Further, even if they are ontological dualists, source physicalists need not claim that mental entities never cause physical entities or other mental entities, but they must claim that there would be no mental entities were it not for the prior existence (and causal powers) of one or more physical entities. The argument proceeds as follows:

  • (1)The total evidence does not favor omni-theism over source physicalism.
  • (2)Source physicalism is many times more probable intrinsically than omni-theism.
It follows from (1) and (2) that
  • (3)Source physicalism is many times more probable than omni-theism.
It follows from (3) that
  • (4)Omni-theism is very probably false.
It follows from (4) that
  • (5)Atheism (understood here as the denial of omni-theism) is very probably true.

Only the argument’s two premises—steps (1) and (2)—are controversial. The other steps in the argument all clearly follow from previous steps.

A thorough examination of the arguments for and against premise (1) is obviously impossible here, but it is worth mentioning that a defense of this premise need not claim that the known facts typically thought by natural theologians to favor omni-theism over competing hypotheses like source physicalism have no force. Instead, it could be claimed that whatever force they have is offset at least to some significant degree by more specific facts favoring source physicalism over omni-theism. Natural theologians routinely ignore these more specific facts and thus appear to commit what might be called “the fallacy of understated evidence”. More precisely, the point is this. Even when natural theologians successfully identify some general fact about a topic that is more probable given omni-theism than given source physicalism, they ignore other more specific facts about that same topic, facts that, given the general fact, appear to be significantly more probable given source physicalism than given omni-theism.

For example, even if omni-theism is supported by the general fact that the universe is complex, one should not ignore the more specific fact, discovered by scientists, that underlying this complexity at the level at which we experience the universe, is a much simpler early universe from which this complexity arose, and also a much simpler contemporary universe at the micro-level, one consisting of a relatively small number of different kinds of particles all of which exist in one of a relatively small number of different states. In short, it is important to take into account, not just the general fact that the universe that we directly experience with our senses is extremely complex, but also the more specific fact that two sorts of hidden simplicity within the universe can explain that complexity. Given that a complex universe exists, this more specific fact is exactly what one would expect on source physicalism, because, as the best natural theologians (e.g., Swinburne 2004) say, the complexity of the universe cries out for explanation in terms of something simpler. There is, however, no reason at all to expect this more specific fact on omni-theism since, if those same natural theologians are correct, then a simple God provides a simple explanation for the observed complexity of the universe whether or not that complexity is also explained by any simpler mediate physical causes.

Another example concerns consciousness. Its existence really does seem to be more likely given omni-theism than given source physicalism (and thus to raise the ratio of the probability of omni-theism to the probability of source physicalism). But we know a lot more about consciousness than just that it exists. We also know, thanks in part to the relatively new discipline of neuroscience, that conscious states in general and even the very integrity of our personalities, not to mention the apparent unity of the self, are dependent to a very high degree on physical events occurring in the brain. Given the general fact that consciousness exists, we have reason on source physicalism that we do not have on theism to expect these more specific facts. Given theism, it would not be surprising at all if our minds were more independent of the brain than they in fact are. After all, if omni-theism is true, then at least one mind, God’s, does not depend at all on anything physical. Thus, when the available evidence about consciousness is fully stated, it is far from clear that it significantly favors omni-theism.

Similar problems threaten to undermine appeals to fine-tuning—that is, appeals to the fact that a number of apparently independent physical parameters have values that, while not fixed by current physical theory, nevertheless happen to fall within a relatively narrow “life-permitting” range assuming no changes to other parameters. Arguably, given that fine-tuning is required for intelligent life and that an omni-God has reason to create intelligent life, we have more reason to expect fine-tuning on omni-theism than on source physicalism. Given such fine-tuning, however, it is far more surprising on omni-theism than on source physicalism that our universe is not teeming with intelligent life and that the most impressive intelligent organisms we know to exist are merely human: self-centered and aggressive primates who far too often kill, rape, and torture each other.

