Feminist Philosophy

First published Thu Jun 28, 2018

This entry provides an overview of all the entries in the feminist philosophy section of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (SEP). After a brief account of the history of feminist philosophy and various issues regarding defining feminism, the entry discusses the three main sections on (1) approaches to feminist philosophy, (2) feminist interventions in philosophy, and (3) feminist philosophical topics.

Feminists working in all the main Western traditions of contemporary philosophy are using their respective traditions to approach their work, including the traditions of analytic, Continental, and pragmatist philosophy, along with other various orientations and intersections. As they do so, they are also intervening in how longstanding basic philosophical problems are understood. As feminist philosophers carry out work in traditional philosophical fields, from ethics to epistemology, they have introduced new concepts and perspectives that have transformed philosophy itself. They are also rendering philosophical previously un-problematized topics, such as the body, class and work, disability, the family, reproduction, the self, sex work, human trafficking, and sexuality. And they are bringing a particularly feminist lens to issues of science, globalization, human rights, popular culture, and race and racism.

1. Introduction

As this entry describes, feminism is both an intellectual commitment and a political movement that seeks justice for women and the end of sexism in all forms. Motivated by the quest for social justice, feminist inquiry provides a wide range of perspectives on social, cultural, economic, and political phenomena. Yet despite many overall shared commitments, there are numerous differences among feminist philosophers regarding philosophical orientation (whether, for example, Continental or analytic), ontological commitments (such as the category of woman), and what kind of political and moral remedies should be sought.

Contemporary feminist philosophical scholarship emerged in the 1970s as more women began careers in higher education, including philosophy. As they did so, they also began taking up matters from their own experience for philosophical scrutiny. These scholars were influenced both by feminist movements in their midst as well as by their philosophical training, which was anything but feminist. Until recently one could not go to graduate school to study “feminist philosophy”. While students and scholars could turn to the writings of Simone de Beauvoir or look back historically to the writings of “first wave” feminists like Mary Wollstonecraft, most of the philosophers writing in the first decades of the emergence of feminist philosophy brought their particular training and expertise to bear on analyzing issues raised by the women’s liberation movement of the 1960s and 1970s, such as abortion, affirmative action, equal opportunity, the institutions of marriage, sexuality, and love. Additionally, feminist philosophical scholarship increasingly focused on the very same types of issues philosophers had been and were dealing with.

Feminist philosophical scholarship begins with attention to women, to their roles and locations. What are women doing? What social/political locations are they part of or excluded from? How do their activities compare to those of men? Are the activities or exclusions of some groups of women different from those of other groups and why? What do the various roles and locations of women allow or preclude? How have their roles been valued or devalued? How do the complexities of a woman’s situatedness, including her class, race, ability, and sexuality impact her locations? To this we add attention to the experiences and concerns of women. Have any of women’s experiences or problems been ignored or undervalued? How might attention to these transform our current methods or values? And from here we move to the realm of the symbolic. How is the feminine instantiated and constructed within the texts of philosophy? What role does the feminine play in forming, either through its absence or its presence, the central concepts of philosophy? And so on.

Feminist philosophers brought their philosophical tools to bear on these questions. And since these feminist philosophers employed the philosophical tools they knew best and found most promising, feminist philosophy began to emerge from all the traditions of Western philosophy prevalent at the end of the twentieth century including analytic, Continental, and classical American philosophy. It should come as no surprise then that the thematic focus of their work was often influenced by the topics and questions highlighted by these traditions. Hence, as a result, a given question can be taken up and addressed from an array of views, sometimes, as discussed below, with quite contradictory answers.

Hence feminist philosophical scholarship is not homogeneous either in methods or in conclusions. Indeed, there has been significant debate within feminist philosophical circles concerning the effectiveness of particular methods within philosophy for feminist goals. Some, for example, have found the methods of analytic philosophy to provide clarity of both form and argumentation not found in some schools of Continental philosophy, while others have argued that such alleged clarity comes at the expense of rhetorical styles and methodological approaches that provide insights into affective, psychic, or embodied components of human experience. Other feminists find approaches within American pragmatism to provide the clarity of form and argumentation sometimes missing in Continental approaches and the connection to real world concerns sometimes missing in analytic approaches.

Founded in 1982 as a venue for feminist philosophical scholarship, Hypatia: A Journal of Feminist Philosophy has embraced a diversity of methodological approaches in feminist philosophy, publishing work from all three traditions. Feminist scholarship in each of these traditions is also advanced and supported though scholarly exchange at various professional societies, including the Society for Women in Philosophy, founded in the United States in 1972. Additionally, the Society for Analytical Feminism, founded in 1991, promotes the study of issues in feminism by methods broadly construed as analytic, to examine the use of analytic methods as applied to feminist issues, and to provide a means by which those interested in analytical feminist can meet and exchange ideas. philoSOPHIA was established in 2005 to promote Continental feminist scholarly and pedagogical development. The Society for the Study of Women Philosophers was established in 1987 to promote the study of the contributions of women to the history of philosophy. Similar organizations and journals on many continents continue to advance scholarship in feminist philosophy.

