Robert Boyle

First published Tue Jan 15, 2002; substantive revision Tue Jul 6, 2010

Boyle was one of the leading intellectual figures of the seventeenth century. He was a dedicated experimenter, unwilling to construct abstract theories to which his results had to conform. “Our Boyle,” Oldenburg wrote to Spinoza, “is one of those who are distrustful enough of their reasoning to wish that the phenomena should agree with it” (Hall & Hall 1965–1977, 2:38). Boyle, a champion of both the corpuscularian doctrine and the Baconian method of natural history, preferred to report the results of his experiments, including negative results, and frequently lamented the fact that we lacked “histories” (collections of experimental results and accurate observations) in various fields of scientific endeavour. He performed so many experiments that he was able, at one “time to loose … at once near five centuries of Experiments of my own” (BP 9:28). Nor was this an isolated loss; nonetheless the number, variety and scope of his experiments were such that he carried on working and publishing with no particular difficulty. “His books,” as Huygens remarked to Leibniz immediately after Boyle's death, “are full of experiments” (Huygens 1888, 10:239). Moreover, experiments were exactly what he was interested in, he had a certain missionary zeal in spreading the corpuscularian gospel, but he was not himself interested in detailed system building,[1] a fact that was commonly noted. Leibniz told Huygens that he was “astonished” that Boyle “who has so many fine experiments, [had] not come to some theory of chemistry after meditating so long on them. Yet in his books, and for all the consequences that he draws from his observations, he concludes only what we all know, that everything happens mechanically. He is perhaps too reserved. Excellent men should leave us even their conjectures; they are wrong if they wish to give us only those truths that are certain” (Leibniz to Huygens, Dec. 29, 1691, in Huygens 1888, 10:228). Boyle was ahead of his time. In the next century d'Alembert wrote “the taste for systems … is today almost entirely banished from works of merit … a writer among us who praised systems would have come too late” (d'Alembert 1751, 94).[2]

Boyle was a corpuscularian, a term he employed to paper over the differences between believers in a vacuum, and believers in a plenum, given that both of them agreed that the explanation of natural occurrences should be solely in terms of particles of matter, their motion and interaction. Boyle consistently refused to pronounce on the question of whether these minima naturalia should be considered atoms, in the strict sense of that term, or not.[3]

Even a metaphysical non-corpuscularian such as Leibniz agreed with Boyle in practical terms. “However much I agree with the Scholastics in this general and, so to speak, metaphysical explanation of the principles of bodies,” he wrote to Arnauld in July 1686, “I am as corpuscular as one can be in the explanation of particular phenomena, and it is saying nothing to allege that they have forms or qualities” (Gerhardt 1875, 2:58, trans. Mason 1967).

Boyle's scientific range was wide. Besides his well known work in mechanics, medicine, hydrodynamics and a wide variety of experiments with his vacuum pump, he was interested both theoretically and practically in alchemy (see Principe 1998, Clericuzio 2000, Newman and Principe 2002), where his interest seems to have been fueled more by his constant desire to acquire knowledge of God and the world than by any desire for riches. He “cultivated Chymistry with a disinterested mind,” seeking the improvement of his own knowledge, “the gratifying the Curious & the Industrious; and the Acquist of some useful helps to make good & uncommon Medicins.”[4] As a corpuscularian he believed that transmutation was physically possible. As a person he believed that it actually occurred. He believed that in his own laboratory gold had been transmuted into a “baser metal” with a specific gravity about two thirds of that of gold, and since he was, he said, more interested in the luciferous aspect of discovery than the lucriferous, he found the process equally interesting in either direction.[5]

During the course of his life he sought constantly to improve the lot of humanity. He was interested in the improvement of agricultural methods, in the possibility of extracting fresh water from salt, in the improvement of medicines and medicinal practice, in the possibility of preserving food by vacuum packing, and in a number of other useful results, actual or potential, of experimental philosophy. He viewed his theological interests and his work in natural philosophy as forming a seamless whole and constantly used results from the one area to enlighten matters in the other. (On the relation between science and religion in Boyle's thought see Hunter 2000.)

Convinced that Christianity was the religion instituted by God, Boyle was concerned that the Bible should be widely promulgated and he devoted time and energy to having it translated into a variety of languages such as Irish, Turkish, and various native American languages. He viewed such conversion attempts as being on all fours with his attempts to find more efficacious medicines for:

To convert Infidels to the Christian Religion is a work of great Charity and kindnes to men. I. In regard of the evills it frees them from, such as, (1) the gross errors and prejudices they had entertain'd before they were instructed in it. (2ly) The vices and polutions they securely liv'd in, before they receiv'd the Gospel; some of which were unworthy of men as such; others very prejudicial to humane society's; and others very mischievous to the vicious persons themselves; and others <againe> great hinderances to the discovery and reception of usefull and noble truths. (3ly) The unexpressible Infelicitys that attend the greatest part of such Infidels & wicked Persons, in the future state.

II. The Christian Religion brings mankind diverse positive Benefits, such as are, more cleare and extensive knowledg of God, and divine things; the Remission of Sins; the Favour of God; severall graces and vertues suitable to mens respective needs and conditions; and above all, a happy Immortality in the Life to come. (Boyle Papers [BP] 5:73–4; BOA §3.7.4, p 301)

1. Life[6]

Robert Boyle was born in Lismore, Ireland, on January 25, 1627. He was his parents' fourteenth, penultimate, child, and the last to survive to adulthood. Boyle was the youngest son and, after his sister Margaret died when he was 10, the youngest child of the family. Boyle speaks fondly of his parents, but he could not have known them well. His mother died in childbirth a few weeks after Boyle's third birthday, and he last saw his father just before he and his brother Francis left for a continental tour when Boyle was twelve.

Like many children Boyle had his share of near escapes from serious injury as a child, but the time and Boyle being what they were he saw in each of them the hand of God. Michael Hunter has pointed out that “the spiritual autobiography, aimed at chronicling God's purpose for the individual in question by recounting providential escapes, spiritual trials and conversion experiences,” was “a characteristic genre of autobiographical writing in seventeenth-century England” (Hunter 1994a, xx), and Nicolas Canny notes that “The invocation of providence as an explanation for accidental or chance happenings in this life was so commonplace among sincere Protestants in the early seventeenth century that it had come to be considered irreverent or profane not so to attribute them” (Canny 1982, 28). But, though common enough, there is no doubt that, in Boyle's case at least, the protestations were sincere. He continued to believe in this divine attention, though in a more intellectual realm, throughout his life. In 1663 he wrote,

And though I dare not affirm … that God discloses to Men the Great Mystery of Chymistry by Good Angels, or by Nocturnal Visions … yet perswaded I am, that the favor of God does (much more than most Men are aware of) vouchsafe to promote some Mens Proficiency in the study of Nature (Boyle Works [BW], 3:276, Birch 1772, II:61).[7]

In Geneva on his continental tour Boyle underwent what he clearly felt to be a conversion from nominal or at least unthinking Christianity to committed Christianity. One summer night, he “was suddenly waked in a Fright with such loud Claps of Thunder … & every clap … both preceded & attended with Flashes of lightning so numerous … & so dazling, that [he] began to imagine … the Day of Judgment's being come.” This led him to vow that “all further additions to his life shud be more Religiously & carefully employ'd.” Realizing the inefficacy of a promise exacted under duress, Boyle repeated the performance under a serene and cloudless sky “so solemnly that from that Day he dated his Conversion; renewing now he was past Danger, the vow he had made whilst he fancy'd himselfe to be in it: that tho his Feare was (& he blush't it was so) the … occasion of his Resolution of Amendment; yet at least he might not owe his more deliberate consecration … of himselfe to Piety, to any less noble Motive then that of it's owne Excellence” (BP 37:181r-v, Hunter 1994a, 16).

The promise seems never to have been broken, and indeed the later Boyle stressed the need to have an examined faith. He pointed out that “usually, such as are born in such a place, espouse the opinions true or false, that obtain there” (BW, 12:421, Birch 1772, VI:712), indeed, “the greatest number of those that pass for Christians, profess themselves such only because Christianity is the religion of their Parents, or their Country, or their Prince, or those that have been, or may be, their Benefactors; which is in effect to say, that they are Christians, but upon the same grounds that would have made them Mahometans, if they had been born and bred in Turky” (BP 7:233, BOA §3.7.5, pp 301–2). Boyle felt that more was required of the thinking believer. Locke agreed: often a child's notion of God does more “resemble the Opinion, and Notion of the Teacher, than represent the True God” (Essay, 1.14.13).