In fairness to omni-theism, however, most of those humans are moral agents and many have religious experiences apparently of God. The problem is that, while the existence of moral agents is “predicted” by omni-theism better than by source physicalism, it is also true that, given their existence, the variety and frequency of easily avoidable conditions that promote morally bad behavior and that severely limit the freedom, agency, and autonomy of countless human beings are much more likely on source physicalism. And while religious experiences apparently of God are no doubt more to be expected if an omni-God exists than if human beings are the product of blind physical forces, it is also true that, given that such experiences do occur, various facts about their distribution that should be surprising to theists are exactly what one would expect on source physicalism, such as the fact that many people never have them and the fact that those who do have them almost always have either a prior belief in God or extensive exposure to a theistic religion.

It seems, then, that when it comes to evidence favoring omni-theism over source physicalism, the Lord giveth and the Lord taketh away. Further, when combined with the fact that what we know about the level of well-being of sentient beings and the extent of their suffering is arguably vastly more probable on source physicalism than on theism, a very strong though admittedly controversial case for premise (1) can be made.

What about premise (2)? Again, a serious case can be made for its truth. Such a case first compares source physicalism, not to omni-theism, but to its opposite, source idealism. Source idealists believe that the mental world existed before the physical world and caused the physical world to come into existence. This view is consistent with both ontological idealism and ontological dualism, and also with physical entities having both physical and mental effects. It entails, however, that all physical entities are, ultimately, causally dependent on one or more mental entities, and so is not consistent with ontological physicalism. The symmetry of source physicalism and source idealism is a good pro tanto reason to believe they are equally probable intrinsically. They are equally specific, they have the same ontological commitments, neither can be formulated more elegantly than the other, and each appears to be equally coherent and equally intelligible. They differ on the issue of what is causally dependent on what, but if Hume is right and causal dependence relations can only be discovered by observation and not a priori, then that won’t affect the intrinsic probabilities of the two hypotheses.

Omni-theism, however, is a very specific version of source idealism; it entails that source idealism is true but goes far beyond source idealism by making a number of very specific claims about the sort of “mental world” that produced the physical world. For example, it adds the claim that a single mind created the physical universe and that this mind is not just powerful but specifically omnipotent and not just knowledgeable but specifically omniscient. In addition, it presupposes a number of controversial metaphysical and meta-ethical claims by asserting in addition that this being is both eternal and objectively morally perfect. If any of these specific claims and presuppositions is false, then omni-theism is false. Thus, omni-theism is a very specific and thus intrinsically very risky form of source idealism, and thus is many times less probable intrinsically than source idealism. Therefore, if, as argued above, source physicalism and source idealism are equally probable intrinsically, then it follows that premise (2) is true: source physicalism is many times more probable intrinsically than omni-theism.

6.3 The Decisive Evidence Argument

Notice that the general strategy of the particular version of the low priors argument discussed above is to find an alternative to omni-theism that is much less specific than omni-theism (and partly for that reason much more probable intrinsically), while at the same time having enough content of the right sort to fit the totality of the relevant data at least as well as theism does. In other words, the goal is to find a runner like source physicalism that begins the race with a large head start and thus wins by a large margin because it runs the race for supporting evidence and thus for probability at roughly the same speed as omni-theism does. This doesn’t show that source physicalism is probable (a “large margin” in this context means a large ratio of one probability to another, not a large difference between the probabilities), because there may be even better runners in the race; it does, however, show that omni-theism loses the race by a large margin and thus is very probably false.

