# Frege's Theorem and Foundations for Arithmetic

*First published Wed Jun 10, 1998; substantive revision Fri Jul 5, 2013*

Over the course of his life, Gottlob Frege formulated two logical
systems in his attempts to define certain basic concepts of
mathematics and to derive certain mathematical laws from the laws of
logic. In his book of 1879, *Begriffsschrift: eine der
arithmetischen nachgebildete Formelsprache des reinen Denkens*, he
developed a second-order predicate calculus and used it both to define
interesting mathematical concepts and to state and prove
mathematically interesting propositions. However, in his two-volume work
of 1893/1903, *Grundgesetze der Arithmetik*, Frege added (as an
axiom) what he thought was a logical proposition (Basic Law V) and
tried to derive the fundamental axioms and theorems of number theory
from the resulting system. Unfortunately, not only did Basic Law V
fail to be a logical proposition, but the resulting system proved to
be inconsistent, for it was subject to Russell's Paradox.

Until recently, the inconsistency in Frege's *Grundgesetze* has
overshadowed a deep theoretical accomplishment that can be extracted
from his work. The *Grundgesetze* contains all the essential
steps of a valid proof (in second-order logic) of the fundamental
propositions of arithmetic from a single consistent principle. This
consistent principle, known in the literature as “Hume's
Principle”, asserts that for any concepts *F*
and *G*, the number of
*F*-things is equal to the number *G*-things if and only
if there is a one-to-one correspondence between the *F*-things
and the *G*-things. Though Frege derived Hume's Principle from
Basic Law V in the *Grundgesetze*, the subsequent derivations
of the fundamental propositions of arithmetic from Hume's Principle do
not essentially require Basic Law V. So by setting aside the
problematic Basic Law V and the derivation of Hume's Principle, one
can focus on Frege's derivations of the basic propositions of
arithmetic using Hume's Principle as an axiom. His theoretical
accomplishment then becomes clear: his work shows us how to prove, as
theorems, the Dedekind/Peano axioms for number theory from Hume's
Principle in second-order logic. This achievement, which involves
some remarkably subtle chains of definitions and logical reasoning,
has become known as *Frege's Theorem*.

The principal goal of this entry is to present Frege's Theorem in the
most logically perspicuous manner, *without* using Frege's own
notation. Of course, Frege's own notation is fascinating and
interesting in its own right, and one must come to grips with that
notation when studying Frege's original work. But one doesn't have to
understand Frege's notation to understand Frege's Theorem, and so we
will, for the most part, put aside Frege's own notation and the many
interpretative issues that arise in connection with it. We strive to
present Frege's Theorem by representing the ideas and claims involved
in the proof in clear and well-established modern logical
notation. With a clear understanding of what Frege accomplished, one
will be better prepared to understand Frege's own notation and
derivations, as one reads Frege's original work (whether in German or
in translation). Moreover, our efforts below should to prepare the
reader to understand a number of scholarly books and articles in the
secondary literature on Frege's work, e.g., Wright 1983, Boolos 1990,
and Heck 1993, 2011, and 2012.

To accomplish these goals, we presuppose only a familiarity with the
first-order predicate calculus. We show how to extend this language
and logic to the second-order predicate calculus, and show how to
represent the ideas and claims involved in Frege's Theorem in this
calculus. These ideas and claims all appear in Frege 1893/1903, which
we refer to as **Gg I**/**II**. But we
sometimes also cite to his book of 1879 and his book 1884 (*Die
Grundlagen der Arithmetik*), referring to these works
as **Begr** and **Gl**, respectively.

- 1. The Second-Order Predicate Calculus and Theory of Concepts
- 2. Frege's Theory of Extensions: Basic Law V
- 3. Frege's Analysis of Cardinal Numbers
- 4. Frege's Analysis of Predecessor, Ancestrals, and the Natural Numbers
- 5. Frege's Theorem
- 6. Philosophical Questions Surrounding Frege's Theorem
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. The Second-Order Predicate Calculus and Theory of Concepts

In this section, we describe the language and logic of the second-order predicate calculus. We then extend this calculus with the classical comprehension principle for concepts and we introduce and explain λ-notation, which allows one to turn open formulas into complex names of concepts. Although Frege's own logic is rather different from the modern second-order predicate calculus, the latter's comprehension principle for concepts and λ-notation provide us with a logically perspicuous way of representing Frege's Theorem. We shall sometimes remark on the differences between the calculus presented below and the calculus that Frege developed, but such remarks are not intended to be a scholarly guide to the many subtleties involved in understanding Frege's original works.

### 1.1 The Language

The language of the second-order predicate calculus starts with
the following lists of *simple terms*:

- object names:
*a*,*b*, … - object variables:
*x*,*y*, … *n*-place relation names:*P*,^{n}*Q*, … (^{n}*n*≥ 1)*n*-place relation variables:*F*,^{n}*G*, … (^{n}*n*≥ 1)

The object names and variables denote, or take values in, a domain
of *objects* and the *n*-place relation names and variables
denote, or take values in, a domain of *n*-*place relations*.
Objects and relations are to be regarded as mutually exclusive
domains: no object is a relation and no relation is an object.
When giving examples of *n*-place relation names or variables for
*n*≥2, we often write *R*,*S*,… instead of
writing *P*^{2},*Q*^{2},….

From these simple terms, one can define the *formulas* of
the language as follows:

- If Π is any
*n*-place relation term and ν_{1},…,ν_{n}are any object terms (*n*≥ 1), then Πν_{1},…,ν_{n}is an (atomic) formula. - If φ, ψ are any formulas, then ¬φ and (φ→ψ) are (molecular) formulas. (We drop the parenthesis around (φ→ψ) when there is no potential for ambiguity.)
- Where φ is any formula and α any variable, then ∀αφ is a (quantified) formula.

So, for example, *Pa*, *Rxy*, etc., are atomic formulas
and these assert, respectively, that object *a* exemplifies the
1-place relation *P* and that *x* and *y* stand in the
relation *R*. The formulas ¬*Pa* and *Pa →
Rxy* are molecular formulas, and these assert, respectively, that
it is *not* the case that *a* exemplifies *P*, and
that *if* *a* exemplifies *P* *then* *x*
and *y* stand in the relation *R*. Finally, here are some
examples of quantified formulas:

∀ xRxaEvery xis such thatxstands in the relationRtoa.∀ x∀y(Px→Qy)For all x, for ally, ifPxthenQy∀ F FaEvery Fis such thatafalls underF∀ F(Fx→Fy)For all F, ifFxthenFy

The language we defined above is *second-order* because the
last clause in the definition of the formulas sanctions both
quantified formulas of the form ∀*x*φ and of the form
∀*F*φ. In what follows, we employ the standard
definitions of the following formulas:

- φ & ψ =
_{df}¬(φ → ¬ψ) - φ ∨ ψ =
_{df}¬φ → ψ - φ ≡ ψ =
_{df}(φ→ψ) & (ψ→φ) - ∃αφ =
_{df}¬∀α¬φ

The first of the above defines the conjunction φ *and*
ψ; the second defines the disjunction φ *or* ψ; the
third defines the biconditional φ *if and only if* ψ
(which we often abbreviate as *iff*); and the last defines the
existentially quantified formula *there is an* α *such
that* φ. It should be noted here that instead of using a linear
string of symbols to express molecular and quantified formulas, Frege
developed a two-dimensional notation for such formulas. Since we won't
be using Frege's notation for complex formulas in what follows, we
need not spend time describing it
here.^{[1]}

But even if we put aside Frege's notation for complex formulas, it
is important to point out that Frege didn't use atomic formulas of the
form *Px*, *Rxy*, etc. as we have done. For one thing,
instead of including *n*-place relation names and variables among
his primitive terms, he instead included primitive function names and
variables such as
ƒ, *g*, *h*, …
and used them to signify *functions*. That is, instead of
distinguishing objects and *relations*, Frege distinguished
objects from *functions*. Though some developments of the modern
predicate calculus include function terms among the simple terms of
the language, we have not included them because we shall not need them
in the development of Frege's Theorem.

It is also important to point out that Frege used functional
application ‘ƒ(*x*)’ to form complex names in
his language and used these names to represent natural language
statements. To see how, note that Frege would use the expression
‘ƒ(*x*)’ to denote the value of the function
ƒ for the argument *x*. Since he also recognized two
special objects he called *truth-values* (The True and The
False), he defined a *concept* to be any function that always
maps its arguments to truth-values. For example, whereas
‘*x*^{2} +3’ and
‘father-of *x*’ signify ordinary functions, the
expressions ‘*x* is happy’ (which we might
represent as ‘*Hx*’) and ‘*x* >
5’ signify concepts. The former signifies a concept which maps
any object that is happy to The True and all other objects to The
False; the latter signifies a concept that maps any object that is
greater than 5 to The True and all other objects to The False. In
this way, ordinary language predications like ‘*b* is
happy’ and ‘4 is greater than 5’, once represented
in Frege's language as ‘*Hb*’ and ‘*4*
> 5’, become *names* of truth-values.

For the purposes of understanding Frege's Theorem, we can think of
our 1-place relation terms as denoting, or ranging over, Fregean
concepts. Once we do this, we can take the formula
‘*Hb*’ to mean that *b* *falls under* the
concept *being happy*. But for the purposes of understanding
Frege's Theorem, it is not necessary to suppose, with Frege, that
concepts like *being happy* are functions from objects to truth
values. So, in what follows, one should remember that whereas we
can interpret the atomic formula *Fx* to mean either that *x*
*exemplifies* the 1-place relation (i.e., property) *F* or
that *x* falls under the concept *F*, Frege would understand
such formulas as instances of functional application. Nevertheless,
we'll henceforth call 1-place relations *concepts*. For all
practical purposes then, we may use the symbols
*F*,*G*, … as variables ranging
over concepts and though we sometimes write
‘*F*(*x*)’ instead of
‘*Fx*’ for perspicuity in parsing an expression,
we should still think of this as a predication.

Frege also supposed that when a *binary* function ƒ (i.e., a
function of two arguments) always maps the arguments *x*
and *y* to a truth value, ƒ is a *relation*. So it
should be remembered that when we use the expression
‘*Rxy*’ (or sometimes
‘*R*(*x*,*y*)’) to assert that the
objects *x* and *y* stand in the relation *R*, Frege
would say that *R* maps the pair of objects *x*
and *y* (in that order) to The True. But again, this Fregean
interpretation is not required for understanding Frege's Theorem. In
what follows, we shall sometimes write the symbol that denotes a
mathematical relation in the usual ‘infix’ notation; for
example, ‘>’ denotes the greater-than relation in the
expression ‘*x* > *y*’.

Finally, it is important to mention that one can add the following
clause to the definition of the *formulas* of our second-order
language so as to include formulas that express identity claims:

- If ν
_{1}and ν_{2}are any object terms, ν_{1}= ν_{2}is a formula.

Thus, formulas such as ‘*x* = *y*’ are
part of the second-order predicate calculus with identity. Frege,
too, had primitive identity statements; for him, identity is a binary
function that maps a pair of objects to The True whenever those
objects are the same object. So whereas we shall suppose that
statements like ‘2^{2} = 4’ are simply true
assertions and statements like ‘2^{2} = 3’ are
simply false ones, Frege took ‘2^{2} = 4’ to be a
name of The True and took ‘2^{2} = 3’ to be a name
of The False. The statement form ‘ƒ(*x*)
= *y*’ plays an important role in Frege's axioms and
definitions, but we shall not need to assert claims of this form in
order to derive Frege's Theorem. Instead, we shall assume (a) that
identity is simply a 2-place relation and (b) that a unary function
ƒ is really a relation *R* that has the following
property: *Rxy* & *Rxz* → *y=z* (i.e., that
functions are relations that always relate their first argument to a
at most one second argument). We may call such
relations *functional relations*. In other words, when Frege
asserts ƒ(*x*)=*y*, we may represent this as asserting
that ƒ is a functional relation *R* such that *Rxy*.
This generalizes to *n*-place relations for *n*≥2. For
example, where + is the binary addition function of arithmetic, we may
represent the arithmetic statement 2+3=5 in our language as a claim of
the form +(2,3,5), where + is taken to be a
3-place functional relation that obeys the condition:
+(*x*,*y*,*z*) & +(*x*,*y*,*w*)
→ *z*=*w*.

### 1.2 The Logic

The basic axioms and rules of inference governing statements in our
second-order language are similar to those of the first-order
predicate calculus with identity, though they've been extended to
apply to claims involving universal quantifiers binding relation
variables. Where φ, ψ, and χ are any formulas, α
any variable and τ any term of the same type as α (i.e.,
both are object terms or both are *n*-place relation terms), then
the following are the basic axioms and rules of second-order
logic:

The axioms for propositional logic. E.g.,

φ → (ψ → φ)

(φ → (ψ → χ)) → (φ → ψ) → (φ → χ)

(¬φ → ¬ψ) → ((¬φ → ψ) → φ)Universal Instantiation: ∀αφ → φ(τ/α), where φ(τ/α) is the result of uniformly substituting τ for the free occurrences of α in φ and τ is substitutable for α (i.e., no variable free in τ becomes bound by any quantifier in φ(τ/α)). E.g., where ‘

*a*’ is any object term and ‘*P*’ is any 1-place relation term,

∀*xPx*→*Pa*

∀*FFa*→*Pa*

(The corresponding principle, Existential Introduction, for the existential quantifier, i.e., φ(τ/α) → ∃αφ, is derivable.)Quantifier Distribution:

∀α(φ → ψ) → (φ → ∀αψ), where α is any variable that isn't free in φLaws of Identity:

*x*=*x*

*x*=*y*→ (φ → φ′), where φ′ is the result of substituting one or more occurrences of*y*for*x*in φ.- Modus Ponens (MP): from φ and φ→ψ, we may infer ψ.
- Rule of Generalization (GEN): from φ, we may infer ∀αφ.

In what follows, we shall assume familiarity with the above axioms
and rules as we derive Frege's Theorem. As noted, these are
essentially the same as the axioms for the first-order predicate
calculus, except for the addition of laws for the second-order
quantifiers ∀*F* and ∃*F* that correspond
to the laws governing the first-order quantifiers ∀*x*
and ∃*x*.

Some of the above laws are found explicitly in **Gg I**, though
expressed in Frege's notation. For example, in **Gg I**,
§47, we find Frege's versions of the following:

I. φ → (ψ → φ) IIa. ∀ xPx→PaIIb. ∀ FFx→PxIII. x=y→ ∀F(Fx→Fy)

These are are first introduced, however, in **Gg I**,
§§18, 20, 25, and 20, respectively.