Hard on the heels of Boyle's enlightenment, doubts about his faith began to trouble him,[8] and these “distracting Doubts of some of the Fundamentals of Christianity” continued: “never after did these fleeting Clouds, cease now & then to darken … the clearest serenity of his quiet: which made him often say that Injections of this Nature were such a Disease to his Faith as the Tooth-ach is to the Body; for tho it be not mortall, ‘tis very troublesome” (BP 37:182r, Hunter 1994a, 17).

Leaving Switzerland, Boyle, along with Marcombes and his brother crossed the Alps and entered Italy in September 1641 where, in Florence, he spent the winter. “In Italy he read over the lives of the ancient philosophers with the utmost attention,” presumably in Diogenes Laertius, and “[t]he sect, which then struck him most, was that of the Stoics; and he tried his proficiency in their philosophy, by enduring a long fit of the tooth-ach with great unconcernedness.”[9] Still in Italy he had (in the winter of 41–42) what seems to have been one of the very few sexual encounters of his life. Writing about himself in the third person as Philaretus (sometimes P., or Filaretus) he says:

Nor did he sometimes scruple, in his Governor's Company, to visit the famousest Bordellos; whither resorting out of bare Curiosity, he retain'd there an unblemish't Chastity, & still return'd thence as honest as he went thither. Professing that he never found any such sermons against them, as they were against themselves. The Impudent Nakednesse of vice, clothing it with a Difformity, Description cannot reach, & the worst of Epithetes cannot but flatter. But tho P. were noe Fewell for forbidden Flames, he prov'd the Object of unnaturall ones. For being at that Time not above 15, & the Cares of the World having not yet faded a Complexion naturally fresh enuf; as he was once unaccompany'd diverting himselfe abroad, he was somewhat rudely presst by the Preposterous Courtship of 2 of those Fryers, whose Lust makes no distinction of Sexes; but that which it's Preference of their owne creates; & not without Difficulty, & Danger, forc't a scape from these gown'd Sodomites. Whose Goatish Heates, serv'd not a little to arme Filaretus against such Peoples specious Hyprocrisy; & heightn'd & fortify'd in him an Aversenesse for Opinions, which now the Religieux discredit as well as the Religion (BP 37:184r-v, Hunter 1994a, 20).

Leaving Italy Marcombes and the two boys found on arrival in Marseilles that the monies the Great Earl had been in the habit of sending were no longer to arrive and that, indeed, the last quarter's payment had been held up by Cork's London agent. Moreover, there was a letter from the Earl, unaware of the mischance affecting the quarterly payment, telling them that, as a result of the rebellion in Ireland, no more money was to be forthcoming: in the “dangerous and poore estate whereunto by gods providence” he had been reduced, he had “with much difficulty gott together two hundred and fifty pounds by selling of plate,” but to pay Marcombes' bills punctually as he had in the past “I am noe waies able.” So he advised Marcombes to use the money to bring the two boys

out of some meet port in France to land either at dublin, Corke, or Youghall, (for all other Cities and Sea townes are possessed by the enemy), or else my two sonnes [must] travaile into Holland, and putt themselves into entertaynement under the service and conduct of the Prince of Orange; for they must henceforward maintayne themselves by such entertaynements as they gett in the warres (Earl of Cork to Marcombes 9 March 1641/2, Maddison 1969, 47).

In the event Francis decided to return to Ireland, arriving in time to fight in the Battle of Liscarrol (September 3, 1642), at which another Boyle brother, Lewis, was killed. Meanwhile Robert decided that his health and lack of money ruled out a return to Ireland, and his age made soldiering in Holland an untempting and indeed implausible prospect.[10] He therefore decided to accept Marcombes' offer of hospitality in Geneva, and did not make his way to England until the summer of 1644.

Before leaving Geneva Boyle had a conversation with François Perreaud (1572–1657), who later wrote Démonographie, ou traité des démons, which Boyle then arranged to have translated into English by Peter du Moulin (the younger, 1601–1684). In a letter prefixed to the English edition Boyle recalled that “the conversation I had with that pious Author during my stay at Geneva, and the present he was pleased to make me of this Treatise before it was printed, in a place where I had opportunities to enquire both after the writer, and some passages of the booke, did at length overcome in me (as to this narrative) all my settled indisposedness to believe strange things.” (BW 1:15) Acceptance of at least the possibility of diabolic or angelic intervention was common among the intelligentsia in the second half of the seventeenth century. Cudworth pointed out one expedient reason for the belief:

all these Extraordinary Phænomena, of Apparitions, Witchcraft, Possessions, Miracles, and Prophecies, do Evince that Spirits, Angels or Demons, though Invisible to us, are no Phancies, but Real and Substantial Inhabitants of the World; which favours not the Atheistick Hypothesis; but some of them, as the Higher kind of Miracles, and Predictions, do also immediatly enforce the acknowledgment of a Deity: a Being superiour to Nature, which therefore can check and controul it; and which comprehending the whole, foreknows the most Remotely distant, and Contingent Events (Cudworth 1678, 715).[11].

In a manuscript draft (“Loose papers whence some things are to be extracted for the Discourse of the causes of Atheism”) Boyle considered three objections that might be made against such a belief: the implausibility of the standard means of bringing about such intervention; the unreliability of the witnesses; and the impossibility of incorporeal beings interacting with matter. He agrees that the first objection, “urg'd with great confidence, and not without much show of Reason” is a strong one, but suggests that “we men understand very little of the nature, customes, & government of the Intelligent creatures of the spirituall world: and particularly what concernes the Falne Angells or bad Daemons. And therefore they being themselves invisible to us, and capable of working in wayes that our sences cannot discerne; and being Agents of great craft & long experience; tis no wonder that many of their actions, thô never so pollytickly contrived & carried on, should seem irrationall to us: who know so little of their particular inclinations & designes, and the subtil & secret methods in which they carry them on.”

The second objection he also accepts, though not wholly: “thô upon particular & cogent proofe I beleeve some of them to be true … yet I reject or distrust far the greatest part, as not being soe attested.” The third he rejects as being simply inconsistent, for the human soul is accepted as incorporeal, and it works (though we know not how) on matter (BP 2:105, BOA §3.5.21, pp 257–8).

When Boyle arrived back in England in mid-1644 at the age of 17 he was quickly reunited with his sister Katherine who seems immediately to have re-adopted the semi-maternal role she had no doubt often played after the death of their mother. She was concerned in a variety of other ways to look after his welfare, both spiritual and worldly. She was, for example, the immediate cause of his getting to know the members of the Hartlib circle.[12]

At this time Boyle settled in Stalbridge (on an estate left to him by his father) and occupied himself mainly in writing or planning works in ethics and theology. Much of his time during the early part of this Stalbridge period was spent in moral philosophy — “My Ethics go very slowly on,” he wrote to his sister Katherine on March 30, 1646 (BC 1:34) — and there was at this stage no reason to think that he would become one of the great natural philosophers of his time. (See further, Hunter 2009, chs. 4 and 5.) He already approximated to the “lay-bishop” that Aubrey, quoting Anthony Walker, was later to find him to be. He was, in fact, a serious, somewhat priggish young man, though he often gave signs of light-heartedness both as a boy and in later life. After his death Gilbert Burnet claimed that “As for Joy, he had indeed nothing of Frolick and Levity in him,” a judgement accepted by Steven Shapin, but this fails to allow for the lighter moments that Boyle undoubtedly enjoyed.[13]

At Stalbridge, about 1649, Boyle began to be interested in experimenting, but was hindered by the fact that he could not obtain a furnace. Stalbridge was far enough away from tradespeople who could make such an item and the furnaces Boyle ordered tended to arrive “crumbled into as many pieces, as we into sects,” leaving Boyle to attempt “such experiments, as the unfurnishedness of the place, and the present distractedness of my mind, will permit me” (BC 1:50).