An alternative strategy is to find a runner that begins the race tied with omni-theism, but runs the race for evidential support much faster than omni-theism does, thus once again winning the race by a margin that is sufficiently large for the rest of the argument to go through. A good name for an argument pursuing this second strategy is the “decisive evidence argument”. The choice of alternative hypothesis is crucial here just as it was in the low priors argument. One promising choice is “aesthetic deism”. (Another would be a more detailed version of source physicalism that, unlike source physicalism in general, makes the relevant data antecedently much more probable than theism does.) In order to help ensure that omni-theism and aesthetic deism begin the race at the same starting line—that is, have the same intrinsic probability—“aesthetic deism” is best defined in such a way that it is almost identical to omni-theism. Thus, it may be stipulated that, like omni-theism, aesthetic deism implies that an eternal, non-physical, omnipotent, and omniscient being created the physical world. The only difference, then, between the God of omni-theism and the deity of aesthetic deism is what motivates them. An omni-theistic God would be morally perfect and so strongly motivated by considerations of the well-being of sentient creatures. An aesthetic deistic God, on the other hand, would prioritize aesthetic goods over moral ones. While such a being would want a beautiful universe, perhaps the best metaphor here is not that of a cosmic artist, but instead that of a cosmic playwright: an author of nature who wants above all to write an interesting story.

As everyone knows, good stories never begin with the line “and they lived happily ever after”, and that line is the last line of any story that contains it. Further, containing such a line is hardly necessary for a story to be good. If aesthetic deism is true, then it may very well be true that, “all the world’s a stage, and all the men and women merely players” (emphasis added). In any case, the hypothesis of aesthetic deism makes “predictions” about the condition of sentient beings in the world that are very different from the ones that the hypothesis of omni-theism makes. After all, what makes a good story good is often some intense struggle between good and evil, and all good stories contain some mixture of benefit and harm. This suggests that the observed mixture of good and evil in our world decisively favors aesthetic deism over omni-theism. And if that’s right, then aesthetic deism pulls far ahead of omni-theism in the race for probability, thereby proving that omni-theism is very improbable.

Here is one possible formulation of this argument:

  • (1)Aesthetic deism is at least as probable intrinsically as omni-theism.
  • (2)The total evidence excluding “the data of good and evil” does not favor omni-theism over aesthetic deism.
  • (3)Given the total evidence excluding the data of good and evil, the data of good and evil strongly favor aesthetic deism over omni-theism.
It follows from (1), (2), and (3) that
  • (4)Aesthetic deism is many times more probable than omni-theism.
It follows from (4) that
  • (5)Omni-theism is very probably false.
It follows from (5) that
  • (6)Atheism (understood here as the denial of omni-theism) is very probably true.

Steps (4)–(6) of this argument are the same as steps (3)–(5) of the low priors argument except that “source physicalism” in step (3) of the low priors argument is replaced by “aesthetic deism” in step (4) of the decisive evidence argument. This makes no difference as far as the inference from step (4) to step (5) is concerned. That inference, like the inferences from steps (1)–(3) to step (4) and from step (5) to step (6), is clearly correct. The key question, then, is whether premises (1), (2), and (3) are all true.

In spite of the nearly complete overlap between omni-theism and aesthetic deism, Richard Swinburne (2004: 96–109) would challenge premise (1) on the grounds that aesthetic deism, unlike omni-theism, must posit a bad desire to account for why the deity does not do what is morally best. Omni-theism need not do this, according to Swinburne, because what is morally best just is what is overall best, and thus an omniscient being will of necessity do what is morally best so long as it has no desires other than the desires it has simply by virtue of knowing what the best thing to do is in any given situation. This challenge depends, however, on a highly questionable motivational intellectualism: it succeeds only if merely believing that an action is good entails a desire to do it. On most theories of motivation, there is a logical gap between the intellect and desire. If such a gap exists, then it would seem that omni-theism is no more probable intrinsically than aesthetic deism.

