William of Auvergne

First published Wed Sep 24, 2008; substantive revision Sat Mar 18, 2023

William of Auvergne or Paris, (ca.1180/90–1249), Bishop of Paris from 1228 until his death in 1249, was one of the first wave of thinkers in the Latin West to engage with the writings on natural philosophy and metaphysics by Greek, Islamic and Jewish thinkers that had recently become available in Latin translation. William took these writings to pose errors dangerous to the Christian faith, and his philosophical works are in large part aimed at combating their errors. Yet at the same time he recognized their philosophical value and, though often confused about their meaning, incorporated their teachings into his own thought. On many of the important issues of later medieval thought, William is the first to provide in-depth discussions, and his voluminous works are an important and still under-appreciated source for our understanding of the development of medieval philosophy.

1. Life

As with so many important medieval figures, we know little about William’s early years. According to one manuscript source, he was born in Aurillac, in the province of Auvergne in south-central France. His birth date is unknown, but since he was a professor of theology at the University of Paris by 1225, a position rarely attained before the age of 35, he is not likely to have been born later than 1190, and scholars have placed his probable birth date some time between 1180 and 1190. He may have come from a poor background, as the Dominican, Stephen of Bourbon (died c. 1261), tells a story of William begging as a young child (Valois 1880, 4). He was a canon of Notre Dame and a master of theology by 1223, and is mentioned in bulls of Pope Honorius III in 1224 and 1225.

The story of his elevation to the episcopacy in 1228 paints a picture of a man of great determination and self-confidence. The previous year the Bishop of Paris, Bartholomeus, had died, and the canons of the chapter of Notre Dame met to select his successor. The initial selection of a cantor named Nicholas did not secure unanimous agreement and was contested, in particular, by William. Nicholas excused himself, and the canons went on to choose the Dean of the Cathedral. William again contested the election and went to Rome to appeal to the Pope to vacate it. He made a favorable impression, for the Pope, impressed by his “eminent knowledge and spotless virtue,” as he put it (Valois 1880, 11), both ordained him priest and made him Bishop of Paris, a position he retained until his death in 1249.

It was not long before the Pope would have regrets. In February 1229 a number of students were killed by the forces of the queen-regent, Blanche of Castile, when they intervened in a drunken student riot during Carnival. Outraged, the masters and students appealed to William for redress of their rights, but William failed to take action. The students and masters went on strike, dispersing from Paris and appealing to Pope Gregory IX. It was apparently during this period that William gave the Dominicans their first chair in theology at the university. The Pope, who was to remark that he regretted “having made this man,” rebuked William, appointed a commission to settle the dispute, and ordered William to reinstate the striking masters. Nevertheless, William went on to receive important missions from the Pope in subsequent years, acting, for example, as a papal representative in peace negotiations between France and England in 1231.

In 1239 William was closely involved in the condemnation of the Talmud. The Pope had asked him for his response to a list of heresies in the Talmud proposed by a converted Jew, Nicholas. William’s response led to a papal bull ordering the confiscation of sacred books from synagogues in 1240, and to their burning in 1242 (for details, see Valois 1880, Smith 1992 and de Mayo 2007).

William died at the end of March (the exact date is unsure) in 1249, and was buried in the Abbey of St. Victor.

2. Works

William’s most important philosophical writings form part of a vast seven-part work he calls the Magisterium divinale et sapientiale, a title Teske translates as Teaching on God in the Mode of Wisdom. The Magisterium is generally taken to consist of the following seven works in the order given:

  • De Trinitate, sive de primo principio (On the Trinity, or the First Principle)
  • De universo (On the Universe)
  • De anima (On the Soul)
  • Cur Deus homo (Why God Became Man)
  • De fide et legibus (On Faith and Laws)
  • De sacramentis (On the Sacraments)
  • De virtutibus et moribus (On Virtues and Morals).

William did not compose the parts of the Magisterium in their rational order, and appears to have developed his conception of its structure as he wrote its various parts. He viewed it as having two principal parts. The first part is comprised of De Trinitate, De universo, and De anima. In this, the most philosophical part of the Magisterium, William proceeds by “the paths of proofs” or philosophizing rather than by an appeal to the authority of revelation. He intends to combat a range of philosophical errors incompatible, as he sees it, with the Christian faith. In On the Trinity he develops his metaphysics, attacking, among others, errors regarding creation, divine freedom and the eternity of the world, and follows it with a philosophical treatment of the Trinity. William’s vast work, On the Universe, is divided into two principal parts. The first part (Ia, i.e. prima pars) is concerned with the corporeal universe and is in turn divided into three parts, the first (Ia-Iae, i.e. prima pars primae partis) arguing for a single first principle and for the oneness of the universe, the second (IIa-Iae) taking up the question of the beginning of the universe and its future state, and the third (IIIa-Iae) treating the governance of the universe through God’s providence. The second principal part (IIa) is concerned with the spiritual universe, and is divided into three parts concerning, respectively, the intelligences or spiritual beings posited by Aristotle and his followers (Ia-IIae), the good and holy angels (IIa-IIae), and the bad and wicked angels, that is, demons (IIIa-IIae). On the Soul is concerned with the human soul. It is divided into seven parts concerning, respectively, its existence, its essence, its composition, the number of souls in a human being, how the human soul comes into being, the state of the soul in the body, and the soul’s relation to God, with a focus on the human intellect.

The works comprising the second part of the Magisterium are more expressly theological in nature and appeal to the authority of revelation. Nevertheless, William continually recurs to his philosophical doctrines in all his works, and even his most theological writings contain material of considerable philosophical interest. In particular, his treatises On Virtues and Morals and On Faith and Laws are of great importance for his moral philosophy.

Scholars agree that On the Trinity is the earliest work in the Magisterium and that it was probably written in the early 1220s. The other works can be partially dated by references to contemporaneous events, though the sheer size of many individual works suggests they were probably written over a period of years. The whole Magisterium itself was probably written during a period extending from the early 1220s to around 1240, with On the Universe written in the 1230s and On the Soul completed by around 1240.

Besides the works contained in the Magisterium, other works of philosophical importance are De bono et malo I (On Good and Evil), where William develops a theory of value; De immortalitate animae (On the Immortality of the Soul), a companion to the treatment of immortality in On the Soul; and De gratia et libero arbitrio (On Grace and Free Choice), a treatment of the Pelagian heresy.

In addition, William wrote some biblical commentaries, a number of other major theological works, and a large number of sermons (for details, see Ottman 2005). The more than 550 sermons that can be attributed to William have recently been critically edited by F. Morenzoni; they comprise four volumes in the Corpus Christianorum series (Opera homiletica, CCCM 230–230C).

With the exception of the sermons, most of William’s works have not been critically edited; several are extant only in manuscript form. The standard edition, which includes all the works that comprise the Magisterium, is the 1674 Orléans-Paris Opera omnia (OO). (The sermons contained in this edition are by William Perrauld, not William of Auvergne.) As might be expected, the texts in this old edition are often in need of correction; Teske has conjectured many corrections in his translations.

3. The Character of William’s Philosophical Works

The reader of William’s philosophical works is struck by their difference in character from the mainstream of philosophical and theological writing of the early thirteenth century. Whereas William’s contemporaries tend to compose works as a series of linked questions, each treated according to the question method (a paradigm of which is Aquinas’s later Summa theologiae), William instead follows the practice of Avicenna and Avicebron and composes treatises much more akin to a modern book. Indeed, William even models his writing style to some degree on the Latin translations of these authors. These features, together with William’s frequent use of analogies, metaphors and examples drawn from everyday life, his long-winded, rambling prose and frequent digressions, his harsh assessments of opponents as imbeciles or morons, and his urging that proponents of dangerous doctrines be wiped out by fire and sword, make for an inimitable and immediately recognizable style.

One of the costs of this style, however, is that at times it can be hard to tell precisely what William thinks. Too often he lets metaphors or analogies bear the argumentative burden in lieu of more careful analysis. And while William’s inventive mind could generate arguments for a position with ease, their quality is uneven: often he proposes problematic arguments without appearing to recognize the difficulties they contain, as may be apparent below to the discerning reader, while at other times he shows an acute awareness of the fundamental problems an issue raises.

