Philosophy in Mexico

First published Wed Jan 20, 2016

Mexican philosophy has received the influence of different traditions of thought. These sources have been combined and transformed according to the specific problems and circumstances of Mexican life. The result has been a rich and original tradition of thought of over five centuries that, together with Peruvian philosophy, is the oldest of the Americas.

Mexican philosophy has been concerned with all sorts of theoretical questions, however, it could be characterized by its peculiar interest in ethical and political issues. The theme of the nature of man and of reason and its connection to the realms of power and domination has been a central line of thought of Mexican philosophy, from the early reflections about the justification of the Spanish conquest to the recent debates about the demands of a democratic reform or the Indian insurgence in Chiapas. The criticism of philosophical eurocentrism has been another central feature of Mexican philosophy due to its links to some of the main political events of Mexican history, such as the Conquest, the Independence and the Revolution..

The Bibliography includes all the books and articles mentioned in this article and a selection of secondary bibliography in English.

1. Some Metaphilosophical Questions

A common feature of Latin American philosophy is that it has raised metaphilosophical questions about its originality and peculiarity (see the related entry on Latin American philosophy). In that vein, it is often claimed that philosophy in Mexico is not the same as Mexican philosophy.

Philosophy in México has a long and distinguished history, but some experts maintain that we cannot speak of a Mexican philosophy, that is, of a tradition of philosophy that is defined on account of the originality of its discussions and propositions, of the soundness of its doctrines or schools of thought, or of the characteristic features of its style or terminology. Other experts consider that there are certain thematic similarities that underlie philosophy in Mexico, and even some original philosophical concepts that allow us to speak of an authentic tradition of Mexican philosophy. Others believe that although a Mexican philosophy is not yet a reality, if more work is done to consolidate its tradition and community, in a near future we would be able to speak of a genuine Mexican philosophy.

However, not all Mexican philosophers today think that developing a distinctive Mexican philosophy is a worthy task. Some claim that philosophy in the 21st century has left behind the stage of national philosophies. Roger Bartra has coined the concept of a post-Mexican condition (see Bartra 2002) and in the same guise we could talk of a post-Mexican philosophy, that is, of a philosophy made in Mexico that has nothing to do with Mexican culture.

On the other hand, the recent links between Mexican philosophy and Latino/a philosophy in the United States might motivate us to consider the beginning of something like a trans-Mexican philosophy that goes beyond geographical borders. What I call here trans-Mexican philosophy should not be confused with a proper Mexican-American or Chicano/a philosophy, although it might have strong links to it.

I will not consider these metaphilosophical issues here (see the related entry on Latin American philosophy: metaphilosophical foundations). My only concern will be to provide a sketch of the history of Mexican philosophy.

A problem for the study of Mexican philosophy in the United States so far has been the scarcity of translations of its main works. However, a group of scholars are working in new translations that will be available soon (see 20th century Mexican philosophy in Other Internet Resources). It is foreseeable that with the increase of Mexican-American and Latino students in North American universities, the demand for more information about Mexican philosophy will increase in the near future (one example of this trend is the Newsletter on Hispanic and Latino issues in Philosophy of the American Philosophical Association).

2. Pre-Hispanic Philosophy

From the early years of the Conquest, it became clear to the Spaniards that pre-Columbian Mexicans had a complex and sophisticated system of beliefs regarding human beings and the universe. In his Historia general de las cosas de la Nueva España (1585 [2006]), Franciscan missionary Bernardino de Sahagún (1499–1590) reproduced the corpus of beliefs of the ancient Mexicans, collected in documents and testimonials. Years later, the discovery of new documents and a deeper knowledge of local languages have enabled us to have a better understanding of how the original inhabitants of Mesoamerica viewed the world.

The first historians of Mexican philosophy recognized the richness and sophistication of native cosmology, but they did not consider it philosophy. The publication of Miguel León Portilla’s (1926) influential book La filosofía náhuatl (1955), a collection of texts recovered and translated into Spanish dealing with cosmology, metaphysics, anthropology, ethics, and aesthetics, would result in a new appreciation. In his book, León Portilla compares the ancient Mexican texts to the western philosophical tradition. Some years later, others authors followed his example studying Mayan texts such as Popol Vuh, which provided a deeper understanding of Classical Mayan cosmology and anthropology.

The use of the term “philosophy” to speak of pre-Columbian thought has been applauded by those who believe it is necessary to put an end to the predominance of the western concept of philosophy; but it has also been criticized because it seems to confuse western philosophy with a series of cultural practices and epistemologies that are entirely something else. Some people have gone so far as to suggest that to interpret philosophically these pre-Columbian texts that have survived to the present day is an act of over-interpretation. Others have even questioned the authenticity of historical sources.

It is not clear whether Quetzalcóatl was a historical figure or a mythical character. However, the ideas attributed to him were fundamental in the development of what we may consider as Náhuatl philosophy. Quetzalcóatl goes beyond the traditional religious myths and offers an original conception of divinity, the universe and man. According to Quetzalcóatl, the supreme god is Ometéotl, the god of duality. Ometéotl was masculine and feminine, the creator of all things, and had an active role in all aspects of reality.

Among the tlamatinime—wise men who followed the intellectual tradition of Quetzalcóatl—Tezcoco’s King Nezahualcóyotl (1402–1472) was the most prominent. Tezcoco was a small kingdom and a military ally of the Aztecs. King Nezahualcóyotl followed a line of thought that has been preserved in his poems and narrative texts, in which he questioned the permanence of human life in a world where everything changes and everything dies. If even gold and jade can splinter, then human beings must accept that their passage on this earth is transitory. However, that must not be an excuse to feel overwhelmed by sadness: the human heart can find a meaning to life in flor y canto (songs and flowers), which is how he referred to art and beauty. Poetry shall persevere even as flowers wither and die: songs will be preserved. In the meantime, people must learn patience. Our heart and our eyes will never see the gods. Their plans are shrouded in mystery. Nezahualcóyotl asks the kind of questions that cannot be adequately satisfied with religious answers. His thoughts on essence and change, as well as his questions about the meaning of life, are very similar to those of other philosophical traditions. It seems perfectly reasonable, for example, to compare him to Heraclitus or Parmenides.