Boyle was troubled throughout his life by the fragmentation of Christianity. Among “the giddy multitude … this multiplicity of religions will end in none at all,” he wrote to John Mallet in 1652,[14] and at the very end of his life he expressed in his Will the wish that the Boyle lecturers should, when “proveing the Christian Religion against notorious Infidels (viz), Theists, Pagans, Jews and Mahometans, not [descend] lower to any Controversies that are among Christians themselves.”[15]

Eventually, however, a furnace did arrive, and Boyle found himself “so transported and bewitch'd [as to] fancy my Laboratory a kind of Elysium … . I there forget my Standish and my Bookes and allmost all things” (Boyle to Katherine Ranelagh, Aug 31, 1649, BC 1:83).

Boyle was never a student at a university. Nor was he ever a fellow of an Oxford College, though that too has been claimed on his behalf (Dutton 1951, 20), but it was to Oxford that he removed after his time at Stalbridge, and it was there that his interest in natural philosophy flowered. Before taking up residence in Oxford however he paid two lengthy visits to Ireland during the early 50s (for a year from June 1652, and then for eight months from Oct 1653), and it was from that “illiterate country” that he wrote to Clodius, probably toward the end of his second Irish visit, in the spring of 1654:

For my part, that I may not live wholly useless, or altogether a stranger in the study of nature, since I want glasses and furnaces to make a chemical analysis of inanimate bodies, I am exercising myself in making anatomical dissections of living animals: wherein (being assisted by your father-in-law's friend Dr Petty, our general's physician) I have satisfied myself of the circulation of the blood, and the (freshly discovered and hardly discoverable) receptaculum chyli, made by the confluence of the venae lactae;[16] and have seen (especially in the dissections of fishes) more of the variety and contrivances of nature, and the majesty and wisdom of her author, than all the books I ever read in my life could give me convincing notions of (BC 1:167).

It was also during this period, no doubt in large part due to Cromwell's extremely harsh treatment of the Irish, that Boyle's Irish properties were made secure and began returning rents to him, ultimately reaching almost £3000 p.a., Hooke told Aubrey. The fact that Boyle's friend Petty conducted the survey on which the disposal of the lands was based can hardly have been to Boyle's disadvantage.

On October 12, 1655, Katherine was in Oxford investigating the suitability of possible lodgings for Boyle. He was to lodge with the apothecary John Crosse, whom Birch felt worthy of mention because he had “a great acquaintance with Dr. John Fell,”[17] and the question was, which was the best room for his purposes, and how was it to be furnished?

My Brother,
It has pleased god to bring us safe to oxford & I am lodged at Mr Crosses with designe to be able to give you from experience an accoumpt which is the warmest roome, & indeed I am satisfied with neither of them as to that poynt, because the doores are placed soe just by the Chimeys that if you have the benifit of the fier you must venture haveing the inconvenience of the wind, which yet may be helped in either by a folding skreen & then I think that which lookes into the garden wilbe the more Comfortable… (BC 1:193).

The house in question stood on the site where the Shelley Memorial now stands, and his two rooms there seem to have served Boyle admirably, though he later set up a retreat at Stanton St John's, where he could retire when the press of society grew too great in Oxford.

In Oxford Boyle's tremendous output of works in philosophy, theology, and experimental philosophy began. It was here that he published New Experiments Physico-Mechanical, Touching the Spring of Air and its Effects, Certain Physiological Essays, The Sceptical Chymist, Some Considerations touching the Usefulness of Experimental Natural Philosophy, and a number of others including The Origine of Forms and Qualities.

Boyle's years in London (from 1668 to his death) saw the continuation of his experimental work, along with a number of works on philosophy and theology, including The Excellency of Theology, Compar'd with Natural Philosophy, Considerations About the Excellency and Grounds of the Mechanical Hypothesis, the Free Enquiry into the Vulgarly Receiv'd Notion of Nature, the Discourse of things above Reason, Disquisition about the Final Causes of Natural Things, and The Christian Virtuoso.

In 1691 Katherine died, and Boyle, whose health throughout his life had been poor, died the following week.

2. Religious Views

The seventeenth century is notable not only for the number but also for the variety of arguments which were offered to prove God's existence. Although writers such as Pascal and Bayle felt such arguments to be both unnecessary and unavailable, demonstrations of God's existence were felt by many to be not only possible but desirable, since they were necessary in the fight against atheism.[18]

Descartes, as is well known, felt that God's existence could be, and epistemologically had to be, demonstrated, and offered a variety of proofs to provide such a demonstration. His version of the ontological argument, his proof from the supposed innate idea of God, his proof from the need for an eternal conscious being,[19] and his proof from the need for continuing creation, all found supporters in the later seventeenth century, though the first two were generally held to be unlikely to convince anyone.

Apart from a brief reference to it in the printed works Boyle does not mention the ontological argument (BW 9:413; Boyle 1772, 4:461–2). This distancing was not uncommon at the time. Ralph Cudworth, though clearly fascinated by the ontological argument, recognized that most would “Distrust, the Firmness and Solidity of such thin and Subtle Cobwebs,” and offered an alternative argument in the hope that it would prove more “Convictive of the Existence of a God to the Generality” (Cudworth 1678, 725).

The language of the ontological argument was acceptable, even when the argument's validity was rejected. Gassendi, for example, agreed that God is that than which nothing greater can be conceived, but denied the validity of the argument which offers this as its main premise (See further Osler 1994, ch. 2).

Nor was the argument from innate ideas more popular. After his dialogue character Cuphophron has espoused it, Henry More has his down to earth Hylobares burst out:

Well, Cuphophron, you may hug your self in your high Metaphysicall Acropolis as much as you will, and deem those Arguments fetched from the frame of Nature mean and popular: but for my part, I look upon them as the most sound and solid Philosophicall Arguments that are for the proving the Existence of a God (More 1668, 53).[20]

Boyle, too, held that design arguments were both available and the most likely to persuade rational, open-minded hearers. Such arguments were intended to form a large part of a book on atheism, something he worked on throughout his adult life but never published, though parts of it were used in various other works of a theological nature.[21] Boyle did, however, leave a plan of the intended work, and in the manuscript remains — seven volumes of correspondence, forty-six volumes of miscellaneous papers and eighteen volumes of notebooks — there are still a number of unpublished fragments and some longer selections which he intended for this work.

Boyle intended “the little Tract about Atheism” to have three sections:

In the First of these, the Author represents some Reasons why it should not be thought strange if it be found somewhat difficult to demonstrate the Existence of a Deity.
1 The First of these Reasons is, that by reason of the selfe existence and Primity of God, his Essence cannot be Causable.

2 The Vitious Affections & Habits and the depravd frame of mind to be met with in most Atheists do very much indispose them to be convinc'd by the proofes of a Deity that might other wise be sufficient.

3 Since God is a Being whose Nature is the most singular of all, there must necessarily belong to him divers things, not to be paralleld.

4 The Difficulty of such speculations as belong to the Contemplations of Gods Attributes keeps the generality of Atheists & Libertines from being qualifyed for such Enquiries.

In the second section <the Author> haveing premisd, that the foregoing Reasons make it Equitable not to expect metaphysical or rigid Demonstrations of a Deity, but to be content with a moral one, if no better can be had, proceeds to the mediums whereof such a Demonstration can be made up. Such as are

The innate Idea of a Deity

The general Consent of mankind. (To one of which or both may be referrd the Epicurean Anticipation.)

The Reproaches or Boadings & Disquieting Terrors of a Guilty Conscience

The Fabrick & Conservation of the world, especially of Animals

The Nature & Propertys of the Soul of Man

The Lawes of its Union with the Body[22]

The Universal Providence that directs the Affairs of Mankind.

Supernatural Effects whether of good or Evil Spirits (as their Apparitions Action Oracles Predictions &c)

The Patefactions that God has made of himselfe by true miracles. (To which Prophecies are reduc'd.)

The Third section is spent in shewing some of the Reasons why the Arguments proposd in the Second are often unprevalent.

1 And among the Intellectual Impediments the First is, That Atheists often injuriously attribute to the notion of a Deity the fond Opinions or rash Assertions of unskillfull men.