4. Sources

William was one of the first thinkers in the Latin West to begin to engage seriously with Aristotle’s writings on metaphysics and natural philosophy and with the thought of Islamic and Jewish thinkers, especially Avicenna (Ibn Sīnā, 980–1037) and Avicebron (Solomon Ibn Gabirol, 1021/2–1057/8) (see e.g. Bertolacci 2012, Caster 1996c, de Vaux 1934 and Teske 1999). The works of these thinkers, which had been coming into circulation in Latin translations from around the middle of the twelfth century, presented both philosophical sophistication and theological danger. Indeed, in 1210, public and private lecturing on Aristotle’s works on natural philosophy and commentaries on them was forbidden at Paris, and in 1215 the papal legate, Cardinal Robert of Courçon forbade “masters in arts from ‘reading,’ i.e., lecturing, on Aristotle’s books on natural philosophy along with the Metaphysics and Summae of the same (probably certain works of Avicenna and perhaps of Alfarabi)” (Wippel 2003, 66). This prohibition remained in effect until it unofficially lapsed around 1231. Nevertheless, it must be emphasized that personal study of these texts had not been forbidden, and William clearly worked hard to master them. He came to be keenly aware of the incompatibility of much of the teaching of these works with Christian doctrine, yet at the same time he found them to be a source of philosophical inspiration, and his thought brims with ideas drawn from Avicenna and Avicebron. His attitude to these thinkers is expressed well in a passage in On the Soul, where, regarding Aristotle, he writes that:

though on many points one must contradict Aristotle, as is really right and proper—and this holds for all the statements by which he contradicts the truth—he should be accepted in all those statements in which he is found to have held the right view. (OO II suppl., 82a; Teske 2000, 89)

Of course, William was also strongly influenced by Christian thinkers. In particular, his writings are permeated by the thought of Saint Augustine, whom William refers to as “one of the more noble of Christian thinkers,” if perhaps in a less obvious way than by the thought of Avicenna. Indeed, as the list in Valois 1880, 198–206, attests, William employs a remarkable range of sources and must be reckoned one of the most well-read thinkers of his day.

The focus of the following outline is William’s views on metaphysics and the soul, but even within these limits the vast range of his thought has required that many issues in these areas not be treated. In a future supplement, William’s views on value theory and morality will be addressed. Teske’s English translations are quoted whenever possible; otherwise, translations are my own (i.e. N. Lewis’s).

5. Metaphysics

William is the first thinker in the Latin West to develop a systematic metaphysics (as ontology) based on the concepts of being (esse) and essence (essentia). Influenced by Boethius and Avicenna, he develops this metaphysics in his early work, On the Trinity, as a preliminary to his account of the Trinity, and he returns to it in other works, especially in On the Universe. The central theme of his metaphysics is that all existing things, besides God, are composites of essence, on the one hand, and their being or existence, on the other, which is said to be acquired or partaken from God, the source of all being. God, in contrast, involves no composition of essence and being, but is his being.

Inspired by Boethius’s distinction in De hebdomadibus between what is good by participation and what is good by substance, William works these ideas out in terms of a distinction between a being by participation (ens participatione) and a being by substance or essence (ens substantia / ens per essentiam). By the essence of a thing William means what is signified by its definition or species name. Under the influence of Avicenna, he often refers to essence as a thing’s quiddity (quidditas, literally, “whatness”), which he identifies with Boethius’s notion of quod est or “that which is.” Analogously, he identifies a thing’s being (esse) or existence with the notion of quo est or “by which it is.” In the case of a being by participation, its essence and features incidental to the essence are distinct from its being; William describes its being as clothed by them or as what would be left if they were stripped away. Such a being (ens) is said to participate in or acquire its being (esse). At times William, following Avicenna, speaks of its being as accidental to it, by which he just emphasizes that its being is not part of the essence.

A being (ens) by substance, in contrast, does not participate in or acquire being but is its very being: “there is also the being whose essence is for it being (esse) and whose essence we predicate when we say, ‘It is,’ so that it itself and its being (esse) … are one thing in every way” (Switalski 1976, 17; Teske and Wade 1989, 65).

In the second chapter of On the Trinity, William also notes that the term “being” (esse) may be used to mean a thing’s essence (similar to Avicenna’s esse proprium), but this sense of “being” plays a minor role in his thought.

William argues that there must be a being by essence; otherwise, no being could be intelligible. Thus, if there were just beings by participation, there would have to be either a circle of beings each of which participates in the being of what is prior to it in the circle, with the absurd consequence that a thing would ultimately participate in its own being; or else there would have to be an infinite series of beings, each member of which participates in the being of what is prior in the series. But then, for a member of the series—say, A—to be, would be for it to have or participate in the being of B; and for B to be, in turn, would be for it to have or participate in the being of C, and so on. But if this were so, the being of no member of the series could be intelligible, since any attempt to spell it out would result in an account of the form: A’s having B’s having C’s having ad infinitum. Since being is intelligible, William concludes that there is a being by essence.

Besides the distinctions between being by participation and being by essence, William mentions sixteen other distinctions, including the distinctions between being of need (esse indigentiae) and being of sufficiency (esse sufficientiae), possible being (esse possibile) and being necessary through itself (esse necesse per se ipsum), false and true being, and flowing and lasting being. William takes these distinctions to be coextensive with the distinction between being by participation and being by essence. Using a form of argument drawn from Avicenna, he argues that given the first member of each distinction, we can prove the existence of the second (see On the Trinity, ch. 6).

The distinction between possible being (possibile esse) and necessary being through itself (necesse esse per se ipsum), which William draws from Avicenna, plays a prominent role in William’s thought. William’s notion of a possible is not that of something that exists in some possible world, but is rather the notion of something whose essence neither requires nor rules out its having being. William treats such possibles as in some sense prior to being. In the case of those that have being and thus actually exist, he holds that the possible “and its being (esse), which does not belong to it essentially, are really two. The one comes to the other and does not fall within its definition or quiddity. Being (ens) [i.e., a being] in this way is, therefore, composite and also resolvable into its possibility, or quiddity, and its being (esse)” (Switalski 1976, 44; Teske and Wade 1989, 87). Some commentators see in such remarks the idea that a real or mind-independent distinction obtains between being and essence in possible beings.

In contrast, the being and essence of a being necessary through itself are not two; such a being does not participate in being but is its being and cannot but exist.

William argues there can be only one being by substance or being necessary through itself. Speaking from a metaphysical point of view, he follows Avicenna and calls it the First (primum). Speaking as a Christian, he identifies it with God, the creator, as he thinks is indicated by Biblical references to God as “he who is”: “being,” he says, is a proper name of God (see e.g. On the Trinity, ch. 4).

The uniqueness of a being by substance is, William argues, a consequence of its absolute simplicity, since nothing could differentiate two or more absolutely simple beings. The absolute simplicity of a being by substance, in turn, is a consequence of the fact that it cannot be caused (not, at least by an external causation; William argues that the being by substance is the Christian Trinity of persons and he admits a kind of internal causation in the Trinity). For everything that is caused is other than its being and thus is a being by participation, whereas a being by essence or substance is its being. But a composite or non-simple being must have an external cause, and must therefore be a being by participation. Therefore, the being by substance, that is to say, God, cannot be composite, but must be absolutely simple.

God’s absolute simplicity also entails that he is neither a universal (i.e., neither a genus nor species), nor an individual falling under such. For, William argues, genera and species are themselves composite, and the individuals that fall under them have a quiddity or definition and therefore compositeness. Nevertheless, William thinks God is an individual, since he holds that all that exists is either a universal or an individual (OO I, 855ab).

William appeals to God’s power to show God has will and knowledge. He argues that God must be omnipotent: he cannot be forced or impeded and has a “two-way” power (potentia), identified by William with what Aristotle calls a rational power. This is a power that “extends to both opposites, namely, to make and not to make” (Switalski 1976, 57; Teske and Wade 1989, 99), in contrast with something, such as fire, which when “it encounters what can be heated is not able to heat or not to heat . . . but it necessarily has only the power to heat” (Switalski 1976, 54; Teske and Wade 1989, 97). However, because a two-way power is poised between acting and not-acting, it must be inclined to acting by something, and William thinks this can only be through a choice. Therefore, God must have will and choice; and since “it is impossible that there be will and choice where there is no knowledge” (Switalski 1976, 59; Teske and Wade 1989, 101), God must also have knowledge. William goes on to argue that God must indeed be omniscient, since “his wisdom is absolute and free, not bound in any way to things, nor dependent upon them” (Switalski 1976, 61; Teske and Wade 1989, 102).

William takes his claim that God has a two-way power to imply that God could have known or willed otherwise than he did. But, as William realizes, this raises the difficulty that if God had known or willed otherwise, it would seem that he would have been different, and this seems to be impossible given his absolute simplicity. In response, William frequently emphasizes that by the very same act of knowing or will by which God in fact knows or wills one thing, he could have known or willed something else (OO I, 780a; Teske 2007, 105). Thus, when we say “God knows or wills X,” we must distinguish the act of knowing or willing, which is identical with God and utterly the same in every possible situation, from the object X to which it is related.

6. God’s Relation to Creatures

6.1 God as the Source of Being

According to William, everything participates in or acquires its being from God. But just what he means by this is less than clear. At times, as in the following passage from On the Universe, he seems to suggest that God is literally present in created things as their being:

the creator is next to and most present to each of his creatures; in fact, he is most interior to each of them. And this can be seen by you through the subtraction or stripping away of all the accidental and substantial conditions and forms. For when you subtract from each of the creatures all these, last of all there is found being or entity, and on this account its giver. (OO I, 625b; Teske 1998a, 100)

Yet William realizes that such statements may give an incorrect impression of his thought. Thus, at one point in On the Universe he writes that “every substance includes, if it is proper to say so (si dici fas est), the creator’s essence within itself” (OO I, 920b), and he goes on to note that it is difficult to state clearly the sense in which the creator is in creatures. In other passages he emphasizes God’s transcendence of creatures: “the first being (esse) is for all things the being (esse) by which they are … It is one essence, pure, solitary, separate from and unmixed with all things.” Often he appeals to an analogy with light: the first being fills “all things like light cast over the universe. By this filling or outpouring it makes all things reflect it. This is their being (esse), namely to reflect it” (Switalski 1976, 45; Teske and Wade 1989, 89). William perhaps intends in such remarks to exploit the medieval view that a point of light (lux) and the light emitted from that point (lumen), though distinct, nonetheless are also in some deep sense the same.

