Metaphysics is the study of the basic structure of reality, of what there is and what it is like. It considers, for example, concepts such as identity, causation, substance, and kind, that seem to be presupposed by any form of inquiry; and it attempts to determine what there is at the most general level. For example, are there minds in addition to bodies? Do things persist through change? Is there freewill or is all action determined by prior events? But since metaphysics not only concerns itself with what there is (ontology), but also the nature of that which exists, metaphysicians ask, for example, whether numbers, if they exist, are dependent upon human thought and practices in some way, whether the concepts and categories we use to think of and describe reality influence or determine in any way what is described, and whether and how values are embodied in our categories and descriptions. It should thus not come as a surprise that there could be a specifically feminist metaphysics, where the question of prime importance is to what extent the central concepts and categories of metaphysics, in terms of which we make sense of our reality, could be value laden in ways that are particularly gendered.
In this way, feminist theorists have asked whether and, if so, to what extent our frameworks for understanding the world are distorting in ways that privilege men or masculinity. What, if anything, is eclipsed if we adopt an Aristotelian framework of substance and essence, or a Cartesian framework of immaterial souls present in material bodies? And is what's left out of such frameworks relevant to the devaluation or oppression of women? Feminists have also considered the structure of social reality and the relationship between the social world and the natural world. Because social structures are often justified as natural, or necessary to control what's natural, feminists have questioned whether such references to nature are legitimate. This has led to considerable work on the idea of social construction and, more specifically, the social construction of gender.
Speaking very generally, the project of feminist metaphysics asks: Have metaphysical claims about what there is, and what it is like, supported sexism, and if so, how? Are there particular metaphysical assumptions or patterns of inference that feminists should challenge (or endorse)? Replies to these questions have offered critiques and reconstructions of concepts for thinking about, e.g., the self (Meyers 1997; Meyers 2004a), sex and sexuality (Butler 1987; Butler 1990; Butler 1993; Fausto-Sterling 2000), mind and body (Bordo 1987; Bordo 1993; Young 1990; Scheman 1993; Gatens 1996; Wendell 1996; Schiebinger 2000), nature (Lloyd 1984; Haraway1991; Butler 1993; Warren 1997), essence (Witt 1993; Schor and Weed 1994; Stoljar 1995; Witt 1995; Witt 2011b; Witt forthcoming), identity (Spelman 1988; Lugones 1994; Young 1994; Frye 1996; Lindemann Nelson 2001; Alcoff 2006; Warnke 2008; Heinämaa 2011), and objectification (see separate SEP entry, Papadaki 2011). Feminists have also questioned whether metaphysics is a legitimate form of inquiry at all, raising epistemological questions about, e.g., foundationalist assumptions implicit in metaphysical inquiry (Irigaray 1985; Flax 1986; Fraser and Nicholson 1990; Haslanger, 2000a). We will focus here on the former set of issues, mentioning methodological and epistemological questions only in passing.
To begin an overview of feminist metaphysics in this century, it is helpful to return to Simone de Beauvoir's classic work The Second Sex (de Beauvoir 1949). Two of her most famous claims appear to have profound metaphysical implications: “One is not born, but rather becomes, a woman,” (de Beauvoir 1949, 267) and “He is the Subject, he is the Absolute—she is the Other” (de Beauvoir 1949, xxviii). There is disagreement about how to interpret both claims, yet to many the former serves as the slogan for the view that gender is socially constructed, and the latter identifies the content of feminine construction as what is opposed to the masculine, the masculine also being what counts as the subject or self. Three interconnected themes prominent in feminist metaphysics emerge here: (i) the social construction of gender (and other categories), (ii) the relational nature of the self (and other categories), (iii) the dangers of dualistic thinking.
In claiming that one is not born a woman, Beauvoir was not suggesting that one is never born with female body parts; rather, her concern was that possession of female (or male) body parts, in and of itself, does not imply how one could or should be socially situated. In spite of this, societies, for the most part, reserve for females certain social roles, norms, and activities that disadvantage them in relation to males, casting the differences as necessary because natural (de Beauvoir 1949, Ch.1). If it is recognized, as Beauvoir urged, that what women and men are is at least partly a social matter, this opens up the possibility that gender roles could be and so should be made more equitable through social change. To simplify discussion, we will use the terms ‘male’/‘female’ to mark the currently familiar sex distinction drawn in terms of primary and secondary sex characteristics, and ‘man’/‘woman’ to mark the gender distinction, where gender is, according to the slogan, “the social meaning of sex.”