Though Frege essentially had a second-order logic in **Gg**, his
rules of inference don't look as familiar, or as simple, as MP and
GEN. The reason is that Frege's rules of inference govern not only his
graphical notation for molecular and quantified formulas, but also his
special purpose symbols, such as certain lowercase letters used as
placeholders, certain Gothic letters and letters used as bound
variables, and various other signs of his system we have not yet
mentioned. Since Frege's notation for rules of inference will play no
role in the discussion that follows, we shall again simplify our task
by abstaining from describing it further.

### 1.3 The Theory of Concepts

The modern second-order predicate calculus includes
a *comprehension* principle that effectively guarantees that
there exists an *n*-place relation corresponding to every open formula with
*n* free object
variables *x*_{1},…,*x _{n}*. We
introduce this principle by considering the following 1-place case:

Comprehension Principle for Concepts:

∃G∀x(Gx≡ φ),

where φ is any formula which has no freeGs.

Similarly the following is a Comprehension Principle for 2-place Relations:

Comprehension Principle for 2-place Relations:

∃R∀x∀y(Rxy≡ φ),

where φ is any formula withxandyfree and which has no freeRs.

Although Frege didn't explicitly formulate these comprehension
principles, they are derivable in his system and constitute very
important generalizations within his system that reveal its underlying
theory of concepts and relations. We can see these principles at work
by formulating the following instance of comprehension, where
‘*Ox*’ asserts that *x is odd*:

∃G∀x(Gx≡ (Ox&x> 5))

This asserts: there exists a concept *G* such that for every
object *x*, *x* falls under *G* if and only if
*x* is odd and greater than 5. If our second-order language
were extended to include the primitive predicates
‘*O*’ and ‘>’ and the primitive object term
‘5’, then the above instance of the Comprehension
Principle for Concepts would be an axiom (and hence, theorem) of
second-order logic.

Similarly, the following is an instance of the Comprehension Principle for Relations:

∃R∀x∀y(Rxy≡ (Ox&x> y))

This asserts the existence of a relation that objects *x* and
*y* bear to one another just in case the complex condition
*Ox* & *x* > *y* holds.

Logicians nowadays typically distinguish the open formula φ in
which the variable *x* is free from the corresponding name of a
concept. For example, they use the notation
[λ*x* *Ox* & *x* > 5] as the name
of the complex concept *being an x such that x is odd and x is
greater than* 5 (or, more naturally, ‘being odd and greater
than 5’). The term-forming operator λ*x* (which we
read as ‘being an *x* such that’) combines with a
formula φ in which *x* is free to produce
[λ*x* φ]. The λ-expression is a name of the
concept expressed by the formula φ. In what follows, the scope of the
variable-binding operator λ*x* in [λ*x* φ]
applies to the entire formula φ, no matter how complex, so that
instead of writing, for example, [λ*x* (*Ox* &
*x* > 5)], we shall simply write:
[λ*x* *Ox* &
*x* > 2].

This notation can be extended for relations. The expression:

[λxyOx&x>y]

names the 2-place relation *being an x and y such that x is odd
and x is greater than y*.

It is important to emphasize that Frege didn't use
λ-notation. By contrast, he thought that predicative
expressions such as ‘( ) is happy’ are incomplete
expressions and that the concepts they denoted were
*unsaturated*. We need not discuss Frege's reasons for this in
this entry, though interested readers may consult his 1892 essay
“Concept and Object”.

For the purposes of understanding Frege's Theorem, we only need to
introduce one axiom that governs λ-notation, namely, the
principle known as λ-Conversion. Let φ be any formula and
let φ(*y*/*x*) be the result of substituting the
variable *y* for free occurrences of *x* everywhere in
φ. Then the principle of λ-Conversion is:

λ-Conversion:

∀y([λxφ]y≡ φ(y/x))

This asserts that an object *y* falls under the concept
[λ*x* φ] if and only if φ(*y*/*x*)
holds. So, using our example, the following is an instance of
λ-conversion:

∀y([λxOx&x> 5]y≡Oy&y> 5)

This asserts that an object *y* falls under the concept
*being odd and greater than* 5 if and only if *y* is odd
and greater than 5. Note that when the variable *y* is
instantiated to some object term, the resulting instance of
λ-Conversion is a biconditional. Some logicians call the rule of
inference derived from the right-to-left direction of such
biconditionals ‘λ-Abstraction’. For example, the
inference from

O6 & 6 > 5

to

[λxOx&x> 5]6

is justified by λ-Abstraction.

The principle of λ-Conversion can be generalized, so that it
governs *n*-place λ-expressions as well. Here
is the 2-place case:

∀z∀w([λxyφ]zw≡ φ(z/x,w/y))

The reader should construct an instance of this principle using our
example [λ*x**y* *Ox* & *x* >
y].

It should be noted at this point that instead of using
comprehension principles, Frege had a distinguished rule in his system
that is equivalent to such principles, namely, his Rule of
Substitution. Though Frege's Rule of Substitution allowed him to
substitute formulas φ for free concept variables *F* in
theorems of logic, we can understand this rule in terms of the
second-order logic we've defined as follows: in any theorem of logic
with a free variable *F ^{n}*, one may both
instantiate

*F*to any

^{n}*n*-place λ-expression [λ

*x*

_{1}…

*x*φ] and then perform λ-conversion. For example, in the second-order system we now have, one can infer ∀

_{n}*x*(

*Ox*&

*x*> 5 ≡

*Ox*&

*x*> 5) from ∀

*y*(

*Fy*≡

*Fy*) by first substituting [λ

*x*

*Ox*&

*x*> 5] for

*F*and then using λ-Conversion on all the resulting subformulas containing the λ-expression that flank the ≡ sign. Frege's Rule of Substitution allows one to do all this in one step. Readers interested in learning a bit more about the connection between the Rule of Substitution and Comprehension Principles described above can consult the following supplementary document:

Frege's Rule of Substitution

Finally, it is important to point out that the system we have just
described, i.e., second-order logic with identity and comprehension
principles, extended by λ-notation and λ-Conversion, is
consistent. Its axioms are true even in very small interpretations,
e.g., ones in which the domain of objects contains a single object and
each domain of *n*-place relations (*n*≥1) has just two
relations. For example, if the domain of objects contains a single
object, say **b**, and the domain of 1-place relations contains two
concepts (i.e., one which **b** falls under and one which nothing
falls under), then all of the above axioms are true, including the
Comprehension Principle for Concepts and 1-place
λ-Conversion. Even so, the system described above requires that
every concept has a negation, every pair of concepts has a
conjunction, every pair of concepts has a disjunction, etc. The reader
should be able to write down instances of the comprehension principle
which demonstrate these claims.

Readers whose main goal is to understand Frege's Theorem can now skip directly to Section 3.

## 2. Frege's Theory of Extensions: Basic Law V

Though the present section is not required for understanding the
proof of Frege's Theorem, we include it so that the reader can get
some sense of how second-order logic (with comprehension) gives rise
to Russell's paradox when one adds Frege's theory of courses-of-values
and extensions. Though we shall briefly discuss Frege's notation for
courses-of-values, we'll subsequently switch to simpler notation for
naming the extensions of concepts. For the purposes of this section,
let us suppose that we have primitive function terms ƒ,*g*,
*h*,… in our language and that functional applications
such as ƒ(*x*), *g*(*y*), etc., are allowed.

The principle that undermined Frege's system, Basic Law V, was one
that attempted to systematize the notions ‘course-of-values of a
function’ and ‘extension of a concept’. The
course-of-values of a function ƒ is something like a set of
ordered pairs that records the value ƒ(*x*) for every
argument *x*. For example, the course-of-values of the function
*father of x* records, among other things, that Bill Clinton is
the value of the function when Chelsea Clinton is the argument. The
course-of-values for the function *x*^{2} records,
among other things, that the number 4 is the value when the number 2
is the argument, that 9 is the value when 3 is the argument, etc. When
a function ƒ is a concept, Frege called the course-of-values for
that concept its *extension*. The extension of a concept is
something like the set of all objects that fall under the concept, for
the extension records all of the objects that the concept maps to The
True. For example, the extension of the concept *x is a positive
even integer less than 8* is something like the set consisting of
the numbers 2, 4, and 6.

### 2.1 Notation for Courses-of-Values of Functions

Frege introduces primitive notation for courses-of-values
in **Gg I**, §9. He switched to the lower case Greek
letters ε and α when writing the names of
courses-of-values and extensions, and placed smooth breathing marks
over them when to indicate they were variable-binding operators:

ἐƒ(ε)

and

ἀg(α)

to designate the course-of-values of the functions ƒ and
*g*, respectively. In this notation, the symbols
ἐ
and
ἀ
bind the object variables ε and α in the expressions
ƒ(ε) and *g*(α), respectively, and the
resulting expression denotes a course-of-values.

Here is a pair of examples of Frege's notation for
courses-of-values. This pair of examples comes from **Gg
I**, §9. Frege uses the expression:

ἐ(ε^{2}− ε)

to denote the course-of-values of the function represented by the open formula:

x^{2}−x

He also uses:

ἀ(α · (α − 1))

to denote the course-of-values of the function represented by the open formula:

x· (x− 1)

Frege then notes that:

∀x[x^{2}−x=x· (x− 1)]

always has the same truth value as the following:

ἐ(ε^{2}− ε) = ἀ(α · (α − 1))

This equivalence will become embodied in Basic Law V. Indeed,
Frege's formulation of Basic Law V in **Gg I**, §20
can now be represented in our language (temporarily extended with
function terms and functional application) as follows:

Basic Law V:

ἐƒ(ε) = ἀg(α) ≡ ∀x[ƒ(x) =g(x)]

This principle asserts: the course-of-values of the function ƒ
is identical to the course-of-values of the function *g* if and
only if ƒ and *g* map every object to the same value.
[Actually, Frege uses an identity sign instead of the biconditional
sign as the main connective of the principle. The reason he could do
this is that, in his system, when two sentences are materially
equivalent, they *name* the same truth value.] We shall soon
see why this principle is inconsistent.

### 2.2 Notation for Extensions of Concepts

Since concepts, for Frege, are functions that always map their arguments to a truth value, we may introduce some new notation to help us represent Frege's method of forming names of the extensions of concepts. This new notation takes advantage of our λ-notation for naming concepts, and so allows us to introduce a new kind of function term where Frege introduced a variable-binding operator.

Let us stipulate that where Π is any 1-place concept term (name
or variable), the notation ‘εΠ’ designates the
extension of the concept Π. So, for example, ε*F*
denotes the extension of the concept *F*. Note that 1-place
λ-expressions of the form [λ*x* φ] are
1-place concept terms, and so ε[λ*x* φ]
is well-formed and designates the extension of the concept
[λ*x* φ]. Thus, whereas Frege used
ἐ
as a variable-binding operator that binds an object variable in a
formula to produce the name of an extension, we are using ε as
a term-forming function symbol that applies to 1-place concept terms
to produce terms denoting, or ranging over, objects. Thus, when ε
is prefixed to a concept name, the resulting expression is a name of
an object, and in particular, a name of the extension of the concept
denoted by the concept name. When the ε is prefixed to a
concept variable, e.g., as in ε*F*, the resulting
expression is a kind of complex variable that ranges over extensions:
for each value of the variable *F*, ε*F* denotes the
extension of *F*.

Here is an example of our notation involving a pair of complex
concepts. Consider the concept *that which when added to* 4
*equals* 5, or using λ-notation, the following
concept:

[λxx+4=5]

We use the following notation to denote the extension of this concept:

ε[λxx+4=5]

Now consider the concept *that which when added to*
2^{2} *equals* 5 (i.e.,
[λ*x* *x*+2^{2}=5]). We use the
following notation to denote the extension of this concept:

ε[λxx+2^{2}=5]

Note that it seems natural to identify these two extensions given
that all and only the objects that fall under the first concept fall
under the second. Those readers already familiar with the
λ-calculus should remember that
ε[λ*x* φ] denotes an object, that
[λ*x* φ] denotes a concept, and that Frege
rigorously distinguished objects and concepts and supposed them to
constitute mutually exclusive domains.

### 2.3 Membership in an Extension

If we remember that the extension of a concept is something like the
set of objects that fall under the concept, then we could replace
Frege's talk of ‘extensions’ by talk of ‘sets’
and use the following ‘set notation’ to refer to the set of
objects that when added to 4 yield 5 and the set of objects that when
added to 2^{2} yield 5, respectively:

{x|x+ 4 = 5}{

x|x+ 2^{2}= 5}

Frege took advantage of his second-order language to *define*
what it is for an object to be a member of an extension or
set. Although Frege used the
notation *x* ∩ *y* to designate the
membership relation, we shall follow the more usual practice of
using *x* ∈ *y*. (Readers should check
that their web browsers are correctly displaying the difference
between the membership sign ∈ and the epsilon operator
ε.) Thus, the following captures the main features of Frege's
definition of membership in **Gg I**, §34:

x∈y=_{df}∃G(y=εG&Gx)

In other words, *x* is an element of *y* just in case
*x* falls under a concept of which *y* is the extension.
For example, given this definition, one can prove that John is a member
of the extension of the concept *being happy* (formally:
*j* ∈ εH) from the premise that John falls under
the concept *being happy* (‘*Hj*’). Here is a
simple proof:

1. HjPremise 2. ε H= εHInstance of axiom x=x3. ε H= εH&Hjfrom 1,2, by &-Introduction 4. ∃ G(εH= εG&Gj)from 3, by Existential Introduction 5. j∈ εHfrom 4, by definition of ∈

Some readers may wish to examine a somewhat more complex example, in
which the above definition of membership is used to prove that 1 ∈
ε[λ*x* *x*+2^{2}=5] given the
premise that 1+2^{2}=5.
(A More Complex Example)

Before we turn to Basic Law V, it is important to mention an important fact about our representation of Frege's system, in which we've introduced the term-forming operator ε into second-order logic with identity. The resulting system has the following principle, which asserts that every concept has an extension, as a theorem:

Existence of Extensions:

∀G∃x(x= εG)

To see that this is derivable given our work thus far, recall line 2 of the proof in the above example: the laws of identity allow us to assert that:

εF= εF

In second-order logic with identity, this is an instance
of *x*=*x* (strictly speaking, one first derives
∀*x*(*x*=*x*) from the
axiom *x*=*x* by GEN, and then instantiates the universally
quantified variable *x* to ε*F*). So, by existential
generalization, it follows that:

∃x(x= εF)

But now the Existence of Extensions principle follows by universal
generalization on the concept variable *F*. Thus, simply by
adding a term-forming operator such as ε to classical
logic with identity, it is provable that every concept gets correlated
with an extension. Basic Law V will not only imply, but also place
a condition on, this correlation.