It’s hard to think of a plausible challenge to premise (2) because, at least when it comes to the usual evidence taken to favor theism over competing hypotheses like naturalism, aesthetic deism accounts for that evidence at least as well as omni-theism does. For example, a deity interested in good narrative would want a world that is complex and yet ordered, that contains beauty, consciousness, intelligence, and moral agency. Perhaps there is more reason to expect the existence of libertarian free will on omni-theism than on aesthetic deism; but unless one starts from the truth of omni-theism, there seems to be little reason to believe that we have such freedom. And even if one takes seriously introspective or other non-theological evidence for libertarian free will, it is not difficult to construct a “de-odicy” here: a good explanation in terms of aesthetic deism either of the existence of libertarian free will or of why there is apparently strong but ultimately misleading evidence for its existence. For example, if open theists are right that not even an omniscient being can know with certainty what (libertarian) free choices will be made in the future, then aesthetic deism could account for libertarian free will and other sorts of indeterminacy by claiming that a story with genuine surprises is better than one that is completely predictable. Alternatively, what might be important for the story is only that the characters think they have free will, not that they really have it.

Finally, there is premise (3), which asserts that the data of good and evil decisively favors aesthetic deism over theism. In this context, the “data of good and evil” include everything we know about how sentient beings, including humans, are benefitted or harmed. A full discussion of this premise is not possible here, but recognition of its plausibility appears to be as old as the problem of evil itself. Consider, for example, the Book of Job, whose protagonist, a righteous man who suffers horrifically, accuses God of lacking sufficient commitment to the moral value of justice. The vast majority of commentators agree that God does not directly respond to Job’s charge. Instead, speaking out of the whirlwind, He describes His design of the cosmos and of the animal kingdom in a way clearly intended to emphasize His power and the grandeur of His creation. Were it not for theological worries about God’s moral perfection, the most natural interpretation of this part of the story would be either that God agrees with Job’s charge that He is unjust or that God denies that Job can sensibly apply terms like “just” and “unjust” to Him because He and Job are not members of any shared moral community (Morriston forthcoming; for an opposing view, see Stump 2010: chapter 9). This is why Job’s first response to God’s speech (before capitulating in his second response) is just to refuse to repeat his (unanswered) accusation. On this interpretation, the creator that confronts Job is not the God he expected and definitely not the God of omni-theism, but rather a being much more like the deity of aesthetic deism.

Those who claim that a God might allow evil because it is the inevitable result of the universe being governed by laws of nature also lend support, though unintentionally, to the idea that, if there is an author of nature, then that being is more likely motivated by aesthetic concerns than moral ones. For example, it may be that producing a universe governed by a few laws expressible as elegant mathematical equations is an impressive accomplishment, not just because of the wisdom and power required for such a task, but also because of the aesthetic value of such a universe. That value may very well depend, however, on the creator’s choosing not to intervene regularly in nature to protect His creatures from harm.

Much of the aesthetic value of the animal kingdom may also depend on its being the result of a long evolutionary process driven by mechanisms like natural selection. As Darwin (1859) famously said in the last lines of On the Origin of Species by Means of Natural Selection,

There is grandeur in this view of life, with its several powers, having been originally breathed into a few forms or into one; and that, whilst this planet has gone cycling on according to the fixed law of gravity, from so simple a beginning endless forms most beautiful and wonderful have been, and are being evolved.

Unfortunately, such a process, if it is to produce sentient life, may also entail much suffering and countless early deaths. One questionable assumption of some natural order theodicists is to think that such connections between aesthetic goods and suffering provide a moral justification for God’s allowing horrific suffering. It is arguably far more plausible that in such a scenario the value of preventing horrendous suffering would, from a moral point of view, far outweigh the value of regularity, sublimity, and narrative. If so, then a morally perfect God would not trade the former for the latter though a deity motivated primarily by aesthetic reasons no doubt would.

To summarize, nearly everyone agrees that the world contains both goods and evils. Pleasure and pain, love and hate, achievement and failure, flourishing and languishing, and virtue and vice all exist in great abundance. In spite of that, some see signs of cosmic teleology. Those who defend the version of the decisive evidence argument stated above need not deny the teleology. They do need to show that it is far easier to make sense of the “strange mixture of good and ill, which appears in life” (Hume Dialogues, XI, 14) when that teleology is interpreted as amoral instead of as moral (cf. Mulgan 2015 and Murphy 2017) and in particular when it is interpreted as directed towards aesthetic ends instead of towards moral ends.

