Feminist Philosophy of Language

First published Fri Sep 3, 2004; substantive revision Tue Jun 15, 2010

Much of feminist philosophy of language so far can be described as critical—critical either of language itself or of philosophy of language, and calling for change on the basis of these criticisms. Those making these criticisms suggest that the changes are needed for the sake of feminist goals — either to better allow for feminist work to be done or, more frequently, to bring an end to certain key ways that women are disadvantaged. In this entry, I examine these criticisms. I also examine work by feminists that seems to suggest some of the criticisms are misplaced: that, for example, philosophy of language is better able to help in feminist projects than critics suppose. My focus in this entry will generally be on the analytic tradition. For continental approaches, see the entries on feminist approaches to the intersection of analytic and continental philosophy, feminist approaches to the intersection of pragmatism and continental philosophy.

1. Language

False gender-neutrality

There has been a great deal of feminist concern over the supposedly gender-neutral use of terms like ‘he’ and ‘man’. It is commonly said that these terms have both gender-specific meanings, as in sentences (1) and (2), and gender-neutral ones, as in sentences (3) and (4).

  1. He drank the wine.
  2. A man went into a bar.
  3. When a student comes into the room, he should pick up a handout.
  4. Man is a primate.

Feminists, however, have pointed out that even the supposed gender-neutral meanings of these terms are not really gender-neutral. Janice Moulton (1981a) and Adele Mercier (1995) provide examples in which there is no doubt that a gender-neutral meaning is intended, but this meaning seems unavailable. As a result, the sentences seem ill-formed:

  1. Man has two sexes; some men are female.
  2. Man breastfeeds his young.
  3. Ask the candidate about his husband or wife.

We are, then, making a classificatory error if we claim that ‘man’ and ‘he’ are gender-neutral terms. In order to avoid such a classificatory error, we need to do more careful work on what the meanings of these terms actually are. Perhaps the meaning of ‘he’ that has been called ‘gender-neutral’ is not really gender-neutral, but something much more complex. Mercier suggests, for example, that we should understand the ‘gender-neutral’ use of ‘man’ as referring to either (a) a person or persons of unknown sex; or (b) males or a combination of males and females. This explains why ‘men’ in (5) and ‘man’ in (6) are anomalous: these terms are being used to refer exclusively to persons known to be female.

The supposed ‘gender-neutral’ meaning of these terms, then, is not truly gender neutral. But, on its own, this does not show that there is a problem with those uses that have traditionally been classified as gender-neutral, as in sentences (3) and (4). (Discovering that we have misclassified an adjective as an adverb would not show anything wrong with actual uses of the term in question.) Further reasons are needed in order to object to the use that is made of these terms.

1.2 Invisibility of women

Feminist concerns, however, go beyond mere classificatory ones. Feminists have also argued that terms like ‘he’ and ‘man’ contribute to making women invisible — that is, to obscuring women's importance, and distracting attention from their existence. Fighting the invisibility of women is an important feminist project in many areas,[1] and language that makes one less likely to think of women clearly contributes to this invisibility. There is good psycholinguistic evidence that those who encounter sentences (like (3) and (4)) using the terms ‘he’ and ‘man’ think more readily of males than of females.[2] If this is right, then the use of these words can be seen as contributing to the invisibility of women. This gives feminists a good reason to object to the ‘gender-neutral’ use of these terms.

1.3 Maleness as norm

If one's only worry concerned the obscuring of women's presence, however, it would be difficult to object to certain other terms to which feminists do commonly object: gender-specific occupational terms like ‘manageress’ (still common in the UK, though not in the US) or ‘lady doctor’. These terms certainly do not contribute to the invisibility of women. Instead, they call attention to the presence of women. Moreover, they call attention to women's presence in positions of authority — doctor and manager. Nonetheless, most feminists who think about language find these terms objectionable.