### 2.4 Basic Law V for Concepts

We can now represent the special case Frege's Basic Law V that applies to concepts, using our ε notation:

Basic Law V(Special Case):

εF= εG≡ ∀x(Fx≡Gx)

In this special case, Basic Law V asserts: the extension of the
concept *F* is identical to the extension of the concept
*G* if and only if all and only the objects that fall under
*F* fall under *G* (i.e., if and only if the concepts
*F* and *G* are materially equivalent). In more modern
guise, Frege's Basic Law V asserts that the set of *F*s is
identical to the set of *G*s if and only if *F* and
*G* are materially equivalent:

{x|Fx} = {y|Gy} ≡ ∀z(Fz≡Gz)

The example discussed above can now be seen as an instance of Basic Law V:

ε[λyy+4=5] = ε[λyy+2^{2}=5] ≡ ∀x([λyy+4=5]x≡ [λyy+2^{2}=5]x)

This simply asserts that the extension of the concept *that which
added to* 4 *yields* 5 is identical to the extension of the
concept *that which added to* 2^{2} *yields* 5 if
and only if all and only the objects that when added to 4 yield 5 are
objects that when added to 2^{2} yield 5.

There are two important corollaries to Law V that play a role in what
follows: the Law of Extensions and the Principle of
Extensionality. The Law of Extensions (cf. **Gg I**,
§55, Theorem 1) asserts that an object is a member of the
extension of a concept if and only if it falls under that concept:

Law of Extensions:

∀F∀x(x∈ εF≡Fx)

Basic Law V also correctly implies the Principle of Extensionality.
This principle asserts that if two extensions have the same members,
they are identical. Let us define ‘*x* *is an extension*’
as follows:

Extension(x) =_{df}∃F(x=εF)

Then we may formally represent and derive the principle of extensionality as follows:

Principle of Extensionality:

Extension(x) &Extension(y) →

[∀z(z∈x≡z∈y) →x=y]

The above facts about Basic Law V will be used in the next
subsections to show why it may *not* be consistently added to
second-order logic with comprehension. Frege was made aware of the
inconsistency by Bertrand Russell, who sent him a letter formulating
‘Russell's Paradox’ just as the second volume
of **Gg** was going to press. Frege quickly added an
Appendix to the second volume, describing two distinct ways of
deriving a contradiction from Basic Law V. He also suggested a way of
repairing Law V, but Quine (1995) later showed that such a repair was
disastrous, since it would force the domain of objects to contain at
most one object.

In the next subsections, we describe the two ways of deriving a
contradiction from Basic Law V that Frege described in the Appendix
to **Gg**. The first establishes the contradiction directly,
without any special definitions. The second deploys the membership
relation and more closely follows Russell's Paradox. As we shall see,
the following combination is a volatile mix: (a) the Comprehension
Principle for concepts, which ensures that there is a concept
corresponding to every formula with free variable *x*, (b) the
Existence of Extensions principle, which ensures every concept is
correlated with an extension, and (c) Basic Law V, which ensures that
the correlation of concepts with extensions behaves in a certain
way.

### 2.5 First Derivation of the Contradiction

In the Appendix to **Gg II**, Frege shows that a
contradiction can be derived from Basic Law V once we formulate the
concept *being an x which is the extension of some concept
which x doesn't fall under*. We may use the following
λ-expression to represent this concept:

[λx∃F(x=εF& ¬Fx)]

We know that there exists such a concept, since the open formula in
the scope ofλ*x* can be used in the Comprehension
Principle for Concepts. Now by the Existence of Extensions principle,
the following concept exists and is correlated with it:

ε[λx∃F(x=εF& ¬Fx)]

It can now be proved that this extension falls under the concept
[λ*x* ∃*F*(*x*=ε*F*
& ¬*Fx*)] if and only if it does not.

(First Derivation of the Contradiction.)

### 2.6 Second Derivation of the Contradiction

In the Appendix to **Gg II**, Frege also explains how
Basic Law V implies the existence of the paradoxical Russell set. We
can represent his reasoning as follows. From the Law of Extensions
(which was derived from Basic Law V above), one can establish a
Naive Comprehension Axiom for Extensions in three simple steps. First
we instantiate the Law of Extensions to the free variable *F*,
to yield:

∀x(x∈ εF≡Fx)

By existentially generalizing on ε*F*, it follows
that:

∃y∀x(x∈y≡Fx)

Now at this point, we may universally generalize on the variable
*F* to get the following second-order Naive Comprehension Axiom
for extensions, which asserts that for every concept *F*, there
is an extension which has as members all and only the objects that fall
under *F*:

Naive Comprehension Axiom for Extensions:

∀F∃y∀x(x∈y≡Fx)

The Naive Comprehension Axiom gives rise to Russell's Paradox once we
instantiate the quantified variable *F* to the concept
[λ*z* *z* ∉ *z*],
where *z* ∉ *z* simply abbreviates
¬(*z* ∈ *z*), to yield:

∃y∀x(x∈y≡ [λzz∉z]x)

By λ-Conversion, this is equivalent to:

∃y∀x(x∈y≡x∉x)

(Note: Frege could have reached this last result in one
step from ∃*y*∀*x*(*x*
∈ *y* ≡ *Fx*) using his Rule of
Substitution.)

The contradiction now goes as follows. Let *b* be such
an object asserted to exist by the claim we just derived. So
we know:

∀x(x∈b≡x∉x)

But we can now instantiate the universally quantified variable to
the object *b* to yield the following contradiction:

b∈b≡b∉b

(See the entry on Russell's Paradox.)

### 2.7 How the Paradox is Engendered

We've now reconstructed the inconsistency in Frege's system by representing his logic and Basic Law V in a modern system of second-order logic. Philosophers have diagnosed the inconsistency in various ways, and it is safe to say that the matter is still somewhat controversial. In this subsection, we discuss only the basic elements of the problem. Most philosophers and logicians agree that the reason second-order logic can't be extended by Basic Law V is that the resulting system requires the impossible situation in which the domain of concepts has to be strictly larger than the domain of extensions while at the same time the domain of extensions has to be as large as the domain of concepts.

To analyze the inconsistency in more detail, it is important to
briefly discuss the conditions under which concepts are to be
identified. Although Frege did not believe that statements of the form
‘*F* = *G*’ are meaningful, it is evident
from the study of **Gg** that the material equivalence of
concepts *F* and *G* serves as a necessary condition for
the identity of *F* and *G*. So, whenever it is
*not* the case that all and only the objects that fall under
*F* fall under *G*, *F* and *G* are
distinct concepts.

With this in mind, we can see how a paradox is engendered. Recall
first that the Existence of Extensions principle correlates each
concept *F* with an extension ε*F*. Each
direction of Basic Law V requires that this correlation have certain
properties. We shall see, for example, that the right-to-left
direction of Basic Law V (i.e., Va) requires that no concept gets
correlated with two distinct extensions. [Frege uses the label
‘Va’ to designate the right-to-left direction of Basic Law
V. See, for example, **Gg I**, §52. However, many
commentators use ‘Va’ to designate the left-to-right
direction. We shall follow Frege's use, since that will make sense of
his Appendix to **Gg II**, in which he discusses the
paradoxes.] We may represent Frege's Va as follows:

Basic Law Va:

∀x(Fx≡Gx) → εF= εG

If we think in terms of its contraposition and remember the
necessary condition for the identity of concepts, Va in effect asserts
that whenever extensions differ, the concepts with which they are
correlated differ. This means that the correlation between concepts
and extensions that Basic Law V sets up must be a function—no
concept gets correlated with two distinct extensions (though for all
Va tells us, distinct concepts might get correlated with the same
extension). Frege noted (in the Appendix to **Gg II**)
that this direction of Basic Law V doesn't seem problematic.

However, the left-to-right direction of Basic Law V (i.e., Vb) is more serious. We may represent Vb as follows:

Basic Law Vb:

εF= εG→ ∀x(Fx≡Gx)

If we consider the contrapositive of this and remember the
necessary condition for the identity of concepts, then Vb, in effect,
asserts that whenever the concepts *F* and *G* differ,
the extensions of *F* and *G* differ. So, the
correlation that Basic Law V sets up between concepts and extensions
will have to be one-to-one; i.e., it correlates distinct concepts with
distinct extensions. Since every concept is correlated with some
extension, there have to be at least as many extensions as there are
concepts.

But the problem is that second-order logic with Basic Law V *as a
whole* requires that there be *more* concepts than
extensions. The requirement that there be more concepts than
extensions is imposed jointly by the Comprehension Principle for
Concepts *and* the new significance this principle takes on in
the presence of Basic Law V. The Comprehension Principle for Concepts
asserts the existence of a concept for every condition on objects
expressible in the language. Now although it may seem that this
principle, in and of itself, forces the domain of concepts to be
larger than the domain of objects, it is a model-theoretic fact that
there are models of second-order logic with the Comprehension
Principle for Concepts (but without Basic Law V) in which the domain
of concepts is not larger than the domain of
objects.^{[2]}
However, the addition of Basic Law V to Frege's system forces the
domain of concepts to be larger than the domain of objects (and so
larger than the domain of extensions), due to the endless cycle of new
concepts that arise in connection with the new extensions contributed
by Basic Law V. However, as we saw in the last paragraph, Vb requires
that there be at least as many extensions as there are concepts.

Thus, the addition of Basic Law V to second-order logic implies an impossible situation in which the domain of concepts has to be strictly larger than the domain of extensions while at the same time the domain of extensions has to be as large as the domain of concepts.

Recently, there has been a lot of interest in discovering ways of
repairing the Fregean theory of extensions. The traditional view is that
one must either restrict Basic Law V or restrict the Comprehension
Principle for Concepts. Recently, Boolos (1986, 1993) developed one of
the more interesting suggestions for revising Basic Law V without
abandoning second-order logic and its comprehension principle for
concepts. On the other hand, there have been many suggestions for
restricting the Comprehension Principle for Concepts. The most severe
of these is to abandon second-order logic (and the Comprehension
Principle for Concepts) altogether. Schroeder-Heister (1987)
conjectured that the first-order portion of Frege's system (i.e., the
system which results by adding Basic Law V to the first-order
predicate calculus) was consistent and this was proved by T. Parsons
(1987) and Burgess (1998).^{[3]} Heck (1996), Wehmeier (1999), Ferreira
& Wehmeier (2002), and Ferreira
(2005) consider less drastic moves. They investigate systems of
second-order logic which have been extended by Basic Law V but in
which the Comprehension Principle for Concepts is restricted in some
way. See also Anderson & Zalta (2004) and Antonelli & May
(2005) for different approaches to repairing Frege's system. See Fine
(2002) for a discussion of the limits of Frege's method and see
Burgess (2005) for a good general overview.

We will not discuss the above research further in the present entry,
for none of these alternatives have achieved a clear
consensus. Instead, we focus on the theoretical accomplishment
revealed by Frege's work in **Gg**. As noted in the
Introduction, Frege validly proved a rather deep fact about the
natural numbers notwithstanding the inconsistency of Basic Law V. He
derived the Dedekind/Peano axioms for number theory in second-order
logic from Hume's Principle (which was briefly mentioned above and
which will be discussed in the next section). But this fact went
unnoticed for many years. Though Geach (1955) claimed such a
derivation was possible, C. Parsons (1965) was the first to note that
Hume's Principle was powerful enough for the derivation of the
Dedekind/Peano axioms. Though Wright (1983) actually carried out most
of the derivation, Heck (1993) showed that although Frege did use
Basic Law V to derive Hume's principle, his (Frege's) subsequent
derivations of the Dedekind/Peano axioms of number theory from Hume's
Principle never made an
*essential* appeal to Basic Law V. Since Hume's Principle can
be consistently added to second-order logic, we may conclude that
Frege himself validly derived the basic laws of number theory. It will
be the task of the next few sections to explain Frege's
accomplishments in this regard. We will do this in two stages. In
§3 we study Frege's attempt to derive Hume's Principle from Basic
Law V by analyzing cardinal numbers as extensions. Then, we put this
aside in §§4 and 5 to examine how Frege was able to derive
the Dedekind/Peano axioms of number theory from Hume's Principle
alone.

## 3. Frege's Analysis of Cardinal Numbers

Cardinal numbers are the numbers that can be used to answer the
question ‘How many … are there?’, and Frege
discovered that such numbers bear an interesting relationship to the
natural numbers. Frege's insights concerning this relationship trace
back to his work in **Gl**, in which the notion of an
extension played very little role. The seminal idea
of **Gl** §46 was the observation that a statement
of number (e.g., “There are eight planets”) is an
assertion about a concept. To explain this idea, Frege noted that one
and the same external phenomenon can be counted in different ways; for
example, a certain external phenomenon could be counted as one army, 5
divisions, 25 regiments, 120 companies, 400 platoons, or 4000
people. Each way of counting the external phenomenon
corresponds to the manner of its conception. The question “How
many are there?” is only properly formulated as the question
“How many *F*s are there?” where a
concept *F* is supplied. On Frege's view, the statements of
number which answer such questions (e.g., “There are
*n* *F*s”) tell us something about the concept
involved. For example, the statement “There are eight planets
in the solar system” tells us that the ordinary
concept *planet in the solar system* falls under
the *second-level* numerical concept *being exemplified
by eight objects*.

In **Gl**, Frege then moves from this realization, in which
statements of numbers are analyzed as predicating second-level
numerical concepts of first-level concepts, to develop an account of
the cardinal and natural numbers as ‘self-subsistent’
objects. He introduces a ‘cardinality operator’ on
concepts, namely, ‘the number belonging to the
concept *F*’, which designates the cardinal number which
numbers the objects falling under *F*. In what follows, we say
this more simply as ‘the number of *F*s’ and use
the simple notation ‘#*F*’. Note that the operator
# behaves like the ε operator — when it is prefixed to a
concept name like *planet* (= *P*), then #*P*
(“the number of planets”) denotes an object; when it is
prefixed to a variable like *F*, then #*F* ranges over
the domain of objects (for each concept that *F* can take as a
value, #*F* denotes an object relative to that concept). Frege
offers both an implicit and an explicit definition of this operator in
**Gl**. Both of these definitions require a preliminary
definition of when two concepts *F* and *G* are in
one-to-one correspondence or ‘equinumerous’. The notion
of equinumerosity plays an important and fundamental role in the
development of Frege's Theorem. After developing the definition of
equinumerosity, we then discuss Frege's implicit and explicit
definition of the number of *F*s. Only the former is
needed for the proof of Frege's Theorem, however.

### 3.1 Equinumerosity

In order to state the definition of equinumerosity, we shall employ the
well-known logical notion ‘there exists a unique *x* such
that φ’. To say that there exists a unique
*x* such that φ is to say: there is some
*x* such that φ, and anything *y* which is such that
φ is identical to *x*. In what follows, we use the notation
‘∃!*x*φ’ to abbreviate this notion of a
formula being uniquely satisfied, and we define it formally as follows
(where again, φ(*y*/*x*) is the result of
substituting *y* for the free occurrences of *x* in φ):

∃!xφ =_{df}∃x[φ & ∀y(φ(y/x) →y=x)]

Now, in terms of this logical notion of unique existence, we can state
Frege's definition of equinumerosity (**Gl**, §71,
72) as follows:

FandGareequinumerousjust in case there is a relationRsuch that: (1) every object falling underFisR-related to a unique object falling underG, and (2) every object falling underGis such that there is a unique object falling underFwhich isR-related to it.