Many of the ways in which feminist philosophy is not monolithic will be discussed below. Nevertheless, it is worth noting here at the start that although feminist philosophers have intended that their work—unlike the traditional philosophy they criticize—be applicable to all women and reflect the diverse experiences of women, in practice it has not always been the case. One important limitation that feminist philosophers are trying to overcome is their insufficient attention to the many interacting ways that human beings are oppressed, for example, along lines of race, sexuality, ability, class, religion, and nationality. Feminist philosophy strives for inclusivity and pluralism, even if it falls short.

2. What is Feminism?

2.1 Feminist Beliefs and Feminist Movements

The term “feminism” has many different uses and its meanings are often contested. For example, some writers use the term “feminism” to refer to a historically specific political movement in the United States and Europe; other writers use it to refer to the belief that there are injustices against women, though there is no consensus on the exact list of these injustices. Although the term “feminism” has a history in English linked with women’s activism from the late nineteenth century to the present, it is useful to distinguish feminist ideas or beliefs from feminist political movements, for even in periods where there has been no significant political activism around women’s subordination, individuals have been concerned with and theorized about justice for women. So, for example, it makes sense to ask whether Plato was a feminist, given his view that some women should be trained to rule (Republic, Book V), even though he was an exception in his historical context (see, e.g., Tuana 1994).

Our goal here is not to survey the history of feminism—as a set of ideas or as a series of political movements—but rather to sketch some of the central uses of the term that are most relevant to those interested in contemporary feminist philosophy. The references we provide below are only a small sample of the work available on the topics in question; more complete bibliographies are available at the specific topical entries and also at the end of this entry.

In the mid-1800s the term “feminism” was used to refer to “the qualities of females”, and it was not until after the First International Women’s Conference in Paris in 1892 that the term, following the French term féministe, was used regularly in English for a belief in and advocacy of equal rights for women based on the idea of the equality of the sexes. Although the term “feminism” in English is rooted in the mobilization for woman suffrage in Europe and the United States during the late nineteenth and early twentieth century, of course efforts to obtain justice for women did not begin or end with this period of activism. So some have found it useful, if controversial, to think of the women’s movement in the United States as occurring in “waves”. On the wave model, the struggle to achieve basic political rights during the period from the mid-nineteenth century until the passage of the Nineteenth Amendment in 1920 counts as “First Wave” feminism. Feminism waned between the two world wars, to be “revived” in the late 1960s and early 1970s as “Second Wave” feminism. In this second wave, feminists pushed beyond the early quest for political rights to fight for greater equality across the board, e.g., in education, the workplace, and at home. More recent transformations of feminism have resulted in a “Third Wave”. Third Wave feminists often critique Second Wave feminism for its lack of attention to the differences among women due to race, ethnicity, class, nationality, religion (see Section 2.3 below; also Breines 2002; Spring 2002), and emphasize “identity” as a site of gender struggle. (For more information on the “wave” model and each of the “waves”, see Other Internet Resources.)

However, some feminist scholars object to identifying feminism with these particular moments of political activism, on the grounds that doing so eclipses the fact that there has been resistance to male domination that should be considered “feminist” throughout history and across cultures: i.e., feminism is not confined to a few (White) women in the West over the past century or so. Moreover, even considering only relatively recent efforts to resist male domination in Europe and the United States, the emphasis on “First” and “Second” Wave feminism ignores the ongoing resistance to male domination between the 1920s and 1960s and the resistance outside mainstream politics, particularly by women of color and working class women (Cott 1987).

One strategy for solving these problems would be to identify feminism in terms of a set of ideas or beliefs rather than participation in any particular political movement. As we saw above, this also has the advantage of allowing us to locate isolated feminists whose work was not understood or appreciated during their time. But how should we go about identifying a core set of feminist beliefs? Some would suggest that we should focus on the political ideas that the term was apparently coined to capture, viz., the commitment to women’s equal rights. This acknowledges that commitment to and advocacy for women’s rights has not been confined to the Women’s Liberation Movement in the West. But this too raises controversy, for it frames feminism within a broadly liberal approach to political and economic life. Although most feminists would probably agree that there is some sense of rights on which achieving equal rights for women is a necessary condition for feminism to succeed, most would also argue that this would not be sufficient. This is because women’s oppression under male domination rarely if ever consists solely in depriving women of political and legal rights, but also extends into the structure of our society and the content of our culture, the workings of languages and how they shape perceptions and permeate our consciousness (e.g., Bartky 1988, Postl 2017).

Is there any point, then, to asking what feminism is? Given the controversies over the term and the politics of circumscribing the boundaries of a social movement, it is sometimes tempting to think that the best we can do is to articulate a set of disjuncts that capture a range of feminist beliefs. However, at the same time it can be both intellectually and politically valuable to have a schematic framework that enables us to map at least some of our points of agreement and disagreement. We’ll begin here by considering some of the basic elements of feminism as a political position or set of beliefs.

2.2 Normative and Descriptive Components

In many of its forms, feminism seems to involve at least two groups of claims, one normative and the other descriptive. The normative claims concern how women ought (or ought not) to be viewed and treated and draw on a background conception of justice or broad moral position; the descriptive claims concern how women are, as a matter of fact, viewed and treated, alleging that they are not being treated in accordance with the standards of justice or morality invoked in the normative claims. Together the normative and descriptive claims provide reasons for working to change the way things are; hence, feminism is not just an intellectual but also a political movement.