6.2 Against the Manichees

Regarding the procession of creatures from God, William is concerned to attack a range of errors. In On the Universe Ia-Iae he attacks the error of the Manichees. Though he refers to Mani, the third-century originator of the Manichee sect, he seems chiefly concerned with the Cathars of his day. The Manichees deny God is the ultimate source of all things and instead posit two first principles, one good and one evil. Only in this way, they think, can we explain the presence of both good and evil in the world. William thinks a fundamental motivation for this view is the principle that “from one of two contraries the other cannot come of itself” (OO I, 602a; Teske 1998a, 54), and hence that evil cannot come from good but must stem from its own first principle. He replies that although one contrary cannot of itself (per se) be from the other, it is perfectly possible for it to be from the other incidentally (per accidens), and he gives everyday examples to illustrate. Thus, “drunkenness comes from wine. In that case it is evident that an evil comes from a good, unless one would say that wine is not good” (OO I, 602a; Teske 1998a, 54). Likewise, there is a sense in which evil is ultimately from God, though incidentally and not as something God aims at or intends as such. The evil of sin, for example, is a consequence of God’s creating creatures with free will and permitting their misuse of it.

William offers a host of arguments against the possibility of two first principles. On metaphysical grounds, for example, he objects that a first principle must be a being necessary through itself, and that he has shown that a plurality of such beings is impossible. And he gives arguments to the effect that the notion of a creative first evil principle is incoherent. Such a being, for example, could not do good for anything, and hence could not have created anything, for in doing so it would have done good for what it created (see also Bernstein 2005 and Teske 1993a).

6.3 Causation, and Creation by Intermediaries

William claims “the creator alone properly and truly is worthy of the title ‘cause,’ but other things are merely messengers and bearers of the last things received as if sent from the creator” (OO I, 622a; Teske 1998a, 92). We speak of creatures as causes, but William says this is “ad sensum” (Switalski 1976, 79; Teske and Wade 1989, 117), that is, in respect of how things appear in sense experience. Both medieval and contemporary commentators have on the basis of such remarks attributed to William the denial that creatures are genuine causes (see Reilly 1953). Certainly he denies that any creature can exercise fully independent causal agency, a view he thinks “the philosophers” have adopted. But this claim is compatible with admission of genuine secondary causes that are reliant for their exercise of causation on the simultaneous activity of prior causes, and ultimately on that of the first cause, God. Is William simply making this point but using the term “cause” in a more restricted manner than his contemporaries? A negative answer is suggested by William’s rationale for his usage. He thinks of causation as the giving of being, and he thinks that anything that receives being, and therefore all creatures, cannot itself give being but can merely transmit it. Moreover, his metaphors of creatures as riverbeds or windows through which the divine causal influence flows strongly suggest that he really does wish to hold that creatures themselves do not really bring anything about but are simply the conduits through which divine causality flows (see Miller 1998 and 2002).

Whether in fact William admits genuine causal agency among creatures, he clearly thinks that God alone can create from nothing. Thus, he rejects Avicenna’s so-called “emanationist” doctrine of creation, according to which, as he puts it, God creates from nothing only one thing, the first intelligence (or spiritual being), which in turn creates the next intelligence, and so on until the tenth or agent intelligence is reached, the creator of souls and the sensible world. William thinks one ground of this doctrine is Avicenna’s principle that “from what is one in so far as it is one there cannot in any way come anything but what is one” (ex uno, secundum quod unum, non potest esse ullo modorum nisi unum) (OO I, 618b; Teske 1998a, 82), and hence from God, who is absolutely one, can at most come one thing. In fact, William agrees with this principle and applies it in the context of Trinitarian theology, but he thinks Avicenna has misapplied it by using it to explain creation. Instead, William follows the Jewish thinker Avicebron (whom he thought was a Christian) and holds that creatures come from God not insofar as he is one, but “through his will and insofar as he wills, just as a potter does not shape clay vessels through his oneness, but through his will” (OO I, 624a; Teske 1998a, 96).

6.4 Against the Necessity of Creation

William thinks the will is necessarily free; thus the fact that God creates through his will means that creation is an exercise of God’s free will. This point serves to undermine another aspect of Avicenna’s doctrine of the procession of creatures from God. For Avicenna posits not only a series of creators, but also holds that this procession is utterly necessary: the actual world must exist and could not have been other than it is. William thinks this conclusion stems from a failure to grasp God’s freedom in creation. Avicenna and others imposed “not only necessity, but natural servitude upon the creator, supposing that he operates in the manner of nature” (OO I, 614b; Teske 1998a, 72). Thus, they think the universe issued from God as brightness issues from the sun or heat from fire, and that God no more had it in his power to do otherwise than do the sun or heat. Against this William argues that it is a consequence of God’s free creation that he had it in his power to create otherwise than he did.

6.5 Against the Eternity of the World

One of the most contentious doctrines presented by Greek and Islamic philosophy to thinkers in the early thirteenth century is that of the eternity of the world, the view that the world had no beginning but existed over an infinite past. This view seems to contradict the opening words of the Bible: “In the beginning God created heaven and earth.” In response, a number of thinkers in the early thirteenth century, including the Franciscan Alexander of Hales, argued that Aristotle, at least, had been misunderstood and had never proposed the eternity of the world. But William, like his Oxford contemporary, Robert Grosseteste, would have none of this: “Whatever may be said and whoever may try to excuse Aristotle, it was undoubtedly his opinion that the world is eternal and that it did not begin to be, and he held the same view concerning motion. Avicenna held this after him” (OO I, 690b; Teske 1998a, 117).

The importance of this issue to William is indicated by the space he devotes to it. His treatment of the question of the eternity aeternitas of the world in On the Universe IIa-Iae is one of the longest discussions of the issue in the middle ages, and the first substantial treatment to be made in the light of Greek and Islamic thought.

William thinks, in fact, that to call the world eternal in the aforementioned sense is not to use the term “eternal” in its strictest sense. Accordingly, he starts by explaining different senses of the term in the first extended treatment of the distinction between eternity and time in the middle ages. He then presents and refutes arguments that the world has no beginning, and provides his own positive arguments that the world must have a temporal beginning, a first instant of its existence.

William’s chief aim in his treatment of time and eternity is to emphasize the fundamental differences between eternity and time. He is especially concerned to attack a conception of eternity as existence at every time, a conception he attributes to Aristotle. In his view, eternity in a strict sense is proper to the creator alone and is his very being, though “the name ‘eternity’ says more than his being, namely, the privations of beginning and ending, as well as of flux and change, and this both in act and in potency” (OO I, 685b–686a; Teske 1998a, 109). The fundamental difference between time and eternity is that “as it is proper and essential to time to flow or cease to be, so it is proper and essential to eternity to remain and stand still” (OO I, 683b; Teske 1998a, 102). William, like other medieval thinkers, tends to describe eternity in terms of what it is not. It has nothing that flows and hence no before or after or parts. Its being is whole at once, not because it all exists at one time, but because it all exists with nothing temporally before or after it. William speaks of duration in eternity, but he holds that the term has a different (unfortunately unexplained) sense in this context than when applied to time.

William had read Aristotle’s Physics and agrees with Aristotle that time and motion are coextensive (OO I, 700a). Yet he does not propose Aristotle’s definition of time as the number of motion in respect of before and after. Rather, in his account of the essential nature of time he describes time simply as being that flows and does not last, “that is, it has nothing of itself that lasts in act or potency” (OO I, 683a; Teske 1998a, 102). Echoing Aristotle and Augustine, he holds that time has the weakest being, and that “of all things that are said to be in any way, time is the most remote from eternity, and this is because it only touches eternity by the very least of itself, the now itself or a point of time” (OO I, 748a).

William introduces his account of the eternity of the world in On the Universe by reference to Aristotle, but he devotes the bulk of his discussion to Avicenna’s arguments for this doctrine. In parallel material in On the Trinity he claims that at the root of Avicenna’s view lies the principle that “if the one essence is now as it was before when nothing came forth from it, something will not now come forth from it” (Switalski 1976, 69; Teske and Wade 1989, 108). That is, nothing new is caused to exist unless there is a change in the cause. Thus God, a changeless being, cannot start to create the world after not creating it; and therefore he must have created it from eternity and without a beginning. Therefore, the world must itself lack a beginning.