7. An Argument against Agnosticism

The topic in section 4 was Le Poidevin’s argument for the truth of a modest form of agnosticism. In this section, an argument for the falsity of a more ambitious form of agnosticism will be examined. Because the sort of agnosticism addressed in this section is more ambitious than the sort defended by Le Poidevin, it is conceivable that both arguments succeed in establishing their conclusions.

In Le Poidevin’s argument, the term “agnosticism” refers to the position that neither versatile theism nor global atheism is known to be true. In this section, “agnosticism” refers to the position that neither the belief that omni-theism is true nor the belief that it is false is rationally permissible. This form of agnosticism is more ambitious because knowledge is stronger (in the logical sense) than rational permissibility: it can be rationally permissible to believe propositions that are not known to be true, but a proposition cannot be known to be true by someone who is not rationally permitted to believe it. Thus, an appropriate name for this form of agnosticism is “strong agnosticism”.

Another difference concerns the object of the two forms of agnosticism. The agnosticism in Le Poidevin’s argument concerned versatile theism versus global atheism. In this section, the target is omni-theism versus the local atheistic position that omni-theism is false. The previous section focused on two arguments for the conclusion that this form of local atheism is very probably true. In this section, the question is whether or not that conclusion, if established, could ground a successful argument against strong agnosticism.

Such an argument can be formulated as follows:

  • (1)Atheism (understood here as the denial of omni-theism) is very probably true.
  • (2)If atheism is very probably true, then atheistic belief is rationally permissible.
It follows from (1) and (2) that
  • (3)Atheistic belief is rationally permissible.
  • (4)If strong agnosticism (about omni-theism) is true (that is, if withholding judgment about the truth or falsity of omni-theism is rationally required), then atheistic belief is not rationally permissible.
It follows from (3) and (4) that
  • (5)Strong agnosticism (about omni-theism) is false.

Premise (1) was defended in section 6, premise (4) is true by the definition of “strong agnosticism”, and steps (3) and (5) follow from earlier steps by modus ponens and modus tollens, respectively. This leaves premise (2), the premise that, if atheism is very probably true, then atheistic belief is rationally permissible.

One might attempt to defend this premise by claiming that the probabilities in premise (2) are rational credences and hence the truth of the so-called Lockean thesis (Foley 1992) justifies (2):

It is rational for a person S to believe a proposition P if and only if it is rational for S’s credence in P to be sufficiently high to make S’s attitude towards P one of belief.

The Lockean thesis, however, is itself in need of justification. Fortunately, though, nothing so strong as the Lockean thesis is needed to defend premise (2). For one thing, all the defender of (2) needs is an “if”, not an “if and only if”. Also, the defender of (2) need not equate, as the Lockean thesis does, the attitude of belief with having a high credence. Thus, all that is required is the following more modest thesis (call it “T”):

  • (T) If it is rationally permissible for S’s credence in a proposition P to be (very) high, then it is rationally permissible for S to believe P.

Even this more modest thesis, however, is controversial, because adopting it commits one to the position that rational (i.e., rationally permissible) belief is not closed under conjunction. In other words, it commits one to the position that it is possible for each of a number of beliefs to be rational even though the additional belief that those beliefs are all true is not rational.

To see why this is so, imagine that a million lottery tickets have been sold. Each player purchased only a single ticket, and exactly one of the players is certain to win. Now imagine further that an informed observer has a distinct belief about each of the million individual players that that particular player will lose. According to thesis T, each of those million beliefs is rational. For example, if Sue is one of the players, then according to T the observer’s belief that Sue will lose is rational because it is rational for the observer to have a (very) high credence in the proposition that Sue will lose. Since, however, it is certain that someone will win, it is also rational for the observer to believe that some player will win. It is not rational, however, to have contradictory beliefs, so it is not rational for the observer to believe that no player will win. This implies, however, that rational belief is not closed under conjunction, for the proposition that no player will win just is the conjunction of all of the propositions that say of some individual player that they will lose.