The relationship between pre-Hispanic thought and Mexican philosophy has become stronger in recent years. One example of this is the concept of “nepantla”, which was recovered by Emilio Uranga (1921–1988) in his book Análisis del ser del mexicano (1952). According to Uranga, being nepantla is an ontological condition of existence that not only captures the nature of Mexican being, but also, ultimately, the condition of all humans. nepantla means to be “in between” two different options without fully rejecting or adopting any of them. The concept of nepantla has since been used in an original and creative way by many authors from Mexico as well as from the United States, to describe various aspects of our existence (e.g., Gloria Anzaldúa).

Other authors have contributed to a recovery of categories coined by the survivors of the indigenous peoples and have made proposals to create a non-western philosophy that can offer alternative answers to our questions. For example Carlos Lenkesdorf’s (1926–2010) Una filosofía en clave tojolabal (2002) makes a philosophical reconstruction of the ways of the Tojolabal natives that inhabit in the state of Chiapas, Mexico. Lenkesdorf’s point of departure is the study of language and everyday practices of the Tojolabal people to propose an entirely different way of understanding the relationship between subjects, community and nature.

In the political thought of the members of the Zapatista Army of National Liberation (EZLN) it is also possible to find a contemporary development of key concepts of the native population.

A recent contribution to this topic is James Maffie’s Aztec Philosophy (2015). On the basis of a wide selection of sources, old and new, Maffie has offered a reconstruction of Aztec philosophy using categories and concepts that belong to western metaphysics but that attempt to explain in a new vein the originality of Nahuatl thinking.

3. The Philosophy of the Conquest and Renaissance Humanism

The Conquest of America and, in particular, of the Aztec Empire, was an event with global repercussions that immediately awoke in philosophers and theologians a need for reflection.

Francisco de Vitoria (1483–1546) was a professor at the University of Salamanca when he put into question whether the Spanish Colonization of the American continent was a “just war”. Vitoria, however, was never in America, and thus had no direct experience in the matter. Other authors who had witnessed the cruelty of Spanish dominion also raised the question of the justification of the Conquest.

Father Bartolomé de las Casas (1484–1566) objected to the Spanish dominion in America and engaged in a famous debate with Juan Ginés de Sepúlveda about whether the indigenous people were fully human or not. Las Casas claimed that the natives were rational beings, and thus should be considered as human as any person from Europe, with the same right to be protected by natural law, to choose their own form of Government, and to be free. The Spaniards did not have the right to make slaves of them or even to rule them. The ideas of Las Casas proved crucial in the creation in 1542 of the Laws of the Indies that protected the indigenous people of the Americas.

The influence of Erasmus’ humanism was clear in many of those authors who wanted to return to the doctrinal simplicity and moral purity of early Christianity, a neo-stoic reconciliation between Plato and Aristotle, with an emphasis on human dignity. We can also trace the influence of Thomas More’s Utopia, which inspired some of the social experiments conducted in New Spain.

Father Juan de Zumárraga (1468–1548) founded El Colegio de Tlatelolco, a school in which the natives were instructed in Christian theology and philosophy; he also helped install the first press in 1539, and conceived the creation of the Royal and Pontifical University of Mexico. Zumárraga wrote several books where we can find the influence of Erasmus as well as that of the Spanish humanist Constantino Ponce, who was a chaplain in Charles I’s court and later accused by the Inquisition of being a Protestant.

Vasco de Quiroga (died 1565) founded hospital-towns in Michoacán that were inspired by the communities described in Thomas More’s Utopia. According to Vasco de Quiroga, the natives lived in a golden age just as described by Lucian of Samosata in his Saturnalia.

Phillip II of Spain sent Francisco Hernández (died 1578) to study the flora and fauna of New Spain. Once in Mexico, Hernández wrote several philosophical works with commentaries on Plato, Aristotle and the Stoics.

Not only the Spaniards thought about the philosophical consequences of the conquest, in 1959 Miguel León Portilla published a book called La visión de los vencidos where he recovered documents of the native population that describe the Conquest from their own perspective. In the 20th century, the principal work that examines the historical and ontological dimension of the Conquest is La invención de América (1958) by Edmundo O’Gorman (1906–1995), who contends against the assumption that America was discovered, that is, that America existed as a reality on its own account before the arrival of the Spaniards. O’Gorman claims that America was invented by the Europeans, on the basis of the premises of their own conceptual schemes.

4. The 16th Century: Scholasticism

The type of philosophy taught and learned in New Spain was Scholasticism, which was the only kind of philosophy approved by the Colonial authorities and the Catholic Church. The Spanish Empire was characterized by its Catholic zeal, hence it did not allow Protestant or pagan philosophies to be propagated or studied in its territories.

Friar Alonso de la Veracruz (1507–1584) was the first philosopher of New Spain; a disciple of Vitoria, he taught the first lessons of Scholastic philosophy. Alonso de la Veracruz was also the first published philosopher of New Spain. He wrote several commentaries on Aristotle, such as Recognitio summularum (1554a), Dialectica resolutio (1554b) and Physica speculatio (1557), used as textbooks in schools. Just like his teacher Vitoria, Alonso also discussed the just causes of the Conquest, but with even stronger sympathy for the indigenous population. Alonso contested the argument that the natives had lost their right to their lands because they were pagans, and he claimed that the Spanish Crown had stolen them from their lawful owners. He also sustained that sovereignty ultimately belongs to the people, not the king.

The Jesuit priest Antonio Rubio stands out among the philosophers of the 16th century. Born in Spain, he established himself in New Spain from 1576 to 1600, where he wrote a famous treatise of logic known as Lógica mexicana (1603). The University of Alcalá adopted Lógica mexicana as a textbook and many re-editions of an abridged version were printed elsewhere in Europe. It is a known fact, for instance, that Descartes studied the book when he was a pupil in La Fleche. Rubio wrote other books in which he wanted to offer a complete course on philosophy and, although his works on natural philosophy were published, his metaphysics were not, perhaps due to the popularity of Francisco Suárez’s Disputationes metaphysicae.

Another philosopher from the 16th century in New Spain is Tomás Mercado, who wrote several studies on logic and matters relating to the philosophy of economics, in which he analyses the rationality and justice of commercial trade.