William replies that Avicenna’s principle leads to an infinite regress; for if something’s operating after not operating requires a change in it, this change will itself require a new cause, and that new cause will itself require a new cause, and so on ad infinitum. William instead holds that it is possible that God, without changing in any way, start to operate after not operating. What William means by this is that the effect of God’s eternal will is a world with a temporal beginning. In general, he holds that verbs such as “create” express nothing in the creator himself but rather something in things. We might put “God begins to create the world” to have the import of: “God by an eternal willing creates the world, and the world has a beginning.”

William emphasizes that God does not will that the world exist without qualification, but rather that it exist with a given temporal structure, namely, a beginning (Switalski 1976, 67–68; Teske and Wade 1989, 107). This might suggest that he thinks God might in fact have created a world without a beginning, but chose not to do so, as Aquinas would hold. But in fact, William argues that this option was not open to God: a world without a beginning is simply not a creatable item. William attempts to establish this point by a host of arguments, many of which are found in his writings for the first time in the Latin West and repeated by later thinkers such as Bonaventure and Henry of Ghent. On the whole, these arguments either allege that the notion of a created thing itself entails that what is created has a temporal beginning or point to alleged paradoxes stemming from the supposition of an infinite past.

For example, William argues (OO I, 696b; Teske 1998a, 133) that because the world in itself is merely a possible, in itself it is in non-being and non-being is therefore natural to it. Hence its non-being, being natural to it, is prior to its being, and therefore in being created it must receive being after non-being, and thus have a beginning.

Among arguments involving infinity, William argues that if the whole of past time is infinite then the infinite must have been traversed to arrive at the present; but since it is impossible to traverse the infinite (OO I, 697b; Teske 1998a, 136), the past must be finite. This line of argument is frequently found in later thinkers.

William also presents arguments that the view that a continuum, such as time, is infinite results in paradoxes (OO I, 698a–700b). These arguments, which William develops at some length, constitute an important early medieval engagement with puzzles relating to infinity.

6.6 Providence

Part IIIa-Iae of On the Universe is a lengthy treatise on God’s providence (providentia). William believes the denial of God’s providence, and in particular the denial that the good will be rewarded and the evil punished, is an error “so harmful and so pernicious for human beings that it eliminates from human beings by their roots all concern for moral goodness, all the honor of the virtues, and all hope of future happiness” (OO I, 776a; Teske 2007, 92).

According to William, God’s providence (providentia) or providing for the universe differs from foreknowledge (praescientia) in that, unlike foreknowledge, it embraces only goods and not also evils (see OO I, 754b; Teske 2007, 30). William is especially concerned to argue that God’s providence is not just general in nature, but extends to all individual creatures. God’s care for the universe and its constituents is a matter of God’s knowing and paying attention to all things. From God’s point of view, nothing happens by chance. William introduces final causality into his explanation by describing the universe as a teleological or goal-directed order, in which each thing has a function or purpose established by God. God’s care is his concern that each thing fulfills its appointed function. Thus, God is not necessarily concerned with what we might think is best for individual things: flies get eaten by spiders, but this in fact is an end for which they were created. And ultimately animals were created for the sake of humans, as William points out (for details on animals and providence, see Wei 2020, 49–74). In the case of humans, however, who are the apex of creation, their end is to experience happiness in union with God, and God’s providential care of human beings is aimed at this.

But if this is so, why do the evil prosper and the good suffer? What are we to make of natural disasters, of pain, suffering, death, and the like? What, in short, are we to make of evil in the world? Although William does not take up the logical compatibility of evil with an all-good, knowing and powerful god, he does attempt to explain at length how a range of particular kinds of evil are compatible with God’s providence and care for human beings. His explanation, in general, is not novel and has roots in Augustine. He distinguishes the evils perpetrated by free agents and for which they are therefore to blame from other forms of evil, and argues that these other evils are in fact not really evil but good. Pain, for example, provides many benefits, among which is that it mortifies and extinguishes “the lusts for pleasures and carnal and worldly desires” (OO I, 764a; Teske 2007, 58). In many cases, what we call evil is in fact God’s just punishment, which William implies always has beneficial effects. As for the blameworthy evils done by free agents, William thinks that God permits these, but that it is incorrect to say they come from God or are intended by him. They are rather the consequence of rational creatures’ misuse of the free will with which they were created, and the moral balance will be set right in the future life, if not this one.

If the evils of this life appear to conflict with God’s providence, God’s providence and foreknowledge themselves seem to entail that everything occurs of necessity and hence that there is no free will. This concern leads William to consider a number of doctrines that aim to show that all events happen of necessity. In addition to foreknowledge or providence, he considers the views that all events are the necessary causal outcomes of the motion and configuration of the heavenly bodies, or that all events result from the heimarmene, i.e. the “interconnected and incessantly running series of causes and the necessary dependence of one upon another” (OO I, 785a; Teske 2007, 120); or finally, that all things happen through fate (fatum sive fatatio). William rejects all these grounds for the necessity of events (esp. on fate, see Sannino 2016).

In an interesting discussion of foreknowledge in part IIIa-Iae, chapter 15, he considers the argument that since it is necessary that whatever God foresees will come about will come about, because otherwise God could be deceived or mistaken, then since God foresees each thing that will come about, it is necessary that it will come about. William replies that the proposition “It is necessary that whatever God foresees (providit) will come about will come about” has two interpretations, “because the necessity can refer to individuals or to the whole” (OO I, 778b; Teske 2007, 99). The argument for the necessity of all events equivocates between these two readings and is therefore invalid. William notes that the distinction he makes is close to the distinction between a divided and composite sense, but he is critical of those who instead distinguish an ambiguity between a de re (about the thing) and de dicto (about what is said) reading.

7. The Soul

William’s treatise On the Soul is one of the most substantial Latin works on the topic from before the middle of the thirteenth century. Although William begins this treatise with Aristotle’s definition of the soul as the perfection of an organic body potentially having life, his conception of the soul is heavily influenced by Avicenna and decidedly Platonic in character. He interprets Aristotle’s definition to mean that the body is an instrument of the soul (as he thinks the term “organic” indicates) and that “a body potentially having life” must refer to a corpse, since a body prior to death actually has life. And although he calls a soul, with Aristotle, a form, unlike Aristotle he holds that a soul is in fact a substance, something individual, singular and a “this something” (hoc aliquid), not at all dependent on the body for its existence.

William adopts the standard view that souls serve to vivify or give life to bodies, and thus he posits not just souls of human beings (i.e., rational souls), but also those of plants and animals (vegetative and sensitive souls respectively), as they all have living bodies. But in the case of the human soul, William also identifies the soul with the human being, the referent of the pronoun “I.”

7.1 The Existence and Substantiality of Souls

Among William’s many arguments for the existence of souls is the argument that bodies are instruments of souls and the power to carry out operations through an instrument cannot belong to the instrument itself. Thus, there must be something other than the bodies of living things that operates by means of bodies, and this is their soul. In the case of the human or rational soul, he argues that its existence follows in particular from the fact that understanding and knowledge are found in a human being but not in the whole body or any part of it. Since these are operations of a living substance, there must be a living incorporeal substance in which they are, and this is what people mean when they speak of their soul.

These arguments serve not only to show the existence of souls, but also that they are substances. In the case of the human soul, William argues, the operations of understanding and knowing must be treated as proper operations of the soul, and this requires that the soul itself be a substance. To the objection that the soul itself does not literally understand or know but is instead that thanks to which a human being can understand and know, William will argue that the soul and human being, which he equates with the referent of the pronoun “I,” are one and the same thing. More generally, the substantiality of souls—and not just of human souls—is indicated by the fact that bodies are their instruments.

7.2 The Incorporeality of Souls

William argues at length that a soul cannot be a body, a conclusion he applies not just to human or rational souls, but also to those of plants and animals. In the case of human souls, he uses, among others, Avicenna’s “flying-man” argument to establish this point, arguing that a human being flying in the air who lacks and never had the use of his senses would know that he exists but deny that he has a body. Therefore “it is necessary that he have being that does not belong to the body and, for this reason, it is necessary that the soul not be a body” (OO II suppl., 83a; Teske 2000, 91) (For details, see Hasse 2000).

More generally, William argues that no body could perform the soul’s function of giving life to the body. For example, if a body were to give life, it would itself have to be a living body, and thus it would itself have to have a soul that rendered it alive. This soul, in turn, would have to be a living body and thus have its own soul, and so on ad infinitum. Thus, the doctrine that souls are bodies leads to an infinite regress.

7.3 The Human Soul and the Human Being

Perhaps the most striking aspect of William’s teaching about the soul is his identification of the human soul with the human being and his denial that the human body constitutes in whole or part the human being. Instead, William describes the body variously as a house, the soul its inhabitant; as a prison, the soul its captive; as a cloak, the soul its wearer, and so on. Nevertheless, the definition of a human being—he perhaps has in mind the Platonic conception of the human being as “a soul using a body”—involves a reference to the body, and it this, William thinks, that has led people to believe that the body is a part of a human being. But this is an error akin to thinking that because a horseman is defined by reference to a horse, the horse must therefore be a part of the horseman. William is aware, of course, that at times we do seem to ascribe to ourselves, and thus to the human being, the acts of the body or things that happen to the body, but he holds that these are non-literal modes of speaking, akin to a rich man’s complaint that he has been struck by hail, when in fact it was his vineyard that was struck.

