Philosophy of Economics

First published Fri Sep 12, 2003; substantive revision Tue Sep 4, 2018

“Philosophy of Economics” consists of inquiries concerning (a) rational choice, (b) the appraisal of economic outcomes, institutions and processes, and (c) the ontology of economic phenomena and the possibilities of acquiring knowledge of them. Although these inquiries overlap in many ways, it is useful to divide philosophy of economics in this way into three subject matters which can be regarded respectively as branches of action theory, ethics (or normative social and political philosophy), and philosophy of science. Economic theories of rationality, welfare, and social choice defend substantive philosophical theses often informed by relevant philosophical literature and of evident interest to those interested in action theory, philosophical psychology, and social and political philosophy. Economics is of particular interest to those interested in epistemology and philosophy of science both because of its detailed peculiarities and because it possesses many of the overt features of the natural sciences, while its object consists of social phenomena.

1. Introduction: What is Economics?

Both the definition and the precise domain of economics are subjects of controversy within philosophy of economics. At first glance, the difficulties in defining economics may not appear serious. Economics is, after all, concerned with aspects of the production, exchange, distribution, and consumption of commodities and services. But this claim and the terms it contains are vague; and it is arguable that economics is relevant to a great deal more. It helps to approach the question, “What is economics?” historically, before turning to comments on contemporary features of the discipline.

1.1 The emergence of economics and of economies

Philosophical reflection on economics is ancient, but the conception of the economy as a distinct object of study dates back only to the 18th century. Aristotle addresses some problems that most would recognize as pertaining to economics, mainly as problems concerning how to manage a household. Scholastic philosophers addressed ethical questions concerning economic behavior, and they condemned usury — that is, the taking of interest on money. With the increasing importance of trade and of nation-states in the early modern period, ‘mercantilist’ philosophers and pamphleteers were largely concerned with the balance of trade and the regulation of the currency. There was an increasing recognition of the complexities of the financial management of the state and of the possibility that the way that the state taxed and acted influenced the production of wealth.

In the early modern period, those who reflected on the sources of a country’s wealth recognized that the annual harvest, the quantities of goods manufactured, and the products of mines and fisheries depend on facts about nature, individual labor and enterprise, tools and what we would call “capital goods”, and state and social regulations. Trade also seemed advantageous, at least if the terms were good enough. It took no conceptual leap to recognize that manufacturing and farming could be improved and that some taxes and tariffs might be less harmful to productive activities than others. But to formulate the idea that there is such a thing as “the economy” with regularities that can be investigated requires a bold further step. In order for there to be an object of inquiry, there must be regularities in production and exchange; and for the inquiry to be non-trivial, these regularities must go beyond what is obvious to the producers, consumers, and exchangers themselves. Only in the eighteenth century, most clearly illustrated by the work of Cantillon, the physiocrats, David Hume, and especially Adam Smith (see the entry on Smith’s moral and political philosophy), does one find the idea that there are laws to be discovered that govern the complex set of interactions that produce and distribute consumption goods and the resources and tools that produce them (Backhouse 2002).

Crucial to the possibility of a social object of scientific inquiry is the idea of tracing out the unintended consequences of the intentional actions of individuals. Thus, for example, Hume traces the rise in prices and the temporary increase in economic activity that follow an increase in currency to the perceptions and actions of individuals who first spend the additional currency (1752). In spending their additional gold imported from abroad, traders do not intend to increase the price level. But that is what they do nevertheless. Adam Smith expands and perfects this insight and offers a systematic Inquiry into the Nature and Causes of the Wealth of Nations. From his account of the demise of feudalism (1776, Book II, Ch. 4) to his famous discussion of the invisible hand, Smith emphasizes unintended consequences. “[H]e intends only his own gain; and he is in this, as in many other cases, led by an invisible hand to promote an end which was no part of his intention. Nor is it always the worse for the society that it was no part of it. By pursuing his own interest, he frequently promotes that of the society more effectually than when he really intends to promote it” (1776, Book IV, Ch. 2). The existence of regularities, which are the unintended consequences of individual choices gives rise to an object of scientific investigation.

One can distinguish the domain of economics from the domain of other social scientific inquiries either by specifying some set of causal factors or by specifying some range of phenomena. The phenomena with which economists are concerned are production, consumption, distribution and exchange—particularly via markets. But since so many different causal factors are relevant to these, including the laws of thermodynamics, metallurgy, geography and social norms, even the laws governing digestion, economics cannot be distinguished from other inquiries only by the phenomena it studies. Some reference to a set of central causal factors is needed. Thus, for example, John Stuart Mill maintained that, “Political economy…[is concerned with] such of the phenomena of the social state as take place in consequence of the pursuit of wealth. It makes entire abstraction of every other human passion or motive, except those which may be regarded as perpetually antagonising principles to the desire of wealth, namely aversion to labour, and desire of the present enjoyment of costly indulgences.” (1843, Book VI, Chapter 9, Section 3) In Mill’s view, economics is mainly concerned with the consequences of individual pursuit of tangible wealth, though it takes some account of less significant motives such as aversion to labor.

Mill takes it for granted that individuals act rationally in their pursuit of wealth and luxury and avoidance of labor, rather than in a disjointed or erratic way, but he has no theory of consumption, or explicit theory of rational economic choice, and his theory of resource allocation is rather thin. These gaps were gradually filled during the so-called neoclassical or marginalist revolution, which linked choice of some object of consumption (and its price) not to its total utility but to its marginal utility. For example, water is obviously extremely useful, but in much of the world it is plentiful enough that another glass more or less matters little to an agent. So water is cheap. Early “neoclassical” economists such as William Stanley Jevons held that agents make consumption choices so as to maximize their own happiness (1871). This implies that they distribute their expenditures so that a dollar’s worth of water or porridge or upholstery makes the same contribution to their happiness. The “marginal utility” of a dollar’s worth of each good is the same.

In the Twentieth Century, economists stripped this theory of its hedonistic clothing (Pareto 1909, Hicks and Allen 1934). Rather than supposing that all consumption choices can be ranked by how much they promote an agent’s happiness, economists focused on the ranking itself. All that they suppose concerning evaluations is that agents are able consistently to rank the alternatives they face. This is equivalent to supposing first that rankings are complete — that is, for any two alternatives x and y that the agent considers, either the agent ranks x above y (prefers x to y), or the agent prefers y to x, or the agent is indifferent. Second, economists suppose that agent’s rankings of alternatives (preferences) are transitive. To say that an agent’s preferences are transitive is to claim that if the agent prefers x to y and y to z, then the agent prefers x to z, with similar claims concerning indifference and combinations of indifference and preference. Though there are further technical conditions to extend the theory to infinite sets of alternatives and to capture further plausible rationality conditions concerning gambles, economists generally subscribe to a view of rational agents as at least possessing complete and transitive preferences and as choosing among the feasible alternatives whichever they most prefer. In the theory of revealed preference, economists have attempted unsuccessfully to eliminate all reference to subjective preference or to define preference in terms of choices (Samuelson 1947, Houtthaker 1950, Little 1957, Sen 1971, 1973, Hausman 2012, chapter 3).

In clarifying the view of rationality that characterizes economic agents, economists have for the most part continued to distinguish economics from other social inquiries by the content of the motives or preferences with which it is concerned. So even though people may seek happiness through asceticism, or they may rationally prefer to sacrifice all their worldly goods to a political cause, economists have supposed that such preferences are rare and unimportant to economics. Economists are concerned with the phenomena deriving from rationality coupled with a desire for wealth and for larger bundles of goods and services.

Economists have flirted with a less substantive characterization of individual motivation and with a more expansive view of the domain of economics. In his influential monograph, An Essay on the Nature and Significance of Economic Science, Lionel Robbins defined economics as “the science which studies human behavior as a relationship between ends and scarce means which have alternative uses” (1932, p. 15). According to Robbins, economics is not concerned with production, exchange, distribution, or consumption as such. It is instead concerned with an aspect of all human action. Robbins’ definition helps one to understand efforts to apply economic concepts, models, and techniques to other subject matters such as the analysis of voting behavior and legislation, even as economics maintains its connection to a traditional domain.

1.2 Contemporary economics and its several schools

Contemporary economics is diverse. There are many schools and many branches. Even so-called “orthodox” or “mainstream” economics has many variants. Some mainstream economics is highly theoretical, though most of it is applied and relies on rudimentary theory. Theoretical and applied work can be distinguished as microeconomics or macroeconomics. There is also a third branch, econometrics which is devoted to the empirical estimation, elaboration, and to some extent testing of microeconomic and macroeconomic models (but see Summers 1991 and Hoover 1994).