2 Atheists on the other side do sometimes no less injuriously father their owne Errors & mistakes on the notion of a Deity.

3 They do not equitably consider the Nature of the Thing to be proved, & the necessity that thence arises, that the Theory of the Divine Attributes should be lyable to specious Objections.

4 They do not duely consider, that their owne Hypothesis is lyable to some of the same difficulties & Objections, and to others that they cannot solve.

5 The Objections are more popular & easy that are to be made against the notion of a Deity than the Answers to those Objections & the Arguments which prove that Notion.

Well, that was the plan, and Boyle certainly thought that the design arguments he intended for section two should convince the open-minded. Moreover, he thought, such arguments should particularly convince those who were knowledgeable about nature, who knew enough about the details of the world to be impressed by the intricacy of the presumed workmanship. “[T]here are,” he wrote, “positive Reasons afforded by Philosophy to prove a Deity, namely … the Cartesian Idæa, the Originall of Motion, the use of Parts in Animalls, especially the Eye, the valves of the heart, the musculi perforantes & perforati,[23] & the temporary [parts][24] of a foetus <& the Mother>.”

The argument from design, said Kant, “always deserves to be mentioned with respect. It is the oldest, the clearest, and the most accordant with the common reason of mankind” (Kant 1781, A623/B651). But, he pointed out, there was a problem with it, a problem which in fact had already been pointed not only by David Hume,[25] but by Boyle's younger contemporary, Charles Blount, who wrote,

could we conclude any thing from Miracles, yet we could never thence conclude of the Existence of God. For since a Miracle is Work limited, and never implies any but a certain and limited Power: most certain and evident it is, that from such an Effect we cannot rightly infer the Existence of a Cause whose Power is infinite, but at most of a Cause whose Power is greater: I say, at most; because from many Causes concurring there may follow some Work, whose Force and Power is indeed less than the Power of all its Causes put together, but far greater than the Power of any one of them taken singularly (Blount 1683, 11).

To a large extent Boyle accepted these points. He notes explicitly that none of the proofs he was prepared to offer amounted to a demonstration of God's existence, and indeed he felt that a demonstration was not possible. A demonstration was typically held to proceed from necessarily true premises (often Aristotelian principles[26]) via a valid argument to a necessarily true conclusion, and part of what was at issue was whether we should be looking for a demonstration of God's existence, or something less which would nonetheless still be useful in the fight against atheism . “To haue the Science of a thing,” said Pierre du Moulin the elder, “two certainties are required. The one is, that the thing be certaine of it selfe and vnchangeable. The second is, that the perswasion which wee haue of it be firme and cleare” (Du Moulin 1624, 162). Gassendi agreed, as did Arnauld and Nicole in the Port Royal Logic (Gassendi 1658, Canon XVI, 144; Arnauld 1662, part IV, ch 8, 323–4, pagination as in the 5th, 1683 edition).

The persuasive alternative to a demonstration was sometimes styled a proof, but often people spoke of moral demonstrations as opposed to strict, or mathematical, demonstrations. Boyle wrote:

besides the Demonstrations wont to be treated of in vulgar Logick, there are among Philosophers three distinct, whether kinds or degrees, of Demonstration. For there is a Metaphysical Demonstration, as we may call that, where the Conclusion is manifestly built on those general Metaphysical Axioms, that can never be other than true; such as Nihil potest simul esse & non esse … &c. (Nothing can both be and not be at the same time) There are also Physical Demonstrations, where the Conclusion is evidently deduc'd from Physical Principles; such as … Ex nihilo nihil fit … &c. (From nothing, nothing comes) which are not so absolutely certain as the former, because, if there be a God, He may (at least for ought we know) be able to create & annihilate Substances …. And lastly, there are Moral Demonstrations … where the Conclusion is built, either upon some one such proof cogent in its kind, or some concurrence of Probabilities, that it cannot but be allowed, supposing the truth of the most receiv'd Rules of Prudence and Principles of Practical Philosophy.

And this third kind of Probation, though it come behind the two others in certainty, yet it is the surest guide, which the Actions of Men, though not their Contemplations, have regularly allow'd them to follow (BW, 8:281; Boyle 1772, 4:182–3).

This moral certainty, Locke remarked, “is not only as great as our frame can attain to, but as our Condition needs” (Locke 1690, 4.11.8).

When we look in detail at Boyle's discussions of the various moral demonstrations outlined in his proposed second section it becomes clear that he fancied some considerably more than others. He often mentions the importance of conscience, but concentrates, as far as proofs go, on various design arguments, on arguments based on the incorporeality of the human soul, and on arguments involving miracles. Unlike the clerical authors of the time he pays little or no attention to the arguments from “the innate Idea of the Deity,” from “the general Consent of Mankind,” or from “the Universal Providence that directs the Affairs of Mankind.”

Boyle did not expect his (or anyone's) proofs to convince most atheists:

you need not thinke it strange, that I never pretended to convert resolved Atheists. For, besides the difficulty of treating clearly and cogently of such abstruse subjects as are many that relate to Atheism; the Will and Affections have so great an influence upon some mens Understandings, that ‘tis almost as difficult to make them beleive, as to make them Love, against their Will. And it must be a very dazzleing Light, that makes an impression upon those that obstinately shut their Eyes against it. ‘Tis not by Gods ordinary workes, but by his Extraordinary Power, that such men must be reclaimd to an acknowledgement of his <Existence>. For they that would find the Truth, especially in matters of Religion, must be diligent Inquirers after it, and may be strict Examiners of it, but must not beresolved Enemies to it. For to such, if to any, God is a Sun, that is not to be discover'd but by <his> owne Light (BP 2:64, BOA §4.6.9 , p 384).

Boyle was aware that most believers held their belief on insufficient grounds (see BP 4:60, BOA §3.7.5, pp. 301–2), but felt himself fortunate in that sound philosophy showed that the religion to which he was born was the correct one. For Boyle, miracles (in particular the miracle of Pentecost) were a crucial factor in opting for Christianity. The Christian miracles, he felt, clearly bore the stamp of God upon them. There were, he agreed, other miracles or apparent miracles, but the miracles which purported to establish Christianity were neither false nor diabolical, and they were miraculous. Locke believed that “Mahomet having none to produce, pretends to no miracles for the vouching of his mission,” but Boyle was aware of the argument that the Koran itself is miraculous (in view of the disparity between it and what might reasonably be expected of its author in the absence of divine inspiration). He felt, not that this argument was inappropriate, but that it failed the test empirically:

[T]he Saracens, press'd with their Religions being destitute of attesting Miracles, … reply, That though there were no other Miracle to manifest the Excellency of their Religion …, yet the Alcoran it Self were sufficient, as being a Lasting Miracle that transcends all other Miracles. How Charming its Eloquence may be in its Original, I confesse my self too unskilfull in the Arabick Tongue, to be a competent Judge … but the Recent Translations I have seen of it in French, and … Latin, elaborated by great Scholars, and accurate Arabicians, by making it very Conformable to its Eastern Original, have not so rendred it, but that Persons that judge of Rhetorick by the Rules of it current in these Western Parts of the World, would instead of extolling it for the Superlative, not allow it the Positive Degree of Eloquence; [and] would think the Style as destitute of Graces, as the Theology of Truth … .[27]

Boyle does not deny that the style could have been miraculous, and indeed he runs a formally similar argument concerning the Apostles and the miracle of Pentecost: the Apostles' “Hearers … knew it was <not> naturally possible, that uninspir'd Persons, and especially illiterate Fishermen, should <grow> able, in a trice, to make <weighty> discourses to many differing Nations, in their respective Languages” (BP 7:99, BOA §3.6.29, p. 390). Boyle accepts, and indeed uses, the form of the Koran argument: it is the premise he disputes.

Boyle is ambivalent about the function of miracles. Generally he regards them as being philosophically relevant after we have a proof of God's existence, something which natural theology will afford us. (Boyle fastens on two main types of design arguments: those involving the complexity of animate beings, particularly very small animate beings,[28] and those which highlight the need to explain the origin and continuing function of natural laws: God must not only sustain God's creatures, Boyle argues, he must also sustain the regularities which we recognize as lawlike.)