In other words, *F* and *G* are equinumerous just in case
there is a relation that establishes a one-to-one correspondence
between the
*F*s and the *G*s. If we let ‘*F*
≈ *G*’ stand for equinumerosity, then the
definition of this notion can be rendered formally as follows:

F≈G=_{df}

∃R[∀x(Fx→ ∃!y(Gy&Rxy)) & ∀x(Gx→ ∃!y(Fy&Ryx))]

To see that Frege's definition of equinumerosity works correctly, consider the following two examples. In the first example, we have two concepts that are equinumerous:

Figure 1

Although there are several different relations *R* which would
demonstrate the equinumerosity of *F* and *G* the
particular relation used in Figure 1 is:

R_{1}= [λxy(x=a&y=f) ∨ (x=b&y=g) ∨ (x=c&y=e)]

It is a simple exercise to show that *R*_{1}, as
defined, is a ‘witness’ to the equinumerosity of *F*
and *G* (according to the definition).

In the second example, we have two concepts that are not equinumerous:

Figure 2

In this example, no relation *R* can satisfy the definition of
equinumerosity.

Given the discussion so far, it seems reasonable to suggest that the
concepts *F* and *G* will be equinumerous whenever the
number of objects falling under *F* is identical to the number
of objects falling under *G*. This suggestion will be codified by
Hume's Principle. Before moving ahead to the discussion of this
principle, the reader should convince him- or herself of the following
four facts: (1) that the material equivalence of two concepts implies
their equinumerosity, (2) that equinumerosity is reflexive, (3) that
equinumerosity is symmetric, and (4) that equinumerosity is
transitive. In formal terms, the following facts are provable:

Facts About Equinumerosity:

1. ∀x(Fx≡Gx) →F≈G

2.F≈F

3.F≈G→G≈F

4.F≈G&G≈H→F≈H

The proofs of these facts, in each case, require the identification of a relation that is a witness to the relevant equinumerosity claim. In some cases, it is easy to identify the relation in question. In other cases, the reader should be able to ‘construct’ such relations (using λ-notation) by considering the examples described above. Facts (2) – (4) establish that equinumerosity is an ‘equivalence relation’ which divides up the domain of concepts into ‘equivalence classes’ of equinumerous concepts.

### 3.2 Contextual Definition of ‘The Number of *F*s’: Hume's Principle

Frege contextually defined ‘the number of *F*s’ in
terms of the principle now known as Hume's
Principle:^{[4]}

Hume's Principle:

The number ofFs is identical to the number ofGs if and only ifFandGare equinumerous.

Using our notation ‘#*F*’ to abbreviate ‘the
number of *F*s’, we may formalize Hume's Principle as
follows:

Hume's Principle:

#F= #G≡F≈G

This contextual definition governing cardinal numbers is the basic
principle upon which Frege forged his development of the theory of
natural
numbers.^{[5]}
In **Gl**, Frege sketched the
derivations of the basic laws of number theory from Hume's Principle;
these sketches were developed into more rigorous proofs in **Gg
I**. We will examine these derivations in the following
sections.

Once Frege had a contextual definition of #*F*, he then
defined a cardinal number as any object which is the number of some
concept:

x is a cardinal number=_{df}∃F(x= #F)

This represents the definition that appears in **Gl**,
§72.

Notice that Hume's Principle bears an obvious formal resemblance to
Basic Law V. Both are biconditionals asserting the equivalence of an
identity among singular terms (the left-side condition) with an
equivalence relation on concepts (the right-side condition). Indeed,
both correlate concepts with certain objects. In the case of Hume's
Principle, each concept *F* is correlated with #*F*.
However, whereas Basic Law V problematically requires that the
correlation between concepts and extensions be one-to-one, Hume's
Principle only requires that the correlation between concepts and
numbers be many-to-one. Hume's Principle often correlates distinct
concepts with the same number. For example, the distinct concepts
*author of Principia Mathematica* (‘[λ*x*
*Axp*]’) and *positive integer between*
1 *and* 4 (‘[λ*x*
1<*x*<4]’) are equinumerous (both have two objects
falling under them). So #[λ*x* *Axp*] =
#[λ*x* 1<*x*<4]. Thus, Hume's Principle,
unlike Basic Law V, does not require that the domain of numbers be as
large as the domain of concepts. Indeed, several authors have
developed models that show Hume's Principle can be consistently added
to second-order logic. See the independent work of Geach (1976,
446–7), Hodes (1984, 138), Burgess (1984) and Hazen (1985).

### 3.3 Explicit Definition of ‘The Number of *F*s’

[Note: The remaining two subsections are not strictly necessary for understanding the proof of Frege's Theorem. They are included here for those who wish to have a more complete understanding of what Frege in fact attempted to do. They presuppose the material in §2. Readers interested in just the positive aspects of Frege's accomplishments should skip directly to §4.]

Before we examine the powerful consequences that Frege derived from
Hume's Principle, it is worth digressing to describe his attempt to
explicitly definition of ‘#*F*’ and to derive
Hume's Principle from Basic Law V. The idea behind this attempt was
the realization that if given any concept *F*, the notion of
equinumerosity can be used to define the second-level
concept *being a concept G that is equinumerous to F*
(‘*G* ≈
*F*’). Frege found a way to collect all of the concepts
equinumerous to a given concept *F* into a single extension. In
**Gl** §68, he informally took this to be an
extension consisting of first-order concepts by stipulating that the
number of *F*s is the extension of the second-level
concept: *being a first-level concept equinumerous to
F*.

In terms of the example used at the end of the previous subsection,
this informal definition identifies the number of the
concept *author of Principia Mathematica* as the extension
consisting of all and only those first-level concepts that are
equinumerous to this concept; this extension has both
[λ*x* *Axp*] and [λ*x* 1<x<4]
as members. Frege in fact identifies the cardinal number 2 with this
extension, for it contains all and only those concepts under which two
objects fall. Similarly, Frege identifies the cardinal number 0 with
the extension consisting of all those first-level concepts under which
no object falls; this extension would include such concepts
as *unicorn*, *centaur*, *prime number between*
3 *and* 5, etc. Frege's insight here inspired Russell to
develop a somewhat similar definition in his work, and it is now
common to see references to the so-called “Frege-Russell
definition of the cardinal numbers” as classes of equinumerous
concepts or
sets.^{[6]}
Of course, this explicit definition of ‘the
number of *F*s’ stands or falls with a coherent conception
of ‘extension’. We know that Basic Law V does not offer
such a coherent conception.

### 3.4 Derivation of Hume's Principle

Frege's derivations of Hume's Principle were invalidated by the
fact that it appeals to the inconsistent Basic Law V. Neverthelss, we
briefly describe in this subsection, for interested readers,
Frege's derivations. In **Gl**, §73, Frege sketches
an informal proof of the right-to-left direction of Hume's Principle
using the above informal definition of the number of *F*s. The
derivation appeals to the fact that a concept *G* is a member
of the extension of the second-level concept *concept equinumerous
to F* if and only if *G* is equinumerous to *F*. In
other words, the proof relies on a kind of higher-order version of the
Law of Extensions (described above), the ordinary version of which we
know to be a consequence of Basic Law
V.^{[7]}
Here is a reconstruction of Frege's proof
in **Gl**, §73, extended so as to cover both directions
of Hume's Principle.

Reconstruction of theGrundlagenDerivation of Hume's Principle

However, in the development of **Gg**, Frege didn't
formulate the extensions of second-level concepts. In
**Gg**, extensions do *not* contain concepts as members but
rather objects. So Frege had to find another way to express the
explicit definition described in the previous subsection. His
technique was to let extensions go proxy for their corresponding
concepts. Since a full reconstruction of this technique and the proof
of Hume's Principle in **Gg** would constitute a
digression for the present exposition, we shall describe the details
for interested readers in a separate document:

Reconstruction of theGrundgesetze‘Derivation’ of Hume's Principle

Interestingly, May and Wehmeier (forthcoming) point out that
in **Gg**, Frege does not, in actual fact, mention Hume's Principle
as a biconditional. Instead, he proves both directions separately
without combining them or indicating that the two directions should be
conceived as a biconditional. Finally, as noted on several occasions,
the inconsistency in Basic Law V invalidated Frege's derivation of
Hume's Principle. But Hume's Principle, in and of itself, is a
powerful and consistent principle.

## 4. Frege's Analysis of Predecessor, Ancestrals, and the Natural Numbers

In what follows, we shall suppose (a) that we've added to our
language the # operator and can formulate terms such as #*F* to
signify the number of the concept *F*, and (b) that we've added
Hume's Principle as an axiom to our second-order system. As
previously mentioned, Frege's Theorem is that the basic laws of number
theory are derivable from Hume's Principle alone. In this section, we
introduce the definitions required for the proof of Frege's
Theorem. In the next section, we go through the proof. In the final
section, we conclude with a discussion of the philosophical questions
that arise when we consider Hume's Principle as a replacement for
Basic Law V.

Before we turn to the definitions required for the proof of Frege's Theorem, it would serve well to discuss one other group of insights underlying Frege's analysis of numbers. The first is that the following series of concepts has a rather interesting property:

C_{0}= [λxx≠x]

C_{1}= [λxx= #C_{0}]

C_{2}= [λxx= #C_{0}∨x= #C_{1}]

C_{3}= [λxx= #C_{0}∨x= #C_{1}∨x= #C_{2}]

etc.

The interesting property of this series is that for each concept
C_{k}, all and only the *numbers* of the
concepts preceding C_{k} in the sequence fall under
C_{k}. So, for example, the concepts preceding
C_{3} are C_{0}, C_{1}, and
C_{2}. Accordingly, all and only the following numbers fall
under C_{3}: #C_{0}, #C_{1}, and
#C_{2}.

Frege' next insight was that these concepts can be used, respectively, to define the finite cardinal numbers, as follows:

0 = #C_{0}

1 = #C_{1}

2 = #C_{2}

etc.

This insight, however, led to another. Frege realized that though
we may identify this sequence of numbers with the natural numbers,
such a sequence is simply a list: it does not constitute a definition
of a concept (e.g., *natural number*) that applies to all and
only the numbers defined in the sequence. Such a concept is required
if we are to prove *as theorems* the following axioms of
Dedekind/Peano number theory:

Dedekind/Peano Axioms for Number Theory:

- 0 is a natural number.
- 0 is not the successor of any natural number.
- No two natural numbers have the same successor.
- If both (a) 0 falls under
F, and (b) for any two natural numbersnandmsuch thatmis the successor ofn, the fact thatnfalls underFimplies thatmfalls underF, then every natural number falls underF. (Principle of Mathematical Induction)- Every natural number has a successor.

Moreover, Frege recognized the need to employ the Principle of
Induction in the proof that every number has a successor. One cannot
prove the claim that *every number has a successor* simply by
producing the sequence of expressions for cardinal numbers (e.g., the
second of the two sequences described above). All such a sequence
demonstrates is that for every expression listed in the sequence, one
can define an expression of the appropriate form to follow it in the
sequence. This is *not* the same as proving that *every
natural number* has a successor.

### 4.1 Predecessor

To accomplish these further goals, Frege proceeded
(**Gl**, §76, and **Gg I**, §43)
by defining the concept *x* (*immediately*) *precedes
y*:

x(immediately)precedesyif and only if there is a conceptFand an objectwsuch that: (a)wfalls underF, (b)yis the number ofFs, and (c)xis the number of the conceptobject falling under F other than w

We may represent Frege's definition formally in our language as follows:

Precedes(x,y) =_{df}

∃F∃w(Fw& y=#F&x=#[λzFz&z≠w])

To illustrate this definition, let us temporarily assume that we
know some facts about the natural numbers 1 and 2 to show that the
definition properly predicts that *Precedes*(1,2), even though
we haven't yet defined these natural numbers. Let the expression
‘[λ*z* *Azp*]’ denote the concept
*author of Principia Mathematica*. Only Bertrand Russell
(‘*r*’) and Alfred Whitehead fall under this
concept. Let the expression ‘[λ*z* *Azp*
& *z*≠*r*]’ denote the concept *author of
Principia Mathematica other than
Russell*.^{[8]}
Then the following may, for
the purposes of this example, be taken as facts:

- Russell falls under the concept
*author of Principia Mathematica*, i.e.,

[λ*z**Azp*]*r* - 2 is the number of the concept
*author of Principia Mathematica*, i.e.,

2 = #[λ*z**Azp*] - 1 is the number of the concept
*author of Principia Mathematica other than Russell*, i.e.,

1 = #[λ*z**Azp*&*z*≠*r*]

If we assemble these truths into a conjunction and apply existential
generalization in the appropriate places, the result is the definiens
of the definition of predecessor instantiated to the numbers 1 and 2.
Thus, if given certain facts about the number of objects falling under
the certain concepts, the definition of predecessor correctly predicts
that *Precedes*(1,2).

### 4.2 The Ancestral of Relation *R*

Frege next defines the relational concept *x is an ancestor of y
in the R-series*. This new relation is called ‘the ancestral
of the relation *R*’ and we henceforth designate this
relation as *R**. Frege first defined the ancestral of relation
*R* in **Begr** (Part III, Proposition 76), though
the word ‘ancestral’ comes to us from Russell and
Whitehead. Frege's term for the ancestral is “*x* comes before
*y* in the *R*-series”; alternatively, “*y*
follows *x* in the *R*-series”. (See also
**Gl**, §79 and **Gg I**, §45.) The
intuitive idea is easily grasped if we consider the relation *x
is the father of y*. Suppose that *a* is the father of
*b*, that *b* is the father of *c*, and that
*c* is the father of *d*. Then ‘*x* is an
ancestor of *y* in the fatherhood-series’ is defined so
that *a* is an ancestor of *b*, *c*, and
*d*, that *b* is an ancestor of *c* and
*d*, and that *c* is an ancestor of *d*.

Frege's definition of the ancestral of *R* requires a
preliminary definition:

the concept F is hereditary in the R-seriesif and only if every pair ofR-related objectsxandyare such thatyfalls underFwheneverxfalls underF

In formal terms:

Her(F,R) =_{abbr}∀x∀y(Rxy→ (Fx→Fy))

Intuitively, the idea is that *F* is hereditary in the
*R*-series if *F* is always ‘passed’ from
*x* to *y* whenever *x* and *y* are a pair
of *R*-related objects. (We warn the reader here that the
notation ‘*Her*(*F*,*R*)’ is merely an
abbreviation of a much longer statement. It is *not* a formula
of our language having the form
‘*R*(*x*,*y*)’. In what follows, we
sometimes introduce other such abbreviations.)