The clearest reason for objecting to ‘manageress’ and ‘lady doctor’ is that the use of these terms seems premised on the idea that maleness is the norm, and that women filling these jobs are somehow deviant versions of doctors and managers. This is also a key objection to the use of ‘he’ and ‘man’. Moulton (1981a) understands these terms on the model of brand names, like ‘Hoover’ or ‘Scotch tape’ that become generic terms for a product type. The message of such terms, she suggests, is that the brand in question is the best, or at least the norm. According to Moulton, terms like ‘he’ and ‘man’ work in the same manner: they are gender-specific terms for men whose use has been extended to cover both men and women. This, Moulton argues, carries the message that maleness is the norm. As a result, the use of these terms as if they were gender neutral constitutes a sort of symbolic insult to women. Horn and Kleinedler (2000) have disputed the details of this, noting that ‘man’ did not begin its life as gender-specific and then get extended to cover both women and men. Rather, ‘man’ actually began its life as ‘mann’, a gender-neutral term, which only later acquired a gender-specific meaning. The temporal sequence, then, cannot support the claim that a gender-specific term has been extended to cover both genders. Nonetheless, Horn and Kleinedler agree that the use of terms like ‘he’ and ‘man’ as if they were gender-neutral perpetuates the objectionable idea that men are the norm for humanity.

1.4 Sex-marking

English, like most — but not all — languages, requires a great deal of what Marilyn Frye calls ‘sex marking’ (Frye 1983). For example, one cannot use pronouns to refer to a particular individual without knowing their sex. Frye notes the absurdity of this.

If I am writing a book review, the use of personal pronouns to refer to the author creates the need to know whether that person's reproductive cells are the sort which produce ova or the sort which produce sperm. (Frye 1983: 22)

Singular personal pronoun usage is impossible without knowing the sex of the person one is discussing, and in many cases sex would otherwise be utterly irrelevant. Frye takes this to be an instance of a general tendency to make sex relevant where it need not be, which she takes to be a key feature of sexism. In addition, she suggests, the constant need to know and indicate sex helps to perpetuate the conviction that sex is a tremendously important matter in all areas. For Frye, this is a key factor in perpetuating male dominance: male dominance requires the belief that men and women are importantly different from each other, so anything that contributes to the impression that sex differences are important is therefore a contributor to male dominance.

1.5 Encoding of male worldview

The idea that some terms encode a male worldview is initially a puzzling one. One thing that is meant by it is, roughly, that the meanings of certain terms seem to divide the world up in a way that is more natural for men than for women. Good examples of this come from the terms ‘foreplay’ and ‘sex’. ‘Sex’ is generally taken to refer to an act that is defined in terms of male orgasm, while the sexual activities during which many women have their orgasms are relegated to secondary status, referred to by terms like ‘foreplay’. These terms, then, can be seen as based in a male perspective on sex. (It is worth noting that the ‘male perspective’ claim need not rest on the (implausible) idea that this perspective is shared by all men. Rather, it can rest on claims about what is typical for men, or on the claim that the only perspective from which certain understandings make sense is a male one.) As a result, these terms may serve as a barrier to accurate communication or even thought about women's experiences of sex. (Cameron 1985, Moulton 1981b, Spender 1985). Catharine MacKinnon and Sally Haslanger also discuss legal definitions of ‘rape’ as (among other things) involving more than ‘the normal level of force’, an understanding that seems committed to the idea that some level of force is acceptable in sexual relations (Haslanger 1995: 109; MacKinnon 1989: 173).

Languages may also lack words for things that matter a great deal to women. This sort of gap is another way that a language can be seen as encoding a male worldview. The term ‘sexual harassment’, for example, is a recent feminist innovation. Women's discussion of their experiences led them to see a certain common element to many of their problems, and as a result they invented the term ‘sexual harassment’. Once the problem was named, it became much easier to fight sexual harassment, both legally and by educating people about it (Farley 1978; Spender 1985).

Miranda Fricker (2007) calls gaps such as that before the invention of the term ‘sexual harassment’ a form of hermeneutical injustice. Roughly speaking, this is what occurs when “some significant area of one's social experience [is] obscured from collective understanding owing to” (155) a gap in communal linguistic/conceptual resources that is more damaging those from a socially disadvantaged group (to which one belongs). In her Epistemic Injustice, Fricker connects this up with issues in both ethics and epistemology, especially epistemology of testimony.