This theme—that social hierarchies are sustained through myths of their natural basis—has prompted a tremendous amount of work on the construction of gender in particular (Delphy 1984, Scott 1986, MacKinnon 1989, Butler 1990, Wittig 1992, Warnke 2008), but also on the construction of other “naturalized” social categories such as race (Appiah 1996, Zack 2002; Warnke 2008) and in a somewhat different way, sexuality (Butler 1990; Butler 1993, Fausto-Sterling 2000). Research in history, anthropology, literature, and sociology has chronicled the various mechanisms by which gender (and other such categories) is enforced, and research in psychology and biology has further loosened the ties between body types and social roles. Having witnessed the power of naturalizing “myths,” feminists tend to be wary of any suggestion that a category is “natural” or that what's “natural” should dictate how we organize ourselves socially. However, there are several different de-naturalizing projects that are often mistaken for each other that engage different sorts of metaphysical issues.
It is important to distinguish first the construction of ideas and the construction of objects (Hacking 1999: 9–16). Let's start with ideas. On one reading, the claim that an idea or a concept is only possible within and due to a social context is utterly obvious. It would seem to be a matter of common sense that concepts are taught to us by our parents through our language; different cultures have different concepts (that go along with their different languages); and concepts evolve over time as a result of historical changes, science, technological advances, etc. Let's (albeit contentiously) call this the “ordinary view” of concepts and ideas. Even someone who believes that our scientific concepts perfectly map “nature's joints” can allow that scientists come to have the ideas and concepts they do through social-historical processes. After all, social and cultural forces (including, possibly, the practices and methods of science) may help us develop concepts that are apt or accurate, and beliefs that are true.
We may sometimes forget that what and how we think is affected by social forces because our experiences seem to be caused simply and directly by world itself. However, it does not take much prompting to recall that our culture is largely responsible for the interpretive tools we bring to the world in order to understand it. Once we've noted that our experience of the world is already an interpretation of it, we can begin to raise questions about the adequacy of our conceptual framework. Concepts help us organize phenomena; different concepts organize it in different ways. It is important, then, to ask: what phenomena are highlighted and what are eclipsed by a particular framework of concepts? What assumptions provide structure for the framework?
For example, our everyday framework for thinking about human beings is structured by the assumptions that there are two (and only two) sexes, and that every human is either a male or a female. But in fact a significant percentage of humans have a mix of male and female anatomical features. Intersexed bodies are eclipsed in our everyday framework. (Fausto-Sterling 2000) This should invite us to ask: Why? Whose interests are served, if anyone's, by the intersexed being ignored in the dominant conceptual framework? (It can't be plausibly argued that sex isn't important enough to us to make fine-grained distinctions between bodies!) Further, once we recognize the intersexed, how should we revise our conceptual framework? Should we group bodies into more than two sexes, or are there reasons instead to complicate the definitions of male and female to include everyone in just two sex categories? More generally, on what basis should we decide what categories to use? (Fausto-Sterling 2000; Butler 1990, Ch. 1) What is the proper scope of application of these categories? In asking these questions it is important to remember that an idea or conceptual framework may be inadequate without being false, e.g., a claim might be true and yet incomplete, misleading, unjustified, biased, etc. (Anderson 1995)
Saying that this or that idea is socially constructed may just be an invitation to recall the ordinary view of concepts and note the motivations behind and limitations of our current framework. Every framework will have some limits; the issue is whether the limits eclipse something that, given the (legitimate) goals of our inquiry, matters. However, sometimes a social constructionist is making a more controversial claim. The suggestion would be that something or other is “merely” a social construction, in other words, that what we are taking to be real is only a fiction, an idea that fails to capture reality. Feminists have argued, for example, that certain mental “disorders” that have been used to diagnose battered women are merely social constructions. Andrea Westlund points out how
[b]attered women's “abnormalities” have been described and redescribed within the psychiatric literature of the twentieth century, characterized as everything from hysteria to masochistic or self-defeating personality disorders (SDPD) to codependency. Moreover, such pathologies measure, classify, and define battered women's deviance not just from “normal” female behavior but also from universalized male norms of independence and self-interest. (Westlund 1999).
Such diagnoses invite us to explain domestic violence by reference to the woman's psychological state rather than the batterer's need for power and control; they also “deflect attention from the social and political aspects of domestic violence to the private neuroses to which women as a group are thought to be prone” (Westlund 1999, 1051). Westlund and others have argued that although victims of domestic violence often do suffer from psychological conditions, e.g., major depression, there is a range of gender coded mental disorders included in the Diagnostic and Statistical Manual of Mental Disorder (DSM) for which there is little, if any, good evidence. These diagnoses, it could be claimed, are merely social constructions in the sense that they are ideas used to interpret and regulate social phenomena, but do not describe anything real. Applying this to the case at hand would entail that “Self-Defeating Personality Disorder” doesn't really exist. The description of SDPD does not capture a mental disorder of the sort alleged.
So in considering the claim that something is socially constructed, we should ask first: Is it an object or an idea? If it is an idea, then we should raise a series of epistemological questions, e.g., are we justified in employing this idea as we do, and metaphysical questions, e.g., is there anything real corresponding to the idea, or is it a fiction? Social constructionists often begin by noticing that an idea is functioning socially to support an unjust institution and then consider how that idea functions within a broader framework of ideas and concepts to structure our experience: does it illegitimately or inappropriately privilege one set of phenomena over another? Does it obscure some phenomena completely? Does it create an illusion of certain kinds of things?