Microeconomics focuses on relations among individuals (with firms and households frequently counting as honorary individuals and little said about the idiosyncrasies of the demand of particular individuals). Individuals have complete and transitive preferences that govern their choices. Consumers prefer more commodities to fewer and have “diminishing marginal rates of substitution” — i. e. they will pay less for units of a commodity when they already have lots of it than when they have little of it. Firms attempt to maximize profits in the face of diminishing returns: holding fixed all the inputs into production except one, output increases when there is more of the remaining input, but at a diminishing rate. Economists idealize and suppose that in competitive markets, firms and individuals cannot influence prices, but economists are also interested in strategic interactions, in which the rational choices of separate individuals are interdependent. Game theory, which is devoted to the study of strategic interactions, is of growing importance in economics. Economists model the outcome of the profit-maximizing activities of firms and the attempts of consumers optimally to satisfy their preferences as an equilibrium in which there is no excess demand on any market. What this means is that anyone who wants to buy anything at the going market price is able to do so. There is no excess demand, and unless a good is free, there is no excess supply.

Macroeconomics grapples with the relations among economic aggregates, such as relations between the money supply and the rate of interest or the rate of growth, focusing especially on problems concerning the business cycle and the influence of monetary and fiscal policy on economic outcomes. Many mainstream economists would like to unify macroeconomics and microeconomics, but few economists are satisfied with the attempts that have been made to do so, especially via so called “representative agents” (Kirman 1992, Hoover 2001a). Macroeconomics is immediately relevant to economic policy and hence (and unsurprisingly) subject to much more heated (and politically-charged) controversy than microeconomics or econometrics. Schools of macroeconomics include Keynesians (and “new-Keynesians”), monetarists, “new classical economics” (rational expectations theory — Begg 1982, Carter and Maddock 1984, Hoover 1988, Minford and Peel 1983), and “real business cycle” theories (Kydland and Prescott 1991, 1994; Sent 1998).

Branches of mainstream economics are also devoted to specific questions concerning growth, finance, employment, agriculture, housing, natural resources, international trade, and so forth. Within orthodox economics, there are also many different approaches, such as agency theory (Jensen and Meckling 1976, Fama 1980), the Chicago school (Becker 1976), or public choice theory (Brennan and Buchanan 1985, Buchanan 1975). These address questions concerning incentives within firms and families and the ways that institutions guide choices.

Although mainstream economics is dominant and demands the most attention, there are many other schools. Austrian economists accept orthodox views of choices and constraints, but they emphasize uncertainty and question whether one should regard outcomes as equilibria, and they are skeptical about the value of mathematical modeling (Buchanan and Vanberg 1989, Dolan 1976, Kirzner 1976, Mises 1949, 1978, 1981, Rothbard 1957, Wiseman 1983, Boettke 2010, Holcombe 2014, Nell 2014a, 2014b, 2017, Boettke and Coyne 2015, Hagedorn 2015, Horwitz 2015, Dekker 2016, Linsbichler 2017 ).

Traditional institutionalist economists question the value of abstract general theorizing and emphasize evolutionary concepts (Dugger 1979, Wilber and Harrison 1978, Wisman and Rozansky 1991, Hodgson 2000, 2013, 2016, Hodgson and Knudsen 2010, Delorme 2010, Richter 2015). They emphasize the importance of generalizations concerning norms and behavior within particular institutions. Applied work in institutional economics is sometimes very similar to applied orthodox economics. More recent work in economics, which is also called institutionalist, attempts to explain features of institutions by emphasizing the costs of transactions, the inevitable incompleteness of contracts, and the problems “principals” face in monitoring and directing their agents (Coase 1937; Williamson 1985; Mäki et al. 1993, North 1990; Brousseau and Glachant 2008).

Marxian and socialist economists traditionally articulated and developed Karl Marx’s economic theories, but recently many socialist economists have revised traditional Marxian concepts and themes with tools borrowed from orthodox economic theory (Morishima 1973, Roemer 1981, 1982, Bowles 2012, Piketty 2014, Lebowitz 2015, Auerbach 2016, Beckert 2016, Jacobs and Mazzucato 2016).

There are also socio-economists, who are concerned with the norms that govern choices (Etzioni 1988, 2018), behavioral economists, who study the nitty-gritty of choice behavior (Winter 1962, Thaler 1994, Ben Ner and Putterman 1998, Kahneman and Tversky 2000, Camerer 2003, Camerer and Loewenstein 2003, Camerer et al. 2003, Loewenstein 2008, Thaler and Sunstein 2008, Saint-Paul 2011, Oliver 2013), post-Keynesians, who look to Keynes’s work and especially his emphasis on demand (Dow 1985, Kregel 1976, Harcourt and Kriesler 2013 Rochon and Rossi 2017), evolutionary economists, who emphasize the importance of institutions (Witt 2008, Hodgson and Knudsen 2010, Vromen 2009, Hodgson 2013, 2016, Carsten 2013, Dopfer and Potts 2014, Wilson and Kirman 2016), neo-Ricardians, who emphasize relations among economic classes (Sraffa 1960, Pasinetti 1981, Roncaglia 1978), and even neuroeconomists, who study neurological concomitants of choice behavior (Camerer 2007, Camerer et al. 2005, Camerer et al. 2008, Glimcher et al. 2008, Loewenstein et al. 2008, Rusticinni 2005, 2008, Glimcher 2010). Economics is not one homogeneous enterprise.

2. Six central methodological problems

Although the different branches and schools of economics raise a wide variety of epistemological and ontological issues concerning economics, six problems have been central to methodological reflection (in this philosophical sense) concerning economics:

2.1 Positive versus normative economics

Policy makers look to economics to guide policy, and it seems inevitable that even the most esoteric issues in theoretical economics may bear on some people’s material interests. The extent to which economics bears on and may be influenced by normative concerns raises methodological questions about the relationships between a positive science concerning “facts” and a normative inquiry into values and what ought to be. Most economists and methodologists believe that there is a reasonably clear distinction between facts and values, between what is and what ought to be, and they believe that most of economics should be regarded as a positive science that helps policy makers choose means to accomplish their ends, though it does not bear on the choice of ends itself.

This view is questionable for several reasons (Mongin 2006, Hausman, McPherson, and Satz 2017). First, economists have to interpret and articulate the incomplete specifications of goals and constraints provided by policy makers (Machlup 1969b). Second, economic “science” is a human activity, and like all human activities, it is governed by values. Those values need not be the same as the values that influence economic policy, but it is debatable whether the values that govern the activity of economists can be sharply distinguished from the values that govern policy makers. Third, much of economics is built around a normative theory of rationality. One can question whether the values implicit in such theories are sharply distinguishable from the values that govern policies. For example, it may be difficult to hold a maximizing view of individual rationality, while at the same time insisting that social policy should resist maximizing growth, wealth, or welfare in the name of freedom, rights, or equality. Fourth, people’s views of what is right and wrong are, as a matter of fact, influenced by their beliefs about how people in fact behave. There is evidence that studying theories that depict individuals as self-interested leads people to regard self-interested behavior more favorably and to become more self-interested (Marwell and Ames 1981, Frank et al. 1993). Finally, people’s judgments are clouded by their interests. Since economic theories bear so centrally on people’s interests, there are bound to be ideological biases at work in the discipline (Marx 1867, Preface). Positive and normative are especially interlinked within economics, because economists are not all researchers and teachers. In addition, economists work as commentators and as it were “hired guns” whose salaries depend on arriving at the conclusions their employers want. The bitter polemics concerning macroeconomic policy responses to the great recession beginning in 2008 testify to the influence of ideology.

2.2 Reasons versus causes

Orthodox theoretical microeconomics is as much a theory of rational choices as it a theory that explains and predicts economic outcomes. Since virtually all economic theories that discuss individual choices take individuals as acting for reasons, and thus in some way rational, questions about the role that views of rationality and reasons should play in economics are of general importance. Economists are typically concerned with the aggregate results of individual choices rather than with the actions of particular individuals, but their theories in fact offer both causal explanations for why individuals choose as they do and accounts of the reasons for their choices. See also the entries on methodological individualism and reasons for action: justification, motivation, explanation.

Explanations in terms of reasons have several features that distinguish them from explanations in terms of causes. Reasons purport to justify the actions they explain, and indeed so called “external reasons” (Williams 1981) only justify action, without purporting to explain it. Reasons can be evaluated, and they are responsive to criticism. Reasons, unlike causes, must be intelligible to those for whom they are reasons. On grounds such as these, many philosophers have questioned whether explanations of human action can be causal explanations (von Wright 1971, Winch 1958). Yet merely giving a reason — even an extremely good reason — fails to explain an agent’s action, if the reason was not in fact “effective.” Someone might, for example, start attending church regularly and give as his reason a concern with salvation. But others might suspect that this agent is deceiving himself and that the minister’s attractive daughter is in fact responsible for his renewed interest in religion. Donald Davidson (1963) argued that what distinguishes the reasons that explain an action from the reasons that fail to explain it is that the former are also causes of the action. Although the account of rationality within economics differs in some ways from the folk psychology people tacitly invoke in everyday explanations of actions, many of the same questions carry over (Rosenberg 1976, ch. 5; 1980, Hausman 2012).