Defenders of premise (2) will claim, very plausibly, that the implication of T that rational belief is not closed under conjunction is completely innocuous. Isn’t it obvious, for example, that it would not be rational for a fallible human being to believe that all of their many beliefs are true, even if each of those beliefs were rational? Others (e.g., Oppy 1994: 151), however, regard the conclusion that rational belief is not closed under conjunction as unacceptable and will for that reason reject premise (2). So even if it can be shown that omni-theism is very probably false, it still won’t be obvious to everyone that it is rationally permissible to be a local atheist about omni-theism and thus it still won’t be obvious to everyone that strong agnosticism about omni-theism is false.


  • Baggini, Julian, 2003, Atheism: A Very Short Introduction, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Bishop, John C., 2008, “How a Modest Fideism May Constrain Theistic Commitments: Exploring an Alternative to Classical Theism”, Philosophia, 35(3–4): 387–402. doi:10.1007/s11406-007-9071-y
  • Buckareff, Andrei A. and Yujin Nagasawa (eds.), 2016, Alternative Concepts of God: Essays on the Metaphysics of the Divine, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198722250.001.0001
  • Bullivant, Stephen, 2013, “Defining ‘Atheism’”, in Bullivant and Ruse 2013: 11–21.
  • Bullivant, Stephen and Michael Ruse (eds.), 2013, The Oxford Handbook of Atheism, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/oxfordhb/9780199644650.001.0001
  • Darwin, Charles, 1859, On the Origin of Species by Means of Natural Selection, London: John Murray. [Darwin 1859 available online]
  • Dennett, Daniel C., 2006, Breaking the Spell: Religion as a Natural Phenomenon, New York: Viking Penguin.
  • Diller, Jeanine, 2016, “Global and Local Atheisms”, International Journal for Philosophy of Religion, 79(1): 7–18. doi:10.1007/s11153-015-9550-1
  • Diller, Jeanine and Asa Kasher, 2013, Models of God and Alternative Ultimate Realities, Dordrecht: Springer.
  • Draper, Paul, 2002, “Seeking but Not Believing: Confessions of a Practicing Agnostic”, in Daniel Howard-Snyder and Paul Moser (eds.), Divine Hiddenness: New Essays, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 197–214.
  • –––, 2016, “Where Skeptical Theism Fails, Skeptical Atheism Prevails”, in Oxford Studies in Philosophy of Religion, volume 7, Jonathan Kvanvig (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 63–80.
  • Ellis, Fiona, 2014, God, Value, and Nature, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198714125.001.0001
  • Flew, Antony, 1972, “The Presumption of Atheism”, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 2(1): 29–46. doi:10.1080/00455091.1972.10716861
  • Foley, Richard, 1992, “The Epistemology of Belief and the Epistemology of Degrees of Belief”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 29(2): 111–121.
  • French, Peter A. and Howard K. Wettstein (eds.), 2013, “Special Issue: The New Atheism and Its Critics”, Midwest Studies in Philosophy, 37(1).
  • Garvey, Brian, 2010, “Absence of Evidence, Evidence of Absence, and the Atheist’s Teapot”, Ars Disputandi, 10: 9–22.
  • Gutting, Gary, 2013, “Religious Agnosticism”, Midwest Studies in Philosophy, 37(1): 51–67. doi:10.1111/misp.12002
  • Hume, David, [1757] 1956, The Natural History of Religion, H.E. Root (ed.), Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, originally published in 1757. [Hume 1757 available online (1889 edition)]
  • –––, [1779] 2007, Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, Dorothy Coleman (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. [References are to the part and paragraph number.]
  • Huxley, Thomas Henry, 1884, “Agnosticism: A Symposium”, The Agnostic Annual, Charles Watts (ed.), pp. 5–6. [Huxley 1884 available online]
  • –––, 1889, “Agnosticism and Christianity”, reprinted in his Collected Essays, Volume 5: Science and the Christian Tradition, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1894, pp. 309–365. [Huxley [1889] 1894 available online]