Of course in some contexts privileging certain phenomena is useful and even necessary: medical sciences are not “neutral” with respect to what phenomena count as significant and how they are categorized; medicine has a legitimate concern with human health and the organisms that affect human health. However, other things being equal, medicine that privileges phenomena related to men's health or the health of the wealthy would not be epistemically or politically legitimate. (Anderson 1995) Considering what is left out of a framework of categories, or what assumptions structure it can also reveal biases of many sorts.
In some cases of social construction what's at issue is the aptness of the classification, in other cases it is whether the classification captures a natural kind or a social kind. In yet further cases, the point is to reveal that classification does not describe anything real at all and, instead, is just a fiction being treated as real. In such cases, substantial work must be done to demonstrate that the idea in question is only a fiction. But that's not all, for we should also ask: How are such distortions and fictions established and maintained? Whose interests do they serve?
Now consider objects (understanding ‘objects’ in the broadest sense as virtually anything that's not an idea). There is a sense in which any artifact is a construction; but claiming that scissors or cars are social constructions would not have much point, given how mundane this claim would be. Social constructionists, on the whole, are arguing for a surprising thesis that they believe challenges our everyday view of things. It is much more surprising to say that women or Asian-Americans, homosexuals, child abusers, or refugees, are social constructions. What could this mean?
In considering the construction of objects, the first point to note is that our classificatory schemes, at least in social contexts, may do more than just map pre-existing groups of individuals; rather our attributions have the power to both establish and reinforce groupings which may eventually come to “fit” the classifications. This works in several ways. Forms of description or classification provide for kinds of intention; e.g., given the classification “cool”, we can set about to become cool, or avoid being cool, etc. But also, such classifications can function in justifying behavior; e.g., “we didn't invite him because he's not cool”, and such justifications, in turn, can reinforce the distinction between those who are cool and those who are uncool. Drawing on Ian Hacking's work, Haslanger has referred to this as “discursive” construction:
Discursive construction: something is discursively constructed just in case it is (to a significant extent) the way it is because of what is attributed to it or how it is classified. (Haslanger 1995, 99)
Admittedly, the idea here is quite vague (e.g., how much is “a significant extent”?). However, social construction in this sense is ubiquitous. Each of us is socially constructed in this sense because we are (to a significant extent) the individuals we are today as a result of what has been attributed and self-attributed to us. For example, being classified as able-bodied females from birth has profoundly affected the paths available to us in life and the sort of persons we have become.
Note, however, that to say that an entity is “discursively constructed”, is not to say that language or discourse brings a material object into existence de novo. Rather something in existence comes to have—partly as a result of having been categorized in a certain way—a set of features that qualify it as a member of a certain kind or sort. Someone's having been categorized as a female at birth (and consistently since then) has been a factor in how she has been viewed and treated; these views and treatments have, in turn, played an important causal role in her becoming gendered as a woman. For example, let us suppose for current purposes that being gendered as a woman is to occupy in one's social context a broad role associated with female reproductive capacities. It is through a process of socialization—being viewed and treated as a girl—that she learned, and eventually internalized, what the “proper” role for females is and how to mark herself as occupying it. So she learned that girls only eat so much, only play such games, only wear certain clothes. Whether or not she accepts these norms, negotiating them was the process by which she became a woman; but discourse didn't bring her into existence.
It would appear that gender (in different senses) is both an idea-construction and an object-construction. Gender is an idea-construction because the classification men/women is the contingent result of historical events and forces. As we saw above, the everyday distinction between males and females leaves out the intersexed population that might have been given its own sex/gender category. Arguably, in fact, some cultures have divided bodies into three sexual/reproductive groups. At the same time the classifications ‘woman’ and ‘man’ are what Hacking calls “interactive kinds”: gender classifications occur within a complex matrix of institutions and practices, and being classified as a woman (or not), or a man (or not), or third, fourth, fifth sex/gender or not, has a profound effect on an individual. Such classification will have a material affect on one's social position as well as effect one's experience and self-understanding. In this sense, women and men—concrete individuals—are constructed as gendered kinds of people, i.e., we are each object constructions.
There is yet a further sense in which something might be a social construction. So far we've been focusing on social causation: to say that something is socially constructed is to say that it is caused to be a certain way, and the causal process involves social factors, e.g., social forces were largely responsible for my coming to have the idea of a husband, and social forces were largely responsible for there being husbands. But often when theorists argue that something is a social construction the point is not about causation. Rather, the point is to distinguish social kinds from physical kinds. In the case of gender, the point is that gender is not a classification scheme based simply on anatomical or biological differences, but marks social differences between individuals. Gender, as opposed to sex, is not about testicles and ovaries, the penis and the uterus, but about a system of social categories (see, e.g., Haslanger 1993, Haslanger 2000b; also Wittig 1992, Delphy 1984, MacKinnon 1989).