Having convinced ourselves of God's existence through the considerations which natural theology makes available to us, and realizing that God is likely to institute a religion to make his nature and requirements known to us, we look to miracles to see which instituted religion is the correct one. However, though in general Boyle argues that accepting something as a miracle presupposes God's existence, and so miracles are to be used to institute the correct religion rather than to ground its metaphysical basis, he does sometimes urge an argument from miracles which will yield not merely the correctness of Christianity, but the acceptability of religious belief as such. Briefly: we have good historical testimony for the occurrence of miracles, but miracles are possible only if God intervenes in nature (and thereby exists) (BP 5:106–7, BOA §3.8.3, pp. 310–12).

3. Boyle's World View

Boyle had a straightforward notion of creation. First of all God, at a particular, fairly recent, point in absolute time, made matter. Boyle was an admirer of “our Irish St. Austin”(BC 1:40), James Ussher, archbishop of Armagh, who famously propounded what seems to us, though not to his contemporaries, to be a very late date (4004 b.c.) for creation. Boyle saw “no just reason to embrace their opinion, that would so turn the two first chapters of Genesis, into an allegory, as to overthrow the literal and historical sense of them” and, noting the implausibility of the claims of “some extravagant ambitious People, such as those fabulous Chaldeans, whose fond account reach'd up to 40000 or 50000 years,” held that “Theology teaches us, that the World is very far from being so old by 30 or 40 thousand years as they … have presum'd: and does, from the Scripture, give us such an account of the age of the World, that it has set us certain Limits, within which so long a Duration may be bounded, without mistaking in our Reckoning. Whereas Philosophy leaves us to the vastness of Indeterminate Duration, without any certain Limits at all” (BW, 8:21; Birch 1772, IV:11). Revelation gives us (1) truths of which we would otherwise be ignorant, such as “the order and time of the Creation of the World and of the first man and woman”; (2) details of truths which we can otherwise obtain “but very dimly, incogently, and defectively”

such as … That the World had a beginning, that ‘tis upheld and govern'd by Gods general concourse & providence; that God has a peculiar regard to mankind; and a propitious one to good men; that he foresees those future things, we call contingent: that mens souls shall not dye with their bodyes, and many other articles of the Philosophers, as well as the Christians Creed (BP 7:242, 4:10–12, BW 14:268–9).

Additionally there are (3) “hints” which lead us to truths we would otherwise miss, such as “that whatever men have generally believ'd, Vegetables had their Origine independent from the Sun, the earth having producd all kinds of plants a day before God made that Luminary” (BP 7:243, 4:15, BW 14:271). Moreover,

it ought much to recommend many of the things that Revelation discovers to us, that they are congruous, and if I may so speak Symmetrical to what reason it self teaches us; and this Supernatural Light does not only confirm, but advance and compleat the truths discoverable by the light of nature. For God has so excellently orderd the discoverys he makes of Theological <Veritys> by meer reason, and by the holy Scriptures, that what Revelation superadds to Reason, does both very well agree with it, and supply what was wanting to it, that from them both might result as compleat a body of Theological Verities, as is either necessary or fit for us in our Mortal State (BP 7:245–6, 4:23, BW 14:275). (See further MacIntosh 1992.)

Unsurprisingly, then, Boyle makes a point of attempting to bring his creation story into line with a literal interpretation of the Genesis story. God, he believes, could have started things off earlier or later, but chose not to. Having created matter, he broke it up and started it moving. Sometimes Boyle says he broke it up by starting it moving.[29] Then he gave it laws, since the “casual justlings of atoms” would not, Boyle thinks, have given rise to this world.[30] Hooke, explicating Genesis, argued for the same ordering. For Boyle and Hooke, that is, a world without laws is not only possible, our world was such a world for a time. In the previous century Konrad Daspodius held that comets “drift without laws,” but by 1686 Leibniz was writing, “God does nothing out of order, and it is impossible even to feign events which are not regular.”[31] Leibniz's point was that just as any ‘random’ sequence of points will determine a curve (actually an infinite set of curves, but Leibniz only needed the lesser claim), so any sequence of events will conform to a regular pattern. Generalizing, we might say that just as points underdetermine equations, so facts underdetermine theories.

It should be noted however that for Leibniz, as for a number of his contemporaries, not all such laws need be laws of nature.[32] Malebranche, for example, in his Dialogues on Metaphysics, offered no fewer than five distinct types of law: “general laws of the communication of motion, … laws of the union of soul and body, … laws of the union of the soul with God, with the intelligible substance of universal Reason, … general laws which give good and bad Angels power over bodies, … finally, the laws by which Jesus Christ received sovereign power in Heaven and on earth, over minds as well as bodies, not only to distribute temporal goods … but to diffuse (répandre) internal grace in our hearts” (Entretiens sur la Métaphysique, in Malebranche 1962, 12:319–320).[33]

Boyle's position is an intermediate one between the claim that some objects or events are lawless, and the claim that lawlessness is impossible. For Boyle, physical objects do exhibit nomological regularities, but this is a contingent fact about the world, or rather, for Boyle was cautious about generalizing, about the spatio-temporal portion of it we occupy. He agrees, however, that there are laws that are not laws of nature, with the laws of interconnection between body and soul providing, for him, an obvious example. This interconnection also provides a clear example of a state which God constantly preserves.

After having made matter, started it moving, and given it laws, God then formed the matter into particular structures and shapes, including certain “seeds.” Then he added some “seminal” principles. Boyle does not clearly indicate whether or not these are a special subclass of natural laws affecting matter, or whether they are in some way what he sometimes calls “supra-mechanical,” though he does point out that if there is a mechanism for animal inheritance, then it would seem to require a framing intelligent agent (BW, 12:445–6, Birch 1772, VI:728–9. Anstey 2002a provides a full discussion of the issue.). His older contemporary Harvey, much admired by Boyle, was in no doubt about the matter, pouring scorn on those who talk

As if (forsooth) Generation were nothing in the world but a meer Separation, or Collection, or Order of things. I do not indeed deny that to the Production of one thing out of another, these fore-mentioned things are requisite, but Generation her self is a thing quite distinct from them all … (Harvey 1653, 51).

All this holds for the corporeal universe, as opposed to the three sorts of incorporeal creatures God created or, in our case, continues to create: angels, evil demons, and human souls: the good, the bad, and the imprisoned.[34] The angels were created “before the visible World … was half compleated,” but God creates new human souls daily, and moreover works a “physical miracle” to attach them to their respective bodies (BP 7:243, 4:14, BW 14:271; BP 2:62).[35] Sometimes Boyle felt that although humans are made in God's image they, like other created beings, are “at their best but umbratile, and Arbitrary Pictures of God their Creatour” (BP 4:4, BOA §2.2.38, p. 145). Elsewhere, however, he offers a more traditional account of the soul as the image of God:

The Christian virtuoso considers the rational soul, not barely as it guides the motions of that living engine, we call the body, but as it is a kind of imprisoned angel, that bears the image of God, and is capable of knowing, both ourselves and him; and by a consciousness of her being his production, is capable of acknowledgeing, loving, and obeying him, and referring to his glory all the excellencies she discovers, both in herself, and in the body she is united to; by which just reference, she is, by his goodness, in his divine Son, made capable of becoming incomparably more knowing, than here she is, and eternally happy with him (BW, 12:504, Birch 1772, VI:775).

Although humans are made in the image of God, they are considerably less clever than the angels,[36] and since it is quite possible that God's primary end in making the universe was to provide a universe for the angels, and not centrally for humans, it is thereby quite possible that the universe will be too complicated for us to understand:

[I]f God be allowed to be, as indeed he is, the Author of the Universe, how will it appear that He, whose Knowledge infinitely transcends ours, and who may be suppos'd to operate according to the Dictates of his own immense Wisdom, should, in his Creating of things, have respect to the measure and ease of Humane Understandings; and not rather, if of any, of Angelical Intellects? So that whether it be to God or to Chance, that we ascribe the Production of things, that way may often be fittest or likelyest for Nature to work by, which is not easiest for us to understand (BW, 3:257, Birch 1772, II:46).