William, as usual, offers numerous arguments for the identification of the soul and human being. He argues that the body cannot be a part of a human being, since the soul and body no more produce a true unity than, for example, a carpenter and his ax, and a human being is a true unity. And he notes that since the soul is subject to reward and punishment in the afterlife for actions we correctly attribute to the human being or ourselves, it must be identified with the human being. He also points to cases where our use of names or demonstratives referring to human beings must be understood as referring to their souls, and concludes that this shows that human beings are their souls.

7.4 The Simplicity of the Soul

According to William, souls are among the simplest of created substances. Nevertheless, like all created substances, they must involve some kind of composition. This composition cannot be a bodily composition, of course, since they are not bodies and thus cannot be divided into bodily parts. According to Avicebron, as well as some of William’s contemporaries, souls are composite in the sense that they are composites of form and matter, though not a matter that involves physical dimensions, but rather what some called “spiritual matter.” This view is part of the doctrine now termed “universal hylomorphism,” according to which every created substance is a composite of form and matter (see Weisheipl 1979). William is one of the first to reject this doctrine; he is later followed by Aquinas. In support of his rejection, in On the Universe he makes one of his rare references to Averroes, citing with approval his claim that prime matter is a potentiality only of perceptible substances and hence is not found in spiritual substances. He also argues that there is no need to posit matter in angels or souls in order to explain their receptivity in cognition, as some had thought necessary (OO I, 851b-852b). Rather, souls and other spiritual substances are “pure immaterial forms” without matter.

William also denies a real plurality of powers in the soul. He holds instead that each power of the soul is identical with the soul and not a part of it. When we speak of a power of the soul, we are really speaking of the soul considered as the source or cause of a certain kind of operation. Thus, the power to understand characteristic of a human or rational soul is the soul considered as a source or cause of the operation of understanding.

What sort of composition, then, is to be found in souls and other spiritual beings? William holds that every being other than God

is in a certain sense composed of that which is (quod est) and of that by which it is (quo est) or its being or entity … since being or entity accrues and comes to each thing apart from its completed substance and account. The exception is the first principle, to which alone [being] is essential and one with it in the ultimate degree of unity. (OO I, 852a)

Here William uses Boethius’s language of quod est and quo est to make the point that in souls, as in all created substances, there is, to use Avicennian terms, a composition of being and essence, a doctrine to be developed by Aquinas.

7.5 Denial of a Plurality of Souls in the Human Body

Besides rejecting universal hylomorphism, William also rejects the doctrine of a plurality of souls in a human being. This doctrine, which was popular among Franciscan thinkers, holds that the body of a human being is informed not just by a single soul, the rational soul, but also by a vegetative and a sensitive soul. This multiplicity of souls, it is held, serves to explain how human beings have the vital operations characteristic of plants and animals in addition to peculiarly human ones, and also explains the development of the fetus’s vital functions. Against this doctrine, William claims to have shown earlier in On the Soul that not only the operation of understanding, but also the sensitive operations of seeing and hearing “are essential and proper to the soul itself” (OO II suppl., 108b; Teske 2000, 164) and “hence, it cannot be denied except through insanity that one and the same soul carries out such operations.” Rather than posit a multiplicity of souls, William holds that higher souls incorporate the kinds of operations attributed to lower ones. The rational soul is infused into the body directly by God when the fetus reaches a suitable stage of organization, and the prior animal or sensitive soul in the fetus ceases to be. In this case too a view along similar lines was to be developed by Aquinas.

Scholars have noted, however, that while William rejects a plurality of souls in the human body, he does subscribe to a version of the doctrine of a plurality of substantial forms in the sense that he treats the human body as itself a substance independent of its association with the soul, and hence having its own corporeal form, while also being informed by the human or rational soul, which renders it a living thing. (For details see Bazán 1969.)

7.6 The Immortality of the Soul

According to William, the immortality of the human soul would be evident if not for the fact that the soul has, as it were, been put to sleep by the corruption of the body stemming from the punishment for sin. In our current state, however, William thinks the human soul’s immortality can be shown by means of philosophical arguments, to which he devotes considerable attention, both in On the Soul and in a shorter work, On the Immortality of the Soul.

He believes the error that the soul is naturally mortal “destroys the foundation of morality and of all religion” (Bülow 1897, 1; Teske 1991, 23), since those who believe in the mortality of the soul will have no motive for acting morally and honoring God. Thus, he notes that if the soul is not immortal, the honor of God is pointless in this life, since in the present life it “involves much torment and affliction for the soul” (Bülow 1897, 3; Teske 1991, 25) and receives no reward.

From a metaphysical point of view, William argues that the soul does not depend on the body for its being, and therefore the destruction of the body does not entail the non-existence of the soul. The rational soul’s independence from the body is due to the fact it is a self-subsistent substance whose proper operations do not involve or require a human body.

Since William takes the souls of plants and animals to be incorporeal substances, it might be thought that he would treat them as immortal too. But William holds that these souls cease to exist upon the death of the plant or animal. This is because all their proper operations, unlike those of the rational soul, depend on the body, and thus there would be no point for their continued existence after the destruction of the body.

7.7 The Powers Characteristic of the Human Soul

Characteristic of human souls, or human beings, are the intellective and motive powers, that is to say, the intellect and will. William thinks that of these, the will is by far the more noble power, and he is accordingly puzzled by the fact that neither Aristotle nor Avicenna have much to say about it. These authors do, however, discuss the intellective power at great length, and William accordingly devotes considerable attention to combating errors he sees in their teachings on the intellect.

7.7.1 The Motive Power: the Will

William develops his account of the will using the metaphor of a king in his kingdom. The will “holds the position in the whole human being and in the human soul of an emperor and king,” while “the intellective or rational power holds the place and function of counselor in the kingdom of the human soul” (OO II suppl. 95a; Teske 2000, 126, 129). William treats acts of will—expressed in the indicative mood by “I will” (volo) or “I refuse” (nolo)—as a kind of command that cannot be disobeyed, as distinguished from mere likings expressed in the form “I would like” (vellem) or “I would rather not’ (nollem). He holds that as a king must understand in order to make use of his counselors’ advice, so the will must not simply be an appetitive power but must also have its own capacity to apprehend. Likewise, the intellect must have its own desires. But he notes in On Virtues, that like a king the will need not heed the advice of its counselor; it may instead “give itself over to the advice of its slaves, that is, the inner powers and the senses”; in so doing it “gives itself over into becoming a slave of its slaves and is like a king … who follows the will and advice of senseless children” (OO I, 122a).

William frequently emphasizes the difference between voluntary action and the actions of brute animals. Animals operate in a “servile” manner, in the sense that they respond to their passions without having control over these responses. A human being, in contrast, has power over the suggestion of its desires; its will is “most free and is in every way in its own power and dominion” (OO II suppl., 94a; Teske 2000, 123). This is why human beings, unlike animals, can be imputed with blame or merit for their deeds.

According to William, the freedom of the will consists in the fact that the will “can neither be forced in any way to its proper and first operation, which is to will or refuse, nor prevented from the same; and I mean that it is not possible for someone to will something and entirely refuse that he will it or to refuse to will something, entirely willing that he will it” (OO I, 957aA). In other words, William defines force and prevention of the will in terms of higher-order volitions and refusals: for the will to be forced is for it to refuse to will X and nonetheless be made to will X, and for it to be prevented is for it to will to will X and be made to refuse X. In a number of works, William argues that neither force nor prevention of the will is possible: if someone refuses to will X, this must be because he takes X to be bad and thus he must refuse X rather than will it; and if someone wills to will X, this must be because he takes X to be good, and thus he must will X rather than refuse it.

7.7.2 The Intellective Power

William’s discussions of the intellective power are driven by a concern to attack errors he sees in his contemporaries and Greek and Islamic thinkers. While his reasons for rejecting these errors are clear enough, if at times based on a confused understanding of his sources, his own views on the nature of cognition are less well developed. Yet it is clear that, with the exception of our knowledge of first principles and the concepts they involve and certain cases of supernaturally revealed knowledge, William wishes to present a naturalistic account of cognition in this life in which God plays no special role.

In both On the Soul and On the Universe William attacks at length theories of cognition that posit an agent intellect (intellectus agens) or agent intelligence (intelligentia agens). He incorrectly ascribes the latter theory to Aristotle, although in fact it is Avicenna’s teaching; he ascribes the former theory to certain unnamed contemporaries. These theories view cognition as involving the active impression of intelligible signs or forms—what we might call concepts—on a receptive or passive recipient. The agent intellect or agent intelligence is taken to perform this function of impressing intelligible forms on our material intellect, which is so-called because like matter it is receptive of forms, albeit intelligible forms. The chief difference between the agent intellect and agent intelligence, as far as the theory of cognition is concerned, is that the former is treated as a part of the human soul, while the latter is taken to be a spiritual substance apart from the human soul, identified with Avicenna’s tenth intelligence. William notes how the agent intellect or agent intelligence is viewed by analogy with light or the sun; as light or the sun through its light serves to render actual merely potentially existing colors, so the agent intellect or intelligence serves to render actual intelligible forms existing potentially in the material intellect.