Frege's definition of the ancestral of *R* can now be stated
as follows:

x comes before y in the R-series=_{df}yfalls under all thoseR-hereditary conceptsFunder which falls every object to whichxisR-related

In other words, *y* follows *x* in
the *R*-series whenever *y* falls under
every *R*-hereditary concept *F* that is exemplified by
everything immediately *R*-related to *x*. In formal
terms:

R*(x,y) =_{df}∀F[∀z(Rxz→Fz) &Her(F,R) →Fy]

For example, Clinton's father stands in relation *father* of*
(i.e., *forefather*) to Chelsea because she falls under every
hereditary concept that Clinton and his brother inherited from
Clinton's father. However, Clinton's brother is not one of Chelsea's
forefathers, since he fails to be her father, her grandfather, or any
of the other links in the chain of fathers from which Chelsea
descended.

It is important to grasp the differences between a relation
*R* and its ancestral *R**. *Rxy* implies
*R**(*x*,*y*) (e.g., if Clinton is a father of
Chelsea, then Clinton is a forefather of Chelsea), but the converse
doesn't hold (Clinton's father is a father* of Chelsea, but he is not a
father of Chelsea). Indeed, a grasp of the definition of *R**
should leave one able to prove the following easy consequences, many of
which correspond to theorems in **Begr** and
**Gg**:^{[9]}

**Facts About R***:

*Rxy*→*R**(*x*,*y*)- ¬∀R∀
*x*∀*y*(*R**(*x*,*y*) →*Rxy*) - [
*R**(*x*,*y*) & ∀*z*(*Rxz*→*Fz*) &*Her*(*F*,*R*)] →*Fy*^{[10]} *R**(*x*,*y*) → ∃*z**Rzy*- [
*Fx*&*R**(*x*,*y*) &*Her*(*F*,*R*)] →*Fy* *Rxy*&*R**(*y*,*z*) →*R**(*x*,*z*)*R**(*x*,*y*) &*R**(*y*,*z*) →*R**(*x*,*z*)

The reader should consider what happens when *R* is taken to be
the relation *precedes* (here we use *precedes* to mean
*immediately precedes*). Appealing to our intuitive grasp of
the numbers, we can say that it is an instance of Fact (1) that if 10
precedes 11, then 10 precedes* 11; and that it is an instance of Fact
(2) that 10's preceding* 12 does not imply that 10 precedes 12. An
instance of Fact (7) is that precedes* is transitive. When we restrict
ourselves to the natural numbers, it is intuitive to think of the
difference between precedes and precedes* as the difference between
*immediately precedes* and *less-than*.

### 4.3 The Weak Ancestral of *R*

Given the notion of the ancestral of relation *R*, Frege then
defines its weak ancestral, which he termed “*y is a member of the
R-series beginning with x*” (cf. **Begr**, Part III,
Proposition 99; **Gl**, §81, and **Gg
I**, §46):

y is a member of the R-series beginning with xif and only if eitherxbears the ancestral ofRtoyorx=y

In formal terms:

R^{+}(x,y) =_{df}R*(x,y) ∨x=y

We note here that Frege would also read
*R*^{+}(*x*,*y*) as: *x* is a
member of the *R*-series ending with *y*. Logicians call
*R*^{+} the ‘weak-ancestral’ of *R*
because it is a weakened version of *R**. When *R* is
*precedes*, we can intuitively regard its weak ancestral,
*precedes*^{+}, as the relation
*less-than-or-equal-to* on the natural numbers.

The general definition of the weak ancestral of *R* yields
the following facts, many of which correspond to theorems in
**Gg**:^{[11]}

**Facts About
R^{+}**:

*R**(*x*,*y*) →*R*^{+}(*x*,*y*)*Rxy*→*R*^{+}(*x*,*y*)*Rxy*&*R*^{+}(*y*,*z*) →*R**(*x*,*z*)*R*^{+}(*x*,*y*) &*Ryz*→*R**(*x*,*z*)*R**(*x*,*y*) &*Ryz*→*R*^{+}(*x*,*z*)*R*^{+}(*x*,*x*) (Reflexivity)*R**(*x*,*y*) → ∃*z*[*R*^{+}(*x*,*z*) &*Rzy*]

(Proof of Fact 6 Concerning the Weak Ancestral)- [
*Fx*&*R*^{+}(*x*,*y*) &*Her*(*F*,*R*)] →*Fy* *R**(*x*,*y*) &*Rzy*&*R*is 1–1 →*R*^{+}(*x*,*z*)^{[12]}

The proofs of these facts are left as exercises.

### 4.4 The Concept *Natural Number*

Frege's definition of *natural number* requires one more
preliminary definition. Frege identified the number 0 as the
(cardinal) number of the concept *being
non-self-identical*. That is:

0 =_{df}#[λxx≠x]

Since the logic of identity guarantees that no object is
non-self-identical, nothing falls under the concept *being
non-self-identical*. Had one of Frege's explicit definitions of
the cardinal numbers worked as he had intended, the number 0 would, in
effect, be identified with the extension of all (extensions of)
concepts under which nothing falls. However, for the present purposes,
we may note that 0 is defined in terms of (a) the primitive notion
‘the number of *F*s’ and (b) a concept
([λ*x* *x*≠*x*]) whose existence is
guaranteed by our second-order logic with identity and
comprehension. It is straightforward to prove the following Lemma
Concerning Zero from this definition of 0:

Lemma Concerning Zero:

#F= 0 ≡ ¬∃xFx

Note that the proof appeals to Hume's Principle and facts about equinumerosity.

Frege's definition of the concept *natural number* can now be
stated in terms of the weak-ancestral of Predecessor:

x is a natural numberif and only ifxis a member of the predecessor-series beginning with 0

This definition appears in **Gl**, §83, and
**Gg I**, §46 as the definition of ‘finite
number’. Indeed, the natural numbers are precisely the finite
cardinals. In formal terms, Frege's definition becomes:

Nx=_{df}Precedes^{+}(0,x)

In what follows, we shall sometimes use the variables *m*,
*n*, and *o* to range over the natural numbers. In other
words, we'll use formulas of the form
∀*n*(…*n*…) to abbreviate formulas
of the form ∀*x*(*Nx* →
…*x*…), and use formulas of the form
∃*n*(…*n*…) to abbreviate formulas
of the form ∃*x*(*Nx* &
…*x*…).

## 5. Frege's Theorem

Frege's Theorem is that the five Dedekind/Peano axioms for number
theory can be derived from Hume's Principle in second-order logic. In
this section, we reconstruct the proof of this theorem which can be
extracted from Frege's work using the definitions and theorems
assembled so far. Some of the steps in this proof can be found in
**Gl**. (See the Appendix to Boolos 1990 for a
reconstruction.) Our reconstruction follows Frege's **Gg**
in spirit and in most details, but we have tried to simplify the
presentation in several places. For a stricter description of
Frege's **Gg** proof, the reader is referred to Heck
1993. The following should help prepare the reader for Heck's
excellent essay.

### 5.1 Zero is a Natural Number

The statement that zero is a natural number is an immediate consequence of
the definition of
*natural number*:

Theorem 1:

N0

Proof: It is a simple consequence of the definition of ‘weak ancestral’ thatR^{+}is reflexive (see Fact 4 aboutR^{+}in our subsection on the Weak Ancestral in §4). SoPrecedes^{+}(0,0). Hence, by the definition of natural number, 0 is a natural number.

It seems that Frege never actually identified this fact explicitly in
**Gl** or labeled this fact as a numbered Theorem in
**Gg I**.

### 5.2 Zero Isn't the Successor of Any Natural Number

It is also a simple consequence of the foregoing that 0 doesn't succeed any natural number. This can be represented formally as follows:

Theorem 2:

¬∃x(Nx&Precedes(x,0))

Proof: Assume, forreductio, that some object, sayb, is such thatPrecedes(b,0). Then, by the definition of predecessor, it follows that there is a concept, sayQand an object, sayc, such thatQc& 0=#Q&b=#[λzQz&z≠c]. But by the Lemma Concerning Zero (above), 0=#Qimplies ¬∃xQx, which contradicts the fact thatQc. So nothing precedes 0. Since nothing precedes 0, no natural number precedes 0.

See **Gl**, §78, Item (6); and **Gg I**,
§109, Theorem 126.

### 5.3 No Two Natural Numbers Have the Same Successor

The fact that no two natural numbers have the same successor is
somewhat more difficult to prove (cf. **Gl**, §78,
Item (5); **Gg I**, §95, Theorem 89). We may formulate this
theorem as follows, with *m*, *n*, and *o* as
restricted variables ranging over the natural numbers:

Theorem 3:

∀m∀n∀o[Precedes(m,o) &Precedes(n,o) →m=n]

In other words, this theorem asserts that predecessor is a one-to-one
relation on the natural numbers. To prove this theorem, it suffices to
prove that predecessor is a one-to-one relation full stop. One can
prove that predecessor is one-to-one from Hume's Principle, with the
help of the following Equinumerosity Lemma, the proof of which is
rather long and involved. The Equinumerosity Lemma asserts that when
*F* and *G* are equinumerous, *x* falls under
*F*, and *y* falls under *G*, then the concept
*object falling under F other than x* is equinumerous to the
concept *object falling under G other than y*. The picture is
something like this:

Figure 3

In terms of Figure 3, the Equinumerosity Lemma tells us that if there
is a relation *R* which is a witness to the equinumerosity of
*F* and *G*, then there is a relation *R*′
which is a witness to the equinumerosity of the concepts that result
when you restrict *F* and *G* to the objects other than
*x* and *y*, respectively.

To help us formalize the Equinumerosity Lemma, let
*F* ^{−x} abbreviate the concept
[λ*z* *Fz* & *z*≠*x*] and let
*G* ^{−y} abbreviate the concept
[λ*z* *Gz* & *z*≠*y*]. Then
we have:

Equinumerosity Lemma:

F≈G&Fx&Gy→F^{−x}≈G^{−y}

Now we can prove that Predecessor is a one-to-one relation from this
Lemma and Hume's Principle (cf. **Gg I**, §108):

Predecessor is One-to-One:

∀x∀y∀z[Precedes(x,z) &Precedes(y,z) →x=y]

Proof: Assume that bothaandbare precedessors ofc. By the definition of predecessor, we know that there are concepts and objectsP,Q,d, ande, such that:

Pd&c= #P&a= #P^{−d}Qe&c= #Q&b= #Q^{−e}But if both

c= #Pandc= #Q, then #P= #Q. So, by Hume's Principle,P≈Q. So, by the Equinumerosity Lemma, it follows thatP^{−d}≈Q^{−e}. If so, then by Hume's Principle, #P^{−d}= #Q^{−e}. But then,a=b.

So, if Predecessor is a one-to-one relation, it is a one-to-one relation on the natural numbers. Therefore, no two numbers have the same successor. This completes the proof of Theorem 3.

It is important to mention here that not only is Predecessor a one-to-one relation, it is also a functional relation:

Predecessor is a Functional Relation:

∀x∀y∀z[Precedes(x,y) &Precedes(x,z) →y=z]

This fact can be proved with the help of a kind of converse to the Equinumerosity Lemma:

Equinumerosity Lemma ‘Converse’:

F^{−x}≈G^{−y}&Fx&Gy→F≈G

We leave the proof of the Equinumerosity Lemma ‘Converse’ and the proof that Predecessor is a functional relation as exercises for the reader.

### 5.4 The Principle of Mathematical Induction

Let us say that a concept *F* is *hereditary on the natural
numbers* just in case every ‘adjacent’ pair of numbers
*n* and *m* (*n* preceding *m*) is such
that *m* falls under *F* whenever *n* falls under
*F*, i.e.,

HerOn(F,N) =_{abbr}∀n∀m[Precedes(n,m) → (Fn→Fm)]

Then we may state the Principle of Mathematical Induction as follows:
if (a) 0 falls under *F* and (b) *F* is hereditary on the
natural numbers, then every natural number falls under *F*. In
formal terms:

Theorem 4:Principle of Mathematical Induction:

F0 &HerOn(F,N) → ∀n Fn

Frege actually proves the Principle of Mathematical Induction from
a more general principle that governs any *R*-series
whatsoever. We will call the latter the General Principle of
Induction. It asserts that whenever *a* falls under *F*,
and *F* is hereditary on the *R*-series beginning
with *a*, then every member of that *R*-series falls
under *F*. We can formalize the General Principle of Induction
with the help of a strict understanding of ‘hereditary on
the *R*-series beginning with *a*’. Here is a
definition:

HerOn(F,^{a}R^{+}) =_{abbr}

∀x∀y[R^{+}(a,x) &R^{+}(a,y) &Rxy→ (Fx→Fy)]

In other words, *F* is hereditary on the members of the
*R*-series beginning with *a* just in case every adjacent
pair *x* and *y* in this series (with *x* bearing
*R* to *y*) is such that *y* falls under
*F* whenever *x* falls under *F*. Now given this
definition, we can reformulate the General Principle of Induction more
strictly as:

General Principle of Induction:

[Fa&HerOn(F,^{a}R^{+})] → ∀x[R^{+}(a,x) →Fx]

This is a version of Frege's Theorem 152 in **Gg I**,
§117.

We may sketch the proof strategy as follows. Assume that the
antecedent of the General Principle of Induction holds for an
arbitrarily chosen concept, say *P*. That is, assume:

Pa&HerOn(P,^{a}R^{+})

Now to show
∀*x*(*R*^{+}(*a*,*x*) →
*Px*), pick an arbitrary object, say *b*, and further
assume *R*^{+}(*a*,*b*). We then simply
have to show *Pb*. We do this by invoking Fact (7)
about *R*^{+} (in our subsection on the Weak Ancestral
in §4). Recall that Fact (7) is:

[Fx&R^{+}(x,y) &Her(F,R)] →Fy

This is a theorem of logic containing the free variables *x*,
*y*, and *F*. First, we instantiate *x* and
*y* to *a* and *b*, respectively. Then, we
instantiate *F* to the concept
[λ*z* *R*^{+}(*a*,*z*) &
*Pz*] and apply λ-Conversion (though Frege could simply
use his Rule of Substitution to achieve the same inference). The
concept being instantiated for *F* is the concept *member of
the R-series beginning with a and which falls under P*. The result
of instantiating the free variables in Fact (7) and then applying
λ-Conversion yields a rather long conditional, with numerous
conjuncts in the antecedent and the claim that *Pb* in the
consequent. Thus, if the antecedent can be established, the proof is
done. For those following along with pencil and paper, all of the
conjuncts in the antecedent are things we already know, with the
exception of the claim that
[λ*z* *R*^{+}(*a*,*z*)
&
*Pz*] is hereditary on *R*. However, this claim can be
established straightforwardly from things we know to be true (and, in
particular, from facts contained in the antecedent of the Principle we
are trying to prove, which we assumed as part of our conditional
proof). The reader is encouraged to complete the proof as an exercise.
For those who would like to check their work, we give the complete
Proof of the General Principle of Induction here.