“[W]e presume too much of our own abilities,” Boyle wrote, c. 1680, “if we imagine that the omniscient God can have no other Ends in the framing & managing of Things Corporeal, than such as we Men can discover” (Boyle MS 198, fol. 120, BP 7:116, BOA §3.6.3, p 267). It follows at once that while simplicity may often be our best guide as to what working hypothesis to choose, we should not think it to be inevitably a reliable guide to truth.

Why did God create the universe in this piecemeal way? What is Boyle's rationale for thinking that God didn't just start off by creating matter in motion with the proper directed velocities and letting it give rise to the present world in its own good time? Or why not suppose that he created the present world as a going concern? Boyle doesn't tell us, but two points stand out.

First of all, it certainly fits the fact that Boyle has a very limited view of omnipotence.[37] Here he is, for example, bemused by the swiftness of God's creative ability:

As great a Number & variety of parts as a living Humane Body consists of, ‘tis highly probable that the Lump of Stupid[38] matter out of which they were fashion'd, was contriv'd into this admirable System; if not in a moment, yet in a very short time. For the sacred story relates, that man was not created till <about> the end of the six dayes work; and since in One day God created all the four footed Beasts, (wilde & tame,) and all the numerous Reptiles that creep upon the Earth after their kind; ‘tis no way improbable that among so great a multitude of differing species of Animals, or Living Engines, that were made in one Part of the same sixth day, God should make a Humane Animal in an extreamly short time, not to say in a trice (BP 4:85, BOA §2.2.68, p 161). [Here and throughout in quotations, the emphasis is in the original.]

Doing things step by step, fairly quickly, and with moderate success, was quite enough to excite Boyle's admiration for the Almighty and, though he had certainly read Descartes's Principles (in which Descartes remarks explicitly that although God could have let things work their way from a very different initial state to the present world, in fact God started the world off in medias res), it is quite possible that the alternative did not strike him as likely: he was not, after all, a mathematician, or even a mathematical physicist.[39]

Given this, and the fact that motion was not natural to matter, but had to be added to it, it would seem plausible to Boyle that God created matter first, and then gave it a push, particularly since the push had to be precisely fine tuned in order to yield just the world we now have. (That matter is not naturally in motion forms the basis of one of Boyle's criticisms of Epicurus. Boyle takes Epicurus to hold that motion is an innate property of matter. How then, asks Boyle, are we to explain the fact that it is lost or changed as a result of collision between particles? (BP 2:5, BOA §4.1, p 340).) Additionally, Boyle notices that no system of laws can offer a complete explanation: we also need an account of the initial parameters.[40] But then, since they are logically distinct, why not have them chronologically distinct as well?

Secondly, there are, perhaps, historical reasons. For Boyle is conscious of himself as building on past views, and such views typically treated matter as giving rise to the present world, and, in the case of some past thinkers, at least, as having existed in a constant state for some time before the initiating changes that led to the present world occurred. The notion of a piecemeal creation, that is, fits Boyle's views of God's abilities, fits Genesis, and fits the views of previous thinkers. Probably we do not need to look farther for an explanation for his adopting such a view.

(b) What kind of world is it that God created?

God created a material world in time and space, but what kind of matter, what kind of space, what kind of time? As to the matter, Boyle agreed with contemporaries such as Huygens and Newton that “Matter [is] in its own Nature but one.”[41] However Boyle, cautious as ever, explicitly allows God the possibility of creating matter which is not like ordinary matter, and instituting laws which are quite unlike the laws that obtain on earth. His views are worth quoting at length:

[T]he World must every way have bounds, and consequently be finite; or it must not have bounds, and so be … infinite. And if the World be bounded, then those that believe a Deity,[42] to whose Nature it belongs to be of infinite Power, must not deny that God was, and still is,[43] able to make other Worlds than this of ours. …

Now if we grant, with some modern Philosophers, that God has made other Worlds besides this of ours, it will be highly probable that he has there display'd His manifold Wisdom, in productions very differing from those wherein we here admire it. And even without supposing any more than one Universe, as all that portion of it that is visible to us, makes but a part of that vastly extended aggregate of bodies: So if we but suppose, that some of the Celestial Globes, whether visible to us, or plac'd beyond the reach of our sight, are peculiar Systemes, the consideration will not be very different. For since the fix'd stars are many of them incomparably more remote than the Planets, ‘tis not absurd to suppose that as the Sun, who is the fix'd star nearest to us, has a whole Systeme of Planets that move about him, so some of the other fix'd Stars may be each of them the Centre, as it were, of another Systeme of Celestial Globes … . Now, in case there be other Mundane Systemes (if I may so speak) besides this visible one of ours, I think it may be probably suppos'd that God may have given peculiar and admirable instances of His inexhausted Wisedom in the Contrivance and Government of Systemes, that for aught we know may be fram'd and manag'd in a manner quite differing, from what is observ'd in that part of the Universe that is known to us. … [H]ere on Earth the Loadstone is a Mineral so differing in divers affections, not onely from all other Stones, but from all other bodies, that are not Magnetical, that this Heteroclite[44] Mineral scarce seems to be Originary of this World of ours, but to have come into it, by a remove from some other World or Systeme … .

Now in these other Worlds, besides that we may suppose that the Original Fabrick … into which the Omniscient Architect at first contriv'd the parts of their matter, was very differing from the structure of our Systeme; besides this, I say, we may conceive that there may be a vast difference betwixt the subsequent Phænomena, and productions observable in one of those Systemes, from what regularly happens in ours, though we should suppose no more, than that two or three Laws of Local Motion may be differing in those unknown Worlds, from the Laws that obtain in ours (BW, 10:172–3, Birch 1772, V:138–139).

Boyle, that is, sees three distinct possibilities: the initial set up may differ, the matter involved may differ, and the laws in question may differ. Moreover the laws, as well as the matter, could have been formed differently by God, and could indeed vary from part to part of the current universe within the universe. Clearly the case of varying laws and the case of varying matter may run into each other, but Boyle treats them as distinct possibilities, and gives as an example the possibility of a combination of conservation and non-conservation possibilities: we can envisage bodies with the “power of exciting Motion in another Body, without the Movents loosing its own.” Were this to be the case the resulting phenomena would be “strangely diversifyed.” Moreover, God may have made a universe, or a part of this universe, which was such that “some parts of matter [would] be of themselves quiescent … and determin'd to continue at rest till some outward Agent force it into motion [while] other parts of the matter [may have] a Power … of restlessly moving themselves, without loosing that power by the motion they excite in quiescent bodies. … Nor is it so extravagant a thing, as at first it may seem, to entertain such suspicions as these. For in the common Philosophy, besides that the Notion and Theory of Local Motion are but very imperfectly propos'd, there are Laws or Rules of it not well, not to say at all, establish'd.”[45]

Boyle does not use the terminology of absolute space and time, but he remarks that God could have made the world earlier:

Nor was it his Indigence, that forc't him to make the World, thereby to make new Acquisitions, but his Goodnesse, that prest him to manifest, and to impart his Glory; and the goods, which he so over-flowingly abounds with. Witness his Suspension of the World's Creation, which certainly had had an earlier Date, were the Deity capable of Want, and the Creatures of Supplying it (BW, 1:97, Birch 1772, I:270).

Boyle's general view about both space and time is that since they are

Primary & Heteroclite … ‘tis noe wonder that our Limited & Imperfect understandings should not be able to reach to a full & clear comprehension of them, but should be swallowd up with the <Scruples &> Difficulties that may be suggested by a <bold &> nice Inquiry into things, <to> which there seemes to belong a kind of Infinity (BP 2:53).

He also remarks about the world that

if it be Finite [which Boyle allows as a possibility], then ‘tis not in a place (such as the Schools define) after the manner of other Bodys, since there is no ambient Body whose inward surface determines it; and we may conceive it to move several wayes, as upwards or downwards, and yet not to change place, because (as was just now said,) it is in none, and all its Extream parts may keep the same situation in reference to one another (BP 1:64).[46]

Moreover, there is a

rigid and Philosophical Notion … of rest, which for distinction sake may be called Absolute or Perfect Rest; which imports a continuance of a Body in the same place precisely, and includes an absolute Negation of all local Motion, though never so slow or imperceptible; … in this rigid sense of the word Rest, I durst not affirm, that there are any Bodies at Rest in the Universe (at least for any long time) but willingly [allow] it to be made a Problem, whether there be any or no; … perhaps I [incline] to the Negative part of the Question (BW, 6:194, Birch 1772, I:444).[47]

Again, Boyle writes: “Suppose a Ball were in motion, & all the world should be on a sudden annihilated about it; why may not the motion of that Ball be continu'd? there being nothing to stop it; & if it be continu'd, we have a motion where the mobile dos not quitt the neighborhood of som bodys, and approach nearer to others” (BP 1:3).