So, for example, a liberal approach of the kind already mentioned might define feminism (rather simplistically here) in terms of two claims:

  1. (Normative) Men and women are entitled to equal rights and respect.
  2. (Descriptive) Women are currently disadvantaged with respect to rights and respect, compared with men […in such and such respects and due to such and such conditions…].

On this account, that women and men ought to have equal rights and respect is the normative claim; and that women are denied equal rights and respect functions here as the descriptive claim. Admittedly, the claim that women are disadvantaged with respect to rights and respect is not a “purely descriptive” claim since it plausibly involves an evaluative component. However, our point here is simply that claims of this sort concern what is the case not what ought to be the case. Moreover, as indicated by the ellipsis above, the descriptive component of a substantive feminist view will not be articulable in a single claim, but will involve an account of the specific social mechanisms that deprive women of, e.g., rights and respect. For example, is the primary source of women’s subordination her role in the family? (Engels 1845; Okin 1989). Or is it her role in the labor market? (Bergmann 2002). Is the problem males’ tendencies to sexual violence (and what is the source of these tendencies?)? (Brownmiller 1975; MacKinnon 1987). Or is it simply women’s biological role in reproduction? (Firestone 1970).

Disagreements within feminism can occur with respect to either the descriptive or normative claims, e.g., feminists differ on what would count as justice or injustice for women (what counts as “equality”, “oppression”, “disadvantage”, what rights should everyone be accorded?) , and what sorts of injustice women in fact suffer (what aspects of women’s current situation are harmful or unjust?). Disagreements may also lie in the explanations of the injustice: two feminists may agree that women are unjustly being denied proper rights and respect and yet substantively differ in their accounts of how or why the injustice occurs and what is required to end it (Jaggar 1994).

Disagreements between feminists and non-feminists can occur with respect to both the normative and descriptive claims as well, e.g., some non-feminists agree with feminists on the ways women ought to be viewed and treated, but don’t see any problem with the way things currently are. Others disagree about the background moral or political views.

In an effort to suggest a schematic account of feminism, Susan James characterizes feminism as follows:

Feminism is grounded on the belief that women are oppressed or disadvantaged by comparison with men, and that their oppression is in some way illegitimate or unjustified. Under the umbrella of this general characterization there are, however, many interpretations of women and their oppression, so that it is a mistake to think of feminism as a single philosophical doctrine, or as implying an agreed political program. (James 1998: 576)

James seems here to be using the notions of “oppression” and “disadvantage” as placeholders for more substantive accounts of injustice (both normative and descriptive) over which feminists disagree.

Some might prefer to define feminism in terms of a normative claim alone: feminists are those who believe that women are entitled to equal rights, or equal respect, or…(fill in the blank with one’s preferred account of injustice), and one is not required to believe that women are currently being treated unjustly. However, if we were to adopt this terminological convention, it would be harder to identify some of the interesting sources of disagreement both with and within feminism, and the term “feminism” would lose much of its potential to unite those whose concerns and commitments extend beyond their moral beliefs to their social interpretations and political affiliations. Feminists are not simply those who are committed in principle to justice for women; feminists take themselves to have reasons to bring about social change on women’s behalf.

Taking “feminism” to entail both normative and empirical commitments also helps make sense of some uses of the term “feminism” in recent popular discourse. In everyday conversation it is not uncommon to find both men and women prefixing a comment they might make about women with the caveat, “I’m not a feminist, but…”. Of course this qualification might be (and is) used for various purposes, but one persistent usage seems to follow the qualification with some claim that is hard to distinguish from claims that feminists are wont to make. For example, I’m not a feminist but I believe that women should earn equal pay for equal work; or I’m not a feminist but I’m delighted that first-rate women basketball players are finally getting some recognition in the WNBA. If we see the identification “feminist” as implicitly committing one to both a normative stance about how things should be and an interpretation of current conditions, it is easy to imagine someone being in the position of wanting to cancel his or her endorsement of either the normative or the descriptive claim. So, e.g., one might be willing to acknowledge that there are cases where women have been disadvantaged without wanting to buy any broad moral theory that takes a stance on such things (especially where it is unclear what that broad theory is). Or one might be willing to acknowledge in a very general way that equality for women is a good thing, without being committed to interpreting particular everyday situations as unjust (especially if is unclear how far these interpretations would have to extend). Feminists, however, at least according to popular discourse, are ready to both adopt a broad account of what justice for women would require and interpret everyday situations as unjust by the standards of that account. Those who explicitly cancel their commitment to feminism may then be happy to endorse some part of the view but are unwilling to endorse what they find to be a problematic package.

As mentioned above, there is considerable debate within feminism concerning the normative question: what would count as (full) justice for women? What is the nature of the wrong that feminism seeks to address? For example, is the wrong that women have been deprived equal rights? Is it that women have been denied equal respect for their differences? Is it that women’s experiences have been ignored and devalued? Is it all of the above and more? What framework should we employ to identify and address the issues? (see, e.g., Jaggar 1983; Young 1985; Tuana & Tong 1995). Feminist philosophers in particular have asked: Do the standard philosophical accounts of justice and morality provide us adequate resources to theorize male domination, or do we need distinctively feminist accounts? (e.g., Okin 1979; Hoagland 1989; Okin 1989; Ruddick 1989; Benhabib 1992; Hampton 1993; Held 1993; Tong 1993; Baier 1994; Moody-Adams 1997; M. Walker 1998; Kittay 1999; Robinson 1999; Young 2011; O’Connor 2008).