Proof of the General Principle of Induction

Now to derive Principle of Mathematical Induction from the General
Principle of Induction, we formulate an instance of the latter by
setting *a* to 0 and *R* to *Precedes*:

[F0 &HerOn(F,^{0}Precedes^{+})] → ∀x[Precedes^{+}(0,x) →Fx]

When we expand the defined notation for *HerOn*, substitute the
notation *N**x* and *N**y* for
*Precedes*^{+}(0,*x*) and
*Precedes*^{+}(0,*y*), respectively, and then
employ our restricted quantifiers
∀*n*(…*n*…) and
∀*m*(…*m*…) for the claims of the
form ∀*y*(*N**y* →
…*y*…) and ∀*x*(*N**x*
→ …*x*…), respectively, the result is the
Principle of Mathematical Induction (in which the notation
*HerOn*(*F*,*N*) has been eliminated in terms of
its definiens).

### 5.5 Every Natural Number Has a Successor

Frege uses the Principle of Mathematical Induction to prove that every natural number has a natural number successor. We may formulate the theorem as follows:

Theorem 5:

∀x[Nx→ ∃y(Ny&Precedes(x,y))]

To reconstruct Frege's strategy for proving this theorem, recall that
the weak ancestral of the Predecessor relation, i.e.,
*Precedes*^{+}(*x*,*y*), can be read as:
*x* is a member of the predecessor-series ending with
*y*. Frege then considers the concept *member of the
predecessor-series ending with n*, i.e., [λ*z*
*Precedes*^{+}(*z*,*n*)], where *n*
is a natural number. Frege then shows, by induction, that every natural
number *n* precedes the number of the concept *member of the
predecessor-series ending with n*. That is, Frege proves that every
natural number has a successor by proving the following Lemma on Successors by
induction:

Lemma on Successors:

∀nPrecedes(n, #[λzPrecedes^{+}(z,n)])

This asserts that every natural number *n* precedes the number of
numbers in the predecessor series ending with *n*. Frege can
establish Theorem 5 by proving the Lemma on Successors and by showing
that the successor of a natural number is itself a natural number.

To see an intuitive picture of why the Lemma on Successors gives us
what we want, we may temporarily regard Precedes^{+} as the
relation ≤. (One can prove that Precedes^{+} has the
properties that ≤ has on the natural numbers.) Although we haven't
yet assigned any meaning to the numerals ‘1’ and
‘2’, the following intuitive sequence is driving Frege's
strategy:

0 precedes #[λzz≤ 0]

1 precedes #[λzz≤ 1]

2 precedes #[λzz≤ 2]

etc.

For example, the third member of this sequence is true because there
are 3 natural numbers (0, 1, and 2) that are less than or equal to 2;
so the number 2 precedes the number of numbers less than or equal to 2.
Frege's strategy is to show that the general claim, that *n*
precedes the number of numbers less than or equal to *n*, holds
for every natural number. So, given this intuitive understanding of the
Lemma on Successors, Frege has a good strategy for proving that every
number has a successor. (For the remainder of this subsection, the
reader may wish to continue to think of Precedes^{+} in terms
of ≤.)

Now to prove the Lemma on Successors by induction, we need to
reconfigure this Lemma to a form which can be used as the consequent
of the Principle of Mathematical Induction; i.e., we need something of
the form ∀*n Fn*. We can get the Lemma on
Successors into this form by ‘abstracting out’ a concept
from the Lemma using the right-to-left direction of
λ-Conversion (i.e., λ-Abstraction) to produce the
following equivalent statement of the Lemma:

∀n[λyPrecedes(y, #[λzPrecedes^{+}(z,y)])]n

The concept ‘abstracted out’ is the following:

[λyPrecedes(y, #[λzPrecedes^{+}(z,y)])]

This is the concept: *being an object y which precedes the
number of the concept: member of the predecessor series ending in
y*. Let us abbreviate the λ-expression that denotes this
concept as ‘*Q*’. Our strategy is to instantiate
the variable *F* in the Principle of Mathematical Induction
to *Q*. The result is therefore something that has been proved and that
we therefore know to be true:

Q0 &HerOn(Q,N) → ∀n Qn

Since the consequent is the reconfigured Lemma on Successors, Frege
can prove this Lemma by proving both that 0 falls under *Q*
(cf. **Gg I**, Theorem 154) and that *Q* is
hereditary on the natural numbers (cf. **Gg I**, Theorem
150):

Given this proof of the Lemma on Successors, Theorem 5 is not far away.
The Lemma on Successors shows that every number precedes some cardinal
number of the form *#F*. We still have to show that such
successor cardinals are natural numbers. That is, it still remains to
be shown that if a number *n* precedes something *y*,
then *y* is a natural number:

Successors of Natural Numbers are Natural Numbers:

∀n∀y(Precedes(n,y) →Ny)

Proof: Suppose thatPrecedes(n,a). Then, by definition, sincenis a natural number,Precedes^{+}(0,n). So by Fact (3) aboutR^{+}(in the subsection on the Weak Ancestral in §4), it follows thatPrecedes*(0,a), and so by the definition ofPrecedes^{+}, it follows thatPrecedes^{+}(0,a); i.e.,ais a natural number.

Theorem 5 now follows from the Lemma on Successors and the fact that successors of natural numbers are natural numbers. With the proof of Theorem 5, we have completed the proof of Frege's Theorem. Before we turn to the last section of this entry, it is worth mentioning the mathematical significance of this theorem.

### 5.6 Arithmetic

From Frege's Theorem, one can derive arithmetic. It is an immediate
consequence of the fact that Predecessor is a functional relation that
every number has a unique successor. That means we can define the
successor function by adding definite descriptions of the form
‘the *x* such that φ’ to our language:

n′ =_{df}thexsuch thatPrecedes(n,x)

We may then define the sequence of natural numbers succeeding 0 as follows:

1 = 0′

2 = 1′

3 = 2′

etc.

Moreover, the recursive definition of addition can now be given:

n+ 0 =n

n+m′ = (n+m)′

We may also officially define:

n<m=_{df}Precedes*(n,m)

n≤m=_{df}Precedes^{+}(n,m)

These definitions constitute the foundations of arithmetic. Frege
has thus insightfully derived the basic laws of arithmetic
from Hume's Principle in second-order logic. (Readers interested in
how these results are affected when Hume's Principle is combined
with *predicative* second-order logic should consult Linnebo
2004.)

## 6. Philosophical Questions Surrounding Frege's Theorem

Frege's Theorem is an elegant derivation of the basic laws of
arithmetic which can be carried out independently of the portion of
Frege's system which led to inconsistency. Frege himself never
identified “Frege's Theorem” as a
“result”. As previously noted, he attempted to derive
Hume's Principle from Basic Law V in **Gg**, but
once the contradiction became known to him, he never officially
retreated to the ‘fall-back’ position of claiming that the
proof of the Dedekind-Peano axioms from Hume's Principle alone
constituted an important result. One of several reasons why he didn't
adopt this fall-back position is that he didn't regard Hume's
Principle as a sufficiently general principle — he didn't
believe it was strong enough, from an epistemological point of view,
to help us answer the question, “How are numbers given to
us?”. We discuss the reasons for his attitude, among other
things, in what follows.

A discussion of the philosophical questions surrounding Frege's
Theorem should begin with some statement of how Frege conceived of his
own project when writing **Begr**, **Gl**,
and **Gg**. It seems clear that epistemological
considerations in part motivated Frege's work on the foundations of
mathematics. It is well documented that Frege had the following goal,
namely, to explain our knowledge of the basic laws of arithmetic by
giving an answer to the question “How are numbers
‘given’ to us?” without making an appeal to the
faculty of intuition. If Frege could show that the basic laws of
number theory are derivable from analytic truths of logic, then he
could argue that we need only appeal to the faculty of understanding
(as opposed to some faculty of intuition) to explain our knowledge of
the truths of arithmetic. Frege's goal then stands in contrast to the
Kantian view of the exact mathematical sciences, according to which
general principles of reasoning must be supplemented by a faculty of
intuition if we are to achieve mathematical knowledge. The Kantian
model here is that of geometry; Kant thought that our intuitions of
figures and constructions played an essential role in the
demonstrations of geometrical theorems. (In Frege's own time, the
achievements of Frege's contemporaries Pasch, Pieri and Hilbert showed
that such intuitions were not essential.)

### 6.1 Frege's Goals and Strategy in His Own Words

Frege's strategy then was to show that no appeal to intuition is required for the derivation of the theorems of number theory. This in turn required that he show that the latter are derivable using only rules of inference, axioms, and definitions that are purely analytic principles of logic. This view has become known as ‘Logicism’. Here is what Frege says:

[

Begr, Preface, p. 5:]

To prevent anything intuitive from penetrating here unnoticed, I had to bend every effort to keep the chain of inferences free of gaps. [from the Bauer-Mengelberg translation in van Heijenoort 1967][

Begr, Part III, §23:]

Through the present example, moreover, we see how pure thought, irrespective of any content given by the senses or even by an intuitiona priori, can, solely from the content that results from its own constitution, bring forth judgements that at first sight appear to be possible only on the basis of some intuition. … The propositions about sequences [R-series] in what follows far surpass in generality all those that can be derived from any intuition of sequences. [from the Bauer-Mengelberg translation in van Heijenoort 1967][

Gl, §62:]

How, then, are numbers to be given to us, if we cannot have any ideas or intuitions of them? Since it is only in the context of a proposition that words have any meaning, our problem becomes this: To define the sense of a proposition in which a number word occurs. [from the Austin translation in Frege 1974][

Gl, §87:]

I hope I may claim in the present work to have made it probable that the laws of arithmetic are analytic judgements and consequently a priori. Arithmetic thus becomes simply a development of logic, and every proposition of arithmetic a law of logic, albeit a derivative one. [from the Austin translation in Frege 1974][

Gg I, §0:]

In myGrundlagen der Arithmetik, I sought to make it plausible that arithmetic is a branch of logic and need not borrow any ground of proof whatever from either experience or intuition. In the present book, this shall be confirmed, by the derivation of the simplest laws of Numbers by logical means alone. [from the Furth translation in Frege 1967][

Gg II, Appendix:]

The prime problem of arithmetic is the question, In what way are we to conceive logical objects, in particular, numbers? By what means are we justified in recognizing numbers as objects? Even if this problem is not solved to the degree I thought it was when I wrote this volume, still I do not doubt that the way to the solution has been found. [from the Furth translation in Frege 1967]

### 6.2 The Basic Problem for Frege's Strategy

The basic problem for Frege's strategy, however, is that for his
logicist project to succeed, his system must at some point include
(either as an axiom or theorem) statements that explicitly assert the
existence of certain kinds of abstract entities and it is not obvious
how to justify the claim that we know such explicit existential
statements. Given the above discussion, it should be clear that Frege
at some point in **Gg** endorsed existence claims, either directly
in his formalism or in his metalanguage, for the following
entities:

- concepts (more generally, functions)
- extensions (more generally, courses-of-value or value-ranges)
- truth-values
- numbers

Although Frege attempted to reduce the latter two kinds of entities (truth-values and numbers) to extensions, the fact is that the existence of concepts and extensions are derivable from his Rule of Substitution and Basic Law V, respectively.

In light of these existence claims, a Kantian might well suggest not only that explicit existence claims are synthetic rather than analytic (i.e., aren't true in virtue of the meanings of the words involved) but also that since the Rule of Substitution and Basic Law V imply existence claims, Frege cannot claim that such principles are purely analytic principles of logic. If the Kantian is right, then some other faculty (such as intuition) might still be needed to account for our knowledge of the existence claims of arithmetic.

### 6.3 The Existence of Concepts

Boolos (1985) noted that the Rule of Substitution causes a problem of this kind for Frege's program given that it is equivalent the Comprehension Principle for Concepts. Boolos suggests a defense for Frege with respect to this particular aspect of his logic, namely, to reinterpret (by paraphrasing) the second-order quantifiers so as to avoid commitment to concepts. (See Boolos (1985) for the details.) Boolos's suggestion, however, is one which would require Frege to abandon his realist theory of concepts. Moreover, although Boolos' suggestion might lead us to an epistemological justification of the Comprehension Principle for Concepts, it doesn't do the same for the Comprehension Principle for Relations, for his reinterpretation of the quantifiers works only for the ‘monadic’ quantifiers (i.e., those ranging over concepts having one argument) and thus doesn't offer a paraphrase for quantification over relational concepts.

Another problem for a strategy of the type suggested by Boolos is that if the second-order quantifiers are interpreted so that they do not range over a separate domain of entities, then there is nothing appropriate to serve as the denotations of λ-expressions. Although Frege wouldn't quite put it this way, our reconstruction suggests that Frege treats open formulas with free object variables as if they denoted concepts. Although Frege doesn't use λ-notation, the use of such notation seems to be the most logically perspicuous way of reconstructing his work. The use of such notation faces the same epistemological puzzles that Frege's Rule of Substitution faces.

To see why, note that the Principle of λ-Conversion:

∀y([λxφ]y≡ φ(y/x))

seems to be an analytic truth of logic. It says this:

An objectyexemplifies the complex propertybeing an x such thatφ if and only ifyis anxsuch that φ

One might argue that this is true in virtue of the very meaning of
the λ-expression, the meaning of ≡, and the meaning of
the statement [λ*x* φ]*y* (which has the
form *Fx*). However, λ-Conversion also implies the
Comprehension Principle for Concepts, for the latter follows from the
former by existential generalization:

∃F∀y(Fy≡ φ(y/x))

The point here is that the fact that an existential claim is derivable
casts at least some doubt on the purely analytic status of
λ-Conversion. The question of how we obtain knowledge of such
principles is still an open question in philosophy. It is an important
question to address, since Frege's most insightful definitions are cast
using quantifiers ranging over concepts and relations (e.g., the
ancestrals of a relation) and it would be useful to have a
philosophical explanation of how such entities and the principles which
govern them become known to us. In contemporary philosophy, this
question is still poignant, since many philosophers do accept that
*properties* and *relations* of various sorts exist.
These entities are the contemporary analogues of Frege's concepts.