1.6 Reform efforts: successes and limitations

Problems like those we have seen so far are relatively easy to discern. Moreover, it may seem that they would be relatively easy to correct — new terms can be invented, or alternative words can be used. Much feminist effort has been devoted to this endeavour, and a huge variety of reforms have been proposed. (See, for example, Miller and Swift 1976, 1980, and the papers in part two of Cameron 1998a.)

One especially successful reform effort has been the increasingly accepted singular use of the third-person gender-neutral pronoun ‘they’, (in place of ‘he’) as in the sentence below:

Somebody left their sweater behind.

A key reason for the success of this reform is perhaps the history of the singular ‘they’. As Ann Bodine has noted (1998), the singular use of ‘they’ has a long history. It did not begin to be criticized until the 19th century, and despite all the efforts of prescriptive grammarians it has remained very popular in speech. Due to feminist work on the effects of ‘gender-neutral’ use of ‘he’, even prescriptive grammarians are now becoming more accepting of ‘they’.

Other reform efforts have met with greater difficulties. Some suggestions (such as the creation of new third-person singular pronouns) have simply not caught on, while others that have caught on seem to have backfired. Susan Erlich and Ruth King (1998), for example, discuss the case of ‘chairperson’, intended to serve as a gender-neutral replacement for ‘chairman’. Instead, it is often used to indicate women who fill the post of chair, while men are referred to as ‘chairman’. They take this to show that reforms cannot succeed unless attitudes change as well.

Moreover, feminist work on language has also indicated that there may be problems which are simply not amenable to piecemeal linguistic reforms. Some difficulties that have been raised go well beyond a handful of problematic terms or gaps. Deborah Cameron offers striking examples of writing that takes males as the norm without using any particular terms to which one might object, such as the following, from The Sunday Times:

The lack of vitality is aggravated by the fact that there are so few able-bodied young adults about. They have all gone off to work or look for work, leaving behind the old, the disabled, the women and the children. (Cameron 1985: 85)

Clearly, in the above example, ‘able-bodied young adult’ is being used in such a way as to exclude women. Moreover, examples like this (and others Cameron provides) pass unnoticed by newspaper editors and many readers. There is clearly a problem, but it is not a problem that can be pinpointed by picking out some particular term as objectionable and in need of reform. Eliminating language use that takes males as the norm, then, must involve more than changing a few terms or usage rules.

1.7 Maleness of language

Some feminists (e.g. Penelope 1990; Spender 1985) argue that English is, in some quite general sense, male. (Corresponding arguments are also put forward about other languages.) One thing that is meant by this is that English can be said to be male in a manner similar to that in which particular terms can be said to be male — by encoding a male worldview, by helping to subordinate women or to render them invisible, or by taking males as the norm. One sort of argument for this begins from the examination of large quantities of specific terms, and the identification of patterns of male bias, and proceeds from this to the conclusion that the male bias of English is so widespread that it is a mistake to locate the problem in a collection of words, rather than in the language as a whole. The first stage of this sort of argument is, obviously, a lengthy and complex one. The sorts of claims (in addition to those we have already seen) cited include (a) that there are more words for males than for females in English, and that more of these words are positive (Spender 1985: 15, citing Stanley 1977); (b) that a “word for women assume[s] negative connotations even where it designated the same state or condition as it did for men” (Spender 1985: 17), as with ‘spinster’ and ‘bachelor’; (c) that words for women are far more frequently sexualized than words for men, and that this holds true even for neutral words, when they are applied to women. Dale Spender, citing Lakoff (1975), discusses the example of ‘professional’, comparing ‘he's a professional’ and ‘she's a professional’, and noting that the latter is far more likely than the former to be taken to mean that the person in question is a prostitute. The sexualisation of words for women is considered especially significant by the many feminists who take sexual objectification to be a crucial element, if not the root, of inequalities between women and men. (For more on such examples, see also Baker 1992.)

This widespread encoding of male bias in language is, according to theorists like Spender, just what we should expect. Males (though not, as she notes, all of them) have had far more power in society, and this, she claims has included the power to enforce, through language, their view of the world. Moreover, she argues, this has served to enhance their power.