Consider, for example, the category of landlords. To be a landlord one must be located within a broad system of social and economic relations which includes tenants, private property, and the like. It might be that all and only landlords have a mole behind their left ear. But even if this were the case, having this physical mark is not what it is to be a landlord. Similarly, one might want to draw a distinction between sex and gender, sex being an anatomical distinction based on locally salient sexual/reproductive differences, and gender being a distinction between the social/political positions of those with bodies marked as of different sexes. One could allow that the categories of sex and gender interact (so concerns with distinctions between bodies will influence social divisions and vice versa); but even to be clear how they interact, we should differentiate them. With this distinction between sex and gender in hand, it is possible that some males are women and some females are men. Because one is a female by virtue of some (variable) set of anatomical features, and one is a woman by virtue of one's position within a social and economic system, the sex/gender distinction gives us some (at least preliminary) resources for including transgendered as well as transsexual persons within our conceptual framework.
In considering this form of social construction, or we might call it social constitution, it is important to note that social kinds cannot be equated with things that have social causes. Sociobiologists claim that some social phenomena have biological causes; some feminists claim that anatomical phenomena have social causes, e.g., the gap in average height and strength differences between men and women in a particular context depends on, among other things, gender norms in that context concerning food and exercise. As Ruth Hubbard explains,
…we live in dynamic interaction with our environment. Sex differences are socially constructed because being raised as a girl or a boy produces biological as well as social differences. Society defines the sex-appropriate behavior to which each of us learns to conform, and our behavior affects our bones, muscles, sense organs, nerves, brain, lungs, circulation, everything. In this way society constructs us as biologically, as well as socially, gendered people. (Hubbard 1990, 138).
It is also significant that not all social kinds are obviously social. Sometimes it is assumed that the conditions for membership in a kind concern only or primarily biological or physical facts. Pointing out that this is wrong can have important consequences. For example, the idea that whether or not a person is White is not simply a matter of their physical features, but concerns their position in a social matrix, has been politically significant, and to many surprising. How should we construe the constructionist project of arguing that a particular kind is a social kind? What could be interesting or radical about such a project?
Suppose Sally says “I am a White woman”. What does this mean? Suppose we pose these questions to someone who is not a philosopher, someone not familiar with the academic social constructionist literature. A likely response will involve mention of her physical features: reproductive organs, skin color, etc. The gender and race constructionists will reject this response and will argue that what makes the claim apt concerns the social relations in which she stands. On this construal, the important social constructionist import in Beauvoir's claim that “one is not born but rather becomes a woman”, (de Beauvoir 1949) is not that one is caused to be feminine by social forces; rather, the important insight was that being a woman is not an anatomical matter but a social matter.
Because being a woman is a social matter, if we allow that social phenomena are highly variable across time, cultures, groups, then this also allows us to recognize that the specific details of it is to be a woman will differ depending on one's race, ethnicity, class, etc. Sally's being a woman occurs in a context in which she is also White and privileged; her actual social position will therefore be affected by multiple factors simultaneously. She learned the norms of WASP womanhood, not Black womanhood. And even if she rejected many of those norms, she benefits from the fact that they are broadly accepted.
The social constructionist's goal is often to challenge the appearance of inevitability of the category in question; as things are arranged now, there are men and women, and people of different races. But if social conditions changed substantially, there would be no men and women, and no people of different races. It would be possible, then, to do away with the conceptual frameworks that we currently use. But an important first step is to make the category visible as a social as opposed to physical category. This sometimes requires a rather radical change in our thinking.
Considerable amount of recent work has focused on the metaphysics of social kinds and social properties more generally (Frye 2011; Mikkola 2006; Mikkola 2011; Stoljar 2011; Sveinsdóttir 2011; Witt 2011; Witt forthcoming).
The previous section outlined ways in which feminists have problematized the idea that particular categories are “natural.” Similarly, feminists have problematized the idea that particular categories are intrinsic or non-relational. The critical charge, stated very generally, is that dominant frameworks for representing the world, especially the social world, purport to classify things on the basis of intrinsic properties when in fact the classifications are crucially dependent on relational properties.
There are two forms of this critique, and correspondingly, two kinds of response. On the first form, the charge is that dominant frameworks misrepresent their subject matter by ignoring important relational aspects of what they purport to be talking about. For example, feminists have long charged that philosophical conceptions of the self, e.g., the conception of the independent rational self-regulator, are framed in atomistic terms, ignoring our inevitable and valuable dependence on each other. In response, feminists have urged us to recognize and revalue the complexity of subjectivity not addressed in models of rational agency, and to incorporate in our understanding of the self facts about the realities of human dependence and interdependence for which women have been primarily responsible. (Meyers 1997; Meyers 1997; Kittay 1999)
The second form of such critique also alleges that the dominant frameworks misrepresent their subject matter by obscuring what's relational. However, the goal is not to capture and revalue the background relations as in the first form of this critique, but to challenge them. In the cases in question, the charge is that although the system of classification appears to be sorting individuals on the basis of intrinsic properties, in fact there are invidious relations that are being masked by these appearances. (Flax 1986, 199–202) Just as there are reasons why dominant frameworks construct myths about what's natural to justify subordinating practices, likewise they construct myths about what's intrinsic.
