Principia Mathematica

First published Tue May 21, 1996; substantive revision Tue Dec 3, 2013

Principia Mathematica, the landmark work in formal logic written by Alfred North Whitehead and Bertrand Russell, was first published in three volumes in 1910, 1912 and 1913. A second edition appeared in 1925 (Volume 1) and 1927 (Volumes 2 and 3). In 1962 an abbreviated issue (containing only the first 56 chapters) appeared in paperback. In 2011 a digest of the book's main definitions and theorems, originally transcribed by Russell for Rudolf Carnap, was reprinted in The Evolution of Principia Mathematica, edited by Bernard Linsky.

Written as a defense of logicism (the thesis that mathematics is in some significant sense reducible to logic), the book was instrumental in developing and popularizing modern mathematical logic. It also served as a major impetus for research in the foundations of mathematics throughout the twentieth century. Along with Aristotle's Organon and Gottlob Frege's Grundgesetze der Arithmetik, it remains one of the most influential books on logic ever written.


1. History of Principia Mathematica

Logicism is the view that (some or all of) mathematics can be reduced to (formal) logic. It is often explained as a two-part thesis. First, it consists of the claim that all mathematical truths can be translated into logical truths or, in other words, that the vocabulary of mathematics constitutes a proper subset of the vocabulary of logic. Second, it consists of the claim that all mathematical proofs can be recast as logical proofs or, in other words, that the theorems of mathematics constitute a proper subset of the theorems of logic. As Russell writes, it is the logicist's goal “to show that all pure mathematics follows from purely logical premises and uses only concepts definable in logical terms” (1959, 74).

The logicist thesis appears to have been first advocated in the late seventeenth century by Gottfried Leibniz. Later, the idea was defended in much greater detail by Gottlob Frege. During the critical movement of the 1820s, mathematicians such as Bernard Bolzano, Niels Abel, Louis Cauchy and Karl Weierstrass succeeded in eliminating much of the vagueness and many of the contradictions present in the mathematics of their day. By the mid- to late-1800s, William Hamilton had gone on to introduce ordered couples of reals as the first step in supplying a logical basis for the complex numbers and Karl Weierstrass, Richard Dedekind and Georg Cantor had all developed methods for founding the irrationals in terms of the rationals. Using work done by H.G. Grassmann and Richard Dedekind, Guiseppe Peano had then gone on to develop a theory of the rationals based on his now famous axioms for the natural numbers. By Frege's day, it was thus generally recognized that large parts of mathematics could be derived from a relatively small set of primitive notions.

Even so, it was not until 1879, when Frege developed the necessary logical apparatus, that logicism could finally be said to have become technically plausible. After another five years' work, Frege arrived at the definitions necessary for logicising arithmetic and during the 1890s he worked on many of the essential derivations. However, with the discovery of paradoxes such as Russell's paradox at the turn of the century, it appeared that additional resources would need to be developed if logicism were to succeed.

By 1902, both Whitehead and Russell had reached this same conclusion. Both men were in the initial stages of preparing second volumes to their earlier books on related topics: Whitehead's 1898 A Treatise on Universal Algebra and Russell's 1903 The Principles of Mathematics. Since their research overlapped considerably, they began collaborating on what would eventually become Principia Mathematica. By agreement, Russell worked primarily on the philosophical parts of the project, including the book's philosophically rich Introduction, the theory of descriptions, and the no-class theory (in which set or class terms become meaningful only when placed in well-defined contexts), all of which can still be read fruitfully even by non-specialists. The two men then collaborated on the technical derivations. As Russell writes,

As for the mathematical problems, Whitehead invented most of the notation, except in so far as it was taken over from Peano; I did most of the work concerned with series and Whitehead did most of the rest. But this only applies to first drafts. Every part was done three times over. When one of us had produced a first draft, he would send it to the other, who would usually modify it considerably. After which, the one who had made the first draft would put it into final form. There is hardly a line in all the three volumes which is not a joint product. (1959, 74)

Initially, it was thought that the project might take a year to complete. Unfortunately, after almost a decade of difficult work on the part of the two men, Cambridge University Press concluded that publishing Principia would result in an estimated loss of 600 pounds. Although the press agreed to assume half this amount and the Royal Society agreed to donate another 200 pounds, this still left a 100-pound deficit. Only by each contributing 50 pounds were the authors able to see their work through to publication (Whitehead, Russell and James, 1910).