An additional difference between explanations in terms of reasons and explanations in terms of causes, which some economists have emphasized, is that the beliefs and preferences that explain actions may depend on mistakes and ignorance (Knight 1935). As a first approximation, economists can abstract from such difficulties caused by the intentionality of belief and desire. They thus often assume that people have perfect information about all the relevant facts. In that way theorists need not worry about what people’s beliefs are. (If people have perfect information, then they believe and expect whatever the facts are.) But once one goes beyond this first approximation, difficulties arise which have no parallel in the natural sciences. Choice depends on how things look “from the inside”, which may be very different from the actual state of affairs. Consider for example the stock market. The “true” value of a stock depends on the future profits of the company, which are of course uncertain. In 2006 house prices in the U.S. were extremely inflated. But whether they were “too high” depended at least in the short run, on what people believe. They were excellent investments if one could sell them to others who would be willing to pay even more for them. Economists disagree about how significant this subjectivity is. Members of the Austrian school argue that these differences are of great importance and sharply distinguish theorizing about economics from theorizing about any of the natural sciences (Buchanan and Vanberg 1989, von Mises 1981).

2.3 Social scientific naturalism

Of all the social sciences, economics most closely resembles the natural sciences. Economic theories have been axiomatized, and articles and books of economics are full of theorems. Of all the social sciences, only economics boasts an ersatz Nobel Prize. Economics is thus a test case for those concerned with the extent of the similarities between the natural and social sciences. Those who have wondered whether social sciences must differ fundamentally from the natural sciences seem to have been concerned mainly with three questions:

(i) Are there fundamental differences between the structure or concepts of theories and explanations in the natural and social sciences? Some of these issues were already mentioned in the discussion above of reasons versus causes.

(ii) Are there fundamental differences in goals? Philosophers and economists have argued that in addition to or instead of the predictive and explanatory goals of the natural sciences, the social sciences should aim at providing us with understanding. Weber and others have argued that the social sciences should provide us with an understanding “from the inside”, that we should be able to empathize with the reactions of the agents and to find what happens “understandable” (Weber 1904, Knight 1935, Machlup 1969a). This (and the closely related recognition that explanations cite reasons rather than just causes) seems to introduce an element of subjectivity into the social sciences that is not found in the natural sciences.

(iii) Owing to the importance of human choices (or perhaps free will), are social phenomena too irregular to be captured within a framework of laws and theories? Given human free will, perhaps human behavior is intrinsically unpredictable and not subject to any laws. But there are, in fact, many regularities in human action, and given the enormous causal complexity characterizing some natural systems, the natural sciences must cope with many irregularities, too.

2.4 Abstraction, idealization, and ceteris paribus clauses in economics

Economics raises questions concerning the legitimacy of severe abstraction and idealization. For example, mainstream economic models often stipulate that everyone is perfectly rational and has perfect information or that commodities are infinitely divisible. Such claims are exaggerations, and they are clearly false. Other schools of economics may not employ idealizations that are this extreme, but there is no way to do economics if one is not willing to simplify drastically and abstract from many complications. How much simplification, idealization, abstraction or “isolation” (Mäki 2006) is legitimate?

In addition, because economists attempt to study economic phenomena as constituting a separate domain, influenced only by a small number of causal factors, the claims of economics are true only ceteris paribus — that is, they are true only if there are no interferences or disturbing causes. What are ceteris paribus clauses, and when if ever are they legitimate in science? Questions concerning ceteris paribus clauses are closely related to questions concerning simplifications and idealizations, since one way to simplify is to suppose that the various disturbing causes or interferences are inactive and to explore the consequences of some small number of causal factors. These issues and the related question of how well supported economics is by the evidence have been the central questions in economic methodology. They will be discussed further below mainly in Section 3.

2.5 Causation in economics and econometrics

Many important generalizations in economics are causal claims. For example, the law of demand asserts that a price increase will (ceteris paribus) diminish the quantity demanded. (It does not merely assert an inverse relationship between price and demand. When demand increases for some other reason, such as a change in tastes, price increases.) Econometricians have also been deeply concerned with the possibilities of determining causal relations from statistical evidence and with the relevance of causal relations to the possibility of consistent estimation of parameter values. Since concerns about the consequences of alternative policies are so central to economics, causal inquiry is unavoidable.

Before the 1930s, economists were generally willing to use causal language explicitly and literally, despite some concerns that there might be a conflict between causal analysis of economic changes and “comparative statics” treatments of equilibrium states. Some economists were also worried that thinking in terms of causes was not compatible with recognizing the multiplicity and mutuality of determination in economic equilibrium. In the anti-metaphysical intellectual environment of the 1930s and 1940s (of which logical positivism was at least symptomatic), any mention of causation became suspicious, and economists commonly pretended to avoid causal concepts. The consequence was that they ceased to reflect carefully on the causal concepts that they continued implicitly to invoke (Hausman 1983, 1990, Helm 1984, Runde 1998). For example, rather than formulating the law of demand in terms of the causal consequences of price changes for quantity demanded, economists tried to confine themselves to discussing the mathematical function relating price and quantity demanded. There were important exceptions (Haavelmo 1944, Simon 1953, Wold 1954), and during the past generation, this state of affairs has changed dramatically.

For example, in his Causality in Macroeconomics (2001b) Kevin Hoover develops feasible methods for investigating large scale causal questions, such as whether changes in the money supply (M) cause changes in the rate of inflation P or accommodate changes in P that are otherwise caused. If changes in M cause changes in P, then the conditional distribution of P on M should remain stable with exogenous changes in M, but should change with exogenous changes in P. Hoover argues that historical investigation, backed by statistical inquiry, can justify the conclusion that some particular changes in M or P have been exogenous. One can then determine the causal direction by examining the stability of the conditional distributions. Econometricians have made vital contributions to the contemporary revival of philosophical interest in the notion of causation. In addition to Hoover’s work, see for example Geweke (1982), Granger (1969, 1980), Cartwright (1989), Sims (1977), Zellner and Aigner (1988), Pearl (2000), Spirtes, Glymour and Scheines (2001).

One relatively secure way to determine causal relations is via randomized controlled experiments. If the experimenters sort subjects randomly into experimental and control groups and vary just one factor, then, unless by bad luck the two groups differ in some unknown way, changes in the outcomes given the common features of the control and treatment groups should be due to the difference in the one factor. Indeed, in the case of quantitative variables, one can calculate average causal effects (Deaton 2010). This makes randomized controlled trials very attractive, though no panacea, since the treatment and control groups may not be representative of the population in which policy-makers hope to apply the causal conclusions, and the causal consequences of the intervention might differ across different subgroups within the control and treatment groups (Worrall 2007, Cartwright and Hardie 2013).

For both practical and ethical reasons, it is often hard to experiment in economics (though, as discussed in section 4.5, far from impossible). But with some ingenuity and with far greater enthusiasm for experimentation than had been the case previously, economists are experimenting much more frequently both in the laboratory and in the field. In addition, as a substitute for experimentation, or as a way of stretching the limits on experimentation, economists in recent years have become very enthusiastic about so-called “instrumental variable” techniques. For example, merely examining the correlation between economic growth and development aid, even controlling for other factors known to influence economic growth is unlikely to reveal the causal influence of aid on growth, because aid may reciprocally depend on growth and well as many factors that are hard to measure that also influence growth. These problems can be to some extent circumvented if economists can find an “instrumental” variable x upon which aid depends that influences growth (if at all) only by its influence on aid and which is probabilistically independent of all other determinants of growth. In that case, one can use the effect of x on growth to estimate the effect of aid on growth. Instrumental variable techniques, policy experimentation, and reliance on “natural experiments” have become widespread, though they bring with them new problems extrapolating experimental results to the target population (Deaton 2010; Cartwright and Hardie 2013).