5. The 17th Century: Scholasticism and the Baroque

In the 17th century, the religious orders of the Dominicans, the Augustinians, the Jesuits, and the Franciscans continued to cultivate scholastic philosophy, as dictated by their specific orientation. However, the practice of philosophy was almost always lacking in originality and critical dimension. A paradigmatic example of this particular way in which philosophy was understood is Francisco Naranjo, a scholar who was known for his ability to recite by heart the entirety of Thomas Aquinas’ Summa Theologica. Other philosophers from that same period were Diego Basalenque, Juan de Rueda, Alonso Guerrero, and Diego Martín Alcázar.

The 17th century in Spain is known as the Spanish Golden Age, with figures such as Francisco de Quevedo and Luis de Góngora in literature and Diego Velázquez and Bartolomé Murillo in painting. We can also talk of a Golden Age in New Spain. Three extraordinary personalities of the 17 th century’s Mexican baroque culture cannot be omitted from a history of Mexican philosophy: Father Miguel Sánchez, Carlos de Sigüenza y Góngora, and Sister Juana Inés de la Cruz. All of them were born in Mexico, wrote their central works in Spanish, and also were familiar with Náhuatl language and culture.

Father Miguel Sánchez (1594–1674) studied at the University de Mexico, but later was not accepted as member of its academic staff. Sánchez is the author of Imagen de la Virgen María (1648) a book in which he interprets the apparition of Virgin of Guadalupe from a biblical, theological, and philosophical point of view. The influence of Saint Augustine in his book is conspicuous. Sánchez is one of the first thinkers to conceive human history from a Latin American perspective.

Carlos Sigüenza y Góngora (1645–1700) was a remarkable scientist, historian, and philosopher. He taught astronomy and mathematics at the Royal and Pontifical University of Mexico, and he became known for his opposition to the belief that comets were harbingers of catastrophes. In his book, Libra astronómica y filosófica (1690 [1984]), Sigüenza y Góngora quoted Galileo Galilei, Descartes, and Kepler with scientific rigor. He was well versed in pre-Columbian culture, and rescued the moral and political virtues of the ancient Aztecs, presenting them as an example to be followed in his own day.

Sister Juana Inés de la Cruz (1651–1695) was not allowed in to the Royal and Pontifical University of Mexico because she was a woman; however, she became world-famous for her wisdom and her literary talent. Although Juana Inés de la Cruz was not a philosopher, her writings contain elements of philosophy, from stoicism and hermeticism to post-Cartesian philosophy. Her long poem Primero sueño (1692) is an erudite reflection on epistemology and theology that was based on several classical and contemporary works. One of the outstanding features of Juana Inés de la Cruz is her study of the circumstances under which women could study philosophy and even produce philosophical writings on their own account. This makes her a pioneer of feminism. Her “Respuesta a Sor Filotea de la Cruz” (1691) is a feminist reflection avant la lettre where she speaks in favor of a woman’s right to develop fully, just as any other person, in the same conditions as men. In that brilliant and erudite text, she claims: “if Aristotle would have been a cook, he would have written even more”.

6. The 18th Century: The Difficult Reception Of Modernity

Just as in the 17th century, in the 18th century it was responsibility of the main religious orders to teach philosophy in New Spain, in accordance to their specific doctrinal orientations. Franciscans adopted the philosophy of Duns Scotus and Dominicans that of Thomas Aquinas. The Jesuits were more receptive to modern philosophy.

In the 17th century, the Jesuits led the trends in education and culture in New Spain. Their work is of central importance, not only because they adopted in an original way modern European thought and because they creatively adapted it to their own circumstances, but because they were pioneers in the creation of a nationalism that would result in political independence from Spain, in the 19th century. However, in 1767, when the Jesuit order was in its zenith, it was expelled from the territories belonging to the Spanish Crown. This was a heavy blow to Mexican intellectuals, and it fueled a growing sense of Mexican nationalism, opposed to Spanish rule.

Among the main Jesuits of New Spain who were forced to leave their homeland were two philosophers: Diego José Abad and Francisco Javier Clavijero. Diego José Abad taught a complete course on philosophy in which he studied Descartes and Gassendi. However, Abad tried to reconcile scholasticism and modern philosophy, as for example atomism and Aristotelian hylomorphism. Francisco Javier Clavijero (1731–1787) wrote Storia antica del Messico (1780 [2006]) where he examines pre-Columbian history following the model of Greco-Roman classical history. He also wrote a Cursus philosophicus, of which only one section has been preserved: Physica particularis (1765).

Each one of these authors tried to combine scholastic philosophy with the advances of philosophy and modern science. This critical eclecticism can be identified in Juan Benito Díaz de Gamarra (1745–1783), author of Elementa recentioris philosophiae (1774), which helped promote the philosophical thought of his times. Others who studied modern thought, particularly in relation to science, were polygraph author José Antonio Alzate (1737–1799), a ferocious critic of Aristotle’s authority, and José Mariano Mociño (1757–1820), a distinguished botanical expert.

7. The 19th Century: Liberals and Positivists

The 19th century was a time of upheaval for Mexico. The Napoleonic Invasion and the abdication of King Ferdinand VII in 1808 forced the citizens of Spanish America to re-examine the concept of sovereignty. If a monarch was absent, could the colonies govern themselves until the monarch returned to the throne?

Several Mexican thinkers appealed to scholastic political philosophy to answer affirmatively to the question, and also—though not always explicitly— to the philosophy of the Enlightenment. Such was the case of Miguel Hidalgo (1753–1811), father of Mexican Independence. Hidalgo’s predilection for French ideas was well known, but he was also known for his opposition to Aristotelian-based scholastic theology displayed in his Disertación sobre el verdadero método de estudiar teología escolástica (1784).

Francisco Severo Maldonado (1775–1832) was also a priest and a philosopher that wrote in favor of the Independence and about the philosophical foundations of the new nation.