Consider again Beauvoir's claim that “He is the Subject, he is the Absolute—she is the Other.” Part of what is at stake in Beauvoir's conception of women as Other is the idea that our conceptions of gender and of the self are implicitly relational, e.g., although it may seem that we can define what it is to be a woman without reference to men, in fact we cannot (Wittig 1992; MacKinnon 1989; Haslanger 1993). For Beauvoir, very roughly, women are those positioned as “Absolute Other”, i.e., as “Other” in relation to a group counting as “Subject” where the relation between these two groups never reverses so the “Other” becomes “Subject”. (Beauvoir 1949, xxii, also xv–xxxiv) So, to be a woman is to stand in a complex set of social (and hierarchical) relations to men (mutatis mutandis for men). And to be a Subject is to stand in a complex set of social relations to some group of Others. For a nuanced recent account of Beauvoir's view of subjectification and objectification's role in that see Bauer 2011.
These particular claims of Beauvoir's are, of course, controversial and would need further argument to be made plausible; but the claims are less important than the general idea that relations, especially social relations, are sometimes obscured by our ordinary frameworks for thinking of things. This is of special interest to feminists (and antiracists) for reasons linked to those we have for questioning the representation of a category as “natural.” Begin with a background assumption that social life cannot help but accommodate what's “natural.” We then can contribute to some category's appearing “natural” by supposing that the basis for membership in the category is intrinsic (thus obscuring the social relations that are the real basis for membership). In this context, pressure to change or abolish the category seems unreasonable.
These critiques raised invite us to ask: how should we re-conceptualize the self and other parts of our social ontology? What is the relation between intrinsicness and naturalness? On what basis can we claim that one framework is “masking” another?
In the previous section we outlined a project of “uncovering” relations in apparently non-relational frameworks. In the sort of cases we had in mind what's “uncovered” are concrete social relations, e.g., relations of sexual subordination. However, Beauvoir's claims about Subject and Other point to additional insights not yet explored.
In saying that “He is the Subject, he is the Absolute—She is the Other,” part of Beauvoir's point is that although it may appear that our distinction between subjects and non-subjects is a purely descriptive demarcation of a specific category of substances (selves), in fact, the distinction in use is normative and non-substantive. Begin with the issue of substances: one of the traditional characteristics of substances is that substances do not have opposites, i.e., there is no opposite of horse (non-horse does not count as an opposite). This is in contrast to many qualities: long/short, inside/outside, loud/quiet. One way of explicating Beauvoir's suggestion is that once we look at the conditions for subjecthood, we see that there is an opposite to being a subject: subjects are, for example, free and autonomous persons, and the opposite of a free and autonomous person is someone unfree, in her terms, someone condemned to immanence. Moreover, it is not only the case that being a subject has an opposite, but that the opposition in question carries normative weight—so much so that the devalued side of the opposition (the Other) is denied reality in its own terms: what it is to be Other just is to be opposite to the Subject.
Again the feminist project is one of unmasking certain ordinary assumptions about our classifications of things: the category of Subject is not—ontologically speaking—what it may seem. More specifically, categories that appear to be descriptive may in fact be functioning normatively; and categories that appear to be substantive, may in fact be functioning as one end of a qualitative spectrum. Although Beauvoir's example has us focus on the notion of a subject or self; feminists have explored the same form of argument with other notions, notably, sex, gender, and race.
There are two significant consequences of this sort of analysis. First, with substances, it is standardly supposed that you are a member of the kind or not and there is no middle ground: you are a horse or you aren't. (Because there is no opposite or contrary to horse, the only negative option a contradictory.) Again we can contrast this with other opposites: there is a middle ground between long/short, inside/outside, loud/quiet; and some things avoid the opposition altogether, e.g., my coffee mug is neither loud nor quiet. Casting a category as substantial, then, limits the available categories for classification. For example, suppose we understand ‘male’ substantively. If males are a substance kind, then everything is either male or not-male, with no middle-ground. But if, in practice, ‘not-male’ actually functions as a way of picking out females, then it would seem that everything must be either male or female, and there can be no space for genuine categories of people who are intersexed, or other-sexed, or for refusing to sex people at all. One strategy, then, for undermining the idea that a category is substantival is to highlight the multiplicity of individuals and categories “in between” the primary category and its implicit opposite. Category proliferation—the generation of a continuum or genuinely “mixed” categories—can loosen the grip of substantival assumptions. (Butler 1987; Lugones 1994; Haraway 1988; Zack 1995)
Second, in the case of substance kinds, those things that are not in the kind don't themselves form a kind of their own. They are what's “left over.” The class of all things that are not-horses includes computers, stars, dust, basketballs, people, etc. So, if we elide ‘not man’ and ‘woman’, then women are not read as a kind. As Marilyn Frye puts it,
When woman is defined as not-man, she is cast into the infinite undifferentiated plenum…[this partly explains why] many men can so naturally speak in parallel constructions of their cars and their women, and say things like, “It's my house, my wife, and my money, and the government can't tell me what to do about any of it.” It also illuminates the fact that women are so easily associated with disorder, chaos, irrationality, and impurity….There are no categories in not-man; it is a buzzing booming confusion. (Frye 1996, 1000).