### 6.4 The Existence of Extensions

Though the existence of extensions falls right out of the theory of
identity (§2.3) once terms of the form ε*F* are
added to second-order logic, the existence of extensions that are
correlated 1–1 with concepts is a consequence of Basic Law
V. The question for Frege's project, then, is why should we accept as
a law of logic a statement that implies the existence of individuals
and a correlation of this kind? Frege recognized that Basic Law V's
status as a logical law could be doubted:

[Gg I, Preface, p. 3:]

A dispute can arise, so far as I can see, only with regard to my Basic Law concerning courses-of-values (V)… I hold that it is a law of pure logic. [from the Furth translation in Frege 1967]

Moreover, he thought that an appeal to extensions would answer one of the questions that motivated his work:

[Letter to Russell, July 28, 1902:]

I myself was long reluctant to recognize ranges of values and hence classes [sets]; but I saw no other possibility of placing arithmetic on a logical foundation. But the question is, How do we apprehend logical objects? And I have found no other answer to it than this, We apprehend them as extensions of concepts, or more generally, as ranges of values of functions. [from the Kaal translation in Frege 1980]

Now it is unclear why Frege thought that he could answer the
question posed here by saying that we apprehend numbers as the
extensions of concepts. He seems to think we can answer the obvious
next question “How do we apprehend extensions?” by saying
“by way of Basic Law V”.
His idea here seems to be that since Basic Law V is supposed to be
purely analytic or true in virtue of the meanings of its terms, we
apprehend a pair of extensions whenever we truly judge that concepts
*F* and *G* are materially equivalent. Of course, given
the necessarily false antecedent, it would be very difficult to argue
for the following counterfactual conditional: had Basic Law V been
consistent, it would have been analytic. Frege would have been
correct to argue in just this way (had Basic Law V been
consistent). But, as we shall see, some philosophers do argue that
certain *consistent* principles having the same logical form
as Basic Law V are analytic, and that such principles justify
*reference* to the entities described in the left-side condition
by grounding such reference in the *truth* of the right-side
condition.^{[13]}

Putting aside the inconsistency in Basic Law V, how exactly
would the claim that concepts *F* and *G* are materially
equivalent ground a claim that implies the existence of extensions?
Given Frege's view that Basic Law V is analytic, it seems that he must
hold that the right-side condition implies the corresponding left-side
condition as a matter of
meaning.^{[14]}
This view, however, runs up against the following argument. Suppose
the right hand condition implies the left-side condition as a matter of
meaning. That is, suppose that (R) implies (L) as a matter of
meaning:

(R) ∀x(Fx≡Gx)(L) ε

F= εG

Now note that (L) itself can be analyzed, from a logical point of
view. The expression ‘ε*F*’, though
constructed from a term-forming operator, is really a definite
description (‘the extension of *F*’) and so, using
Russell's theory of descriptions, (L) can be logically analyzed as the
claim:

There is an objectxand an objectysuch that:

(1)xis a unique extension ofF,

(2)yis a unique extension ofG, and

(3)x=y.

That is, for some defined or primitive notion
*Extension*(*x*,*F*) (‘*x* is an
extension of *F*’), (L) implies the analysis (D) as a
matter of meaning:

(D) ∃x∃y[Extension(x,F) & ∀z(Extension(z,F) →z=x) &

Extension(y,G) & ∀z(Extension(z,G) →z=y) &x=y]

But if (R) implies (L) as a matter of meaning, and (L) implies (D) as a
matter of meaning, then (R) implies (D) as a matter of meaning. This
seems doubtful. The material equivalence of *F* and *G*
does not imply the existence claim (D) as a matter of meaning, whatever
notion of meaning is involved. [This argument attempts to show why Va
(i.e., the right-to-left direction of Basic Law V) is not analytic.
Below, it will be adapted to show that the right-to-left direction of
Hume's Principle is not analytic. See Boolos 1997 (307–309), for
reasons why Vb and the left-to-right direction of Hume's Principle are
not analytic.]

The moral to be drawn here is that it is not exactly clear how the
right side of Basic Law V grounds a claim that implies the existence
of extensions, even assuming it were consistent. In the end, we may
need to justify our knowledge of existence claims for abstract objects
such as extensions *head on* rather try to justify them
indirectly, since an indirect justification seems to contain a
gap. Even if we follow Frege in conceiving of extensions as
‘logical objects’, the question remains as to how the very
claims that such objects exist can be true on logical or analytic
grounds alone. We might agree that there must be logical objects of
some sort if logic is to have a subject matter, but if Frege is to
achieve his goal of showing that our knowledge of arithmetic is free
of intuition, then at some point he has to address the question of
how, as a matter of meaning, existence claims can be analytic. We'll
return to this theme in the final subsection.

### 6.5 The Existence of Numbers and Truth-Values: The Julius Caesar Problem

Given that the proof of Frege's Theorem makes no appeal to Basic
Law V, some philosophers have argued Frege's best strategy for
producing an epistemologically-justified foundation for arithmetic is
to replace primitive terms like ε*F* with #*F*,
replace Basic Law V with Hume's Principle, and argue that Hume's
Principle is an analytic principle of
logic.^{[15]}
However, we have just seen one reason why such a strategy does not
suffice. The claim that Hume's Principle is an analytic principle of
logic is subject to the same problem just posed for Basic Law V. The
claim:

F≈G

does not, as a matter of meaning, imply:

#F= #G

if this latter claim is logically analyzable, as it seems to be, as the claim:

∃x∃y[Numbers(x,F) & ∀z(Numbers(z,F) →z=x) &

Numbers(y,G) & ∀z(Numbers(z,G) →z=y) &x=y]

Moreover, Frege had his own reasons for not replacing Basic Law V with Hume's Principle.

One reason was that he thought Hume's Principle offered no answer
to the epistemological question, ‘How do we grasp or apprehend
logical objects, such as the numbers?’. But Frege had another
reason for not substituting Hume's Principle for Basic Law V, namely,
that Hume's Principle would be subject to ‘the Julius Caesar
problem’. Frege first raises this problem in connection with an
inductive definition of ‘*n* = #*F*’ that he
tries out in **Gl**, §55. Concerning this
definition, Frege says:

[Gl, §55:]

… but we can never — to take a crude example — decide by means of our definitions whether any concept has the number Julius Caesar belonging to it, or whether that conqueror of Gaul is a number or is not. [from the Austin translation in Frege 1974]

Frege raises this same concern again for a contextual definition that
gives a ‘criterion of identity’ for the objects being
defined. In **Gl** §66, Frege considers the following
contextual definition of ‘the direction of line
*x*’:

The direction of linea= the direction of linebif and only ifais parallel tob.

With regard to this definition, Frege says:

[Gl, §66:]

It will not, for instance, decide for us whether England is the same as the direction of the Earth's axis— if I may be forgiven an example which looks nonsensical. Naturally no one is going to confuse England with the direction of the Earth's axis; but that is no thanks to our definition of direction. [from the Austin translation in Frege 1974]

Now trouble for Hume's Principle begins to arise when we recognize that
it is a contextual definition that has the same logical form as this
definition for directions. It is central to Frege's view that the
numbers are *objects*, and so he believes that it is incumbent
upon him to say *which* objects they are. But the ‘Julius
Caesar problem’ is that Hume's Principle, if considered as the
sole principle offering identity conditions for numbers, doesn't
describe the conditions under which an arbitrary object, say Julius
Caesar, is or is not to be identified with the number of planets. That
is, Hume's Principle doesn't define the condition
‘#*F*=*x*’, for arbitrary *x*. It only
offers identity conditions when *x* is an object we know to be a
cardinal number (for then *x*=#*G*, for some *G*,
and Hume's Principle tells us when #*F*=#*G*).

In **Gl**, Frege solves the problem by giving his
explicit definition of numbers in terms of extensions. (We described
this in §4 above.) Unfortunately, this is only a stopgap measure,
for when Frege later systematizes extensions in **Gg**,
Basic Law V has the same logical form as Hume's Principle and the above
contextual definition of directions. Frege is aware that the Julius
Caesar problem affects Basic Law V, though. In **Gg I**,
§10, Frege appears to raise the Julius Caesar problem for
extensions of concepts. With respect to Basic Law V, he says
(remembering that for Frege, ε binds object variables and
is not a function term):

[Gg I, §10:]

…this by no means fixes completely the denotation of a name like ‘ἐΦ(ε)’. We have only a means of always recognizing a course-of-values if it is designated by a name like ‘ἐΦ(ε)’, by which it is already recognizable as a course-of-values. But, we can neither decide, so far, whether an object is a course-of-values that is not given us as such … [from the Furth translation in Frege 1967]

In other words, Basic Law V does not tell us the conditions under which
an arbitrarily chosen object *x* may be identified with some
given extension, such as ε*F*.

Until recently, it was thought that Frege solved this problem in
§10 by restricting the universal quantifier ∀*x* of
his **Gg** system so that it ranges only over extensions.
If Frege could have successfully restricted this quantifier to
extensions, then when the question arises, whether (arbitrarily chosen)
object *x* is identical with ε*F*, one could
answer that *x* has to be the extension of some concept, say
*G* and that Basic Law V would then tell you the conditions
under which *x* is identical to ε*F*. On this
interpretation of §10, Frege is alleged to have restricted the
quantifiers when he identified the two truth values (The True and The
False) with the two extensions that contain just these objects as
members, respectively. By doing this, it was thought that all of the
objects in the range of his quantifier ∀*x* in
**Gg** become extensions which have been identified as
such, for the truth values were the only two objects of his system that
had not been introduced as extensions or courses of value.

However, recent work by Wehmeier (1999) suggests that, in §10,
Frege was not attempting to restrict the quantifiers of his system to
extensions (nor, more generally, to courses-of-values). The extensive
footnote to §10 indicates that Frege considered, but did not hold
much hope of, identifying every object in the domain with the extension
consisting of just that
object.^{[16]}
But, more importantly, Frege later considers cases (in
**Gg**, Sections 34 and 35) which seem to presuppose that
the domain contains objects which aren't extensions. (In these
sections, Frege considers what happens to the definition of
‘*x* is a member of *y*’ when *y* is
not an
extension.)^{[17]}

Even if Frege somehow could have successfully restricted the
quantifiers of **Gg** to avoid the Julius Caesar problem,
he would no longer have been able to extend his system to include names
of ordinary non-logical objects. For if he were to attempt to do so,
the question, “Under what conditions is ε*F* identical
with Julius Caesar?”, would then be legitimate but have no answer. That
means his logical system could not be used for the analysis of ordinary
language. But it was just the analysis of ordinary language that led
Frege to his insight that a statement of number is an assertion about a
concept.

### 6.6 Final Observations

Even when we replace the inconsistent Basic Law V with the powerful
Hume's Principle, Frege's work still leaves two questions unanswered:
(1) How do we know that numbers exist?, and (2) How do we precisely
specify which objects they are? The first question arises because
Hume's Principle doesn't seem to be a purely analytic truth of logic;
if neither Hume's Principle nor the existential claim that numbers
exist is analytically true, by what faculty do we come to know (the
truth of) the existential claim? The second question arises because
Frege's work offers no general condition under which we can identify
an arbitrarily chosen object *x* with a given number such as
the number of planets; how then can Frege claim to have precisely
specified which objects the numbers are within the domain of all
logical and non-logical objects? So questions about the very existence
and identity of numbers still plague Frege's work.

These two questions arise because of a limitation in the logical form
of these Fregean biconditional principles such as Hume's Principle and
Basic Law V. These contextual definitions combine two jobs which
modern logicians now typically accomplish with separate principles. A
properly reformulated theory of ‘logical’ objects should
have separate principles: (1) one or more principles which assert the
*existence* of logical objects, and (2) a separate identity
principle which asserts the conditions under which logical objects
are *identical*. The latter should specify identity conditions
for logical objects in terms of their most salient characteristic, one
which distinguishes them from other objects. Such an identity
principle would then be more specific than the global identity
principle for all objects (Leibniz's Law) which asserts that if
objects *x* and *y* fall under the same concepts, they
are identical.

By way of example, consider modern set theory. Zermelo set theory (Z) has several distinctive set existence principles. For example, consider the well-known Subset (or Separation) Axiom:

Subset (Separation) Axiom of Z:

∀x[Set(x) → ∃y[Set(y) & ∀z(z∈y≡ (z∈x& φ))]],

where φ is any formula in whichyisn't free

The Subset Axiom and the other set existence axioms in Z are distinct from Z's identity principle for sets:

Identity Principle for Sets:

Set(x) &Set(y) → [∀z(z∈x≡z∈y) →x=y]

Note that the second principle offers identity conditions in terms of
the most salient features of sets, namely, the fact that they, unlike
other objects, have members. The identity conditions for objects which
*aren't* sets, then, can be the standard principle that
identifies objects whenever they fall under the same concepts. This
leads us naturally to a very general principle of identity for any
objects whatever:

General Principle of Identity:

x=y=_{df}[Set(x) &Set(y) & ∀z(z∈x≡z∈y)] ∨

[¬Set(x) & ¬Set(y) & ∀F(Fx≡Fy)]

Now, if something is given to us *as a set* and we ask
whether it is identical with an arbitrarily chosen object *x*,
this specifies a clear condition that settles the matter. The only
questions that remain for the theory Z concern its existence
principle: Do we know that the Subset Axiom and other set existence
principles are true, and if so, how? The question of existence is thus
laid bare. We do not approach it by attempting to justify a principle
that implies the existence of sets via definite descriptions which we
don't yet know to be well-defined.

In some classic essays (1987 and 1986), Boolos appears to recommend
this very procedure of using separate existence and identity
principles. In those essays, he eschews the primitive mathematical
relation of set membership and suggests that Frege could formulate his
theory of numbers (‘Frege Arithmetic’) by using a single
*nonlogical* comprehension axiom which employs a special
instantiation relation that holds between a concept *G* and an
object *x* whenever, intuitively, *x* is an extension
consisting solely of concepts and *G* is a concept
‘in’ *x*. He calls this nonlogical axiom
‘Numbers’ and uses the notation
‘*G*η*x*’ to signify that *G* is
in *x*:

Numbers:

∀F∃!x∀G(Gηx≡G≈F)

[See Boolos 1987 (5), 1986 (140).] This principle asserts
that for any concept *F*, there is a unique object which
contains in it all and only those concepts *G* which are
equinumerous to *F*. Boolos then makes two observations: (1)
that Frege can then define #*F* as “the unique object *x*
such that for all concepts *G*, *G* is in *x* iff
*G* is equinumerous to *F*”, and (2) that Hume's
Principle is derivable from Numbers. [See Boolos 1986 (140).] Given
these observations, we know from our work in §§4 and 5 above
that Numbers suffices for the derivation of the basic laws of
arithmetic.