Note, however, that by phrasing the task as one of identifying the wrongs women suffer (and have suffered), there is an implicit suggestion that women as a group can be usefully compared against men as a group with respect to their standing or position in society; and this seems to suggest that women as a group are treated in the same way, or that they all suffer the same injustices, and men as a group all reap the same advantages. But of course this is not the case, or at least not straightforwardly so. As bell hooks so vividly pointed out, in 1963 when Betty Friedan urged women to reconsider the role of housewife and demanded greater opportunities for women to enter the workforce (Friedan 1963), Friedan was not speaking for working class women or most women of color (hooks 1984: 1–4). Neither was she speaking for lesbians. Women as a group experience many different forms of injustice, and the sexism they encounter interacts in complex ways with other systems of oppression. In contemporary terms, this is known as the problem of intersectionality (Crenshaw 1991, Botts 2017). This critique has led some theorists to resist the label “feminism” and to adopt a different name for their view. Earlier, during the 1860s–80s, the term “womanism” had sometimes been used for such intellectual and political commitments; in 1990, Alice Walker proposed that “womanism” provides a contemporary alternative to “feminism” that better addresses the needs of Black women and women of color more generally. But given more recent work on trans issues such a gender-specific term would today raise many more problems than it would solve.

2.3 Feminism and the Diversity of Women

To consider some of the different strategies for responding to the phenomenon of intersectionality, let’s return to the schematic claims that women are oppressed and this oppression is wrong or unjust. Very broadly, then, one might characterize the goal of feminism to be ending the oppression of women. But if we also acknowledge that women are oppressed not just by sexism, but in many ways, e.g., by classism, homophobia, racism, ageism, ableism, etc., then it might seem that the goal of feminism is to end all oppression that affects women. And some feminists have adopted this interpretation (e.g., Ware 1970, quoted in Crow 2000: 1).

Note, however, that not all agree with such an expansive definition of feminism. One might agree that feminists ought to work to end all forms of oppression—oppression is unjust and feminists, like everyone else, have a moral obligation to fight injustice—without maintaining that it is the mission of feminism to end all oppression. One might even believe that in order to accomplish feminism’s goals it is necessary to combat racism and economic exploitation, but also think that there is a narrower set of specifically feminist objectives. In other words, opposing oppression in its many forms may be instrumental to, even a necessary means to, feminism, but not intrinsic to it. For example, bell hooks argues:

Feminism, as liberation struggle, must exist apart from and as a part of the larger struggle to eradicate domination in all its forms. We must understand that patriarchal domination shares an ideological foundation with racism and other forms of group oppression, and that there is no hope that it can be eradicated while these systems remain intact. This knowledge should consistently inform the direction of feminist theory and practice. (hooks 1989: 22)

On hooks’ account, the defining characteristic that distinguishes feminism from other liberation struggles is its concern with sexism:

Unlike many feminist comrades, I believe women and men must share a common understanding—a basic knowledge of what feminism is—if it is ever to be a powerful mass-based political movement. In Feminist Theory: From Margin to Center, I suggest that defining feminism broadly as “a movement to end sexism and sexist oppression” would enable us to have a common political goal…Sharing a common goal does not imply that women and men will not have radically divergent perspectives on how that goal might be reached. (hooks 1989: 23)

hooks’ approach depends on the claim that sexism is a particular form of oppression that can be distinguished from other forms, e.g., racism and homophobia, even though it is currently (and virtually always) interlocked with other forms of oppression. Feminism’s objective is to end sexism, though because of its relation to other forms of oppression, this will require efforts to end other forms of oppression as well. For example, feminists who themselves remain racists will not be able to fully appreciate the broad impact of sexism on the lives of women of color—nor the interconnections between racism and sexism. Furthermore because sexist institutions are also, e.g., racist, classist, and homophobic, dismantling sexist institutions will require that we dismantle the other forms of domination intertwined with them (Heldke & O’Connor 2004). Following hooks’ lead, we might characterize feminism schematically (allowing the schema to be filled in differently by different accounts) as the view that women are subject to sexist oppression and that this is wrong. This move shifts the burden of our inquiry from a characterization of what feminism is to a characterization of what sexism, or sexist oppression, is.

As mentioned above, there are a variety of interpretations—feminist and otherwise—of what exactly oppression consists in, but the leading idea is that oppression consists in “an enclosing structure of forces and barriers which tends to the immobilization and reduction of a group or category of people” (Frye 1983: 10–11). Not just any “enclosing structure” is oppressive, however, for plausibly any process of socialization will create a structure that both limits and enables all individuals who live within it. In the case of oppression, however, the “enclosing structures” in question are part of a broader system that asymmetrically and unjustly disadvantages one group and benefits another. So, for example, although sexism restricts the opportunities available to—and so unquestionably harms—both men and women (and considering some pairwise comparisons may even have a greater negative impact on a man than a woman), overall, women as a group unjustly suffer the greater harm. It is a crucial feature of contemporary accounts, however, that one cannot assume that members of the privileged group have intentionally designed or maintained the system for their benefit. The oppressive structure may be the result of an historical process whose originators are long gone, or it may be the unintended result of complex cooperative strategies gone wrong.