Publication itself involved the enormous job of type-setting all three volumes by hand. In 1911, the printing of the second volume was interrupted when Whitehead discovered a difficulty with the symbolism. The result was the insertion (on roman numeral pages) of a long “Prefatory Statement of Symbolic Conventions” at the beginning of Volume 2.

Today there is not a major academic library anywhere in the world that does not possess a copy of this landmark publication.

2. Significance of Principia Mathematica

Achieving Principia's main goal proved to be a challenge. Primarily at issue were the kinds of assumptions Whitehead and Russell needed to complete their project. Although Principia succeeded in providing detailed derivations of many major theorems in finite and transfinite arithmetic, set theory, and elementary measure theory, two axioms in particular were arguably non-logical in character: the axiom of infinity and the axiom of reducibility. The axiom of infinity in effect states that there exists an infinite number of objects. Arguably it makes the kind of assumption generally thought to be empirical rather than logical in nature. The axiom of reducibility was introduced as a means of overcoming the not completely satisfactory effects of the theory of types, the mechanism Russell and Whitehead used to restrict the notion of a well-formed expression, thereby avoiding Russell's paradox. Although technically feasible, many critics concluded that the axiom was simply too ad hoc to be justified philosophically. Kanamori sums up the sentiment of many readers: “In traumatic reaction to his paradox Russell had built a complex system of orders and types only to collapse it with his Axiom of Reducibility, a fearful symmetry imposed by an artful dodger” (2009, 411). In the minds of many, the issue of whether mathematics could be reduced to logic, or whether it could be reduced only to set theory, thus remained open.

In response, Whitehead and Russell argued that both axioms were defensible on inductive grounds. As they tell us in the Introduction to the first volume of Principia,

self-evidence is never more than a part of the reason for accepting an axiom, and is never indispensable. The reason for accepting an axiom, as for accepting any other proposition, is always largely inductive, namely that many propositions which are nearly indubitable can be deduced from it, and that no equally plausible way is known by which these propositions could be true if the axiom were false, and nothing which is probably false can be deduced from it. If the axiom is apparently self-evident, that only means, practically, that it is nearly indubitable; for things have been thought to be self-evident and have yet turned out to be false. And if the axiom itself is nearly indubitable, that merely adds to the inductive evidence derived from the fact that its consequences are nearly indubitable: it does not provide new evidence of a radically different kind. Infallibility is never attainable, and therefore some element of doubt should always attach to every axiom and to all its consequences. In formal logic, the element of doubt is less than in most sciences, but it is not absent, as appears from the fact that the paradoxes followed from premisses which were not previously known to require limitations. (1910, 2nd edn 59)

Whitehead and Russell were also disappointed by the the book's largely indifferent reception on the part of many working mathematicians. As Russell writes,

Both Whitehead and I were disappointed that Principia Mathematica was only viewed from a philosophical standpoint. People were interested in what was said about the contradictions and in the question whether ordinary mathematics had been validly deduced from purely logical premisses, but they were not interested in the mathematical techniques developed in the course of the work. ... Even those who were working on exactly the same subjects did not think it worth while to find out what Principia Mathematica had to say on them. I will give two illustrations: Mathematische Annalen published about ten years after the publication of Principia a long article giving some of the results which (unknown to the author) we had worked out in Part IV of our book. This article fell into certain inaccuracies which we had avoided, but contained nothing valid which we had not already published. The author was obviously totally unaware that he had been anticipated. The second example occurred when I was a colleague of Reichenbach at the University of California. He told me that he had invented an extension of mathematical induction which he called 'transfinite induction'. I told him that this subject was fully treated in the third volume of the Principia. When I saw him a week later, he told me that he had verified this. (1959, 86)

Despite such concerns, Principia Mathematica proved to be remarkably influential in at least three ways. First, it popularized modern mathematical logic to an extent undreamt of by its authors. By using a notation superior to that used by Frege, Whitehead and Russell managed to convey the remarkable expressive power of modern predicate logic in a way that previous writers had been unable to achieve. Second, by exhibiting so clearly the deductive power of the new logic, Whitehead and Russell were able to show how powerful the idea of a modern formal system could be, thus opening up new work in what soon was to be called metalogic. Third, Principia Mathematica re-affirmed clear and interesting connections between logicism and two of the main branches of traditional philosophy, namely metaphysics and epistemology, thereby initiating new and interesting work in both of these areas.