2.6 Structure and strategy of economics: paradigms and research programmes

In the wake of the work of Kuhn (1970) and Lakatos (1970), philosophers are much more aware of and interested in the larger theoretical structures that unify and guide research within particular research traditions. Since many theoretical projects or approaches in economics are systematically unified, they pose questions about what guides research, and many economists have applied the work of Kuhn or Lakatos in the attempt to shed light on the overall structure of economics (Baumberg 1977, Blaug 1976, de Marchi and Blaug 1991, Bronfenbrenner 1971, Coats 1969, Dillard 1978, Hands 1985b, Hausman 1992, ch. 6, Hutchison 1978, Latsis 1976, Jalladeau 1978, Kunin and Weaver 1971, Stanfield 1974, Weintraub 1985, Worland 1972). Whether these applications have been successful is controversial, but the comparison of the structure of economics to Kuhn’s and Lakatos’ schema served to highlight distinctive features of economics and may have contributed to some of the changes that economics has undergone. For example, asking what the “positive heuristic” of mainstream economics consists in permits one to see that mainstream theoretical models typically attempted to demonstrate that an economic equilibrium will obtain, and thus that mainstream models were unified in more than just their common assumptions. Since the success of research projects in economics is controversial, understanding their global structure and strategy helped to clarify their drawbacks as well as their advantages.

3. Inexactness, ceteris paribus clauses, tendencies, “unrealistic assumptions” and models

As mentioned in the previous section, the most important methodological issue concerning economics involves the very considerable simplification, idealization, and abstraction that characterizes economic theory and the consequent doubts these features of economics raise concerning whether economics is well supported. Claims such as, “Agents prefer larger commodity bundles to smaller commodity bundles,” raise serious questions, because if they are interpreted as universal generalizations, they are false; and philosophy of science has traditionally supposed that science is devoted to the discovery of genuine laws—that is, true universal generalizations. Even though it is false that everyone always prefers larger commodity bundles to smaller, the generalization seems informative and useful. Can a science rest on false generalizations? If these claims are not universal generalizations, then what is their logical form? And how can claims that appear in this way to be false or approximate be tested and confirmed or disconfirmed? These problems have bedeviled economists and economic methodologists from the first methodological reflections to the present day.

3.1 Classical economics and the method a priori

The first extended reflections on economic methodology appear in the work of Nassau Senior (1836) and John Stuart Mill (1836). Their essays must be understood against the background of both the economic theory and the philosophy of science of their times. Like Smith’s economics (to which it owed a great deal) and modern economics, the “classical” economics of the middle decades of the 19th century traced economic regularities to the choices of individuals facing social and natural constraints. But, as compared to Smith, more reliance was placed on severely simplified models. David Ricardo’s Principles of Political Economy (1817), draws a portrait in which wages above the subsistence level lead to increases in the population, which in turn require more intensive agriculture or cultivation of inferior land. The extension of cultivation leads to lower profits and higher rents; and the whole tale of economic development leads to a gloomy stationary state in which profits are too low to command any net investment, wages slide back to subsistence levels, and only the landlords are affluent.

Fortunately for the world, but unfortunately for economic theorists of the mid 19th century, the data consistently contradicted the trends the theory predicted (de Marchi 1970). Yet the theory continued to hold sway for more than half a century, and the consistently unfavorable data were explained away as due to various “disturbing causes.” It is consequently not surprising that Senior’s and Mill’s accounts of the method of economics emphasize the relative autonomy of theory.

Mill distinguishes between two main kinds of inductive methods. The method a posteriori is a method of direct experience. In his view, it is only suitable for phenomena in which few causal factors are operating or in which experimental controls are possible. Mill’s famous methods of induction provide an articulation of the method a posteriori. In his method of difference, for example, one holds fixed every causal factor except one and checks to see whether the effect ceases to obtain when that one factor is removed. The goal is to identify exceptionless causal laws.

Mill maintains that direct inductive methods cannot be used to study phenomena in which many causal factors are in play. If, for example, one attempts to investigate whether tariffs enhance or impede prosperity by comparing the prosperity of nations with high tariffs and nations without high tariffs, the results will be uninformative, because prosperity depends on so many other causal factors. So, Mill argues, one needs instead to employ the method a priori. Despite its name, this too is an inductive method. However, unlike the method a posteriori, the method a priori is an indirect inductive method. Scientists first determine the laws governing individual causal factors in domains in which Mill’s methods of induction are applicable. Having then determined the laws of the individual causes, they investigate their combined consequences deductively. Finally, there is a role for “verification” of the combined consequences, but owing to the causal complications, this testing has comparatively little weight. The testing of the conclusions serves only as a check on the scientist’s deductions and as an indicator of whether there are significant disturbing causes that scientists have not yet accounted for.

Mill gives the example of the science of the tides. Physicists determined the law of gravitation by studying planetary motion, in which gravity is the only significant causal factor. Then physicists develop the theory of tides deductively from that law and information concerning the positions and motions of the moon and sun. The implications of the theory will be inexact and sometimes badly mistaken, because many subsidiary causal factors influence tides. Testing theories of tides can uncover mistakes in the deductions physicists made, and it may uncover evidence concerning the role of the subsidiary factors. But because of the causal complexity, such testing does little to confirm or disconfirm the law of gravitation, which has already been established. Although Mill does not often use the language of “ceteris paribus”, his view that the principles or “laws” of economics hold in the absence of “interferences” or “disturbing causes” provides an account of how the principles of economics can be true ceteris paribus (Hausman 1992, ch. 8, 12).

Because economic theory includes only the most important causes and necessarily ignores minor causes, its claims, like claims concerning tides, are inexact. Its predictions will be imprecise, and sometimes far off. Mill maintains that it is nevertheless possible to develop and confirm economic theory by studying in simpler domains the laws governing the major causal factors and then deducing their consequences in more complicated circumstances. For example, the statistical data are ambiguous concerning the relationship between minimum wages and unemployment of unskilled workers; and since the minimum wage has never been extremely high, there are no data about what unemployment would be in those circumstances. On the other hand, everyday experience teaches economists that firms can choose among more or less labor-intensive processes and that a high minimum wage will make more labor-intensive processes more expensive. On the assumption that firms try to keep their costs down, economists have good (though not conclusive) reason to believe that a high minimum wage will increase unemployment.

In defending a view of economics as in this way inexact and employing the method a priori, Mill thought he was able to reconcile his empiricism and his commitment to Ricardo’s economics. Although Mill’s views on economic methodology were challenged later in the nineteenth century by economists who believed that theory was too remote from the contingencies of policy and history (Roscher 1874, Schmoller 1888, 1898), Mill’s methodological views dominated the mainstream of economic theory for a century (for example, Cairnes 1875). Mill’s vision survived the so-called neoclassical revolution in economics beginning in the 1870s and is clearly discernible in the most important methodological treatises concerning neoclassical economics, such as John Neville Keynes’ The Scope and Method of Political Economy (1891) or Lionel Robbins’ An Essay on the Nature and Significance of Economic Science (1932). Hausman (1992) argues that current methodological practice closely resembles Mill’s methodology, despite the fact that few economists explicitly defend it.

Although this way of interpreting Mill and the methodology of economics is coherent and conforms to an old-fashioned empiricist philosophy of science that finds the nomological force of generalizations in their universality, it is not faithful to the way in which economists see their theories. Rather than regarding generalizations such as acquisitiveness as universal laws carrying implicit ceteris paribus qualifications in their antecedents, economists are much more likely to regard these generalizations as “tendencies” that continue to operate even when defeated by interferences and that need to be studied separately (Woodward 2003). Even Mill speaks of tendencies, though without reconciling his talk of tendencies with his empiricism. If one sets aside metaphysical qualms about tendencies and counterfactuals, the most natural way to see economic theorizing is as the counterfactual investigation of combinations of tendencies. As the discussion below of models confirms, such views are congenial to economists and puzzling to philosophers with empiricist scruples.

Conceptualizing of economic inquiry as the study of models and tendencies, seems to shift the terms of the problems posed by inexactness rather than to offer a solution. Julian Reiss has, in effect, rediscovered the problem in an influential essay, “The Explanation Paradox.” (2013), where he argues that the following three propositions are inconsistent: (1) Economic models are false. (2) Economic models are explanatory. (3) Explanation requires truth.The formulation is a bit obscure, since models are not single sentences or propositions that can be true or false, but it should be clear that Reiss’s putative paradox is a reformulation of the problem posed by the inexactness of economic theories or models.

3.2 Friedman and the defense of “unrealistic assumptions”

Although some contemporary philosophers have argued that Mill’s method a priori is largely defensible (Bhaskar 1975, Cartwright 1989, and Hausman 1992), by the middle of the Twentieth Century Mill’s views appeared to many economists out of step with their understanding of contemporary philosophy of science. Without studying Mill’s text carefully, it was easy for economists to misunderstand his terminology and to regard his method a priori as opposed to empiricism. Others took seriously Mill’s view that the basic principles of economics should be empirically established and found evidence to cast doubt on some of the basic principles, particularly the view that firms attempt to maximize profits (Hall and Hitch 1938, Lester 1946, 1947). Methodologists who were well-informed about contemporary developments in philosophy of science, such as Terence Hutchison (1938), denounced “pure theory” in economics as unscientific.