There is sexism in language, it does enhance the position of males, and males have had control over the production of cultural forms. (Spender 1985: 144)

This, Spender claims, provides circumstantial evidence that ‘males have encoded sexism into language to consolidate their claims of male supremacy’ (Spender 1985: 144). Spender takes the evidence for this claim to be far more than circumstantial, however, and to support it she discusses the efforts of prescriptive grammarians. These include, for example, the claim that males should be listed before females because ‘the male gender was the worthier gender’ (Spender 1985: 147, emphasis hers), and the efforts (noted earlier) to establish ‘he’ as the gender-neutral third-person English pronoun.

According to theorists like Spender, men's ability to control language gives them great power indeed. We have already seen ways in which what one might call the maleness of language contributes to the invisibility of women (with respect to words like ‘he’ and ‘man’). If one takes the maleness of language to go beyond a few specific terms, one will take language's power to make women invisible to be even stronger. We have also seen ways that what might be called maleness can make it more difficult for women to express themselves. Where we lack words for important female experiences, like sexual harassment, women will find it more difficult to describe key elements of their existence. Similarly, where the words we have — like ‘foreplay’ — systematically distort women's experiences, women will have a difficult time accurately conveying the realities of their lives. If one takes such problems to go beyond selected particular terms, and to infect language as a whole, it is natural to suppose that women are to a large degree silenced — unable to accurately articulate key elements of their lives, and unable to communicate important aspects of their thoughts. Spender and others also suggest that the maleness of language constrains thought, imposing a male worldview on all of us, and making alternative visions of reality impossible, or at least very difficult to articulate. These arguments often draw upon the Sapir-Whorf hypothesis (Sapir 1949; Whorf 1976). This is generally described as roughly the hypothesis that “our worldview is determined by the structures of the particular language that we happen to speak” (Cameron 1998b: 150).

Some suggest that male power over language allows men to shape not just thought, but also reality. For example, Spender claims that men “created language, thought, and reality” (1985: 143). This is a very strong version of what Sally Haslanger has called discursive constructivism.[3] She defines this view as follows:

Something is discursively constructed just in case it is the way it is, to some substantial extent, because of what is attributed (and/or self-attributed) to it. (Haslanger 1995: 99)

Feminists like Spender and Catherine MacKinnon (1989) argue that male power over language has allowed them to create reality. This is partly due to the fact that our categorizations of reality inevitably depend on our social perspective: “there is no ungendered reality or ungendered perspective”. (MacKinnon 1989: 114. Haslanger discusses this argument in detail in her 1995.)

In general, the solution suggested is not to attempt to create a neutral language that can accurately capture reality in itself, a goal they would take to be nonsense. Instead, we must aim to create a new reality more congenial to women. Some feminists have argued that the only way to achieve this is for women to create their own language, either by redefining terms already in use, or by inventing a new language, with new words and new rules. Only in this way, they suggest, will women be able to break free from the constraints of male language and male thought, to articulate a competing vision for the world, and to work toward it (Daly and Caputi 1987, Elgin 1985, MacKinnon 1989, Penelope 1990, Spender 1985). Lynne Tirrell offers an especially sophisticated and complex discussion of this idea in her “Definition and Power: Toward Authority Without Privilege” (1993).

The claims discussed above concerning the ‘maleness’ of English, its causes, and its effects, are far from uncontentious. First, the extent of male bias in language is debatable. Although it is right that there is much to worry feminists about a wide variety of specific terms and usages, it is far from clear that it is appropriate to claim that English is male-biased in some sweeping sense. It is also unclear exactly what the claim being made is. If this claim is taken to be that every term is male-biased, then it is obviously false: surely no sane person would allege a male bias to be present in ‘piano’ or ‘isotope’. If the claim is simply that there is much for feminists to object to, then it is almost certainly right — but it is far from obvious that it is useful to focus on such a general claim rather than on specific problems, their complexities and their possible solutions (Cameron 1998b).

Next, the power that men have undeniably exercised in society by no means translates to a general power over language. Language is a difficult thing to control, as those who have attempted to create languages have learned. The main power men have had has concerned dictionaries, usage guides, and laws. While these are enormously important in shaping reality, and in shaping our thoughts, it is quite a leap to move from this power to the claim that men ‘created language, thought, and reality.’