As a result, not only did Principia introduce a wide range of philosophically rich notions (including propositional function, logical construction, and type theory), it also set the stage for the discovery of crucial metatheoretic results (including those of Kurt Gödel, Alonzo Church, Alan Turing and others). Just as importantly, it initiated a tradition of common technical work in fields as diverse as philosophy, mathematics, linguistics, economics and computer science.

Today a lack of agreement remains over the ultimate philosophical contribution of Principia, with some authors holding that, with the appropriate modifications, logicism remains a feasible project. Others hold that the philosophical and technical underpinnings of the project remain too weak or too confused to be of great use to the logicist. (For more detailed discussion, readers should consult Quine (1966a), Quine (1966b), Landini (1998), Landini (2011), Linsky (1999), Linsky (2011), Hale and Wright (2001), Burgess (2005), Hintikka (2009) and Gandon (2012).)

There is also lack of agreement over the importance of the second edition of the book, which appeared in 1925 (Volume 1) and 1927 (Volumes 2 and 3). The revisions were done by Russell, although Whitehead was given the opportunity to advise. In addition to the correction of minor errors throughout the original text, changes to the new edition included the inclusion of a new Introduction and three new appendices. (The appendices discuss the theory of quantification, mathematical induction and the axiom of reducibility, and the principle of extensionality respectively.) The book itself was reset more compactly, making page references to the first edition obsolete. Russell continued to make corrections as late as 1949 for the 1950 printing, the year he and Mrs Whitehead finally began to receive royalties.

Today there is still debate over the ultimate value, or even the correct interpretation, of some of the revisions, revisions that were motivated in large part by the work of some of Russell's brightest students, including Ludwig Wittgenstein and Frank Ramsey. Appendix B has been notoriously problematic. The appendix purports to show how mathematical induction can be justified without use of the axiom of reducibility; but as Alasdair Urquhart reports,

The first indication that something was seriously wrong appeared in Gödel's well known essay of 1944, “Russell's Mathematical Logic.” There, Gödel points out that line (3) of the demonstration of Russell's proposition *89.16 is an elementary logical blunder, while the crucial *89.12 also appears to be highly questionable. It still remained to be seen whether anything of Russell's proof could be salvaged, in spite of the errors, but John Myhill provided strong evidence of a negative verdict by providing a model-theoretic proof in 1974 that no such proof as Russell's can be given in the ramified theory of types without the axiom of reducibility. (Urquhart 2012)

Linsky (2011) provides helpful discussion, both of the Appendix itself and of the suggestion that by 1925 Russell may have been out of touch with recent developments in the quickly changing field of mathematical logic. He also addresses the suggestion, made by some commentators, that Whitehead may have been opposed to the revisions, or at least indifferent to them, concluding that both charges are likely without foundation. (Whitehead's own comments, published in 1926 in Mind, shed little light on the issue.)

3. Contents of Principia Mathematica

Principia Mathematica originally appeared in three volumes. Images of the title page of the first volume of the first edition and of the cover of the first paperback issue may be seen here:

  • Title page of the first edition of Principia Mathematica, Volume 1 (1910)
  • Cover of the first paperback issue of Principia Mathematica to *56 (1962).

Together the three volumes are divided into six parts. Volume 1 begins with a lengthy Introduction containing sections entitled

  • “Preliminary Explanations of Ideas and Notations,”
  • “The Theory of Logical Types,” and
  • “Incomplete Symbols.”