William as usual offers a large number of objections to these theories. He attacks as inappropriate the analogies with light or the sun, and argues that the theory of the agent and material intellects is incompatible with the simplicity of the soul, as it posits these intellects as two distinct parts of the soul, one active and one receptive. In the case of both the agent intellect and the agent intelligence, he argues that their proponents will be forced to hold the absurd result that human beings know everything that is naturally knowable, whereas in fact we must study and learn and observe in order to acquire much of our knowledge.

As for his own views on the intellective power, William holds that, like all the powers of the soul, the intellective power in the present life of misery has been corrupted. Therefore an account of it must distinguish its operation in its pure, uncorrupted state from its operation in the present life. In its pure state it is capable of knowing, without reliance on the senses, everything naturally knowable, even sensible things, and thus presumably also is capable of possessing the concepts in terms of which such knowledge is formulated. In its present state, however, most of its knowledge and repertoire of concepts stems in some manner from sense experience.

The knowledge of which the intellective power is naturally capable extends not just to universals, but also to singulars. For the intellect is naturally directed at the true as the will is at the good, and has as its end knowledge of the first truth, the creator, who is singular. William also notes our knowledge of ourselves and the importance of singular knowledge for our dealings with the world. Unfortunately, he provides no theory of the nature of singular cognition, and this issue must be left on the agenda until taken up by thinkers such as Scotus and Ockham in the late thirteenth and early fourteenth centuries.

William proposes a representationalist theory of cognition. He holds that it is not things or states of affairs themselves that are in the intellective power but rather signs or intelligible forms that serve to represent them. He takes these signs to be mental habits, that is to say, not bare potentialities but potentialities most ready to be actualized. Propositions are those complexes formed from signs through which states of affairs are represented to the mind. Although William speaks of these signs as likenesses, he is well aware of the difficulty in thinking of concepts as such, and he concludes that in fact there need not be a likeness between a sign and that of which it is a sign (OO II suppl. 214b; Teske 2000, 454).

A key question William confronts is how we acquire concepts and knowledge in the present life. In On the Soul he draws an important distinction. In the case of the first rules of truth and morality, he speaks of God as a mirror or book of all truths in which human beings naturally and without an intermediary, and thus without reliance on sense experience, read these rules. Likewise, God impresses or inscribes on our intellective power the intelligible signs in terms of which these first rules or principles are formulated. Thus, William posits at least some innate concepts; he notes, for example, in On Virtues and Morals that the concept of the true (veri) is innate (OO I, 124a). God also reveals to some prophets in this life “hidden objects of knowledge to which the created intellect cannot attain except by the gift and grace of divine revelation” (OO II suppl., 211b; Teske 2000, 445).

Does William therefore hold, as some have held (Gilson 1926), that at least in the case of these rules God in some special manner illuminates the human intellect? This might be suggested by his references to the intellective power as spiritual vision and his frequent use of the language of vision and illumination in his accounts of cognition. And yet, according to William, the first rules of truth and morality are “known through themselves” or self-evident. They are “lights in themselves … visible through themselves without the help of something else” (OO II suppl., 210b; Teske 2000, 443), and they serve to illuminate to the intellect the conclusions drawn from them. God’s role, it would seem, is to impress upon or supply to our intellect, in some way, these principles, but William gives no indication that he takes God to shed a special light on these principles in order that they may be known: once possessed they are, as it were, self illuminating.

The first rules of truth and morality and the concepts in terms of which they are formulated form only a small subset, however, of our cognitive repertoire. The remainder of our concepts and knowledge, leaving to one side the special divine revelation made to prophets, stems in some way from our dealings with the sensible world. But the problem William faces is to explain how this is so. The problem, he says, is that “sensation … brings to the intellect sensible substances and intellectual ones united to bodies [i.e., souls]. But it does not imprint [pingit] upon it their intelligible forms, because it does not receive such forms of them” (OO II suppl., 213a; Teske 2000, 449).

William’s response to this problem is to hold that the senses have the role simply of stimulating the intellective power in such a way that it “forms on its own and in itself intelligible forms for itself” (OO I, 914b), a doctrine he draws from Augustine. According to this account, the intellect is fundamentally active in the acquisition of intelligible forms. William speaks of the intellect as able, under the prompting of the senses, to consider the substances that underlie sensible accidents, and speaks of the intellect as “abstracting” from sense experience in the sense that it forms concepts of so-called “vague individuals” by stripping away perceptible features that serve to distinguish one individual from another. In these cases, William says, “the intellect is occasionally inscribed by these forms that are more separate and more appropriate to its nature” (OO II suppl., 213b; Teske 2000, 450).

A third cognitive process William mentions, conjunction or connection, is concerned not with the acquisition of intelligible forms, but rather with how knowledge of one thing brings with it knowledge of another. In particular, William argues that knowledge of a cause brings with it knowledge of the effect.

William is particularly concerned, however, that his account of the intellect’s generation of intelligible forms will require a division of the intellect into active and passive parts—the very distinction between an agent and material or receptive intellect he has devoted so much energy to attacking. The need to make this division of the intellect into two part is because it is impossible for the same thing to be both active and passive in the same respect, and yet in treating the intellect as indivisible it looks as though William is in fact committed to its being both active and passive in the same respect in the formation and reception of intelligible forms.

William’s attempts to resolve this problem are repeated in a number of works and couched in highly metaphorical language that poses severe problems of interpretation. The intellective power is both “a riverbed and fountain of the scientific and sapiential waters … Hence, in one respect it overflows and shines forth on itself, and in another respect it receives such outpouring or radiance” (OO II, suppl. 216b; Teske 2000, 457). William holds that because on this account the intellective power is not active and passive in the same respect, he is not forced to divide the intellect into two distinct parts, one active and one passive.

8. William’s Influence

Scholars have devoted little attention to William’s influence on later writers. Nevertheless, it is clear that he gave rise to no school of thought, and subsequent thinkers seem to have picked and chosen from his works the parts they would accept and the parts they would reject. Thus, William’s arguments that the world must have a beginning probably influenced thinkers such as Bonaventure and Henry of Ghent, while his rejection of universal hylomorphism and his metaphysics of being and essence may have influenced Aquinas, who presents similar views. There is also little doubt that some of William’s views were the subject of criticism, as for example his apparent denial of genuine secondary causation (see Reilly 1953). The large body of manuscripts in which William’s works survive suggests he was being read throughout the middle ages; Ottman 2005, for example, lists 44 manuscripts known to contain On the Universe. William’s works were also published in a number of printed editions in the 16th and 17th centuries.


Bibliographical and Biographical Studies

A full bibliography is included in Teske 2006.

  • Ottman, Jennifer R., 2005, “List of Manuscripts and Editions”, in Morenzoni and Tilliette 2005, pp. 375–399. The most up-to-date listing of William’s works.
  • Valois, Noël, 1880, Guillaume d’Auvergne, évêque de Paris (1228–1249): Sa vie et ses ouvrages, Paris: Picard. An old but still standard work.

Primary Texts in Latin

  • Opera homiletica, 2010–2013, Franco Morenzoni (ed.), 4 vols., Turnhout: Brepols [vol. 1: Sermones de tempore, I–CXXXV (CCCM 230); vol. 2: Sermones de tempore, CXXXVI–CCCXXIII (CCCM 230A); vol. 3: Sermones de sanctis (CCCM 230B); vol. 4: Sermones de communi sanctorum et de occasionibus (CCCM 230C)]. Critical edition of all sermons attributable to William.
  • [OO] Opera omnia, 1674, 2 vols., ed. F. Hotot, with Supplementum, ed. Blaise Le Feron, Orléans-Paris; reprinted Frankfurt am Main: Minerva, 1963. This edition remains the standard text for a large number of William’s writings. Available online from the links listed below.
  • Bülow, Georg (ed.), 1897, Des Dominicus Gundissalinus Schrift von der Unsterblichkeit der Seele nebst einem Anhange, enthaltend die Abhandlung des Wilhelm von Paris (Auvergne) De immortalitate animae (Beiträge zur Geschichte der Philosophie des Mittelalters, II, 3), Münster: Aschendorff. An edition of De immortalitate animae. Bülow’s attribution of this work to Dominicus Gundissalinus is now generally rejected.
  • Corti, Guglielmo (ed.), 1966, Il Tractatus de gratia di Guglielmo d’Auvergne, Rome: Lateran University, 1966. An edition of De gratia et libero arbitrio.
  • O’Donnell, J. Reginald (ed.), 1946a, “Tractatus Magistri Guillelmi Alvernensis De bono et malo”, Mediaeval Studies, 8: 245–299.
  • ––– (ed.), 1954, “Tractatus secundus Guillelmi Alvernensis De bono et malo”, Mediaeval Studies, 16: 219–271. This work is also known as De paupertate spirituali.
  • Switalski, Bruno (ed.), 1976, De Trinitate, Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies.

Primary Texts in Modern Translation

The following books all contain useful detailed outlines of the contents of the works translated.