The claimed effects of the maleness of language are also problematic. We have already seen problems for the idea that men control language. The idea that men also control or create thought and reality faces further problems. The ability of feminists to successfully point out ways in which elements of language have obscured women's experiences counts strongly against the claim that men control thought (Cameron 1998); and, as Sally Haslanger has argued in detail (1995), discursive constructivism about reality is unsustainable. Nonetheless, it does seem right to notice that problems with specific terms can render it more difficult for women to communicate about important elements of their lives, and probably also more difficult to reflect upon these elements (Hornsby 1995). These difficulties could perhaps be described as partial silencing, or partial constraint of thought.

If the criticisms above are right, then women certainly do not need to create their own language. Many welcome this conclusion, worried that a women's language would doom women's thoughts to marginality and impede feminist progress. Moreover, the idea that women could craft a common language that allowed the articulation of all their experiences seems to ignore the fact that women differ enormously from one another (Lugones and Spelman 1983, Spelman 1988; see the section on feminism and the diversity of women in the entry on topics in feminism). If women cannot use the same language as men, why should we suppose that women can successfully share a language?

1.8 Metaphor

Feminists have also devoted attention to another aspect of language — the use of metaphor. (See the section Feminist Critiques and Conceptions of Objectivity in the entry on feminist epistemology and philosophy of science; and the entry on feminist approaches to the intersection of pragmatism and continental philosophy.) In particular, feminists have discussed the use of gendered metaphors in philosophy and in science.[4] Emily Martin offers particularly vivid examples in her (1996) discussion of the use of gendered metaphors in discussions of human reproduction.

At its extreme, the age-old relationship of the egg and the sperm takes on a royal or religious patina. The egg coat, its protective barrier, is sometimes called its ‘vestments’, a term usually reserved for sacred, religious dress. The egg is said to have a ‘corona’, a crown, and to be accompanied by ‘attendant cells’. It is holy, set apart and above, the queen to the sperm's king. The egg is also passive, which means it must depend on the sperm for rescue. Gerald Schatten and Helen Schatten liken the egg's role to that of Sleeping Beauty: ‘a dormant bride awaiting her mate's magic kiss, which instills the spirit that brings her to life’. Sperm, by contrast, have a ‘mission’ which is to ‘move through the female genital tract in quest of the ovum’. One popular account has it that the sperm carry out a ‘perilous journey’ into the ‘warm darkness’, where some fall away ‘exhausted’. ‘Survivors’ ‘assault’ the egg, the successful candidates ‘surrounding the prize’… (Martin 1996: 106.)

The vision of reproduction suggested above is an inaccurate one. The sperm fails to behave in the single-minded manner suggested. Instead, the “sideways motion of the sperm's tail makes the head move sideways with a force that is ten times stronger than its forward movement…in fact, its strongest tendency, by tenfold, is to escape by attempting to pry itself off the egg” (Martin 1996: 108). Nor is the egg passive: adhesive molecules on its surface play a crucial role in overcoming the sperm's tendency to pry itself away (Martin 1996: 108). Martin argues that scientists have been slow to discover these facts, partly due to the metaphors they employed; and that even as they have learned these facts they have been slow to update their metaphors. Gendered stereotypes, Martin suggests, can impair our understanding of reproduction — by leading scientists to employ misleading metaphors that conceal the truth. The use of gendered stereotypes in scientific imagery can also help to perpetuate damaging stereotypes, for example by reinforcing the tendency to see females as passive. Martin's account has, however, been challenged by Paul Gross (1998), who argues that scientists were not nearly so slow to these discoveries as Martin claimed. If Gross is right, then the problematic metaphors did not affect scientists' work in the ways suggested by Martin (though they do seem to have affected popular writing on the subject.)

Gendered metaphors have been used at many levels of discussion, including the most general. An important topic of feminist concern has been the historical tendency to conceive of the scientific endeavour in gendered ways. A particularly clear example comes from Francis Bacon, discussed by both Evelyn Fox Keller and Genevieve Lloyd:

For Bacon, the promise of science is expressed as ‘leading to you Nature with all her children to bind her to your service and make her your slave’. (Keller 1996: 36.)