Frye's strategy is not to challenge the substantive status of the man-kind by proliferation, but to challenge its hegemony in the space of persons. So she proposes the construction of a woman-kind that is defined in its own terms, not simply by opposition to men. (Also, Schor and Weed 1994) She argues, among other things, that this will require a recognition of real differences not only between men and women, but among women.
This barely scratches the surface of feminist discussion of the dualisms that guide our thinking, both in philosophy and common sense. These include mind/body, reason/emotion (Jaggar 1989, Scheman 1993; Rooney 1993; Rooney 1994; Campbell 1998), nature/culture (Ortner 1972; Butler 1993), freedom/necessity (Mackenzie and Stoljar 2000, Hirschmann 2003, Holroyd 2011), agent/patient (Meyers 2004a; Meyers 2004b). However, it does, hopefully, provide some introduction to the feminist issues that arise in thinking about classification, substances, dichotomy, and the potential political import of ontology and the prime importance of the question of value ladenness and attention to ideology in feminist theorizing. (Alcoff 2011, Haslanger 2011, Janack 2011).
There are a couple of over-arching questions that are worth raising now with a (brief) overview in place. The outline offered here suggests that in a number of different ways feminist are keen to “unmask” or “uncover” or “demythologize” certain aspects of our ordinary (and philosophical) thinking. Where ordinarily we take ourselves to be dealing with an ontology of substances, natural things, intrinsic properties, we're in fact dealing with an ontology of social things, relations, and non-substantive (and often normative) kinds. But what is the relationship between these sorts of “unmasking” projects and projects that count as part of “mainstream” philosophy, or more specifically, “mainstream” metaphysics? So much analytic metaphysics consists in “reconstructions” of our ordinary concepts; a significant amount of it is unabashedly “revisionary.” So along those lines, feminist metaphysics would seem to fit right in. Clearly feminist metaphysics differs from the mainstream in its subject matter and background assumptions, in particular in its focus on the possible value ladenness of our concepts, categories and theories, and its attention to the potential harms of justificatory ideologies. But are there more substantial differences? Is feminist metaphysics just “mainstream” metaphysics directed at different issues, or is there a deep difference? And if there is a deep difference, what exactly is it?
- Alcoff, Linda Martín. 2006. Visible Identities. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- –––. 2011. “Experience and Knowledge: The Case of Sexual Abuse Memories”. In Witt 2011a, 209–2223.
- Anderson, Elizabeth. 1995. “Knowledge, Human Interests, and Objectivity in Feminist Epistemology.” Philosophical Topics, 23 (2) (Fall): 27–58.
- Appiah, K. A. 1996. “Race, Culture, Identity: Misunderstood Connections.” In K. A. Appiah and A. Gutmann, ed., Color Conscious: The Political Morality of Race. Princeton: Princeton University Press, pp. 30–105.
- Bauer, Nancy. 2011. “Beauvoir on the Allure of Self-Objectification”. In Witt 2011a, 117–129.
- de Beauvoir, Simone. 1949. The Second Sex, trans. H. M. Parshley. New York: Vintage Books, 1989. (All page references are to the 1989 edition.).
- Bordo, Susan. 1987. The Flight to Objectivity: Essays on Cartesianism and Culture. Albany: SUNY Press.
- –––. 1993. Unbearable Weight: Feminism, Western Culture and the Body. Berkeley: University of California Press.
- Butler, Judith P. 1987. “Variations on Sex and Gender.” In Feminism as Critique, ed., S. Benhabib and D. Cornell. Minneapolis: Univ. of Minnesota Press, pp. 128–142.
- –––. 1990. Gender Trouble: Feminism and the Subversion of Identity: New York, Routledge.
- –––. 1993. Bodies That Matter: On the Discursive Limits of Sex: New York, Routledge.
- Campbell, Sue. 1998. Interpreting the Personal: Expression and the Formation of Feelings: Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
- Delphy, Christine. 1984. Close to Home: A Materialist Analysis of Women's Oppression. Amherst, MA: University of Massachusetts Press.
- Fausto-Sterling, A. 2000. Sexing the Body: Gender Politics and the Construction of Sexuality: New York, Basic Books.
- Flax, Jane. 1986. “Gender as a Problem: In and For Feminist Theory.” American Studies/Amerika Studien, 31 (2) (June): 193–213.