Leaving aside (at least for the moment) further details in the account of oppression, the question remains: What makes a particular form of oppression sexist? If we just say that a form of oppression counts as sexist oppression if it harms women, or even primarily harms women, this is not enough to distinguish it from other forms of oppression. Virtually all forms of oppression harm women, and arguably some besides sexism harm women primarily (though not exclusively), e.g., body size oppression, age oppression. Besides, as we’ve noted before, sexism is not only harmful to women, but is harmful to all of us.

What makes a particular form of oppression sexist seems to be not just that it harms women, but that someone is subject to this form of oppression specifically because she is (or at least appears to be) a woman. Racial oppression harms women, but racial oppression (by itself) doesn’t harm them because they are women, it harms them because they are (or appear to be) members of a particular race. The suggestion that sexist oppression consists in oppression to which one is subject by virtue of being or appearing to be a woman provides us at least the beginnings of an analytical tool for distinguishing subordinating structures that happen to affect some or even all women from those that are more specifically sexist (Haslanger 2004). But problems and unclarities remain.

First, we need to explicate further what it means to be oppressed “because you are a woman”. For example, is the idea that there is a particular form of oppression that is specific to women? Is to be oppressed “as a woman” to be oppressed in a particular way? Or can we be pluralists about what sexist oppression consists in without fragmenting the notion beyond usefulness?

Two strategies for explicating sexist oppression have proven to be problematic. The first is to maintain that there is a form of oppression common to all women. For example, one might interpret Catharine MacKinnon’s work as claiming that to be oppressed as a woman is to be viewed and treated as sexually subordinate, where this claim is grounded in the (alleged) universal fact of the eroticization of male dominance and female submission (MacKinnon 1987, 1989). Although MacKinnon allows that sexual subordination can happen in a myriad of ways, her account is monistic in its attempt to unite the different forms of sexist oppression around a single core account that makes sexual objectification the focus. Although MacKinnon’s work provides a powerful resource for analyzing women’s subordination, many have argued that it is too narrow, e.g., in some contexts (especially in developing countries) sexist oppression seems to concern more the local division of labor and economic exploitation. Although certainly sexual subordination is a factor in sexist oppression, it requires us to fabricate implausible explanations of social life to suppose that all divisions of labor that exploit women (as women) stem from the “eroticization of dominance and submission”. Moreover, it isn’t obvious that in order to make sense of sexist oppression we need to seek a single form of oppression common to all women.

A second problematic strategy has been to consider as paradigms those who are oppressed only as women, with the thought that complex cases bringing in additional forms of oppression will obscure what is distinctive of sexist oppression. This strategy would have us focus in the United States on white, wealthy, young, beautiful, able-bodied, heterosexual women to determine what oppression, if any, they suffer, with the hope of finding sexism in its “purest” form, unmixed with racism or homophobia, etc. (see Spelman 1988: 52–54). This approach is not only flawed in its exclusion of all but the most elite women in its paradigm, but it assumes that privilege in other areas does not affect the phenomenon under consideration. As Elizabeth Spelman makes the point:

…no woman is subject to any form of oppression simply because she is a woman; which forms of oppression she is subject to depend on what “kind” of woman she is. In a world in which a woman might be subject to racism, classism, homophobia, anti-Semitism, if she is not so subject it is because of her race, class, religion, sexual orientation. So it can never be the case that the treatment of a woman has only to do with her gender and nothing to do with her class or race. (Spelman 1988: 52–3)

Other accounts of oppression are designed to allow that oppression takes many forms, and refuse to identify one form as more basic or fundamental than the rest. For example, Iris Young describes five “faces” of oppression: exploitation, marginalization, powerlessness, cultural imperialism, and systematic violence (Young 1980 [1990a: ch. 2]). Plausibly others should be added to the list. Sexist or racist oppression, for example, will manifest itself in different ways in different contexts, e.g., in some contexts through systematic violence, in other contexts through economic exploitation. Acknowledging this does not go quite far enough, however, for monistic theorists such as MacKinnon could grant this much. Pluralist accounts of sexist oppression must also allow that there isn’t an over-arching explanation of sexist oppression that applies to all its forms: in some cases it may be that women’s oppression as women is due to the eroticization of male dominance, but in other cases it may be better explained by women’s reproductive value in establishing kinship structures (Rubin 1975), or by the shifting demands of globalization within an ethnically stratified workplace. In other words, pluralists resist the temptation to “grand social theory”, “overarching metanarratives”, “monocausal explanations”, to allow that the explanation of sexism in a particular historical context will rely on economic, political, legal, and cultural factors that are specific to that context which would prevent the account from being generalized to all instances of sexism (Fraser & Nicholson 1990). It is still compatible with pluralist methods to seek out patterns in women’s social positions and structural explanations within and across social contexts, but in doing so we must be highly sensitive to historical and cultural variation.