  • Brenet, Jean-Baptiste (trans.), 1998, De l’âme (VII, 1–9), Paris: Vrin. French translation of parts of De anima.
  • Teske, Roland J. (trans.), 1991, The Immortality of the Soul (Medieval Philosophical Texts in Translation 30), Milwaukee, WI: Marquette University Press. Translation of De immortalitate animae.
  • –––, 1998a, The Universe of Creatures (Medieval Philosophical Texts in Translation 35), Milwaukee, WI: Marquette University Press. Translation of extensive selections from parts two and three of the first principal part of De universo.
  • –––, 2000a, The Soul (Medieval Philosophical Texts in Translation 37), Milwaukee, WI: Marquette University Press. Translation of De anima.
  • –––, 2007, The Providence of God Regarding the Universe (Medieval Philosophical Texts in Translation 43), Milwaukee, WI: Marquette University Press. Translation of part three of the first principal part of De universo.
  • –––, 2009a, On the Virtues (Mediaeval Philosophical Texts in Translation 45), Milwaukee, WI: Marquette University Press. Translation of De virtutibus.
  • –––, 2011, Selected Spiritual Writings: Why God Became Man; On Grace; On Faith (Mediaeval Sources in Translation 50), Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies. Translation of Cur Deus homo, De gratia, and De fide.
  • –––, 2013a, On Morals (Mediaeval Sources in Translation 55), Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies. Translation of De moribus.
  • –––, 2013b, Rhetorica divina, seu ars oratoria eloquentiae divinae (Dallas Medieval Texts and Translations 17), Paris/Leuven/Walpoe, MA: Peeters. Latin text and English translation.
  • Teske, Roland J., and Francis C. Wade (trans.), 1989, The Trinity, or the First Principle (Medieval Philosophical Texts in Translation 28), Milwaukee, WI: Marquette University Press. Translation of De Trinitate.