It also contains Part I, “Mathematical Logic,” which contains sections on

  • “The Theory of Deduction,”
  • “Theory of Apparent Variables,”
  • “Classes and Relations,”
  • “Logic of Relations,” and
  • “Products and Sums of Classes”,

and Part II, “Prolegomena to Cardinal Arithmetic”, which includes sections on

  • “Unit Classes and Couples,”
  • “Sub-Classes, Sub-Relations, and Relative Types,”
  • “One-Many, Many-One and One-One Relations,”
  • “Selections,” and
  • “Inductive Relations.”

Volume 2 begins with a “Prefatory Statement of Symbolic Conventions.” It then continues with Part III, “Cardinal Arithmetic,” which itself contains sections on

  • “Definition and Logical Properties of Cardinal Numbers,”
  • “Addition, Multiplication and Exponentiation,” and
  • “Finite and Infinite”.

It also includes Part IV, “Relation-Arithmetic”, which has sections on

  • “Ordinal Similarity and Relation-Numbers,”
  • “Addition of Relations, and the Product of Two Relations,”
  • “The Principle of First Differences, and the Multiplication and Exponentiation of Relations,” and
  • “Arithmetic of Relation-Numbers”;

and the first half of Part V, “Series”, which has sections on

  • “General Theory of Series,”
  • “On Sections, Segments, Stretches, and Derivatives,” and
  • “On Convergence, and the Limits of Functions.”

Volume 3 continues Part V, with sections on

  • “Well-Ordered Series,”
  • “Finite and Infinite Series and Ordinals,” and
  • “Compact Series, Rational Series, and Continuous Series.”

It also contains Part VI, “Quantity”, which includes sections on

  • “Generalization of Number,”
  • “Vector-Families,”
  • “Measurement,” and
  • “Cyclic Families.”

A fourth volume on geometry was begun but never completed (Russell 1959, 99).

Overall, the three volumes not only represent a major leap forward with regard to modern logic, they are also rich in early twentieth-century mathematical developments. To give one example, Whitehead and Russell were the first to define a series as a set of terms having the properties of being asymmetrical, transitive and connected (1912, 2nd edn, 497). To give another, it is in Principia that we find the first detailed development of a generalized version of Cantor's transfinite ordinals, which the authors call “relation-numbers.” The resulting “relation-arithmetic” in turn led to significant improvements in our understanding of the general notion of structure (1912, Part IV).

As T.S. Eliot points out, the book also did a great deal to promote clarity in the use of ordinary language in the early part of the twentieth century:

how much the work of logicians has done to make of English a language in which it is possible to think clearly and exactly on any subject. The Principia Mathematica are perhaps a greater contribution to our language than they are to mathematics (1927, 291)

The book is also not without some self-deprecating humour. As Blackwell points out (2011, 158, 160), the authors twice poke fun at the length and tedium of the project's many logical derivations. In Volume 1, the authors explain that one cannot list all the non-intensional functions of φ!zˆ “because life is too short” (1910, 2nd edn 73); and in Volume 3, after over 1,800 pages of dense symbolism, the authors end Part IV, Section D, on Cyclic Families, with the comment,

We have given proofs rather shortly in this Section, particularly in the case of purely arithmetical lemmas, of which the proofs are perfectly straightforward, but tedious if written out at length. (1913, 2nd edn 461)

Evidence that the humour originates more with Russell than with Whitehead is perhaps found in not dissimilar remarks that appear in Russell's other writings. Russell's comment when discussing the axiom of choice, to the effect that given a collection of sets, it is possible to “pick out a representative arbitrarily from each of them, as is done in a General Election” (1959, 92), is perhaps a case in point.

Contemporary readers (i.e., those who have learned logic in the last few decades of the twentieth century or later) will find the book's notation somewhat antiquated. Readers wanting assistance are advised to consult the Notation in Principia Mathematica entry in this encyclopedia. Even so, the book remains one of the great scientific documents of the twentieth century.

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Frege, Gottlob | frege-logic | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm | logic: classical | logicism and neologicism | Principia Mathematica: notation in | propositional function | Russell, Bertrand | Russell's paradox | type theory | Whitehead, Alfred North

Acknowledgments

Thanks are due to Kenneth Blackwell, Fred Kroon, Bernie Linsky, Jim Robinson and several anonymous referees for their helpful comments on earlier versions of this material.

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Andrew David Irvine

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