2.4 Feminism as Anti-Sexism

However, if we pursue a pluralist strategy in understanding sexist oppression, what unifies all the instances as instances of sexism? After all, we cannot assume that the oppression in question takes the same form in different contexts, and we cannot assume that there is an underlying explanation of the different ways it manifests itself. So can we even speak of there being a unified set of cases—something we can call “sexist oppression”—at all?

Some feminists would urge us to recognize that there isn’t a systematic way to unify the different instances of sexism, and correspondingly, there is no systematic unity in what counts as feminism: instead we should see the basis for feminist unity in coalition building (Reagon 1983). Different groups work to combat different forms of oppression; some groups take oppression against women (as women) as a primary concern. If there is a basis for cooperation between some subset of these groups in a given context, then finding that basis is an accomplishment, but should not be taken for granted.

An alternative, however, would be to grant that in practice unity among feminists cannot be taken for granted, but to begin with a theoretical common ground among feminist views that does not assume that sexism appears in the same form or for the same reasons in all contexts. We saw above that one promising strategy for distinguishing sexism from racism, classism, and other forms of injustice is to focus on the idea that if an individual is suffering sexist oppression, then an important part of the explanation why she is subject to the injustice is that she is or appears to be a woman. This includes cases in which women as a group are explicitly targeted by a policy or a practice, but also includes cases where the policy or practice affects women due to a history of sexism, even if they are not explicitly targeted. For example, in a scenario in which women are children’s primary caregivers and cannot travel for work as easily as men, then employment practices that reward those who can travel can be deemed sexist because the differential is due to sexist practices. The commonality among the cases is to be found in the role of gender in the explanation of the injustice rather than the specific form the injustice takes. Building on this we could unify a broad range of feminist views by seeing them as committed to the (very abstract) claims that:

  1. (Descriptive claim) Women, and those who appear to be women, are subjected to wrongs and/or injustice at least in part because they are or appear to be women.
  2. (Normative claim) The wrongs/injustices in question in (i) ought not to occur and should be stopped when and where they do.

We have so far been using the term “oppression” loosely to cover whatever form of wrong or injustice is at issue. Continuing with this intentional openness in the exact nature of the wrong, the question still remains what it means to say that women are subjected to injustice because they are women. To address this question, it may help to consider a familiar ambiguity in the notion “because”: are we concerned here with causal explanations or justifications? On one hand, the claim that someone is oppressed because she is a woman suggests that the best (causal) explanation of the subordination in question will make reference to her sex: e.g., Paula is subject to sexist oppression on the job because the best explanation of why she makes $10.00 less an hour for doing comparable work as Paul makes reference to her sex (possibly coupled with her race or other social classifications). On the other hand, the claim that someone is oppressed because she is a woman suggests that the rationale or basis for the oppressive structures requires that one be sensitive to someone’s sex in determining how they should be viewed and treated, i.e., that the justification for someone’s being subject to the structures in question depends on a representation of them as sexed male or female. For example, Paula is subject to sexist oppression on the job because the pay scale for her job classification is justified within a framework that distinguishes and devalues women’s work compared with men’s.

Note, however, that in both sorts of cases the fact that one is or appears to be a woman need not be the only factor relevant in explaining the injustice. It might be, for example, that one stands out in a group because of one’s race, or one’s class, or one’s sexuality, and because one stands out one becomes a target for injustice. But if the injustice takes a form that, e.g., is regarded as especially apt for a woman, then the injustice should be understood intersectionally, i.e., as a response to an intersectional category. For example, the practice of raping Bosnian women was an intersectional injustice: it targeted them both because they were Bosnian and because they were women.

Of course, these two understandings of being oppressed because you are a woman are not incompatible; in fact they typically support one another. Because human actions are often best explained by the framework employed for justifying them, one’s sex may play a large role in determining how one is treated because the background understandings for what’s appropriate treatment draw invidious distinctions between the sexes. In other words, the causal mechanism for sexism often passes through problematic representations of women and gender roles.

In each of the cases of being oppressed as a woman mentioned above, Paula suffers injustice, but a crucial factor in explaining the injustice is that Paula is a member of a particular group, viz., women. This, we think, is crucial in understanding why sexism (and racism, and other -isms) are most often understood as kinds of oppression. Oppression is injustice that, first and foremost, concerns groups; individuals are oppressed just in case they are subjected to injustice because of their group membership. On this view, to claim that women as women suffer injustice is to claim that women are oppressed.

Where does this leave us? “Feminism” is an umbrella term for a range of views about injustices against women. There are disagreements among feminists about the nature of justice in general and the nature of sexism, in particular, the specific kinds of injustice or wrong women suffer; and the group who should be the primary focus of feminist efforts. Nonetheless, feminists are committed to bringing about social change to end injustice against women, in particular, injustice against women as women.

3. Approaches to Feminism

Feminism brings many things to philosophy including not only a variety of particular moral and political claims, but ways of asking and answering questions, constructive and critical dialogue with mainstream philosophical views and methods, and new topics of inquiry. Feminist philosophers work within all the major traditions of philosophical scholarship including analytic philosophy, American pragmatist philosophy, and Continental philosophy. Entries in this Encyclopedia appearing under the heading “feminism, approaches” discuss the impact of these traditions on feminist scholarship and examine the possibility and desirability of work that makes links between two traditions. Feminist contributions to and interventions in mainstream philosophical debates are covered in entries in this encyclopedia under “feminism, interventions”. Entries covered under the rubric “feminism, topics” concern philosophical issues that arise as feminists articulate accounts of sexism, critique sexist social and cultural practices, and develop alternative visions of a just world. In short, they are philosophical topics that arise within feminism.