We have, then, Boyle's view that a body can continue “in the same place precisely,” that the whole (finite) universe might move in space, and that God could have created the world earlier than he did. Such views do not at least amount to a rejection of absolute space and time. Boyle's contemporary, Leibniz, who did reject absolute space, explicitly drew the conclusion that a finite universe could not move as a whole in space, and could not have been created earlier in time.[48]

The universe God created, then, contains a number of finite incorporeal entities, for whom the writ of physics does not run, and a number of material entities, compounded as far as we are aware, of the same matter in every case, set in a space and time independent of them, and subject to a number of God given laws.

4. Laws of Nature

On a number of occasions Boyle assures us that “God [is] the Author of the universe & free Establisher of the Laws of motion, whose generall Concourse is necessary to the conservation & Efficacy of every particular Physicall Agent” (BP 2:132). The trouble is, he seems to have thought that this remark was fairly transparent, and does not trouble to explain it to us. Moreover, he tends to use much the same phraseology on each occasion he discusses the issue. It was a commonplace of the time that Boyle was no stylist — it was obvious at times to Boyle himself — but though even the obsequious Budgell remarked that Boyle was “too wordy and prolix,” in this case at least he was not wordy enough (Budgell 1732, 124).

It is tempting to suppose that Boyle must have had some reasonably well thought out views on the question of how God sustains the world. He was after all one of the most impatient of thinkers when it came to fake or non-explanations, and he was in general very aware of the danger of letting verbal ‘explanations’ get in the way of real ones. He objected against the scholastics, for example that

to explicate a Phænomenon, being to deduce it from something else in Nature more known to Us, than the thing to be explain'd by It, how can the imploying of Incomprehensible (or at least Uncomprehended) substantial Forms help Us to explain intelligibly This or That particular Phænomenon? For to say, that such an Effect proceeds not from this or that Quality of the Agent, but from its substantial Form, is to take an easie way to resolve all difficulties in general, without rightly resolving any one in particular; and would make a rare Philosophy, if it were not far more easie than satisfactory … (BW, 5:351–2, Birch 1772, III:46–7).[49]

On the other hand, in theology he was more likely than elsewhere to let things get by, since he was convinced in advance that his theological picture was the right one, and he was used to stifling doubts about theological claims. Writing about himself in the third person as a young man he speaks of the “fleeting Clouds” of doubts which never ceased “now & then to darken /obscure/ the clearest serenity of his quiet: which made him often say that Injections of this Nature were such a Disease to his Faith as the Tooth-ach is to the Body; for tho it be not mortall, ‘tis very troublesome” (BP 37:182r). (These doubts persisted: see Hunter 1990, 410.)

Moreover, he had a well worked out doctrine concerning the limitations of reason, and often points out that we should not expect fully to understand God's workings, for God is, after all, “<a Being> of a most Primary and most singular Nature” (BP 2:107, 2:37, BOA § 4.1, p 357). (For Boyle on the limits of reason see Wojcik 1997.) Furthermore, he was willing to admit the impossibility of our understanding — at least given the present limitations on our intellects — even quite ordinary and lawlike matters, e.g., the way in which the human soul and human body interact. How God could have created the world, and how it is that he can intervene in it, are matters as mysterious to us as how mind and body can interact, and that is a total mystery.

Sometimes, Boyle remarks, our ignorance of things has to do simply with our lack of knowledge of the inner or hidden workings of a thing. He offers his, and indeed the century's, standard example of clocks which may have various internal mechanisms to produce the same outer effects. Thus he remarks that “we know in general, that digestion is made by some Menstruum or subtile substance in the Stomach; thô we know not the particular nature of that substance, (as whether it be Acid, Urinous, &c.)”. Sometimes, though, our ignorance is of a deeper, richer variety:

sometimes … we are not able to conceive the Modus of a thing, soe much as in general, or, as to the possibility of it, (abstracting from the positive Proofs that such a thing is) as, when we cannot conceive, how the Rational Soul can stop or determine the motions of the <humane> Body. And in this latter case, our not knowing the Modus of a thing, is usually more than a bare Ignorance, and inclines us to frame Objections against the Truth or Existence of the thing: because oftentimes the Incomprehensiblenes of the Modus, is grounded upon some thing that we conceive to be in the case, repugnant to the Laws or Course of Nature, or to some Dictate of right Reason: as, in the instance newly mention'd, it seems repugnant to the nature of things, that an Immaterial substance, not being Impenetrable, can resist or reflect the motion of a Body &c (BP 1:129, 7:155v, BOA §3.5.19, p 255).

Boyle was impatient with the Cartesian suggestion that we might be able to alter the direction though not the quantity of motion, not for Leibniz's reason that the notion of quantity of motion required a confusion between momentum and kinetic energy,[50] but for the straightforward reason that interfering with the directed velocity required as mysterious an interaction as altering the ‘quantity of motion’ would. He was aware of the Cartesian claim “that the rational Soul doth [not] give any motion to the parts of the Body, but only guide or regulate that which she finds in them already” (BW, 9:379, Birch 1772, IV:416), but that, he felt, did not really solve the problem, for that interaction was as mysterious as an energy introducing one: “I do as little conceive how the motions of the Conarion can work upon an Immaterial soul, as how any other part of the Body can do it. Nor do I conceive how an Immaterial Soul can work upon the Conarion its self, more then it can upon any other part of the Body” (BP 1:128 BOA §3.5.15, p 253), and he notes that it will not “suffice to object, that the human will does, in these cases, not produce any new motion, but only determine[s] the motions of the spirits, and by their means of the locomotive organs. For to put a check, at pleasure, to the motion of a body, that does already actually move in one line, and determine its motion to continue in another, that is perhaps differing from it, or even opposite to it; to do this, I say, without opposing to the moving body, some other body, which, by its resistance and situation may change its former course, is not a mechanical operation” (BW, 12:480, Birch 1772, VI:756). A change of direction, just as much as a change in the ‘quantity of motion,’ is in fact as mysterious and inexplicable, if done by incorporeal means, as the introduction of energy into the system would be.

5. Boyle's Law

Many of us learned at school that Boyle's Law holds for ideal gases and can be summarized as PV = k, where k is a constant, and P and V are pressure and volume respectively. This law does stem from Boyle's work, but it is not what Boyle took himself to have demonstrated.[51]

Boyle was arguing specifically against a Jesuit scientist, Franciscus Linus, who claimed, not that ordinary atmospheric air does not have any pressure (a spring), but that its pressure was not sufficiently powerful for it to do all the things it does in fact do. So Boyle decided on an experiment to show the way in which, as we would say, the pressure and the volume of the air vary, when the air is, in Boyle's words, either ‘compressed or dilated.’

He and his assistant, at the time Robert Hooke, made a J shaped tube and began to make a few measurements, but “were hindered from prosecuting the trial at that time by the casual breaking of the tube.”

Subsequently they made another, larger, better piece of apparatus, and taking particular care that the measurements should be accurate, tested the hypothesis “that supposes the pressures and expansions to be in reciprocal proportion.” The results are set out, with misprints, in two tables, and Boyle's conclusion was that the experimental findings matched the predicted results very well in the case of compression, less well in the case of rarefaction. Boyle suggested that the divergence from the expected result in the case of rarefaction may have been due to “some little aerial bubbles in the quicksilver” (“so easy is it in such nice experiments to miss of exactness,” he added).