After Mexico’s Independence in 1821, and throughout the 19th century, a very intense debate took place regarding the principles of liberal philosophy and their applications to Mexican reality. Among the authors who stood up for liberal ideas were José María Luis Mora (1794–1850), Melchor Ocampo (1814–1851), Ignacio Ramírez (1818–1879), and Ignacio Manuel Altamirano (1834–1893). Liberals wanted the Mexican Constitution to emulate the Constitution of the United States, which defended individual rights, as well as freedom of speech and freedom of press. They also believed in the separation between Church and State, and argued that all the wealth and the huge territories owned by the Mexican Church should be expropriated as a way to promote economic development. Liberals believed all people were equal before the law and thus tried to erase the cultural differences that prevailed in the nation, particularly with indigenous communities.

But the conservatives also had eminent supporters, such as Lucas Alamán (1792–1853), who believed Mexico had to preserve the best of its Spanish heritage. For instance, they argued that Catholicism functioned as an element of national cohesion. Conservatives also defended a special legislation to protect indigenous people, and demanded protection for the local industry. During the 19th century, scholastic philosophy was affected by the political turmoil, and in response developed a defensive attitude. The most important scholastic philosopher of the 19th century was Clemente de Jesús Munguía (1810–1868). Munguía wrote extensively on various topics. Del pensamiento y su enunciación (1852) is his most ambitious theoretical book.

The debate between liberals and conservatives would define Mexican history in the first decades of its independent life. The controversy soon passed from words to guns. From 1862 to 1867, during the French Intervention, conservatives supported the government of Maximilian of Hapsburg. After he was defeated, the Conservative Party lost all chance of regaining power.

During the 19th century, apart from liberalism, currents like utilitarianism, sensualism, materialism, socialism, anarchism, and romanticism were known in Mexico. Juan Nepomuceno Adorno was a romantic thinker that proposed a deistic philosophy and an utopian conception of man and society. His main work is La armonía del universo (1862).

However, the philosophy that prevailed in the second half of the century was positivism, understood in a broad sense which encompassed authors like Auguste Comte, Herbert Spencer, Hyppolite Taine, and John Stuart Mill.

The main representative of positivism in Mexico was Gabino Barreda (1818–1881). In his “Oda cívica” (1867), he offered an interpretation of Mexico’s history that was inspired by Comte’s philosophy of history. Barreda believed that the victory of the Liberal Party was a victory of positivism. He also believed that a national reconstruction should not be founded in religion or speculative philosophy, but in the experimental method of science. With this in mind, he led an educational reform that excluded theology and philosophy from government-sponsored schools.

For Mexican positivists the challenge was to find a way to reconcile freedom and order. In his essay “De la educación moral” (1863), Barreda sustained that it was a mistake to assume that freedom consists in doing whatever one wants to do. True freedom, he said, is always limited by the law. Moral progress is always the consequence of a scientific knowledge of moral law.

Spencer’s evolutionism had a strong influence in Mexico’s social and historical thought, as can be seen in the works of Justo Sierra (1848–1912), and Francisco Bulnes (1847–1924). According to social evolutionism, nations are very much like animal species: they are in a constant fight for survival, and the stronger nations prevail. In his book El porvenir de las naciones hispanoamericanas (1899), Bulnes claimed that Mexico would have to make drastic changes to survive in its struggle against the Anglo-Saxons. From a political point of view, Spencer’s social evolutionism was the foundation of the gradualist ideology that said Mexico did not need another revolution but an orderly, planned evolution. Justo Sierra’s Evolución política del pueblo mexicano (1902) was used by supporters of the dictatorship of General Porfirio Díaz, who ruled Mexico for almost three decades, until the Mexican Revolution began in 1910.

In the fields of logic and epistemology, Mill’s influence was unchallenged. Porfirio Parra (1845–1912) wrote Nuevo sistema de lógica inductiva y deductiva (1903), the most relevant work within this current of thought; in it, he defends an idealist version of empiricism.

8. The 20th Century

8.1 Philosophy and the Mexican Revolution (1910–1930)

The Mexican Revolution was a social movement influenced by a myriad of ideologies: classical liberalism, social liberalism, the social doctrine of the Catholic Church, socialism, anarchism, spiritism, Bergsonism, and pragmatism.

Ricardo Flores Magón was an activist that struggled against the dictatorship of Porfirio Díaz. From 1904 until his death in 1922 he lived in the United States, first as an exile and then as a prison inmate. In many of his writings, distributed through the clandestine journal Regeneración, he developed a concept of society based on socialist and anarchist philosophy.

In 1909, a group of young students formed the “Ateneo de la Juventud”. Antonio Caso (1883–1946) and José Vasconcelos (1882–1959) were two of its most prominent members. Both promoted a renewal of Mexican philosophy. They rejected the positivist doctrines of humanity as being moved by selfish calculation, of morality as being accountable by the laws of nature, and of the universe as governed by deterministic laws. The members of the Ateneo stated that humans were free, creative and spiritual, capable of using intuition to understand the world, and inspired by moral feelings that went beyond the laws of nature. This conception of human beings and the world can be considered one of the ideological currents of the Mexican Revolution.

Antonio Caso was the leading figure of Mexican philosophy in the first decades of the 20th century. He created the Department of Philosophy in the National University of Mexico, tutored several generations of philosophers, promoted the work of the main authors and trends of thought of European philosophy in his time, and acted as one of the moral and intellectual authorities of the period. His most important work, Existencia como economía, como desinterés y como caridad responded to Darwin’s theory of biology, Spencer’s social evolutionism, Nietzsche’s doctrine of the Übermensch, and Max Stirner’s extreme egoism, while drawing inspiration from sources as diverse as Bergson, Tolstoy, and Christian morality. According to Caso, human existence has three levels: the biological or economic, the disinterested or aesthetic, and—the highest—the charitable. Towards the 1930s, Caso became more open to other trends, such as axiology, phenomenology, and personalism, although these did not alter his main philosophical ideas. In La persona humana y el estado totalitario (1941), Caso makes a brave defense of democracy against fascism and communism. Some years before, he debated with Vicente Lombardo Toledano (1894–1968) about the national plan to make public education socialist. Caso defended the autonomy of the university and academic freedom.