Approaches to feminist philosophy are almost as varied as approaches to philosophy itself, reflecting a variety of beliefs about what kinds of philosophy are both fruitful and meaningful. To spell out such differences, this section of the SEP provides overviews of the following dominant (at least in more developed societies) approaches to feminist philosophy. The following are links to essays in this section:

All these approaches share a set of feminist commitments and an overarching criticism of institutions, presuppositions, and practices that have historically favored men over women. They also share a general critique of claims to universality and objectivity that ignore male-dominated theories’ own particularity and specificity. Feminist philosophies of most any philosophical orientation will be much more perspectival, historical, contextual, and focused on lived experience than their non-feminist counterparts. Unlike mainstream philosophers who can seriously consider the philosophical conundrums of brains in a vat, feminist philosophers always start by seeing people as embodied. Feminists have also argued for the reconfiguration of accepted structures and problematics of philosophy. For example, feminists have not only rejected the privileging of epistemological concerns over moral and political concerns common to much of philosophy, they have argued that these two areas of concern are inextricably intertwined. Part 2 of the entry on analytic feminism lays out other areas of commonality across these various approaches. For one, feminist philosophers generally agree that philosophy is a powerful tool for understanding

ourselves and our relations to each other, to our communities, and to the state; to appreciate the extent to which we are counted as knowers and moral agents; [and] to uncover the assumptions and methods of various bodies of knowledge.

For another, feminist philosophers all generally are keenly attuned to male biases at work in the history of philosophy, such as those regarding “the nature of woman” and supposed value neutrality, which on inspection is hardly neutral at all. Claims to universality, feminist philosophers have found, are usually made from a very specific and particular point of view, contrary to their manifest claims. Another orientation that feminist philosophers generally share is a commitment to normativity and social change; they are never content to analyze things just as they are but are instead looking for ways to overcome sexist practices and institutions.

Such questioning of the problematic of mainstream approaches to philosophy has often led to feminists using methods and approaches from more than one philosophical tradition. As Ann Garry notes in part three of the entry on Analytic Feminism (2017), it is not uncommon to find analytic feminists drawing on non-analytic figures such as Beauvoir, Foucault, or Butler; and because of their motivation to communicate with other feminists, they are more motivated than other philosophers “to search for methodological cross-fertilization”.

Even with their common and overlapping orientations, the differences between the various philosophical approaches to feminism are significant, especially in terms of styles of writing, influences, and overall expectations about what philosophy can and should achieve. Analytic feminist philosophy tends to value analysis and argumentation, Continental feminist theory values interpretation and deconstruction, and pragmatist feminism values lived experience and exploration. Coming out of a post-Hegelian tradition, both Continental and pragmatist philosophers usually suspect that “truth”, whatever that is, emerges and develops historically. They tend to share with Nietzsche the view that truth claims often mask power plays. Yet where Continental and pragmatist are generally wary about notions of truth, analytic feminists tend to argue that the way to

counter sexism and androcentrism is through forming a clear conception of and pursuing truth, logical consistency, objectivity, rationality, justice, and the good. (Cudd 1996: 20).

These differences and intersections play out in the ways that various feminists engage topics of common concern. One key area of intersection noted by Georgia Warnke is the appropriation of psychoanalytic theory, with Anglo-American feminists generally adopting object-relations theories and Continental feminists drawing more on Lacan and contemporary French psychoanalytic theory, though this is already beginning to change (entry on intersections between analytic and continental feminism). The importance of psychoanalytic approaches is also underscored in Shannon Sullivan’s essay Intersections Between Pragmatist and Continental Feminism. Given the importance of psychoanalytic feminism for all three traditions, a separate essay on this approach to feminist theory is included in this section.

No topic is more central to feminist philosophy than sex and gender, but even here many variations on the theme flourish. Where analytic feminism, with its critique of essentialism, holds the sex/gender distinction practically as an article of faith (see the entry on feminist perspectives on sex and gender and Chanter 2009), Continental feminists tend to suspect either (1) that even the supposedly purely biological category of sex is itself socially constituted (Butler 1990 and 1993 or (2) that sexual difference itself needs to be valued and theorized (see especially Cixous 1976 and Irigaray 1974.

Despite the variety of different approaches, styles, societies, and orientations, feminist philosophers’ commonalities are greater than their differences. Many will borrow freely from each other and find that other orientations contribute to their own work. Even the differences over sex and gender add to a larger conversation about the impact of culture and society on bodies, experience, and pathways for change.