Secondary Literature

  • Barnes, Corey L., 2020, “Providence and Causality in the Summa Halensis”, in Lydia Schumacher (ed.), The Summa Halensis: Doctrines and Debates, Berlin/Boston: De Gruyter, pp. 89–106. For William on providence, see pp. 89–94 [Barnes 2020 available online].
  • Bazán, B. Carlos, 1969, “Pluralisme de formes ou dualisme de substances?”, Revue philosophique de Louvain, 67: 30–73.
  • Bernstein, Alan E., 2005, “William of Auvergne and the Cathars”, in Morenzoni and Tilliette 2005, pp. 271–289.
  • Bertolacci, Amos, 2012, “On the Latin Reception of Avicenna’s Metaphysics before Albertus Magnus: An Attempt at Periodization”, in Dag N. Hasse and Amos Bertolacci (eds.), The Arabic, Hebrew and Latin Reception of Avicenna’s Metaphysics, Berlin/Boston: De Gruyter, pp. 197–223.
  • Black, Winston, 2013, “William of Auvergne on the Dangers of Paradise: Biblical Exegesis Between Natural Philosophy and Anti-Islamic Polemic”, Traditio, 68: 233–258.
  • Caster, Kevin J., 1996a, “The Distinction between Being and Essence according to Boethius, Avicenna, and William of Auvergne”, The Modern Schoolman, 73: 309–332.
  • –––, 1996b, “The Real Distinction between Being and Essence according to William of Auvergne”, Traditio, 51: 201–223.
  • –––, 1996c, “William of Auvergne’s Adaptation of Ibn Gabirol’s Doctrine of the Divine Will”, The Modern Schoolman, 74: 31–42.
  • Cesalli, Laurent, 2005, “Guillaume d’Auvergne et l’enunciabile: La solution profane d’un problème théologique”, in Morenzoni and Tilliette 2005, pp. 117–136.
  • Corti, Guglielmo, 1968, “Le sette parte del Magisterium divinale et sapientiale di Guglielmo di Auvergne”, in Studi e ricerche di scienze religiose in onore dei santi apostoli Petro et Paulo nel XIX centenario del loro martirio, Rome: Lateran University, pp. 289–307.
  • Davis, Leo D., 1973, “Creation according to William of Auvergne”, in Gerard G. Steckler and Leo D. Davis (eds.), Studies in Mediaevalia and Americana, Essays in Honor of William Lyle Davis, S.J., Spokane: Gonzaga University Press, pp. 51–75.
  • de Mayo, Thomas, 2007, The Demonology of William of Auvergne: By Fire and Sword, Lewiston, NY: Edwin Mellen Press.
  • de Vaux, Roland, 1934, Notes et textes sur l’avicennisme latin aux confins des XIIe et XIIIe siècles, Paris: Vrin.
  • Fischer, Katrin, 2015, “Avicenna’s ex-uno-Principle in William of Auvergne’s De Trinitate”, Quaestio, 15: 423–32.
  • –––, 2018, “Avicenna’s Influence on William of Auvergne’s Theory of Efficient Causes”, in Dag N. Hasse and Amos Bertolacci (eds.), The Arabic, Hebrew and Latin Reception of Avicenna’s Physics and Cosmology, Boston/Berlin: De Gruyter, 371–396.
  • Gilson, Etienne, 1926, “Pourquoi saint Thomas a critiqué saint Augustin”, Archives d’histoire doctrinale et littéraire du Moyen Âge, 1: 5–127.
  • –––, 1946, “La notion d’existence chez Guillaume d’Auvergne”, Archives d’histoire doctrinale et littéraire du Moyen Âge, 21: 55–91.
  • Grant, Lindy, 2016, Blanche of Castile: Queen of France, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press. Contains remarks on William’s relationship with the Capetian court.
  • Grice, Deborah, 2020, Church, Society and University: The Paris Condemnation of 1241/4, London/New York: Routledge.
  • Hasse, Dag N., 2000, Avicenna’s De anima in the Latin West: The Formation of a Peripatetic Philosophy of the Soul, 1160–1300, London/Turin: The Warburg Institute – Nino Aragno Editore.
  • Iribarren, Isabel, 2017, “L’Empyrée et ses habitants au Moyen Âge”, Revue des sciences religieuses, 91(2): 181–192 [Iribarren 2017 available online].
  • Jüssen, Gabriel, 1975, “Wilhelm von Auvergne und die Entwicklung der Philosophie im Übergang zur Hochscholastik”, in Wolfgang Kluxen (ed.), Thomas von Aquin im philosophischen Gespräch, Freiburg/Munich: Alber, pp. 185–203.
  • –––, 1987, “Wilhelm von Auvergne und die Transformation der scholastischen Philosophie im 13. Jahrhundert”, in Jan P. Beckmann et al. (eds.), Philosophie im Mittelalter: Entwicklungslinien und Paradigmen, Hamburg: Meiner, pp. 141–164.
  • –––, 1995, “Die Tugend und der gute Wille: Wilhelm von Auvergnes Auseinandersetzung mit der aristotelischen Ethik”, in B. Carlos Bazán, Eduardo Andújar and Léonard G. Sbrocchi (eds.), Les philosophies morales et politiques au Moyen Âge: Actes du IXe Congrès international de Philosophie Médiévale, Ottawa, du 17 au 22 août 1992, vol. 2, New York/Ottawa/Toronto: Legas, pp. 709–722; reprinted in Philosophisches Jahrbuch, 102, 1995: 20–32.
  • Kramp, Josef, 1920, “Des Wilhelm von Auvergne Magisterium Divinale”, Gregorianum, 1: 538–613.
  • –––, 1921, “Des Wilhelm von Auvergne Magisterium Divinale”, Gregorianum, 2: 42–103, 174–195.
  • Laumakis, John A., 1999, “The Voluntarism of William of Auvergne and Some Evidence to the Contrary”, The Modern Schoolman, 76: 303–312.
  • –––, 2011, “William of Auvergne on the Human Being”, in Richard C. Taylor, David Twetten, and Michael Wreen (eds.), Tolle Lege: Essays on Augustine and on Medieval Philosophy in Honor of Roland. J. Teske, S.J., Milwaukee: Marquette University Press, pp. 303–320.
  • Lewis, Neil, 1995, “William of Auvergne’s Account of the Enuntiabile: Its Relation to Nominalism and the Doctrine of the Eternal Truths”, Vivarium, 33: 113–136.
  • Marrone, Steven P., 1983, William of Auvergne and Robert Grosseteste: New Ideas of Truth in the Early Thirteenth Century, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, 2004, “William of Auvergne and Aristotle on Knowing”, in Matthias Lutz-Bachmann, Alexander Fidora and Pia Antolic-Piper (eds.), Erkenntnis und Wissenschaft/Knowledge and Science: Probleme der Epistemologie in der Philosophie des Mittelalters/Problems of Epistemology in Medieval Philosophy, Berlin: Akademie Verlag, pp. 143–159.
  • Masnovo, Amato, 1929, “Guglielmo d’Auvergne e l’università di Parigi dal 1229 al 1231”, Giornale critico della filosofia italiana, 10: 310–355.
  • –––, 1946, Da Guglielmo d’Auvergne a S. Tommaso d’Aquino, 3 vols., 2nd edition, Milan: Vita et Pensiero.
  • Miller, Michael, 1998, “William of Auvergne on Primary and Secondary Qualities”, The Modern Schoolman, 75: 265–277.
  • –––, 2002, “William of Auvergne and the Aristotelians: The Nature of a Servant”, in John Inglis (ed.), Medieval Philosophy and the Classical Tradition: In Islam, Judaism and Christianity, Richmond, Surrey: Curzon, pp. 263–276.
  • Moody, Ernest A., 1975, “William of Auvergne and His Treatise De anima”, in Id. Studies in Medieval Philosophy, Science, and Logic, Collected Papers 1933–1969, Berkeley: University of California Press, pp. 1–109.
  • Morenzoni, Franco, 2007, “Le corpus homilétique de Guillaume d’Auvergne, évêque de Paris”, Sacris Erudiri, 46: 287–369.
  • Morenzoni, Franco, and Jean-Yves Tilliette (eds.), 2005, Autour de Guillaume d’Auvergne († 1249), Turnhout: Brepols.
  • O’Donnell, J. Reginald, 1946b, “The Notion of Being in William of Auvergne”, Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association, 21: 156–165.
  • Pitour, Thomas, 2011, Wilhelm von Auvergnes Psychologie: Von der Rezeption des aristotelischen Hylemorphismus zur Reformulierung der Imago-Dei-Lehre Augustins, Paderborn: Schöningh Verlag.
  • Reilly, James P., 1953, “Thomas of York on the Efficacy of Secondary Causes”, Mediaeval Studies, 15: 225–233.
  • Reynolds, Philip L., 2016, How Marriage Became One of the Sacraments: The Sacramental Theology of Marriage from Its Medieval Origins to the Council of Trent, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. For William on marriage and on his moral exchange theory, see pp. 506–511 and 540–543.
  • Rohls, Jan, 1980, Wilhelm von Auvergne und der mittelalterliche Aristotelismus: Gottesbegriff und aristotelische Philosophie zwischen Augustin und Thomas von Aquin, Munich: Kaiser.
  • Rosheger, John P., 2002, “Is God a ‘What’? Avicenna, William of Auvergne, and Aquinas on the Divine Essence”, in John Inglis (ed.), Medieval Philosophy and the Classical Tradition: In Islam, Judaism and Christianity, Richmond, Surrey: Curzon, pp. 277–296.
  • Sannino, Antonella, 2004, “La dottrina della causalità nell’universo di Guglielmo d’Alvernia: Percorsi di lettura”, Studi filosofici, 27: 31–68.
  • –––, 2016, “Fato, necessitá e causalitá astrale in Guglielmo d’Alvernia”, Studi filosofici, 39: 31–47.
  • Schindele, Stephan, 1900, Beiträge zur Metaphysik des Wilhelm von Auvergne, Munich: Kastner&Lossen.
  • Silva, José Filipe, 2014, “Medieval Theories of Active Perception: An Overview”, in Id. and Mikko Yrjonsuuri (eds.), Active Perception in the History of Philosophy: From Plato to Modern Philosophy, Dordrecht: Springer, pp. 117–46.
  • Smith, Lesley, 1992, “William of Auvergne and the Jews”, in Diana Wood (ed.), Christianity and Judaism. Papers Read at the 1991 Summer Meeting of the Ecclesiastical History Society, Oxford: Blackwell, pp. 107–117.
  • –––, 2005, “William of Auvergne and the Law of the Jews and the Muslims”, in Thomas Heffernan and Thomas E. Burman (eds.), Scripture and Pluralism: Reading the Bible in the Religiously Plural Worlds of the Middle Ages and Renaissance, Leiden/Boston: Brill, pp. 123–142.
  • –––, 2020, “Slippers in Heaven: William of Auvergne Preaching to the Brethren”, in Lydia Schumacher (ed.), The Summa Halensis: Sources and Context, Berlin/Boston: De Gruyter, pp. 285–298 [Smith 2020 available online].
  • Teske, Roland J., 1990, “The Identity of the Italici in William of Auvergne’s Discussion of the Eternity of the World”, Proceedings of the PMR Conference, 15: 191–203; reprinted in Teske 2006, pp. 53–63.
  • –––, 1992, “William of Auvergne on De re and De dicto Necessity”, The Modern Schoolman, 69: 111–121; reprinted in Teske 2006, pp. 65–79.
  • –––, 1993a, “William of Auvergne and the Manichees”, Traditio, 48: 63–75; reprinted in Teske 2006, pp. 81–99.
  • –––, 1993b, “William of Auvergne’s Use of Avicenna’s Principle: ‘Ex Uno, Secundum Quod Unum, Non Nisi Unum’”, The Modern Schoolman, 71: 1–15; reprinted in Teske 2006, pp. 101–119.
  • –––, 1994a, “The Will as King over the Powers of the Soul: Uses and Sources of an Image in the Thirteenth Century”, Vivarium, 32: 62–71.
  • –––, 1994b, “William of Auvergne on the Eternity of the World”, The Modern Schoolman, 67: 187–205; reprinted in Teske 2006, pp. 29–52.
  • –––, 1994c, “William of Auvergne on the Individuation of Human Souls”, Traditio, 49: 77–93; reprinted in Teske 2006, pp. 121–143.
  • –––, 1995a, “William of Auvergne’s Arguments for the Newness of the Word”, Mediaevalia: Textos e Estudos, 7–8: 287–302; reprinted in Teske 2006, pp. 145–159.
  • –––, 1995b, “William of Auvergne’s Rejection of the Agent Intelligence”, in William J. Carrol and John J. Furlong (eds.), Greek and Medieval Studies in Honor of Leo Sweeney, S.J., New York: Peter Lang, pp. 211–235.
  • –––, 1996, “Freedom of the Will in William of Auvergne”, in B. Carlos Bazán et al. (eds.), Moral and Political Philosophies in the Middle Ages. Proceedings of the Ninth International Conference on Medieval Philosophy, vol. 2, New York: Legas, pp. 932–938.
  • –––, 1998b, “William of Auvergne on Philosophy as divinalis and sapientialis”, in Jan A. Aertsen and Andreas Speer (eds.), Was ist Philosophie in Mitteralter?, Berlin: De Gruyter, pp. 475–481.
  • –––, 1998c, “William of Auvergne on the Relation between Reason and Faith”, The Modern Schoolman, 75: 279–291; reprinted in Teske 2006, pp. 179–194.
  • –––, 1998d, “William of Auvergne and Plato’s World of Ideas”, Traditio, 55: 117–130; reprinted in Teske 2006, pp. 161–178.
  • –––, 1999, “William of Auvergne’s Debt to Avicenna”, in Jules L. Janssens and Daniel de Smet (eds.), Avicenna and His Heritage. Acts of the International Colloquium. Leuven-Louvain-la-Neuve, September 8–September 11, 1999, Leuven: Leuven University Press, pp. 153–170; reprinted in Teske 2006, pp. 217–237.
  • –––, 2000b, “William of Auvergne on Time and Eternity”, Traditio, 55: 125–141; reprinted in Teske 2006, pp. 195–215.
  • –––, 2003, “William of Auvergne on the Various States of our Nature”, Traditio, 58: 201–218; reprinted in Teske 2006, pp. 239–253, and in Peter J. Weigel and Joseph G. Prud’homme (eds.), 2016, The Philosophy of Human Nature in Christian Perspective, New York: Peter Lang, pp. 65–81.
  • –––, 2005, “William of Auvergne’s Spiritualist Conception of Man”, in Morenzoni and Tilliette 2005, pp. 35–53.
  • –––, 2006, Studies in the Philosophy of William of Auvergne. Milwaukee, WI: Marquette University Press. A Collection of Papers by the Preeminent Student of William of Auvergne’s Thought.
  • –––, 2009b, “William of Auvergne on the Virtues”, Modern Schoolman, 87: 35–49.
  • Wei, Ian P., 2020, “William of Auvergne”, in Id., Thinking about Animals in Thirteenth-Century Paris: Theologians on the Boundary between Humans and Animals, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 9–93. A detailed analysis on the role of animals and the relationship between animals and humans in De legibus and De universo.
  • Weill-Parot, Nicolas, 2017, “Relatos de los poderes de las imágenes mágicas entre prescripción y prueba (siglos XII–XV)”, História revista, 22(1): 19–34 [Weill-Parot 2017 available online].
  • –––, 2019, “Pouvoir de la magie astrale et ordre politique chez Guillaume d’Auvergne”, Quaestio, 19: 149–172.
  • Weisheipl, James A., 1979, “Albertus Magnus and Universal Hylomorphism”, Southwestern Journal of Philosophy, 10: 239–260.
  • Wippel, John F., 2003, “The Parisian Condemnations of 1270 and 1277”, in Jorge J. E. Gracia and Timothy B. Noone (eds.), A Companion to Philosophy in the Middle Ages, Malden, MA: Blackwell, 65–73.
  • Young, Spencer E., 2014, Scholarly Community at the Early University of Paris: Theologians, Education and Society, 1215–1248, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. For William of Auvergne, see pp. 64–101.

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