Philosophically reflective economists proposed several ways to replace the old-fashioned Millian view with a more up-to-date methodology that would continue to justify much of current practice (see particularly Machlup 1955, 1960 and Koopmans 1957). By far the most influential of these efforts was Milton Friedman’s 1953 essay, “The Methodology of Positive Economics.” This essay has had an enormous influence, far more than any other work on methodology.

Friedman begins his essay by distinguishing in a conventional way between positive and normative economics and conjecturing that policy disputes are typically really disputes about the consequences of alternatives and can thus be resolved by progress in positive economics. Turning to positive economics, Friedman asserts (without argument) that correct prediction concerning phenomena not yet observed is the ultimate goal of all positive sciences. He holds a practical view of science and finds the value of science in predictions that will guide policy.

Since it is difficult and often impossible to carry out experiments and since the uncontrolled phenomena economists observe are difficult to interpret (owing to the same causal complexity that bothered Mill), it is hard to judge whether a particular theory is a good basis for predictions or not. Tendencies are not universal laws. A claim such as “firms attempt to maximize profits” will be “unrealistic” in the sense that it is not a true universal generalization. Although not in these terms, Friedman objects to criticisms of tendencies that in effect complain that they are merely tendencies, rather than universal laws. If his criticism stopped there, it would be sensible, although it would avoid the problems of understanding and appraising claims about tendencies.

But Friedman draws a much more radical conclusion. In his terminology, the mistake economists make who criticize claims such as “firms attempt to maximize profits” lies in the attempt to test theories by the “realism” of their “assumptions” rather than by the accuracy of their predictions. He maintains that the realism of a theory’s assumptions is irrelevant to its predictive value. It does not matter whether the assumption that firms maximize profits is realistic. Theories should be appraised exclusively in terms of the accuracy of their predictions. What matters is exclusively whether the theory of the firm makes correct and significant predictions.

As critics have pointed out (and almost all commentators have been critical), Friedman refers to several different things as “assumptions” of a theory and means several different things by speaking of assumptions as “unrealistic” (Brunner 1969). Since Friedman aims his criticism to those who investigate empirically whether firms in fact attempt to maximize profits, he must take “assumptions” to include central economic generalizations, such as “Firms attempt to maximize profits,” and by “unrealistic,” he must mean, among other things, “false.” In arguing that it is a mistake to appraise theories in terms of the realism of assumptions, Friedman is arguing at least that it is a mistake to appraise theories by investigating whether their central generalizations are true or false.

It would seem that this interpretation would render Friedman’s views inconsistent, because in testing whether firms attempt to maximize profits, one is checking whether predictions of theory concerning the behavior of firms are true or false. An “assumption” such as “firms maximize profits” is itself a prediction. But there is a further wrinkle. Friedman is not concerned with every prediction of economic theories. In Friedman’s view, “theory is to be judged by its predictive power exclusively for the class of phenomena which it is intended to explain” (1953, p. 8 [italics added]). Economists are interested in only some of the implications of economic theories. Other predictions, such as those concerning the results of surveys of managers, are irrelevant to policy. What matters is whether economic theories are successful at predicting the phenomena that economists are interested in. In other words, Friedman believes that economic theories should be appraised in terms of their predictions concerning prices and quantities exchanged on markets. In his view, what matters is “narrow predictive success” (Hausman 2008a), not overall predictive adequacy.

So Friedman permits economists to ignore the disquieting findings of surveys, or the fact that people do not always prefer larger bundles of commodities to smaller bundles of commodities. Nor do economists need to be concerned about whether there is a tendency to prefer more commodities to fewer. They need not be troubled that some of their models suppose extravagantly that all agents know the prices of all present and future commodities in all markets. All that matters is whether the predictions concerning market phenomena turn out to be correct. And since anomalous market outcomes could be due to any number of uncontrolled causal factors, while experiments are difficult to carry out, it turns out that economists need not worry about ever encountering evidence that would strongly disconfirm fundamental theory. Detailed models may be confirmed or disconfirmed, but fundamental theory is safe. In this way one can understand how Friedman’s methodology, which appears to justify the eclectic and pragmatic view that economists should use any model that appears to “work” regardless of how absurd or unreasonable its assumptions might appear, has been deployed in service of a rigid theoretical orthodoxy. For other discussions of Friedman’s essay, see Bear and Orr 1969, Boland 1979, Hammond 1992, Hirsch and de Marchi 1990, Mäki 1990a, Melitz 1963, Rotwein 1959, and Samuelson 1963.

Over the last two decades there has been a surge of experimentation in economics, and Friedman’s methodological views probably do not command the same near unanimity that they used to. But they are still enormously influential, and they still serve as a way of avoiding awkward questions concerning simplifications, idealizations, and abstraction in economics rather than responding to them.

3.3 Models

A century ago economists talked of their work in terms of “principles,” “laws,”, and “theories.” That language has not disappeared altogether: economists still talk of “game theory”, “consumer choice theory”, or the “law of demand”. But nowadays the standard intellectual tool or form in economics is a “model.” Econometricians speak of models and structures. Economists are more comfortable describing the axioms concerning rational choice as constituting a model of rational choice than as delineating a theory of rational choice. Many of the most distinguished commentators on models regard them as fictional worlds, whose study informs our understanding of actual phenomena (Frigg, 2010). “Creating models is ‘world-making.’” (Morgan 2012, pp. 95, 405). In their view, economists are able to investigate how causal factors would operate in the absence of interferences by constructing models —that is fictional economies—in which the interferences are absent. Uskali Mäki maintains that “Models are experiments. Experiments are models.” (2005). Dani Rodrik (2015) argues that economics consists of a collection of models, and that doing economics consists in selecting or customizing a model from this collection. Is the ubiquity of talk of models just a change in terminological fashion, or does the concern with models (which is by no means unique to economics) signal a methodological shift? What are models? These questions have been discussed by Cartwright 1989, 1999, Godfrey Smith 2006, Grüne-Yanoff 2009, Hausman 1992, 2015a, Kuorikoski and Lehtinen 2009, Mäki, ed. 1991, Mäki 2005, 2009a, 2009b, Morgan 2001, 2004, 2012, Morgan and Morrison 1999, Rappaport 1998, Sugden 2000, 2009, Weisberg 2007, and Lehtinen, Kuorikoski and Ylikoski 2012.

The view of models to which economists are most attracted is philosophically problematic, because it is apparently committed to the existence of fictional entities whose properties and causal propensities economists can investigate. In experiments, whether carried out in a laboratory or in the field, experimenters interact causally with flesh and blood experimental subjects, and the outcome may contradict the economist’s predictions. In investigating a model, in contrast, the economist “interacts” with fictional entities, which are arguably nothing other than his or her own thoughts, and the logical implications of the axioms that define the model are never disappointed. This is not to say that the logical investigation of models never results in surprises. Humans are not logically omniscient, and discovering the implications of a set of axioms may be an arduous task. But it is a different task than carrying out an experiment in the laboratory or the field, and ontology of the “worlds” that economists allegedly “create” and then study is deeply puzzling. Although less faithful to economic practice, it is far more intelligible philosophically to regard models as predicates or as definitions of predicates (Hausman 1992). For example, when economists write down a model of a firm with a single output and just two inputs, they are defining a concept that they can use to describe actual firms.

4. Influential approaches to economic methodology

The past half century has witnessed the emergence of a large literature devoted to economic methodology. That literature explores many methodological approaches and applies its conclusions to many schools and branches of economics. Much of the literature has focused on the fundamental theory of mainstream economics — the theory of the equilibria resulting from constrained rational individual choice — but the tremendous importance of macroeconomics in determining the proper responses to the great recession beginning in 2008, coupled with the rapidly increasing role of empirical and experimental inquiries in the day-to-day work of economists have seen echoes in methodological inquiries (Backhouse 2010). Since 1985, there has been a journal Economics and Philosophy devoted specifically to philosophy of economics, and since 1994 there has also been a Journal of Economic Methodology. This section will sample some of the methodological approaches of the past two decades.