José Vasconcelos was one of the central thinkers of Mexican culture in the 20th century. His reputation as an intellectual, politician and writer is stronger than his reputation as philosopher. However, he cannot be ignored in a history of Mexican philosophy. His theoretical works can be divided into two groups. The first group includes the writings in which he developed a philosophical system, from Lógica (1945) to Estética (1936), that contain a metaphysical proposal already laid out in his Pitágoras, una teoría del ritmo (1916). Vasconcelos believed that his main contribution to philosophy was the notion of an aesthetic a priori. His legacy was somewhat hurt by his personality, by his self-alienation and because he was not, like Caso, a teacher of philosophy. The second group, which includes Vasconcelos’ texts on Latin American history and culture, was considered by Vasconcelos himself as secondary to his philosophical work. Nevertheless, the works on Latin American history and culture have been more influential than his work on Latin American philosophy. His most important work, La raza cósmica (1925), is a prophetic essay in which Latin America becomes the source of a mixed race that synthesizes the four human races and will lead humanity to the height of its development: the aesthetic level. Although Vasconcelos said that philosophy should be studied for its own sake, and for the universality of its ideas, he also claimed that philosophy should be used as an ideological instrument of Latin American nations to stand against political, economical and intellectual domination of the countries to the North (see his Ética, 1932).

In the late 1920’s the pedagogical and social ideas of John Dewey were very influential in the Mexican education system. Vasconcelos considered that Dewey’s philosophy was a vehicle of United States influence in Mexico and wrote a book against Dewey called De Robinson a Odiseo (1935).

8.2 The Forming of Professional Philosophy (1930–1960)

The intellectual atmosphere in the 1930s saw dramatic changes: the new generation, students and protegés of both Caso and Vanconcelos, were not interested in the debate between determinism and freedom, materialism and spirit. To them, values, objectivity, and social responsibility, are the central issues of their time. They reacted to the intuitionism and the irrationalism of Caso and Vasconcelos, with a renewed rationalism and universalism. Critical reflection on being Mexican started to gain importance, although it would not be until the end of the 1940s that it would reach full prominence.

In the 1930s and 1940s, former students of Caso, such as José Romano Muñoz (1890–1967), Samuel Ramos (1897–1959), Adalberto García de Mendoza (1900–1963), Oswaldo Robles (1905–1969), Edmundo O’Gorman (1906–1995), Francisco Larroyo (1908–1981), Eduardo García Máynez (1908–1993), Antonio Gómez Robledo (1908–1994), and Guillermo Héctor Rodríguez (1910–1988) adopted and promoted philosophical currents from Germany, such as Neo-Kantianism of the Marburg and Baden schools, Dilthey’s historicism, Husserl’s phenomenology, Heidegger’s existentialism, Kelsen’s legal positivism and, above all, the philosophy of values of Scheler and Hartmann. José Ortega y Gasset and specifically his journal Revista de Occidente also influenced that generation.

Samuel Ramos was an outstanding philosopher and intellectual. He criticized Caso’s philosophical style and his defense of irrationality. Ramos believed the country needed a new philosophy, one that could detect the flaws of Mexicans and which was capable of imbuing them with strong values and instilling in them the use of reason. Thus, Mexican philosophy ought to be dedicated to the rigorous study of human being and the objective field of values. Ramos also became interested in aesthetics, and was a promoter of professional philosophy. Some of his most important works are: Perfil del hombre y la cultura en México (1934), Hacia un nuevo humanismo (1940), and Filosofía de la vida artística (1950).

Francisco Larroyo was the main representative of Neo-Kantianism. He wrote many books in which he invariably defended the Neo-Kantian position towards the problems of philosophy, science and education. Some of his books are La filosofía de los valores (1936) and La lógica de las ciencias (1938). Larroyo claimed that Mexico’s progress required a rigorous, rationalist and scientific philosophy. Another well-known Neo-Kantian and Kelsenian was Guillermo Héctor Rodríguez.

Oswaldo Robles connected Neo-Thomism to phenomenology and psychoanalysis. Among his books we can remember La teoría de la idea en Malebranche y la tradición filosófica (1937) and Esquema de antropología filosófica (1942).

Edmundo O’Gorman was a distinguished historian and philosopher. In his essay “Del arte o de la monstruosidad” (1940), he maintained that the study of Pre-Columbian art should be based on different categories from those used to interpret European art. In Crisis y porvenir de la ciencia histórica (1947), he criticized positivist historiography from the point of view of historicism and existentialism. This book set the theoretical foundations for his subsequent notion of the invention of America.

Eduardo García Máynez was one of the main promoters of the professionalization of Mexican philosophy in the 20th century. His book Los principios de la ontología formal del derecho y su expresión simbólica (1953) marked the beginning of the logical turn in Mexican philosophy, which anticipated the linguistic turn of the analytical philosophers about a decade later. Some of his works include: La definición del derecho. Ensayo de perspectivismo jurídico (1948) and Filosofía del derecho (1974). García Máynez claimed that the legitimacy of law depends on the existence of objective values, but he added that, in spite of their objectivity, values are subjected to several forms of relativity in relation to people, concrete actions, space, and time. Like Ramos, García Máynez believed objectivist axiology was what Mexico needed to advance in its social progress. He also claimed that legal freedom consisted in a “second order” right, that is, in the normative possibility to choose the alternative to exercise certain independent faculties. The development of this thesis forced him to sustain that there are some a priori necessary principles to any normative system which is axiomatic and, most particularly, formal. His “theory of the three circles” maintains that the definitions of law as formally valid, as intrinsically valid, and as a positive right, were not compatible in the field of theory, although they were compatible in the field of practice.

8.3 The Spanish Exiles

The Spanish Civil War (1936–1939) forced some of the most prominent Spanish philosophers to move to Mexico. Joaquín Xirau (1895–1943), José Gallegos Rocafull (1895–1963), Wenceslao Roces (1897–1992), José Gaos (1900–1969), Luis Recasens Siches (1903–1977), and Eduardo Nicol (1907–1990), would live and die in Mexico. Juan David García Bacca (1901–1992) and María Zambrano (1907–1991) would spend part of their exile in Mexico. Adolfo Sánchez Vázquez (1915–2011) and Ramón Xirau (1924) arrived in Mexico at a young age, and completed their studies in their new country. All of them left a valuable philosophical legacy through their creativity, teaching and translation.