- Fraser, Nancy and Linda Nicholson. 1990. “Social Criticism without Philosophy: An Encounter Between Feminism and Post-modernism.” in Feminism/Postmodernism, ed., L. Nicholson. New York: Routledge, pp. 19–38.
- Frayer, David L. and Milford H. Wolpoff. 1985. “Sexual Dimorphism.” Annual Review of Anthropology 14: 429–473.
- Frye, Marilyn. 1983. The Politics of Reality: Essays in Feminist Theory. New York: The Crossing Press.
- –––. 1996. “The Necessity of Differences: Constructing a Positive Category of Women.” Signs, 21 (4) (Summer): 991–1010.
- –––. 2011. “Metaphors of Being a Φ”. In Witt 2011a, 85–95.
- Gatens, Moira. 1996. Imaginary Bodies. New York: Routledge, 1996.
- Hacking, Ian. 1986. “Making Up People.” in Reconstructing Individualism, ed., M. Heller et al. Stanford: Stanford Univ. Press.
- –––. 1999. The Social Construction of What? Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
- Haraway, Donna. 1988. “Situated Knowledges: The Science Question in Feminism and the Privilege of Partial Perspective.” Feminist Studies, 14 (3) (Fall): 575–600.
- –––. 1989. “Introduction.” in her Primate Visions. New York: Routledge, 1989, pp. 1–15.
- –––. 1991. “A Cyborg Manifesto: Science, Technology and Socialist Feminism in the Late Twentieth Century.” in her Simians, Cyborgs and Women: The Reinvention of Nature. New York: Routledge, pp. 149–181.
- Haslanger, Sally. 1993. “On Being Objective and Being Objectified.” in A Mind of One's Own, ed., L. Antony and C. Witt. Boulder, CO: Westview, pp. 85–125.
- –––. 1995. “Ontology and Social Construction.” Philosophical Topics, 23 (2) (Fall): 95–125.
- –––. 2000a. “Feminism and Metaphysics: Negotiating the Natural.” in The Cambridge Companion to Feminism in Philosophy, ed., M. Fricker and J. Hornsby. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 107–126.
- –––. 2000b. “Gender and Race: (What) Are They? (What) Do We Want Them To Be?” Noûs, 34 (1): 31–55.
- –––. 2000c. “Feminism and Metaphysics: Unmasking Hidden Ontologies,” APA Newsletter on Feminism and Philosophy, 99 (2) (Spring): 192–196.
- –––. 2003. “Social Construction: The ”Debunking“ Project,” in F. Schmitt, Socializing Metaphysics: The Nature of Social Reality. Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield, pp. 301–325.
- –––. 2005. “Social Construction: Who? What? Where? How?” in Theorizing Feminisms, ed., Elizabeth Hackett and Sally Haslanger. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 16–23.
- –––. 2011. “Ideology, Generics, and Common Ground”. In Witt 2011a, 179–207.
- Heinämaa, Sara. 2011. “A Phenomenology of Sexual Difference: Types, Styles, and Persons;. In Witt 2011a, 131–155.
- Hirschmann, Nancy J. 2003. The Subject of Liberty: Toward a Feminist Theory of Freedom. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
- Holroyd, Jules. 2011. “The Metaphysics of Relational Autonomy”. In Witt 2011a, 99–115.
- hooks, bell. 1981. Ain't I A Woman: Black Women and Feminism. Boston: South End Press.
- Hubbard, Ruth. 1990. The Politics of Women's Biology. New Brunswick: Rutgers University Press.
- Irigaray, L. 1985. The Sex Which Is Not One, trans C. Porter and C. Burke. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
- Jaggar, A. M. 1989. “Love and Knowledge: Emotion in Feminist Epistemology”, in Women, Knowledge, and Reality Explorations in Feminist Philosophy, eds. Ann Garry and Marilyn Pearsall Unwin Hyman: Boston, pp. 129–155.
- Janack, Marianne. 2011. “The Politics and Metaphysics of Experience”. In Witt 2011a, 159–178.
- Kittay, Eva. 1999. Love's Labor: Essays on Women, Equality and Dependency. New York: Routledge.
- Lindemann Nelson, Hilde. 2001. Damaged Identities, Narrative Repair. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
- Lloyd, Genevieve. 1984. The Man of Reason: “Male” and “Female” in Western Philosophy. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
- Lugones, Maria. 1994. “Purity, Impurity and Separation.” Signs, 19 (2): 458–79.
- MacKenzie, C. and Natalie Stoljar. 2000. Relational Autonomy: Feminist Perspectives on Autonomy, Agency an the Social Self. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- MacKinnon, Catharine. 1989. Toward a Feminist Theory of the State. Cambridge, Mass: Harvard.
- Meyers, Diana, ed. 1997. Feminists Rethink the Self. Boulder, CO: Westview Press.