4.1 Popperian approaches

Karl Popper’s philosophy of science has been influential among economists, as among other scientists. Popper defends what he calls a falsificationist methodology (1968, 1969). Scientists should formulate theories that are “logically falsifiable” — that is, inconsistent with some possible observation reports. “All crows are black” is logically falsifiable; it is inconsistent with (and would be falsified by) an observation report of a red crow. (Probabilistic claims are obviously not in this sense falsifiable.) Popper insists on falsifiability on the grounds that unfalsifiable claims that rule out no observations are uninformative. They provide no guidance concerning what to expect, and there is nothing to be learned from testing them. Second, Popper maintains that scientists should subject theories to harsh test and should be willing to reject them when they fail the tests. Third, scientists should regard theories as at best interesting conjectures. Passing a test does not confirm a theory or provide scientists with reason to believe it. It only justifies on the one hand continuing to employ the hypothesis (since it has not yet been falsified) and, on the other hand, devoting increased efforts to attempting to falsify it (since it has thus far survived testing). Popper has defended what he calls “situational logic” (which is basically rational choice theory) as the correct method for the social sciences (1967, 1976). There appear to be serious tensions between Popper’s falsificationism and his defense of situational logic, and his discussion of situational logic has not been as influential as his falsificationism. For discussion of how situational logic applies to economics, see Hands (1985a).

Given Popper’s falsificationism, there seems little hope of understanding how extreme simplifications can be legitimate or how current economic practice could be scientifically reputable. Economic theories and models are almost all unfalsifiable, and if they were, the widespread acceptance of Friedman’s methodological views would insure that they are not subjected to serious test. When models apparently fail tests, they are rarely repudiated. Economists conclude instead merely that they chose the wrong model for the task, or that there were disturbing causes. Economic models, which have not been well tested, are often taken to be well-established guides to policy, rather than merely conjectures. Critics of neoclassical economics have made these criticisms (Eichner 1983), but most of those who have espoused Popper’s philosophy of science have not repudiated mainstream economics and have not been harshly critical of its practitioners.

Mark Blaug (1992) and Terence Hutchison (1938, 1977, 1978, 2000), who are the most prominent Popperian methodologists, criticize particular features of economics, and they both call for more testing and a more critical attitude. For example, Blaug praises Gary Becker (1976) for his refusal to explain differences in choices by differences in preferences, but criticizes him for failing to go on and test his theories severely (1980a, chapter 14). However, both Blaug and Hutchison understate the radicalism of Popper’s views and take his message to be little more than that scientists should be critical and concerned to test their theories.

Blaug’s and Hutchison’s criticisms have sometimes been challenged on the grounds that economic theories cannot be tested, because of their ceteris paribus clauses and the many subsidiary assumptions required to derive testable implications (Caldwell 1984). But this response ignores Popper’s insistence that testing requires methodological decisions not to attribute failures of predictions to mistakes in subsidiary assumptions or to “interferences.” For views of Popper’s philosophy and its applicability to economics, see de Marchi (1988), Caldwell (1991), Boland (1982, 1989, 1992, 1997), and Boylan and O’Gorman (2007), Backhouse (2009), and Thomas (2017).

Applying Popper’s views on falsification literally would be destructive. Not only neoclassical economics, but all significant economic theories would be condemned as unscientific, and there would be no way to discriminate among economic theories. One major problem with a naive reading of Popper’s views is that one cannot derive testable implications from theories by themselves. To derive testable implications, one also needs subsidiary assumptions concerning probability distributions, measurement devices, proxies for unmeasured variables, the absence of interferences, and so forth. This is the so-called “Duhem-Quine problem” (Duhem 1906, Quine 1953, Cross 1982). These problems arise generally, and Popper proposes that they be solved by a methodological decision to regard a failure of the deduced testable implication to be a failure of the theory. But in economics the subsidiary assumptions are dubious and in many cases known to be false. Making the methodological decision that Popper requires is unreasonable and would lead one to reject all economic theories.

Imre Lakatos (1970), who was for most of his philosophical career a follower of Popper, offers a broadly Popperian solution to this problem. Lakatos insists that testing is always comparative. When theories face empirical difficulties, as they always do, one attempts to modify them. Scientifically acceptable (in Lakatos’ terminology “theoretically progressive”) modifications must always have some additional testable implications; otherwise they are purely ad hoc. If some of the new predictions are confirmed, then the modification is “empirically progressive,” and one has reason to reject the unmodified theory and to employ the new theory, regardless of how unsuccessful in general either theory may be. Though progress may be hard to come by, Lakatos’ views do not have the same destructive implications as Popper’s. Lakatos appears to solve the problem of how to appraise mainstream economic theory by arguing that what matters is empirical progress or retrogression rather than empirical success or failure. Lakatos’ views have thus been more attractive to economic methodologists than Popper’s.

Developing Thomas Kuhn’s notion of a “paradigm” (1970) and some hints from Popper, Lakatos also presented a view of the global theory structure of whole theoretical enterprises, which he called “scientific research programmes.” Lakatos emphasized that there is a “hard core” of basic theoretical propositions that define a research programme and that are not to be questioned within the research programme. In addition members of a research programme accept a common body of heuristics that guide them in the articulation and modification of specific theories. These views have also been attractive to economic methodologists, since theory development in economics is sharply constrained and since economics appears at first glance to have a “hard core.” The fact that economists do not give up basic theoretical postulates that appear to be false might be explained and justified by regarding them as part of the “hard core” of the “neoclassical research programme”.

Yet Lakatos’ views do not provide a satisfactory account of how economics can be a reputable science despite its reliance on extreme simplifications. For it is questionable whether the development of neoclassical economic theory has demonstrated empirical progress. For example, the replacement of “cardinal” utility theory by “ordinal” utility theory (see below Section 5.1) in the 1930s, which is generally regarded as a major step forward, involved the replacement of one theory by another that had no additional empirical content. Furthermore, despite his emphasis on heuristics as guiding theory modification, Lakatos still emphasizes testing. Science is for Lakatos more empirically driven than mainstream economics has been (Hands 1992). It is also doubtful whether research enterprises in economics have “hard cores” (Hoover 1991, Hausman 1992, ch. 6). For attempts to apply Lakatos’ views to economics see Latsis (1976), and Weintraub (1985). As is apparent in de Marchi and Blaug (1991), writers on economic methodology have in recent years become increasingly disenchanted with Lakatos’ philosophy (Backhouse 2009).

There is a second major problem with Popper’s philosophy of science, which plagues Lakatos’ views as well. Both maintain that there is no such thing as empirical confirmation (for some late qualms, see Lakatos 1974). Popper and Lakatos maintain that evidence never provides reason to believe that scientific claims are true, and both also deny that results of tests can justify relying on statements in practical endeavours or in theoretical inquiry. There is no better evidence for one unfalsified proposition than for another. On this view, someone who questions whether there is enough evidence for some proposition to justify relying on it in theoretical studies or for policy purposes would be making the methodological “error” of supposing that there can be evidence in support of hypotheses. With the notable exception of Watkins (1984), few philosophers within the Popperian tradition have faced up to this challenging consequence.

4.2 The rhetoric of economics

One radical reaction to the difficulties of justifying the reliance on severe simplifications is to deny that economics passes methodological muster. Alexander Rosenberg (1992) maintains that economics can only make imprecise generic predictions, and it cannot make progress, because it is built around folk psychology, which is a mediocre theory of human behavior and which (owing to the irreducibility of intentional notions) cannot be improved. Complex economic theories are scientifically valuable only as applied mathematics, not as empirical theory. Since economics does not show the same consistent progress as the natural sciences, one cannot dismiss Rosenberg’s suggestion that economics is an empirical dead end. But his view that it has made no progress and that it does not permit quantitative predictions is hard to accept. For example, contemporary economists are much better at pricing stock options or designing auctions than economists were even a generation ago.

An equally radical but opposite reaction is Deirdre McCloskey’s, who denies that there are any non-trivial methodological standards that economics must meet (1985, 1992, 1994, 2000, McCloskey and Ziliak 2003, Ziliak and McCloskey 2008). In her view, the only relevant and significant criteria for assessing the practices and products of a discipline are those accepted by the practitioners. Apart from a few general standards such as honesty and a willingness to listen to criticisms, the only justifiable criteria for any conversation are those of the participants. Economists can thus dismiss the arrogant pretensions of philosophers to judge economic discourse. Whatever a group of respected economists takes to be good economics is automatically good economics. Philosophical standards of empirical success are just so much hot air. Those who are interested in understanding the character of economics and in contributing to its improvement should eschew methodology and study instead the “rhetoric” of economics — that is, the means of argument and persuasion that succeed among economists.

McCloskey’s studies of the rhetoric of economics have been valuable and influential (1985, esp. ch. 5–7, McCloskey and Ziliak 2003, Ziliak and McCloskey 2008), but a great deal of her work during the 1980s and 1990s consists of philosophical critiques of economic methodology rather than studies of the rhetoric of economics. Her philosophical critiques are problematic, because the position sketched in the previous paragraph is hard to defend and potentially self-defeating. It is hard to defend, because epistemological standards have already influenced the conversation of economists. The standards of predictive success which lead one to have qualms about economics are already standards that many economists accept. The only way to escape these doubts is to surrender the standards that gave rise to them. But McCloskey’s position undermines any principled argument for a change in standards. Furthermore, as Rosenberg has argued (1988), it seems that economists would doom themselves to irrelevance if they were to surrender standards of predictive success, for it is upon such standards that policy decisions are made.