Joaquín Xirau wrote several books on metaphysics, history of philosophy, and philosophy of education. When he was already in Mexico, he wrote Amor y mundo (1940), in which he reflects on love understood as Eros and caritas. His ontology is dialectical, and he claims that being and value, as well as subject and object, are abstract ideas if they are considered as static realities outside change. His premature death prevented his influence to grow further.

José Gaos wrote while in Mexico the largest part of his works, but he is remembered, above all, for his extraordinary contribution in the training forming of philosophers. Gaos defended a radical version of perspectivism: to him, philosophy is a personal confession, so there can be no philosophy that is worse or better than another as they are all, in the end, the expression of an individual. His most important works are: Del hombre (1970) and De la filosofía (1962). His research and his teaching of the history of ideas in Mexico and the rest of the Americas were extremely influential. His ideas on how to teach philosophy were included in the curricula of several departments of philosophy in the country. Among his disciples were some of the most important philosophers of the second half of the 20th century.

Luis Recasens Siches, a philosopher of law, wrote many books in which the influence of José Ortega y Gasset was visible. Among them is Vida humana, sociedad y derecho (1940).

Eduardo Nicol founded the Metaphysics Seminar at the Department of Philosophy of the National Autonomous University of Mexico where he taught with rigor and brilliance. For him, philosophy ought to recover its place as the primary science. His metaphysics, dialectical in essence, wanted to find a way to reconcile being and the expression, and truth and history. All of his works were written in Mexico, and among them are: La idea del hombre (1946), Metafísica de la expresión (1957), and Los principios de la ciencia (1965).

8.4 The Hiperión Group

In 1934, Samuel Ramos published one of the central books of Mexican culture, Perfil del hombre y la cultura en México, an analysis of history, culture and the personality of Mexicans, who endure, he claims, an inferiority complex. According to Ramos, Mexicans have set for themselves goals that are impossible to accomplish, particularly because they have tried to imitate more developed nations, and this has imbued in them a feeling of inferiority that explains their individual and collective behavior. Ramos’ book was very controversial, and sparked other similar studies about Mexican being, like Octavio Paz’s El laberinto de la soledad (1950).

The Hiperión Group was an association of young philosophers from the National Autonomous University of Mexico that included Leopoldo Zea (1912–2006), Jorge Portilla (1918–1963), Emilio Uranga (1921–1988), and Luis Villoro (1922–2014). The Hiperión Group was active between 1948 and 1952, and its purpose was to use the categories of existentialism to perform an analysis of Mexico and of Mexican being that would enable them not only to really know Mexico and Mexicans but also to shake them up and to transform them.

Jorge Portilla’s posthumous book Fenomenología del relajo (1966) is a phenomenological study about the complex relations that Mexicans have to moral behavior.

Arguably the most important work of the Hiperión was Análisis del ser del mexicano (1952), by Emilio Uranga. This book proposed an ontology of mexicanidad and a philosophy of Mexican culture. According to Uranga, our negative traits, such as resentment, melancholy and zozobra, are superficial expressions of what he calls “accidentality”, a constitutive existential mode of Mexicans. Uranga believes that historically Mexicans were denied full humanity because of their differences with Europeans. However, because human traits are defined as accidental, Mexicans are in fact closer to full humanity and Europeans could achieve such a status when they resemble the being of Mexicans. If the Conquest of Mexico tried to assimilate Mexicans to Europe, what Uranga did was try to assimilate the whole of humanity to Mexico, that is, to make humanity recognize and value its repressed accidentality. By identifying Mexicanidad with accidentality, Uranga transforms Mexican being into an ontological category.

8.5 Leopoldo Zea

Leopoldo Zea was the most recognized and influential Mexican philosopher of the second half of the 20th century, particularly in Latin America and the former Soviet Bloc. Some of his books are:El positivismo en México (1943), América en la historia (1957), La filosofía americana como filosofía sin más (1969), and Discurso desde la marginación y la barbarie (1988).

In his essay “En torno a una filosofía americana” (1945), Zea sustained that Latin American philosophy could and should devote itself to topics that are specifically Latin American, apart from the universal problems of any other philosophy. In “La filosofía como compromiso” (1948), he claims that Latin American philosophy should not settle with understanding its reality: it also needs to transform it. From then on, Zea’s work adopts a clearly defined ideological and political purpose to favor the emancipation of Latin America and what is generally called the “Third World”.

To Zea, philosophy should be an instrument of freedom. He strongly objected to the Eurocentric vision of human beings, history and reason, a critique that would fully evolve decades later with Post-Modernism and Post-Colonialism. During most of the second half of the 20th century, Zea promoted what today is known as Latin American philosophy, which combines an interdisciplinary study of society, thought, and history in this region of the world.

Other Mexican philosophers that have worked in this area are Joaquín Sánchez McGregor (1925-2008), Abelardo Villegas (1934–2001), Mario Magallón Anaya (1946), and Horacio Cerutti (1950).

8.6 Luis Villoro

The works of Luis Villoro were influenced by the most important philosophical currents of the second half of the 20th century: existentialism, phenomenology, Marxism, analytic philosophy, and multiculturalism. However, in his reflections one can observe a continuity of his central concerns: the metaphysical understanding of alterity, the limits and boundaries of reason, the relationship between knowledge and power, the search of a communion with others, an ethical reflection of injustice, the defense of respect for cultural diversity, and a critical dimension of philosophical thought. Some of his books are: Los grandes momentos del indigenismo en México (1950), Creer, saber, conocer (1982), El concepto de ideología (1985), and El poder y el valor (1997).

In Creer, saber, conocer, a book that belongs to the analytical tradition, Villoro produced an epistemology that eliminated the clause of truth from the definition of knowledge, in order to understand the epistemic practice in its historical and political dimension. Villoro analyzes “to know p” as “to believe p with sufficiently objective reasons”. One reason to think that p is sufficiently objective is that it is conclusive, complete and coherent, regardless of who sustains p. However, one reason can be objectively sufficient in an epistemic community but not in another. This leads to an epistemic relativity accepted by Villoro as the only way to respond to the challenge of skepticism.