Since Boolos calls this principle ‘Numbers’, it is no
stretch to suppose that he would accept the following
reformulation (in which ‘*Number*(*x*)’ is an
undefined, primitive notion):

Numbers:

∀F∃!x[Number(x) & ∀G(Gηx≡G≈F)]

Though Boolos doesn't explicitly formulate an identity principle to complement Numbers, it seems clear that the following principle would offer identity conditions in terms of the most distinctive feature of numbers:

Identity Principle for Numbers:

Number(x) &Number(y) → [∀G(Gηx≡Gηy) →x=y]

It is then straightforward to formulate a general principle of identity, as we did in the case of the set theory Z:

General Principle of Identity:

x=y=_{df}[Number(x) &Number(y) & ∀F(Fηx≡Fηy)] ∨

[¬Number(x) & ¬Number(y) & ∀F(Fx≡Fy)]

This formulation of Frege Arithmetic, in terms of Numbers and the
General Principle of Identity, puts the Julius Caesar problem
(described above) into better perspective; the condition
‘#*F*=*x*’ is defined for arbitrary concepts
*F* and objects *x*. It openly faces the epistemological
questions head-on: Do we know that Numbers is true, and if so, how?
This is where philosophers need to concentrate their energies. [For a
reconstruction of Frege Arithmetic with a more general version of the
special instantiation relation η, see Zalta 1999.]

By replacing Fregean biconditionals such as Hume's Principle with separate existence and identity principles, we reduce two problems to one and and isolate the real problem for Fregean foundations of arithmetic, namely, the problem of giving an epistemological justification of distinctive existence claims (e.g., Numbers) for abstract objects of a certain kind. For anything like Frege's program to succeed, it must at some point assert (as an axiom or theorem) the existence of (logical) objects of some kind. Those separate existence claims should be the focus of attention. A theory of logical objects, if carried out without any mathematical primitives, might in fact be best understood as a theory where logic and metaphysics dovetail. A proper epistemology for such a theory should offer some epistemological justification of the separate existence claims that are axioms or theorems of that theory.

## Bibliography

### Primary Literature: Cited Works by Frege

- 1879,
*Begriffsschrift, eine der arithmetischen nachgebildete Formelsprache des reinen Denkens*, Halle a. S.: Louis Nebert; translation by S. Bauer Mengelberg as*Concept Notation: A formula language of pure thought, modelled upon that of arithmetic*, in J. van Heijenoort,*From Frege to Gödel: A Sourcebook in Mathematical Logic, 1879–1931*, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press - 1884,
*Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik: eine logisch-mathematische Untersuchung über den Begriff der Zahl*, Breslau: w. Koebner; translated by J. L. Austin as*The Foundations of Arithmetic: A Logic-Mathematical Enquiry into the Concept of Number*, Oxford: Blackwell, second revised edition, 1974. - 1892, ‘Über Begriff und Gegenstand’, in
*Vierteljahresschrift für wissenschaftliche Philosophie*, 16: 192–205; translated as ‘Concept and Object,’ by P. Geach in*Translations from the Philosophical Writings of Gottlob Frege*, P. Geach and M. Black (eds. and trans.), Oxford: Blackwell, third edition, 1980. - 1893/1903,
*Grundgesetze der Arithmetik*, Band I/II, Jena: Verlag Herman Pohle; partial translation by M. Furth as*The Basic Laws of Arithmetic*, Berkeley: U. California Press, 1964. - 1967,
*The Basic Laws of Arithmetic*, M. Furth (trans.), Berkeley: University of California. - 1974,
*The Foundations of Arithmetic*, J. L. Austin (trans.), Oxford: Basil Blackwell. - 1980,
*Philosophical and Mathematical Correspondence*, G. Gabriel, H. Hermes, F. Kambartel, C. Thiel, and A. Veraart (eds. of the German edition), abridged from the German edition by Brian McGuinness, translated by Hans Kaal, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.

### Secondary Literature

- Anderson, D., and Zalta, E., 2004, ‘Frege, Boolos, and
Logical Objects’,
*J. Philosophical Logic*, 33 (1): 1–26. - Antonelli, A., and May, R., 2005, ‘Frege's Other
Program’,
*Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic*, 46 (1): 1–17. [Available online in PDF.] - Beaney, M., 1997,
*The Frege Reader*, Oxford: Blackwell. - Bell, J. L., 1995, ‘Type-Reducing Correspondences and
Well-Orderings: Frege's and Zermelo's Construction Re-examined’,
*Journal of Symbolic Logic*, 60: 209–221. - –––, 1999, ‘Frege's Theorem in a Constructive
Setting’,
*Journal of Symbolic Logic*, 64 (2): 486–488. - –––, 1994, ‘Fregean Extensions of First-Order
Theories’,
*Mathematical Logic Quarterly*, 40: 27–30; reprinted in Demopoulos 1995, 432–437. - Boolos, G., 1985, ‘Reading the
*Begriffsschrift*’,*Mind*, 94: 331–344; reprinted in Boolos (1998): 155–170. [Page references are to the reprint.] - –––, 1986, ‘Saving Frege From
Contradiction’, in
*Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society*, 87 (1986/1987): 137–151; reprinted in Boolos (1998): 171–182. [Page references are to the original.] - –––, 1987, ‘The Consistency of
Frege's
*Foundations of Arithmetic*’, in*On Being and Saying*, J. J. Thomson (ed.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, pp. 3–20; reprinted in Boolos (1998): 183–201. [Page references are to the original.] - –––, 1990, ‘The Standard of Equality of
Numbers’, in
*Meaning and Method: Essays in Honor of Hilary Putnam*, G. Boolos (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 261–277; reprinted in Boolos (1998): 202–219. [Page references are to the original.] - –––, 1993, ‘Whence the Contradiction?’, in
*Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume*, 67: 213–233; reprinted in Boolos (1998): 220–236. - –––, 1994, ‘The Advantages of Honest Toil
Over Theft’, in
*Mathematics and Mind*, Alexander George (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 27–44; reprinted in Boolos (1998): 255–274. - –––, 1997, ‘Is Hume's Principle Analytic?’, in Heck (ed.) 1997, 245–262; reprinted in Boolos (1998): 301–314. [Page references are to the reprint.]
- –––, 1998,
*Logic, Logic, and Logic*, J. Burgess and R. Jeffrey (eds.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press. - Burgess, J., 1984, ‘Review of Wright (1983)’,
*The Philosophical Review*, 93: 638–40. - –––, 1998, ‘On a Consistent Subsystem of
Frege's
*Grundgesetze*’,*Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic*, 39: 274–278. - –––, 2005,
*Fixing Frege*, Princeton: Princeton University Press. - Demopoulos, W., 1998, ‘The Philosophical Basis of Our
Knowledge of Number’,
*Noûs*, 32: 481–503. - Demopoulos, W., (ed.), 1995,
*Frege's Philosophy of Mathematics*, Cambridge: Harvard University Press. - Demopoulos, W., and Clark, P., 2005, ‘The Logicism of
Frege, Dedekind and Russell’, in
*Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Mathematics and Logic*, S. Shapiro (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 129–165. - Dummett, M., 1991,
*Frege: Philosophy of Mathematics*, Cambridge: Harvard University Press. - –––, 1997, ‘Neo-Fregeans: In Bad Company?’, in Schirn (1997).
- Ferreira, F., 2005, ‘Amending Frege's
*Grundgesetze der Arithmetik*’,*Synthese*, 147: 3–19. - Ferreira, F., and K. Wehmeier, 2002, ‘On the Consistency of
the Δ11-CA Fragment of
Frege's
*Grundgesetze*,*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 31: 303–311. - Field, H., 1984, ‘Critical Notice of Crispin Wright:
*Frege's Conception of Numbers as Objects*’,*Canadian Journal of Philosophy*, 14: 637–632; reprinted under the title ‘Platonism for Cheap? Crispin Wright on Frege's Context Principle’ in H. Field,*Realism, Mathematics, and Modality*, Oxford: Blackwell, 1989, pp. 147–170. - Fine, K., 2002,
*The Limits of Abstraction*, Oxford: Clarendon Press. - Furth, M., 1967, ‘Editor's Introduction’, in G. Frege,
*The Basic Laws of Arithmetic*, M. Furth (translator and editor), Berkeley: University of California Press, pp. v–lvii. - Geach, P., 1976, “Critical Notice”,
*Mind*, 85 (339): 436–449. - –––, 1955, “Class and Concept”,
*Philosophical Review*, 64: 561–570. - Goldfarb, W., 2001, ‘First-Order Frege Theory is
Undecidable’,
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 30: 613–616. - Hale, B., 1994, ‘Dummett's Critique of Wright's Attempt to
Resuscitate Frege’,
*Philosophia Mathematica*, (Series III), 2: 122–147. - Hazen, A., 1985, ‘Review of Crispin Wright's
*Frege's Conception of Numbers as Objects*’,*Australasian Journal of Philosophy*, 63 (2): 251–254. - Heck, Jr., R., 2012,
*Reading Frege's*Grundgesetze, Oxford: Clarendon Press. - –––, 2011,
*Frege's Theorem*, Oxford: Clarendon Press. - –––, 1999, ‘Grundgesetze der Arithmetik I,
§10’,
*Philosophia Mathematica*, 7: 258–292. - –––, 1997, ‘The Julius Caesar Objection’, in Heck (ed.) 1997, 273–308.
- –––, 1996, ‘The Consistency of Predicative
Fragments of Frege's
*Grundgesetze der Arithmetik*’,*History and Philosophy of Logic*, 17: 209–220. - –––, 1993, ‘The Development of Arithmetic
in Frege's
*Grundgesetze der Arithmetik*’,*Journal of Symbolic Logic*, 58 (2): 579–600; reprinted in Demopoulos (1995). - Heck, R. (ed.), 1997,
*Language, Thought, and Logic: Essays in Honour of Michael Dummett*, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1997. - Hodes, H., 1984, “Logicism and the Ontological
Commitments of Arithmetic,”
*Journal of Philosophy*, 81 (3): 123–149. - Linnebo, Ø., 2004, ‘Predicative Fragments of Frege
Arithmetic’,
*The Bulletin of Symbolic Logic*, 10 (2): 153–174. - MacBride, F., 2003, ‘Speaking with Shadows: A Study of
Neo-Logicism’,
*British Journal for the Philosophy of Science*, 54: 103–163. - MacFarlane, J., 2002, ‘Frege, Kant, and the Logic in
Logicism’,
*The Philosophical Review*, 111: 25–65. - May, R., and Wehmeier, forthcoming, ‘The Proof of Hume's
Principle’, P. Ebert and M. Rossberg (eds.),
*A Companion to Frege's*Grundgesetze, Oxford: Oxford University Press. - Parsons, C., 1965, ‘Frege's Theory of Number’,
*Philosophy in America*, M. Black (ed.), Ithaca: Cornell University Press, pp. 180–203; reprinted with Postscript in Demopoulos (1995), pp. 182–210. - Parsons, T., 1987, ‘The Consistency of the First-Order
Portion of Frege's Logical System’,
*Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic*, 28: 161–68. - Pelletier, F.J., 2001, ‘Did Frege Believe Frege's Principle’,
*Journal of Logic, Language, and Information*, 10 (1): 87–114. - Quine, W.V.O., 1995, ‘On Frege's Way Out’, in
*Selected Logical Papers*(enlarged edition), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press. - Reck, E., and Awodey, S. (trans./eds.), 2004,
*Frege's Lectures on Logic: Carnap's Student Notes, 1910–1914*, Chicago and La Salle, IL: Open Court. - Resnik, M., 1980,
*Frege and the Philosophy of Mathematics*, Ithaca: Cornell University Press. - Rosen, G., 1993, ‘The Refutation of Nominalism(?)’,
*Philosophical Topics*, 21 (2): 149–186 - Ruffino, M., 2003, ‘Why Frege Would Not Be A
Neo-Fregean’,
*Mind*, 112 (445): 51–78. - Schirn, M., (ed.), 1997,
*Philosophy of Mathematics Today*, Oxford: Oxford University Press. - Schroeder-Heister, P., 1987, ‘A model-theoretic
reconstruction of Frege's Permutation Argument’,
*Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic*, 28 (1): 69–79. - Sullivan, P. and Potter, M., 1997, ‘Hale on Caesar’,
*Philosophia Mathematica*(Series III), 5: 135–152. - Tabata, H., 2000, ‘Frege's Theorem and His Logicism’,
*History and Philosophy of Logic*, 21 (4): 265–295. - van Heijenoort, J., 1967, ed.,
*From Frege to Gödel: A Sourcebook in Mathematical Logic*, Cambridge: Harvard University Press. - Wehmeier, K., 1999, ‘Consistent Fragments of
*Grundgesetze*and the Existence of Non-Logical Objects’,*Synthese*, 121: 309–328. - Whitehead, A. N. and Russell, B., 1912,
*Principia Mathematica Vol. II*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Wright, C., 1983,
*Frege's Conception of Numbers as Objects*, Aberdeen: Aberdeen University Press. - –––, 1997a, ‘Response to Dummett’, in Schirn (1997).
- –––, 1997b, ‘On the Philosophical Significance of Frege's Theorem’, in Heck (ed.) 1997, 201–244.
- Zalta, E., 1999, ‘Natural Numbers and Natural Cardinals as
Abstract Objects: A Partial Reconstruction of Frege's
*Grundgesetze*in Object Theory’,*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 28 (6): 619–660.

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## Other Internet Resources

- Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik, original German text (maintained by Alain Blachair, Académie de Nancy-Metz)
- Grundgesetze der Arithmetik, original German text at GoogleBooks.

## Related Entries

Frege, Gottlob |
Frege, Gottlob: controversy with Hilbert |
*Principia Mathematica* |
Russell, Bertrand |
Russell's paradox

### Acknowledgments

I was motivated to write the present entry after reading an early
draft of an essay by William Demopoulos. (The draft was eventually
published as Demopoulos and Clark 2005.) Demopoulos kindly allowed me
to quote certain passages from that early draft in the footnotes to
the present entry. I am also indebted to Roberto Torretti, who
carefully read this piece and identified numerous infelicities; to
Franz Fritsche, who noticed a quantifier transposition error in Fact 2
about the strong ancestral, to Seyed N. Mousavian, who noticed some
typographical errors in some formulas; to Xu Mingming, who noticed
that Fact 8 about the Weak Ancestral (Section 4, subsection “The
Weak Ancestral of *R*”) was missing an important
condition (namely, that *R* must be 1–1); and to Paul
Pietroski, who noticed an infelicity in the first statement of the
principle of induction in Section 4. I am indebted to Kai Wehmeier,
who (a) reminded me that, strictly speaking, the result of replacing
Basic Law V by Hume's Principle in Frege's system does not result in a
subsystem of the original until we replace the primitive notion
“the course of values of the function ƒ” with the
primitive notion “the number of
*F*s”, and (b) refereed the July 2013 update to this
entry and developed numerous, insightful suggestions for
improvement. Finally, I am indebted to Jerzy Hanusek for pointing out
that Existence of Extensions principle can be derived more simply in
Frege's system directly from the classical logic of identity.