McCloskey does not, in fact, want to preclude the possibiity that economists are sometimes persuaded when they should not be or are not persuaded when they should be. For she herself criticizes the bad habit some economists have of conflating statistical significance with economic importance (1985, ch. 9, McCloskey and Ziliak 2003, Ziliak and McCloskey 2008). McCloskey typically characterizes rhetoric descriptively as the study of what in fact persuades, but sometimes she instead characterizes it normatively as the study of what ought to persuade (1985, ch. 2). And if rhetoric is the study of what ought rationally to persuade, then it is methodology, not an alternative to methodology. Questions about whether economics is a successful empirical science cannot be conjured away.

4.3 “Realism” in economic methodology

Economic methodologist have paid little attention to debates within philosophy of science between realists and anti-realists (van Fraassen 1980, Boyd 1984, Psillos 1999, Niniluoto 2002, Chakravarty 2010, Dicken 2016), because economic theories rarely postulate the existence of unobservable entities or properties, apart from variants of “everyday unobservables,” such as beliefs and desires. Methodologists have, on the other hand, vigorously debated the goals of economics, but those who argue that the ultimate goals are predictive (such as Milton Friedman) do so because of their interest in policy, not because they seek to avoid or resolve epistemological and semantic puzzles concerning references to unobservables.

Nevertheless there are two important recent realist programs in economic methodology. The first, developed mainly by Uskali Mäki, is devoted to exploring the varieties of realism implicit in the methodological statements and theoretical enterprises of economists (see Mäki 1990a, b, c, 2007, and Lehtinen, Kuorikoski and Ylikoski 2012). The second, which is espoused by Tony Lawson and his co-workers, mainly at Cambridge University, derives from the work of Roy Bhaskar (1975) (see Lawson 1997, 2015, Bhaskar et al. 1998, Fleetwood 1999, Brown and Fleetwood 2003, Ackroyd and Fleetwood 2004, Edwards, Mahoney, and Vincent 2014). In Lawson’s view, one can trace many of the inadequacies of mainstream economics (of which he is a critic) to an insufficient concern with ontology. In attempting to identify regularities on the surface of the phenomena, mainstream economists are doomed to failure. Economic phenomena are in fact influenced by a large number of different causal factors, and one can achieve scientific knowledge only of the underlying mechanisms and tendencies, whose operation can be glimpsed intermittently and obscurely in observable relations. Mäki’s and Lawson’s programs have little to do with one another, though Mäki (like Mill, Cartwright, and Hausman) shares Lawson’s and Bhaskar’s concern with underlying causal mechanisms. See also the entry on scientific realism.

4.4 Economic methodology and social studies of science

Throughout its history, economics has been the subject of sociological as well as methodological scrutiny. Many sociological discussions of economics, like Marx’s critique of classical political economy, have been concerned to identify ideological distortions and thereby to criticize particular aspects of economic theory and economic policy. Since every political program finds economists who testify to its economic virtues, there is a never-ending source of material for such critiques. For example, in the wake of the near collapse of the international financial system in 2008, American economists who argued for austerity were mostly Republicans, while those who defended efforts to increase aggregate demand were mostly Democrats.

The influence of contemporary sociology of science and social studies of science, coupled with the difficulties methodologists have had making sense of and rationalizing the conduct of economics, have led to efforts at fusing economics and sociology (Granovetter 1985, Swedberg 1990, 2007) as well as to a sociological turn within methodological reflection itself. Rather than showing that there is good evidence supporting developments in economic theory or that those developments have other broadly epistemic virtues, methodologists and historians such as D. Wade Hands (2001); Hands and Mirowski 1998), Philip Mirowski (1990, 2002, 2004, 2013), and E. Roy Weintraub (1991) have argued that these changes reflect a wide variety of non-rational factors, from changes in funding for theoretical economics, political commitments, personal rivalries, attachments to metaphors, or mathematical interests.

Furthermore, many of the same methodologists and historians have argued that economics is not only an object of social inquiry, but that it can be a tool of social inquiry into science. By studying the incentive structure of scientific disciplines and the implicit or explicit market forces impinging on research (including of course research in economics), it should be possible to write the economics of science and the economics of economics itself (Hands 1995, Hull 1988, Leonard 2002, Mirowski and Sent 2002).

Exactly how, if at all, this work is supposed to bear on questions concerning how well supported are the claims economists make is not clear. Though eschewing traditional methodology, Mirowski’s monograph on the role of physical analogy in economics (1990) is often very critical of mainstream economics. In his Reflection without Rules (2001) D. W. Hands maintains that general methodological rules are of little use. He defends a naturalistic view of methodology and is skeptical of prescriptions that are not based on detailed knowledge. But he does not argue that no rules apply.

4.5 Case studies

The above survey of approaches to the fundamental problems of appraising economic theory is far from complete. For example, there have been substantial efforts to apply structuralist views of scientific theories (Sneed 1971, Stegmüller 1976, 1979) to economics (Stegmüller et al. 1981, Hamminga 1983, Hands 1985c, Balzer and Hamminga 1989). The above discussion documents the diversity and disagreements concerning how to interpret and appraise economic theories. It is not surprising that there is no consensus among those writing on economic methodology concerning the overall empirical appraisal of specific approaches in economics, including mainstream microeconomics, macroeconomics, and econometrics. When practitioners cannot agree, it is questionable whether those who know more philosophy but less economics will be able to settle the matter. Since the debates continue, those who reflect on economic methodology should have a continuing part to play.

Meanwhile, there are many other more specific methodological questions to address, and it is a sign of the maturity of the subdiscipline that a large and increasing percentage of work on economic methodology addresses more specific questions. There is plethora of work, as a perusal of any recent issue of the Journal of Economic Methodology or Economics and Philosophy will confirm. Some of the range of issues currently under discussion were mentioned above in Section 2. Here is a list of three of the many areas of current interest:

1. Although more concerned with the content of economics than with its methodology, the recent explosion of work on feminist economics is shot through with methodological and sociological self-reflection. The fact that a considerably larger percentage of economists are men than is true of any of the other social sciences and indeed than most of the natural sciences raises questions about whether there is something particularly masculine about the discipline. Important texts are Ferber and Nelson (1993, 2003), Nelson (1995, 1996, 2001), Barker and Kuiper (2003). Since 1995, there has been a journal, Feminist Economics, which pulls together much of this work.

2. During the past decades, laboratory experimentation in economics has expanded rapidly. Laboratory experimentation has many different objectives (see Roth 1988) and apparently holds out the prospect of bridging the gulf between fundamental economic theory and empirical evidence. Some of it casts light on the way in which methodological commitments influence the extent to which economists heed empirical evidence. A good deal of laboratory experimentation in contemporary economics is in the service of behavioral economics, which prides itself on heeding experimental evidence concerning the structure and determinants of individual choices. Although behavioral economics has secured a foothold within mainstream economics, it remains controversial substantively and methodologically, and its implications for normative economics, discussed below in section 6, are controversial.

For example, in the case of preference reversals, discussed briefly below in Section 5.1, economists devoted considerable attention to the experimental findings and conceded that they disconfirmed central principles of economics. But economists have been generally unwilling to pay serious attention to the theories proposed by psychologists that predicted the phenomena before they were observed. The reason seems to be that these psychological theories do not have the same wide scope as the basic principles of mainstream economics (Hausman 1992, chapter 13). Hesitation concerning neuroeconomics (Camerer et al. 2005, Camerer 2009, Marchionni and Vromen 2014, Rustichini 2005, 2009, Glimcher and Fehr 2013, Reuter and Montag 2016, Vromen and Marchionni 2018) is also common. In an extremely influential essay, “The Case for Mindless Economics.” Gul and Pesandorfer (2008) argue that the findings of behavioral economics (and neuroeconomics) are irrelevant to economics. They are at most of heuristic value. They maintain that the findings of behavioral economics are irrelevant to economics, because they do not concern market choices and their consequences, which are the only germane data. Sometimes Gul and Pesandorfer appear to identify economic theory with the empirical consequences economists are concerned with, while at other points they echo Milton Friedman (see section 3.2) and deny that the “realism” of the “assumptions” of economic models matters. They do not address sophisticated defenses of realism concerning mental states like Dietrich and List (2016). It seems to me that theoretical resistance to engaging with behavioral economists like that one finds in Gul and Pesandorfer’s essay is weakening. But it is clear that the methodological commitments governing theoretical economics are much more complex and more specific to economics than the general rules proposed by philosophers such as Popper and Lakatos.