In El poder y el valor, Villoro reflects on the nature of political power and moral values. After performing an extensive and deep analysis, Villoro sustains that the values that bind individuals to a community should be a priority, without opposing the principles of liberty and social order. This leads him to defend a radical democracy, where power is in the hands of people immersed in concrete social networks in the places where they live and work. Villoro believed that indigenous communities of Mexico are a living example of such egalitarian society. In “Filosofía y dominación”, Villoro sustained that philosophy must be a permanent critique of inherited and imposed beliefs. However, he insisted that philosophy should not be an ideology, but a rigorous and independent exercise of reason.

8.7 The Years of Expansion (1960–2000)

In the 20th century, several Mexican philosophers cultivated humanism and metaphysics from as perspectives as dissimilar as Hellenism, Thomism, and existentialism.

Antonio Gómez Robledo (1908–1994) was a distinguished humanist and jurist who studied and defended the value of Greco-Latin and Christian cultures in an elegant and anti-dogmatic way. Among his works are: Ensayo sobre las virtudes intelectuales (1957), Meditación sobre la justicia (1963), and Sócrates y el socratismo (1966). He also translated Plato’s Republic, Aristotle’s Politics, Marcus Aurelius’ Meditations, and other classics. His studies of the principles of international law and the Spanish tradition of law are also worthy of being included in the history of Mexican philosophy.

Ramón Xirau cultivated philosophy, literary criticism, and poetry, and he has combined all three in very enriching ways. Xirau wrote about the relationship between philosophy and poetry as two different forms of knowledge, and about the ontological nature of human being, understanding ser and estar as different categories. Among his best-known books are: Introducción a la historia de la filosofía (1964), Poesía y conocimiento (1979), and El tiempo vivido (1985).

Juliana González (1936) is a disciple of Eduardo Nicol. She has taught and written about the main problems of philosophical and moral anthropology as well as about Nietzsche, Freud and Heidegger. González’s ethics are grounded on her complex vision of the human being, which underscores our capacity to choose. González has also dealt with the ethical and metaphysical dimension of psychoanalysis and genomics. Some of her books include Ética y libertad (1989a), El malestar en la moral (1989b), and El poder del Eros (1999).

Neo-Thomism was taught at the Universidad Iberoamericana by José Sánchez Villaseñor (1911–1961), Fernando Sodi Pallares (1917–1980), Héctor González Uribe (1918–1988), José Sanabria (1924–2002), and Miguel Mansur (1928–1993). The Aristotelian tradition has been studied at the Universidad Panamericana by Carlos Llano (1932–2010), Virginia Aspe (1952), Héctor Zagal (1963), and Luis Xavier López Farjeat (1973). In Monterrey, Agustín Basave Fernández del Valle (1923–2006), developed what he called an integralismo metafísico antroposófico. Among his many books we can single out Tratado de metafísica. Teoría de la habencia (1982).

Socialist and Marxist thought was one of the ideological currents of the Mexican Revolution. Vicente Lombardo Toledano was a promoter of Marxism and used it to explain national reality. José Revueltas (1914–1976) was an unorthodox Marxist who discussed philosophical themes in his literary and political writings. However, Marxism was relatively ignored by the academia before the 1970s. Two central figures of Marxism in the academy in Mexico during that period were Eli de Gortari (1918–1991) and Adolfo Sánchez Vázquez.

De Gortari was the first systematic philosopher of science in Mexico. He studied the foundation of dialectic logic and the applications of such logic to the sciences. He also worked on the philosophy of mathematics and physics, the mechanization of propositional calculus, and the history of science in Mexico. In 1955 he founded the Seminar of Scientific and Philosophical Problems. Among his books are La ciencia de la lógica (1950), and Dialéctica de la Física (1964).

Adolfo Sánchez Vázquez was very young when he arrived in Mexico and, like Ramón Xirau, he became a philosopher in Mexico. He produced a very solid body of works that dealt with some of the central notions of Marxist ethics and aesthetics. His critical reflections on the concept of praxis were a contribution to Marxist philosophy. He was also quite critical of the aesthetic doctrine of Socialist realism. Among his main books we can mention: Las ideas estéticas de Marx (1965), Una filosofía de la praxis (1967), and Ética (1969). Many Mexican Marxist philosophers of the next generations were his disciples.

After the 1960s, the list of teachers and researchers of Marxism increased exponentially and Marxism became the most active philosophical current in some Mexican universities. It was at that time that both inside and outside the universities Marx was studied, along with Althusser, Gramsci, Bloch, and Marcuse. Some of the main Mexican Marxist philosophers of that period were: Porfirio Miranda (1924–2001), Enrique González Rojo (1928), Cesáreo Morales (1936), Jaime Labastida (1940), and Gabriel Vargas Lozano (1947). Carlos Pereyra (1940–1988) was a rigorous philosopher of history and a well-known left-wing intellectual; his philosophical papers were collected in Filosofía, historia y política (2010). Bolívar Echeverría (1941–2010), wrote La modernidad de lo barroco (1998), where he offered a critique of capitalist modernity from a Latin American perspective.

A famous disciple of the Mexican school of Marxist philosophy is Rafael Sebastián Guillén Vicente (1957), also know as “Subcomandante Marcos” of the EZLN. His correspondence with Luis Villoro is included in the book La alternativa. Perspectiva y posibilidades de cambio (Villoro 2015).

After the fall of the Berlin wall there was a decline of Marxist philosophy. What came instead was an interest in non-Marxist political philosophy that coincided with the public debate about the reform of the Mexican State at the end of the last century. Among the most studied foreign authors were Weber, Arendt, Rawls, Bobbio and Habermas. Democracy, justice, citizenship and multiculturalism were some of the topics of discussion for philosophers such as: Luis Aguilar Villanueva (1938), Paulette Dieterlen (1947), Luis Salazar (1949), León Olivé (1950), Griselda Gutiérrez (1951), María Pía Lara (1954), Ambrosio Velasco (1954), Rodolfo Vázquez (1956), Mario Teodoro Ramírez (1958), and Enrique Serrano (1958).

Philosophy of liberation was a movement that originated in South America in 1976; in the beginning, it mixed elements of liberation theology, dependence theory, and Latin American philosophy. Enrique Dussel (1934) is the main representative of that current in Mexico. Among his numerous works, which have been translated extensively to other languages, are Filosofía de la liberación (1977) and Ética de la liberación en la edad de la globalización y la exclusión (1998). Dussel has offered a critique of western philosophy from the point of view of the poor and the excluded. Like Liberation Theology, Philosophy of Liberation seemed to be declining in recent years; however, Pope Francis has renewed the interest in this movement.