  • Kahane, Guy, 2011, “Should We Want God to Exist?” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 82(3): 674–696. doi:10.1111/j.1933-1592.2010.00426.x
  • Kenny, Anthony, 1983, Faith and Reason, (Bampton lectures in America, no. 22), New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Le Poidevin, Robin, 2010, Agnosticism: A Very Short Introduction, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/actrade/9780199575268.001.0001
  • Leftow, Brian, 2016, “Naturalistic Pantheism”, in Buckareff and Nagasawa 2016: 64–87.
  • McLaughlin, Robert, 1984, “Necessary agnosticism?” Analysis 44(4): 198–202. doi:10.1093/analys/44.4.198
  • Morris, Thomas V., 1985, “Agnosticism”, Analysis 45(4): 219–224. doi:10.1093/analys/45.4.219
  • Morriston, Wes, forthcoming, “Protest and Enlightenment in the Book of Job”, in Paul Draper and J.L. Schellenberg (eds.), Renewing Philosophy of Religion: Exploratory Essays, Oxford: Oxford University Press, chap. 13.
  • Mulgan, Tim, 2015, Purpose in the Universe: The Moral and Metaphysical Case for Ananthropocentric Purposivism, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199646142.001.0001
  • Murphy, Mark C., 2017, God’s Own Ethics: Norms of Divine Agency and the Argument from Evil, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Nagasawa, Yujin, 2008, “A New Defence of Anselmian Theism”, Philosophical Quarterly, 58(233): 577–596. doi:10.1111/j.1467-9213.2008.578.x
  • Nagel, Thomas, 1997, The Last Word, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/0195149831.001.0001
  • Oppy, Graham, 1994, “Weak Agnosticism Defended”, International Journal for Philosophy of Religion, 36(3): 147–67. doi:10.1007/BF01316921
  • Pike, Nelson, 1970, God and Timelessness, New York: Schocken Books.
  • Plantinga, Alvin, 2000, Warranted Christian Belief, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/0195131932.001.0001
  • Rowe, William L., 1979, “The Problem of Evil and Some Varieties of Atheism”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 16(4): 335–341.
  • Russell, Bertrand, 1997, “Is There a God? [1952]”, in John G. Slater and Peter Köllner (eds.), The Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell, Vol. 11: Last Philosophical Testament, 1943–68, London and New York: Routledge, pp. 542–548.
  • Schellenberg, J.L., 2007, The Wisdom to Doubt: A Justification of Religious Skepticism, Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press.
  • Strawson, Galen, 1990, “Review of Created from Animals, by James Rachels”, The Independent, London, June 24.
  • Stump, Eleonore, 2010, Wandering in Darkness: Narrative and the Problem of Suffering, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199277421.001.0001
  • Swinburne, Richard, 2001, Epistemic Justification, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/0199243794.001.0001
  • –––, 2004, The Existence of God, second edition, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199271672.001.0001
  • van Inwagen, Peter, 2012, “Russell’s China Teapot”, in Dariusz Lukasiewicz and Roger Pouivet (eds.), The Right to Believe: Perspectives in Religious Epistemology, Heusenstamm: Ontos Verlag, pp. 11–26.
  • Wielenberg, Erik J., 2009, “Dawkins’ Gambit, Hume’s Aroma, and God’s Simplicity”, Philosophia Christi, 11(1): 111–125.
  • Zenk, Thomas, 2013, “New Atheism”, in Bullivant and Ruse 2013: 245–260.

Other Internet Resources


The author is grateful to the students in his Fall 2016 seminar on atheism and agnosticism: John Absher, Matthew Fritz, Alžbeta Hájková, Vincent Jacobson, Daniel Linford, Adam Nuske, Bianca Oprea, and Luke Wilson. They contributed in a variety of ways to making this entry much better than it would otherwise have been. The author is also grateful to Jeanine Diller and Jeffrey Lowder for helpful comments on a preliminary draft of this entry.

Copyright © 2017 by
Paul Draper <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free