The tendency to describe nature in feminine terms is a long-standing and widespread one, well-documented in Lloyd (1984). Lloyd links this to a tendency to describe reason and the mind as male, and to contrast these with ‘feminine’ emotions and bodies. She argues that these metaphors play a powerful role in the history of philosophy, shaping and often distorting our views both of reason, mind, emotion, and body and of men and women. Other important discussions of gendered metaphors in philosophy include Irigaray (1985 a, b), Le Doeuff, (1990), and Nye (1990, 1992).

2. Philosophy of Language

Some feminists have argued that philosophy of language is problematic from a feminist point of view. One sort of criticism is that philosophy of language, like English, displays a male bias. Another is simply that philosophy of language is ill-equipped to further feminist aims. Those making these criticisms do not suggest that philosophy of language be abandoned, but rather that it should be reformed — purged of male bias and turned into a discipline that can help in the attainment of feminist ends. Not all feminists hold this view, however: some have suggested ways that traditional philosophy of language (as it stands) can aid in the understanding of issues important to feminism.

2.1 Feminist worries about philosophy of language

What reasons are given for supposing that philosophy of language is ill suited to achieving feminist ends? There are a variety of reasons (Hintikka and Hintikka 1983 Hornsby 2000; Nye 1996, 1998), but one common thread involves the idea that philosophy of language is excessively individualistic. Criticism of individualism in philosophy is widespread in many areas of feminism. Exactly what ‘individualism’ comes to varies depending upon the area of philosophy under discussion, and depending also on the concerns of the particular critic. (For more on what feminists mean by ‘individualism’, see Antony 1995.) Because of this, I will not attempt a general definition of ‘individualism’, as used by those raising these concerns. However, I will sketch what seems to be at issue in concerns over philosophy of language. Some claim that philosophy of language focuses excessively on the states of mind of individual speakers — in particular on their intentions (Hornsby 2000). Hornsby's central example of this tendency is the work of H P Grice, which does indeed analyse speaker meaning in terms of speaker intentions. (Although it is worth noting that that Grice's analysis of sentence meaning incorporates social elements, and that both speaker and audience are essential to his notion of conversational implicature. For more on this, see Saul 2002.) Others suggest that semantics assigns too important a role to the notion of reference to discrete individuals (Hintikka and Hintikka 1983). Their focus is on Tarski's truth definitions (Tarski 1956) and R. Montague's work (Thomason 1974).

Individualism of this sort is said to be problematic for several reasons. One common claim is that this sort of individualism is characteristic of male thinking. Men tend, according to this line of thought, to be interested in separate, discrete individuals; while women are interested in connections and relationships. Thus, it is suggested, an individualistic philosophy of language is one that represents a male way of thinking about the world. For philosophy of language to be true to the experiences and language use of both men and women, then, the individualistic philosophy of language which is characteristic of male thinking will need to be supplemented or replaced by a version more suited to female thinking (Hintikka and Hintikka 1983, Hornsby 2000). As Sally Haslanger (2000) and others have noted, however, the claims regarding male and female thinking on which this line of thought depends are not well supported. Moreover, differences among women give us reason to doubt the prospects for any supportable generalizations about ‘women's’ thinking (Lugones and Spelman 1983, Moody-Adams 1991).

Other objections to individualism do not depend upon contentious psychological claims about differences between women and men. Instead, they suggest that the real problem with individualism is its failure to appreciate the importance of the social. The social world is, naturally, an important area of concern when discussing politics and power relations. Understanding how people come to dominate one another, and exactly how this domination functions, are important projects for feminists. Language is an important part of the social world, and understanding the roles that language plays in communicating, manipulating, and controlling (to cite just a few examples) is surely vital to understanding the workings of power (See, for example, MacKinnon's views on speech in MacKinnon 1993). So, many feminists suggest, a philosophy of language that is appropriate to understanding communicative interactions in the social world could be a valuable tool for feminists. However, they insist that the individualism of philosophy of language (as it is now) prevents it from serving this function (Hornsby 2000).