Towards the end of the 1950s and the beginning of the 1960s, there was an interest in analytical philosophy and, in particular, in Russell, Carnap, Wittgenstein, Strawson, and Quine. The creation of the journal Crítica in 1967 triggered the development of this current. At the end of the 1960s, the Institute for Philosophical Research of the National Autonomous University of Mexico became the main center of analytical philosophy in the country and the whole of Latin America. The main promoters of analytic philosophy during that period were Fernando Salmerón (1925–1997) and Alejandro Rossi (1932–2009), author of Lenguaje y significado (1969).

At the end of the 1970s, a group of analytical philosophers had already consolidated: Enrique Villanueva (1938), José Antonio Robles (1938–2014), Javier Esquivel (1941–1992), and Hugo Margáin (1942–1978). In the 1980s, more analytic philosophers joined the Institute, among them: Raúl Orayen (1942–2003), who wrote Lógica, significado y ontología (1989), Ulises Moulines (1946), a structuralist philosopher of science, Mark Platts (1947), author of Ways of Meaning (1979), León Olivé (1950), who wrote several books of philosophy of science and culture, and Adolfo García de la Sienra (1951), philosopher of economics and theological reformer.

Mexican analytic philosophy has followed the main trends of the analytic current since the 1960s. In its beginning, it had strong links to Oxford philosophy, but today it has developed ties with other centers around the world. Some Mexican analytic philosophers have studied abroad and have remained outside Mexico, such as Agustín Rayo, author of The Construction of Logical Space (2013); others work in Mexico but publish mainly in English, such as Maite Ezcurdia (1966), Mario Gómez-Torrente (1967), or Axel Barceló (1970). To some extent, they could be considered as post-Mexican philosophers. But some others write analytic philosophy in Spanish, like Alejandro Tomasini (1952), author of a vast number of books that develop an original interpretation of Wittgenstein’s philosophy.

The main proponent of feminist philosophy was Graciela Hierro (1928–2003), founder of the Centro de Estudios de Género of the National Autonomous University of Mexico. Two of her books are Ética y feminismo (1985), and De la domesticación a la educación de las mexicanas (1989).

As in other Latin American countries, history of philosophy is a strong field or research in Mexico. Among the main scholars in this area we can mention: Laura Benitez (1944), Alberto Constante (1949), Enrique Hülsz (1954), Gustavo Leyva, Pedro Stepanenko (1960), Efraín Lazos (1962), Ricardo Salles (1965), Faviola Rivera (1967), and Ángel Xolocotzi (1969).

9. The 21st Century (2000–2015)

Mexican philosophy today is a professional, pluralistic and vibrant field of study, with the participation of hundreds of scholars and students. It would be impossible to describe current Mexican philosophy in such a brief space.

The Mexican philosophical community has very strong links to the philosophical communities of Spain and the rest of Latin America. Almost all the philosophical publications are in Spanish. However, some books of contemporary Mexican philosophers can be found in English. For example: Paulette Dieterlen, Poverty: A Philosophical Approach (2005), Ricardo Salles, The Stoics on Determinism and Compatibilism (2005), Atocha Aliseda, Abductive Reasoning: Logical Investigations into Discovery and Explanation (2006), María Pía Lara, Narrating Evil: A Postmetaphysical Theory of Reflective Judgement (2007), Guillermo Hurtado and Oscar Nudler (eds.), The Furniture of the World (2012), and Enrique Dussel, Ethics of Liberation: In the Age of Globalization and Exclusion (1998 [2013]).

As in other areas of Mexican culture, philosophy is highly concentrated in Mexico City. However, there are dozens of departments of philosophy in universities scattered in different regions of the Mexican Republic. Many of these universities offer graduate degrees and some publish their own reviews and books, for example, the state universities of Puebla, Michoacán, and Veracruz.

Philosophy has been taught in secondary education since the 19th century. However, in 2009 there was an attempt by the Government to eliminate philosophy from the curriculum. The national philosophical community gathered around the Observatorio filosófico de México and successfully stopped that initiative (see Other Internet Resources)

There are several philosophical associations in the country: Asociación filosófica de México is the largest of all. Since 1975, it is responsible for the celebration of a bi-annual congress that has been essential to the forming of a national philosophical community (see Other Internet Resources).

I will limit the rest of my commentary to two of the Mexican philosophers that are in their creative peak.

Carlos Pereda (1944) has written several important books, including Vértigos argumentales (1994), Crítica de la razón arrogante (1999), and Sobre la confianza (2009). He adopts the idea of phronesis from Aristotle, and the idea of the universality of practical reason from Kant. Pereda examines the vices and confusion of our life and our thought in order to recommend subtle strategies to help us navigate through the difficulties he has discovered. To do so, Pereda has offered us a peculiar diagnostic of the entanglements and pathologies of reason. One of the concepts he discusses is that of argumentative vertigoes: a vortex into which our thinking and acting fall, making us see things only in one direction, wrapping around us like a frenzy of stubbornness and obstinacy that leaves us blind to the motives and feelings of others.

The main exponent of philosophical hermeneutics, Mauricio Beuchot (1950), distinguished himself in his early years for his prolific work as a historian and a translator of the philosophy of New Spain and medieval philosophy (i.e., La filosofía del lenguaje en la Edad Media, 1981), as well as for his synthesis of Thomism and analytic philosophy (i.e., Lógica y ontología, 1986), but in the beginning of the 1990s, he turned to hermeneutics. In his Tratado de hermenéutica analógica (1997), he created a system he called “analogical hermeneutics”. His thesis is that analogy must be adopted as the main instrument of interpretation in order to avoid the excesses of positivist “univoicism” or postmodern “equivocalism”. The analogical hermeneutics of Beuchot has inspired a philosophical movement with hundreds of followers around the world.


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I wish to thank Kim Díaz, Gregory Pappas, Fanny del Río, Carlos Alberto Sánchez and Robert Sánchez for their valuable comments on previous versions of this paper.

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