- –––. 2004a. “Feminist Perspectives on the Self.” The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2004 Edition), Edward N. Zalta, (ed.), URL = <http://plato.stanford.edu/archives/spr2004/entries/feminism-self/>.
- –––. 2004b. Gender in the Mirror: Cultural Imagery and Women's Agency. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Mikkola, Mari. 2006. “Elizabeth Spelman, Gender Realism, and Women”. Hypatia 21: 79–96.
- –––. 2011. “Ontological Commitments, Sex and Gender”. In Witt 2011a, 67–83.
- Ortner, S. B. 1972. “Is Female to Male as Nature Is to Culture?” Feminist Studies, 1 (2): 5–31.
- Papadaki, Evangelia (Lina), "Feminist Perspectives on Objectification", The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2011 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <http://plato.stanford.edu/archives/fall2011/entries/feminism-objectification>.
- Rooney, P. 1993. “Feminist-Pragmatist Revisionings of Reason, Knowledge, and Philosophy”. Hypatia, 8 (2): 15–37.
- –––. 1994. “Recent Work in Feminist Discussions of Reason”. American Philosophical Quarterly 31: 1–21.
- Scheman, Naomi. 1993. Engenderings: Constructions of Knowledge, Authority, and Privilege. New York: Routledge.
- Schiebinger, Linda, ed. 2000. Feminism and the Body. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Schor, Naomi and Elizabeth Weed, ed. 1994. The Essential Difference. Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
- Scott, Joan. 1986. “Gender: A Useful Category of Historical Analysis.” American Historical Review 9: 1053–75.
- Spelman, Elizabeth V. 1988. Inessential Woman: Problems of Exclusion in Feminist Thought. Boston: Beacon Press.
- Stoljar, Natalie. 1995. “Essence, Identity and the Concept of Woman.” Philosophical Topics, 23 (2) (Fall): 261–294.
- –––. 2011. “Different Women: Gender and the Realism-Nominalism Debate”. In Witt 2011a, 27–46.
- Sveinsdóttir, Ásta Kristjana. 2011. “The Metaphysics of Sex and Gender”. In Witt 2011a, 47–65.
- Wendell, Susan. 1996. The Rejected Body: Feminist Philosophical Reflections on Disability. New York: Routledge.
- Warnke, Georgia. 2008. After Identity: Rethinking Race, Sex, and Gender. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press.
- Warren, Karen. 1997. Ecofeminism: Women, Culture, Nature. Indianapolis: Indiana University Press.
- Westlund, Andrea. 1999. “Pre-Modern and Modern Power: Foucault and the Case of Domestic Violence.” Signs, 24 (4) (Summer): 1045–1066
- Witt, Charlotte. 1993. “Feminist Metaphysics.” in A Mind of One's Own, ed., L. Antony and C. Witt. Boulder, CO: Westview, pp. 273–288.
- –––. 1995. “Anti-Essentialism in Feminist Theory.” Philosophical Topics, 23 (2) (Fall): 321–344.
- –––, ed. 2011a. Feminist Metaphysics. Springer.
- –––. 2011b. “What is Gender Essentialism?” In Witt 2011a, 11–25.
- –––. Forthcoming. The Metaphysics of Gender. Oxford, UK: Oxford University Press.
- Wittig, Monique. 1992. The Straight Mind. Boston: Beacon Press.
- Young, Iris M. 1990. Throwing Like a Girl and Other Essays in Feminist Philosophy and Social Theory: Indianapolis: Indiana University Press.
- –––. 1994. “Gender as Seriality: Thinking about Women as a Social Collective.” Signs, 19 (3) (Spring): 733–734.
- Zack, Naomi. 1995. “Life After Race.” in American Mixed Race, ed., N. Zack. Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield Pub.
- –––. 2002. Philosophy of Science and Race. New York: Routledge.
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
[Please contact the author with suggestions.]
feminism, approaches to: continental philosophy | feminism, approaches to: intersections between analytic and continental philosophy | feminism, approaches to: intersections between pragmatist and continental philosophy | feminism, approaches to: pragmatism | feminist (interventions): aesthetics | feminist (interventions): bioethics | feminist (interventions): environmental philosophy | feminist (interventions): epistemology and philosophy of science | feminist (interventions): ethics | feminist (interventions): history of philosophy | feminist (interventions): moral psychology | feminist (interventions): philosophy of biology | feminist (interventions): philosophy of language | feminist (interventions): philosophy of law | feminist (interventions): philosophy of religion | feminist (topics) | feminist (topics): perspectives on class and work | feminist (topics): perspectives on objectification | feminist (topics): perspectives on power | feminist (topics): perspectives on reproduction and the family | feminist (topics): perspectives on science | feminist (topics): perspectives on sex and gender | feminist (topics): perspectives on sex markets | feminist (topics): perspectives on sexuality | feminist (topics): perspectives on the body | feminist (topics): perspectives on the self
Thanks to Elizabeth Hackett. Some sections of this entry are drawn from Haslanger (1992).