The general charge that philosophy of language pays little attention to the social world is not one that all feminists would agree with. Indeed, it is a difficult one to sustain in light of the prominence of — to give a few examples — Kripke 's causal theory of reference (1972), (see Section 2 of the entry on reference), Hilary Putnam's arguments for a social element (the division of linguistic labor) in the working of kind terms (1975), (see Section 3 of the entry on reference), HP Grice's theory of conversation (1975/1989), David Lewis's work on convention (1969), and JL Austin's speech act theory (1962/1975). Nonetheless, one might well suggest that philosophers of language have generally attended only to aspects of the social world that are not of particular interest to feminists. While causal theories of reference undeniably involve social elements, these social elements don't seem to be of the sort that concern feminists; while Putnam's division of linguistic labour arguably involves some power relations (experts have a special sort of linguistic power that non-experts lack), the political aspects of these power relations — if any — have been ignored. Andrea Nye criticizes mainstream philosophy of language on roughly these grounds, arguing that work on radical translation has not been sufficiently sensitive to political concerns (for the notion of radical translation, see the section on Meaning and Truth in the entry on Donald Davidson).

…a highly technical and professionalized English-speaking philosophy of language was addressing problems of the possibility of ‘radical’ translation from one language community to another, of alternate and incommensurable conceptual schemes, of the difficulty of establishing singular reference across ‘different worlds’, but with virtually no reference to actual failures of communication or problems of gender. (Nye 1998: 266)

As the effort to introduce such political concerns into philosophy of language is a rather new one, it is not yet clear what will come of it. In particular, it is not yet clear whether attending to these concerns will reveal the need for changes in the way that philosophy of language is done.

2.2 Feminist use of philosophy of language

Despite these criticisms, more and more philosophers have been making feminist use of traditional philosophy of language. Recently, there has been an explosion of work on the idea that philosophy of language (especially, though not exclusively, speech act theory) can help us to understand some of the ways that women are disadvantaged.[5]

Much of this work takes as its starting place Rae Langton's and Jennifer Hornsby's use of speech act theory to make sense of Catharine MacKinnon's suggestion that pornography silences and subordinates women. To give some flavour of this work, I'll briefly summarise Langton's discussion of silencing.

We will focus here just on the example of silencing. According to Rae Langton (1993), pornography helps to bring about rape by perlocutionarily and illocutionarily silencing women. Following Austin, Langton distinguishes between locutionary, illocutionary, and perlocutionary acts. A locutionary act is, roughly, the act of uttering words that have particular meanings; a perlocutionary act is, roughly, the act of uttering words that have a particular effect; and an illocutionary act is the act done in uttering the words. Consider, for example, my utterance one day of the sentence ‘I pledge my allegiance to Her Majesty the Queen and all her heirs’. The locutionary act I performed was simply the utterance of a sentence with a particular meaning. This act had many perlocutionary effects: it made it possible for me to get a British passport, it made me feel slightly disturbed at having expressed such monarchist sentiments, and it made me wonder whether a republic, should it succeed the Queen, would count as an heir. The illocutionary act I performed was that of becoming a British citizen.

Langton proposes that there are forms of silencing corresponding to each of these sorts of speech act. A person is locutionarily silenced if she is prevented from speaking, or intimidated into not speaking. A person is illocutionarily silenced if she is unable to carry out the acts that she intends to carry out in speaking. A person is perlocutionarily silenced when her speech cannot have its intended effects. Langton is particularly concerned with the role that perlocutionary and illocutionary silencing may play in rape. A woman's refusal to have sex is perlocutionarily silenced if — even though she is recognized as refusing — she is forced to have sex. Her (attempted) refusal to have sex is illoctionarily silenced if it is not even recognized as a refusal. In such a case, according to Langton, it isn't a refusal. She suggests that pornography plays a key role in making men less able to recognise women's refusals as refusals and more willing to rape women even when they recognise women's refusals. This means, she argues, that pornography illocutionarily and perlocutionarily silences women. And this silencing is an important one, as it results in rape.