Now, what did Boyle take himself to have shown? First, that there is, as a matter of experimental fact, a spring to the air: this is not in the sense in which Boyle understands the term, any longer an hypothesis: it is now obvious from the experimental results: what explains, or purports to explain this fact will be a theory or an hypothesis, but the result itself is in no sense an hypothesis. As Boyle said

…to determine whether the motion of restitution in bodies proceed from this, that the parts of a body of a peculiar structure are put into motion by the bending of the spring, or from the endeavour of some subtle ambient body, whose passage may be opposed or obstructed, or else its pressure unequally resisted by reason of the new shape or magnitude, which the bending of a spring may give the pores of it seems to me a matter of more difficulty, than at first sight one would easily imagine it. Wherefore I shall decline meddling with a subject, which is much more hard to be explicated than necessary to be so by him, whose business it is not … to assign the adequate cause of the spring of the air, but only to manifest, that the air hath a spring, and to relate some of its effects (BW, 1:166, Birch 1772, I:12).

Secondly, Boyle takes himself to have shown that, for atmospheric air, within the limits of his experimental set-up, “the pressures and expansions [are] in reciprocal proportion,” or, as we would say, pressure and volume vary inversely. He doesn't take himself to have shown anything more than this. He does remark that further experiments may show that the relationship holds outside the boundary conditions imposed by the experimental set-up, but the experiments he has just made certainly don't show that. What Boyle expressly said was,

till further trial hath more clearly informed me, I shall not venture to determine, whether or no the intimated theory will hold universally and precisely, either in condensation of air, or rarefaction: all that I shall now urge being, that…the trial already made sufficiently proves the main thing, for which I here allege it; since by it, it is evident, that as common air, when reduced to half its wonted extent, obtained near about twice as forcible a spring as it had before, so this thus comprest air being further thrust into half this narrow room, obtained thereby a spring about as strong again as that it last had, and consequently four times as strong as that of the common air (BW, 3:60, Birch 1772, I:159).

Thus Boyle's Law, for Boyle, was not a universal generalization about ideal gases: it was a strictly limited claim about common or atmospheric air. Boyle did add that “there is no cause to doubt, that if we had been here furnished with a greater quantity of quicksilver and a very strong tube, we might, by a further compression of the included air, have made it counter balance the pressure of a far taller and heavier cylinder of mercury.”

But he did not claim that the same ratio between pressure and volume would hold in such more extreme cases. Nor did he claim that there are no limits to the possible compression. It is worth stressing that Boyle had this limited view of his result, for Shapin and Schaffer 1985 suggest that

The work Boyle undertook in reply to Linus was … done … with a specially constructed J-shaped tube in which pressures higher than atmospheric could be attained. Using this apparatus Boyle showed that if he compressed air twice as strongly as usual he could produce twice as strong a spring. He concluded that the process could go on indefinitely, so that there were no limits to the power of the air's spring (Shapin and Schaffer 1985, 168–9).

But Boyle was quite happy not to draw such conclusions, simply because his experiments didn't allow that kind of jump. There are other important ways in which he thought that generalizations about nature might fail of universality. He had a very healthy notion of the complexity of the world, and an acute sense of the difficulties to which even apparently simple experiments could give rise, and perhaps in consequence had more sympathy than stricter theologians for the problems which universe construction might involve, even for the Almighty.

6. Perception and the Soul

Two distinct notions of the soul occupied centre stage in the seventeenth century. One, stemming from Plato and the Pythagoreans, with theological trimmings by Augustine, had been given immense prestige by Descartes' championing of it. This view was what Geach has called the “savage superstition ... that a man consists of two pieces, body and soul, which come apart at death.” Geach adds, “the superstition is not mended but rather aggravated by conceptual confusion, if the soul-piece is supposed to be immaterial” (Geach 1969, 38).

The second main account, stemming from Aristotle, had been taken over and made Christian by St Thomas Aquinas.[52] In this account the soul was, though incorporeal, not simply a separate bit attached to the body, but was the form of the individual animal in question, whether human or not. Aquinas presented arguments to show that human souls were subsistent in view of various capacities they had, and proceeded from there to argue for the possibility of the continuing existence of human souls in the absence of the body. He was, however, clear that the human person (even when the person in question was Christ in human form) was not merely a soul with an attached body, but was the body informed by the soul: if your soul alone were to survive death you would not. Bodily resurrection is essential to the survival and immortality of humans.

Cartesians and Thomists alike believed on scriptural grounds that there were actual cases of separated souls, namely, the angels, fallen and unfallen, so the possibility that the human soul might itself be subsistent was simply the possibility that it might sufficiently resemble an already accepted ontological group: despite the problems that substance dualism raises, a number of which presented themselves clearly to Boyle, there was no general problem concerning incorporeal entities, and there were, Boyle felt, strong arguments for the incorporeality of the human soul.

For Boyle, as for other leading seventeenth century figures, perception was a matter of information entering the brain as a result of causal interaction between the perceiver and the perceived object. Arriving at the brain the information was processed by a subsystem or set of subsystems devoted to presenting it to the cognitive system, and to storing it thereafter. The initial processing was done by a system, the common sense, that combined the inputs from the various sense organs (left eye + right eye; eyes + ears; etc.) and it was then imagined — that is, an image was formed in the brain though, as Kepler and Descartes noted explicitly, the image was not a literal, optical, image. That apart, seventeenth century thinkers accepted in general outline the position which had already been set out in the thirteenth century by Roger Bacon, who was in turn simply collating the views of earlier Islamic writers on the subject, though of course the details, particularly the details of the causal interaction between percipient and perceived, varied from writer to writer (See further Lindberg 1976, MacIntosh 1983, and Sutton 1998).

Imagination was a matter of material images being formed in the brain. But, it was held by Boyle and others, we have knowledge of things which are literally unimaginable — that is, they cannot be accurately represented by a corporeal image in the central nervous system. There were a variety of reasons for this belief. First it was held that there were things which were too large, and things which were too small to be imagined, that is, imaged. Hence some non-material faculty was needed to account for this ability. Additionally, there are things which are not image-able because they cannot be represented accurately by any physical system. Boyle's stock example in this area, though not his only example, is the incommensurability of the sides and diagonal of a square. Since √2 is irrational no discrete (corpuscular) system can accurately represent both. But we do have knowledge of squares. Therefore we must be employing a non-material system. Also, there were things such as Descartes' chiliagon which, while they could be represented physically, could not (as experience shows) be represented accurately by our physical imaging system.

Additionally (a familiar Aristotelian point), our ability to abstract — to consider universals and not merely particular instances — was held to provide further evidence for the incorporeality of the soul and hence for the possibility at least of human immortality.

Boyle also noted, as did his contemporary Henry More, the Cambridge Platonist, the occurrence of ecstasies. Boyle, like More, took the existence of ecstasies seriously and, accepting the literal meaning of the term, thought that such experiences showed the actuality of non-corporeal, out-of-body, experiences. Boyle indeed offers the case as a refutation of the Aristotelian view that images are required for human thinking. Locke was more cautious on the issue: “whether that, which we call Extasy, be not dreaming with the Eyes open, I leave to be examined.”[53]

Thus, for Boyle, souls were almost certainly Cartesian souls, though as mentioned earlier he hesitates about whether or not the human soul may not be a substantial form (BW, 5:300, Birch 1772, III:12).

Given that souls are incorporeal adjuncts of the body, it follows that they are not materially destructible, and that the laws of interaction between soul and body are not laws of natural philosophy. Why grass looks green is a feature of the world which God decided upon and upholds. His reasons for this decision, says Boyle, were no doubt weighty, but they are, as to us, arbitrary (see, e.g., BP 2:62, BOA §3.5.1, p 247; 2:105, BOA 3.5.21, p 258; 9:40; 36.46v). Now, if our souls are non-material, that demolishes at least one philosophical barrier to a belief in an after-life such as is promised by Christianity. (For a detailed discussion of Boyle's views on perception see Anstey 2000.)


Primary Sources

BP Boyle Papers: The Boyle Papers, Boyle Letters, and Boyle Notebooks in the Royal Society Library, London; now available on microfilm, Michael Hunter (ed.), as Letters and Papers of Robert Boyle, Bethsada MD: University Publications of America, 1990
BW Boyle Works, The Works of Robert Boyle, Hunter, M., and Davis, E. B. (eds.), 14 vols., London: Pickering and Chatto, 1999–2000
BC Boyle Correspondence, The Correspondence of Robert Boyle, Hunter, M., Clericuzio, A., and Principe, L. (eds.), 6 vols., London: Pickering and Chatto, 2001
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