4. Interventions in Philosophy

Philosophers who are feminists have, in their work in traditional fields of study, begun to change those very fields. The Encyclopedia includes a range of entries on how feminist philosophies have intervened in conventional areas of philosophical research, areas in which philosophers often tend to argue that they are operating from a neutral, universal point of view (notable exceptions are pragmatism, poststructuralism, and some phenomenology). Historically, philosophy has claimed that the norm is universal and the feminine is abnormal, that universality is not gendered, but that all things feminine are not universal. Not surprisingly, feminists have pointed out how in fact these supposed neutral enterprises are in fact quite gendered, namely, male gendered. For example, feminists working on environmental philosophy have uncovered how practices disproportionately affect women, children, and people of color. Liberal feminism has shown how supposed universal truths of liberalism are in fact quite biased and particular. Feminist epistemologists have called out “epistemologies of ignorance” that traffic in not knowing. Across the board, in fact, feminist philosophers are uncovering male biases and also pointing to the value of particularity, in general rejecting universality as a norm or goal.

Entries under the heading of feminist interventions include the following:

5. Topics in Feminism

Feminist critical attention to philosophical practices has revealed the inadequacy of dominant philosophical tropes. For example, feminists working from the perspective of women’s lives have been influential in bringing philosophical attention to the phenomenon of care and care-giving (Ruddick 1989; Held 1995, 2007; Hamington 2006), dependency (Kittay 1999), disability (Wilkerson 2002; Carlson 2009) women’s labor (Waring 1999; Delphy 1984; Harley 2007), and scientific bias and objectivity (Longino 1990), and have revealed weaknesses in existing ethical, political, and epistemological theories. More generally, feminists have called for inquiry into what are typically considered “private” practices and personal concerns, such as the family, sexuality, and the body, in order to balance what has seemed to be a masculine pre-occupation with “public” and impersonal matters. Philosophy presupposes interpretive tools for understanding our everyday lives; feminist work in articulating additional dimensions of experience and aspects of our practices is invaluable in demonstrating the bias in existing tools, and in the search for better ones.

Feminist explanations of sexism and accounts of sexist practices also raise issues that are within the domain of traditional philosophical inquiry. For example, in thinking about care, feminists have asked questions about the nature of the self; in thinking about gender, feminists have asked what the relationship is between the natural and the social; in thinking about sexism in science, feminists have asked what should count as knowledge. In some such cases mainstream philosophical accounts provide useful tools; in other cases, alternative proposals have seemed more promising.

In the sub-entries included under “feminism (topics)” in the Table of Contents to this Encyclopedia, authors survey some of the recent feminist work on a topic, highlighting the issues that are of particular relevance to philosophy. These entries are:

See also the entries in the Related Entries section below.


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  • Robinson, Fiona, 1999, Globalizing Care: Ethics, Feminist Theory, and International Affairs, Boulder, CO: Westview Press.
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  • Rubin, Gayle, 1975, “The Traffic in Women: Notes on the ’Political Economy’ of Sex”, in Towards an Anthropology of Women, Rayna Rapp Reiter (ed.), New York: Monthly Review Press, 157–210.
  • Ruddick, Sara, 1989, Maternal Thinking: Towards a Politics of Peace, Boston: Beacon Press.
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  • Scheman, Naomi, 1993, Engenderings: Constructions of Knowledge, Authority, and Privilege, New York: Routledge.
  • Schneir, Miriam, 1972, Feminism: The Essential Historical Writings, New York: Vintage Books.
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  • Schott, Robin May, 2003, Discovering Feminist Philosophy, Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Schwartzman, Lisa H., 2006, Challenging Liberalism: Feminism as Political Critique, University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press.
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  • Spelman, Elizabeth, 1988, Inessential Woman: Problems of Exclusion in Feminist Thought, Boston: Beacon Press.
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  • Superson, Anita M., 2009, The Moral Skeptic, New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780195376623.001.0001
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  • Tuana, Nancy (ed.), 1992, Woman and the History of Philosophy, New York: Paragon Press.
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  • Walker, Rebecca (ed.), 1995, To Be Real: Telling the Truth and Changing the Face of Feminism, New York: Random House (Anchor Books).
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  • Waring, Marilyn, 1999, Counting for Nothing: What Men Value and What Women Are Worth, second edition, Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
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  • –––, 1990a, Throwing Like a Girl and Other Essays in Feminist Philosophy and Social Theory, Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
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Other Internet Resources

Resources listed below have been chosen to provide only a springboard into the huge amount of feminist material available on the web. The emphasis here is on general resources useful for doing research in feminist philosophy or interdisciplinary feminist theory, e.g., the links connect to bibliographies and meta-sites, and resources concerning inclusion, exclusion, and feminist diversity. The list is incomplete and will be regularly revised and expanded. Further resources on topics in feminism such as popular culture, reproductive rights, sex work, are available within each sub-entry on that topic.



“Waves” of Feminism

Feminism and Class

Marxist, Socialist, and Materialist Feminisms

Feminist Economics

Women and Labor

Feminism and Disability

Feminism, Human Rights, Global Feminism, and Human Trafficking

Feminism and Race/Ethnicity

General Resources

African-American/Black Feminisms and Womanism

Asian-American and Asian Feminisms

Chicana/Latina Feminisms

American Indian, Native, Indigenous Feminisms

Feminism, Sex, Sexuality, Transgender, and Intersex


Over many revisions, thanks go to Elizabeth Harman, Elizabeth Hackett, Ishani Maitra, Ásta Sveinsdóttir, Leslee Mahoney, and Ann Garry.

Copyright © 2018 by
Noëlle McAfee <noelle.c.mcafee@emory.edu>

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