This example can also help us to see that some elements of individualism may be indispensable to feminism (for more arguments to this effect, see Antony 1995). Assuming that Langton's arguments are sound, we can see an important role for individualistic philosophy of language in feminism. Although it is right that focusing exclusively on individual speakers' intentions would prevent us from seeing some important facts (as Hornsby 2000 argues), it also vital to recognise the importance of paying some attention to speaker intentions. In order to understand what has gone wrong in the illocutionary silencing described above, one needs to understand that the woman intended to be refusing sex. In order to understand what has gone wrong in the perlocutionary silencing example, one needs to understand that the woman intended her refusal to bring it about that she did not have sex. More generally, not being understood properly is an important element of life in a subordinate position, as many feminists have noted. In order to make sense of not being understood properly, one needs to attend to what the speaker intended and how the audience understood the speaker, and how these things differ. To do this, one needs to look at individual states of mind.

These discussions have inspired a now substantial literature. Below, I give some very non-comprehensive pointers to this literature.

  1. Some critics (e.g. Dworkin 1991, 1993, Jacobson 1995) have argued that any silencing which may result from pornography is not of the sort that free speech law should attempt to protect. (Responses to these criticisms can be found in Hornsby and Langton 1998; Langton 2009a; and West 2003.)
  2. Others, such as Green 1998, have argued that pornography does not have the sort of authority needed to carry out acts of subordination and silencing. Langton has responded to this criticism in her 2009b; and Mary Kate McGowan, in her 2003, argues that the sort of authority needed for the acts in question is really quite a modest and ordinary sort of conversational authority. Nellie Weiland (2007), like McGowan, thinks that there is no need for the sort of authority that worries Green. However, she argues that Langton's account runs the risk of absolving rapists from culpability for their crimes. (Jacobson also raises this culpability worry.) McGowan and Maitra respond to this in their 2009, as do McGowan, Adelman, Helmers and Stolzenberg (forthcoming).
  3. Jennifer Saul (2006) worries about Langton's claim that pornography itself is a speech act, arguing that only utterances in contexts can be speech acts. Moreover, she suggests that if Langton's claim is revised to be one about acts of viewing or showing pornography it loses its plausibility. Bianchi criticizes this in her 2008 and Mikkola (2008) responds.
  4. A further concern about context comes from Lynne Tirrell (1999). Tirrell argues that MacKinnon assigns pornography an authority so strong that women would be unable to successfully articulate their own experiences. She suggests that MacKinnon's picture needs revising to make room for the successful communication that takes place between feminists.
  5. Bird (2002), Jacobson (1995) and Maitra (2009) all raise worries about the Austinian distinction between illocution and perlocution and its role in the silencing argument (in particular, about the requirement that illocutions must be understood to be successful). For Bird and Jacobson this leads to a rejection of the silencing argument, but Maitra instead re-frames it in Gricean terms.
  6. Judith Butler objects to the silencing argument on several grounds, chief among them (a) that it assumes an implausible picture of language use; and (b) that silencing does not matter in the way that Langton and Hornsby think that it does. Langton responds in her 2009c.

In addition the rich critical literature on subordination and silencing surveyed above, philosophers like Mary Kate McGowan have begun expanding on these ideas. In her 2009a, McGowan argues for the existence of a different sort of silencing due to pornography; and in her 2009b she argues that speech may be counted not just as silencing or subordinating, but also as oppressing. Moreover, she suggests that oppressive speech is likely to be a very widespread phenomenon.

Feminist work on language, and on philosophy of language, is a relatively new endeavour. But there is good reason to suppose that feminist philosophers can bring much that is useful to the study of language, and that philosophy of language has valuable resources to offer feminism.

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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Acknowledgments

I am very grateful to David Braun, Ray Drainville, Sally Haslanger, Chris Hookway, Jules Holroyd, and Nancy Tuana for their invaluable help with this entry. I would also like to thank Kathrin Gluer-Pagin for spotting some misidentified sentences in an earlier version of this entry, and Erik Tellgren for alerting me to Paul Gross's response to Emily Martin. Special thanks are due to Mary Kate McGowan for her extremely helpful advice on the 2010 update to this entry.



Copyright © 2010 by
Jennifer Saul <j.saul@shef.ac.uk>

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