The relevance of laboratory experimentation remains controversial. Behavioral economists are enthusiastic, while more traditional theorists question whether experimental findings can be generalized to non-experimental contexts and, more generally, concerning the possibilities of learning from experiments (Caplin and Schotter 2008). For discussions of experimental economics, see Guala (2000a, b, 2005), Hey (1991), Kagel and Roth (1995, 2016), Plott (1991), Smith (1991), Starmer (1999), Camerer (2003), Bardsley and Cubitt 2009, Durlauf and Blume (2009), Branas-Garza and Cabrales (2015), Fréchette and Schotter (2015), Jacquemet and L’Haridon (2018), and the June, 2005 special issue of the Journal of Economic Methodology. Al Roth’s Game Theory, Experimental Economics, and Market Design Page ( is a useful source. For recent work on behavioral economics see the Journal of Behavioral Economics, the Review of Behavioral Economics, and Behavioural Public Policy.

3. During the past generation, there has been a radical transformation in the attitudes of economists toward empirical causal inquiry, especially in the form of field experiments and natural experiments, often employing instrumental variables. For example, about two-thirds of the articles in the February, 2018 American Economic Review are based on empirical studies. The titles of the first four entries in the table of contents are: “The Effects of Pretrial Detention on Conviction, Future Crime, and Employment: Evidence from Randomly Assigned Judges,” “Implications of US Tax Policy for House Prices, Rents, and Homeownership,” “The Welfare Cost of Perceived Policy Uncertainty: Evidence from Social Security,” “The Economic Consequences of Hospital Admissions.” If one goes back twenty-five years, only about one-eighth of the first issue of the 1993 American Economic Review appear to rely on any empirical studies. The first four entries are: “Today’s Task for Economists,” “Trigger Points and Budget Cuts: Explaining the Effects of Fiscal Austerity,” “Economic Policy, Economic Performance, and Elections,” “The Macroeconomics of Dr. Strangelove.” A Rip Van Winkle who had gone to sleep in 1983 reading the principal economics journals would be staggered when he awoke in 2018.

Field experiments have been especially important in development economics where the results of various foreign aid projects have too often provided meagre benefits. One can find good introductions to this work in Carpenter et al. (2005), Duflo and Banerjee (2011, 2017), Gugerty and Karlan (2018), Karlan and Appel (2011, 2016), Kremer and Glennerster (2011), List and Samek (2018), and Mullainathan and Shafir (2013). See also the Poverty Action Lab. Although field experiments appear to be hard-nosed inquiries that establish what works and what does not work, matters are not so simple (Deaton 2010, Cartwright and Hardie 2013). Without knowledge of the mechanisms, it is all too easy for an intervention that works splendidly at a specific time and place to fail abysmally when tried elsewhere. Atheoretical inquiry, even when methodologically sophisticated, has severe limits as a tactic of knowledge acquisition.

The empirical turn in economics has also had the effect of increasing the importance of economic history. With some ingenuity, especially in identifying possible instrumental variables, history is full of “natural experiments.” For example (J. Hausman 2016), in 1936, the American Congress voted to pay pensions to veterans of World War I eight years before they were due to be paid. Because the percentages of veterans differed across states, Hausman can use the differing economic performances of states to estimate the effects of the economic stimulus the pensions provided. Although less decisive than randomized controlled trials (which are often impossible to carry out), examination of historical episodes such as this one provide significant evidence concerning economic hypotheses.

5. Rational choice theory

Insofar as economics explains and predicts phenomena as consequences of individual choices, which are themselves explained in terms of alleged reasons, it must depict agents as to some extent rational. Rationality, like reasons, involves evaluation, and just as one can assess the rationality of individual choices, so one can assess the rationality of social choices and examine how they are and ought to be related to the preferences and judgments of individuals. In addition, there are intricate questions concerning rationality in strategic situations in which outcomes depend on the choices of multiple individuals. Since rationality is a central concept in branches of philosophy such as action theory, epistemology, ethics, and philosophy of mind, studies of rationality frequently cross the boundaries between economics and philosophy.

5.1 Individual rationality

The barebones theory of rationality discussed above in Section 1.1 takes an agent’s preferences (rankings of states of affairs) to be rational if they are complete and transitive, and it takes the agent’s choice to be rational if the agent does not prefer any feasible alternative to the one he or she chooses. Such a theory of rationality is clearly too weak, because it says nothing about belief or what rationality implies when agents do not know (with certainty) everything relevant to their choices. But it may also be too strong, since, as Isaac Levi in particular has argued (1986), there is nothing irrational about having incomplete preferences in situations involving uncertainty. Sometimes it is rational to suspend judgment and to refuse to rank alternatives that are not well understood. On the other hand, transitivity is a plausible condition, and the so-called “money pump” argument demonstrates that if one’s preferences are intransitive and one is willing to make exchanges, then one can be exploited. (Suppose an agent A prefers X to Y, Y to Z and Z to X, and that A will pay some small amount of money $P to exchange Y for X, Z for Y, and X for Z. That means that, starting with Z, A will pay $P for Y, then $P again for X, then $P again for Z and so on. Agents are not this stupid. They will instead refuse to trade or adjust their preferences to eliminate the intransitivity (but see Schick 1986).

On the other hand, there is considerable experimental evidence that people’s preferences are not in fact transitive. Such evidence does not establish that transitivity is not a requirement of rationality. It may show instead that people are sometimes irrational. In the case of so-called “preference reversals,” for example, it seems plausible that people in fact make irrational choices (Lichtenstein and Slovic 1971, Tversky and Thaler 1990). Evidence of persistent violations of transitivity is disquieting, since standards of rationality should not be impossibly high.

A further difficulty with the barebones theory of rationality concerns the individuation of the objects of preference or choice. Consider, for example, data from multistage ultimatum games. Suppose A can propose any division of $10 between A and B. B can accept or reject A’s proposal. If B rejects the proposal, then the amount of money drops to $5, and B gets to offer a division of the $5 which A can accept or reject. If A rejects B’s offer, then both players get nothing. Suppose that A proposes to divide the money with $7 for A and $3 for B. B declines and offers to split the $5 evenly, with $2.50 for each. Behavior such as this is, in fact, common (Ochs and Roth 1989, p. 362). Assuming that B prefers more money to less, these choices appear to be a violation of transitivity. B prefers $3 to $2.50, yet declines $3 for certain for $2.50 (with some slight chance of A declining and B getting nothing). But the objects of choice are not just quantities of money. B is turning down $3 as part of “a raw deal” in favor of $2.50 as part of a fair arrangement. If the objects of choice are defined in this way, there is no failure of transitivity.

This plausible observation gives rise to a serious problem. Unless there are constraints on how the objects of choice are individuated, conditions of rationality such as transitivity are empty. A’s choice of X over Y, Y over Z and Z over X does not violate transitivity if “X when the alternative is Y” is not the same object of choice as “X when the alternative is Z”. John Broome (1991) argues that further substantive principles of rationality are required to limit how alternatives are individuated or to require that agents be indifferent between alternatives such as “X when the alternative is Y” and “X when the alternative is Z.”

To extend the theory of rationality to circumstances involving risk (where the objects of choice are lotteries with known probabilities) and uncertainty (where agents do not know the probabilities or even all the possible outcomes of their choices) requires further principles of rationality, as well as controversial technical simplifications. Subjective Bayesians suppose that individuals in circumstances of uncertainty have well-defined subjective probabilities (degrees of belief) over all the payoffs and thus that the objects of choice can be modeled as lotteries, just as in circumstances involving risk, though with subjective probabilities in place of objective probabilities. See the entries on Bayes’ theorem and Bayesian epistemology. The most important of the axioms needed for the theory of rational choice under conditions of risk and uncertainty is the independence condition. It says roughly that the preferences of rational agent between two lotteries that differ in only one outcome should match their preferences between the differing outcomes. Although initially plausible, the independence condition is very controversial. See Allais and Hagen (1979) and McClennen (1983, 1990).

A considerable part of rational choice theory is concerned with formalizations of conditions of rationality and investigation of their implications. When an agent’s preferences are complete and transitive and satisfy a further continuity condition, then they can be represented by a so-called ordinal utility function. What this means is that it is possible to define a function that represents an agent’s preferences so that U(X) > U(Y) if and only if the agent prefers X to Y, and U(X) = U(Y) if and only if the agent is indifferent between X and Y. This function merely represents the preference ranking. It contains no information beyond the ranking. Any order-preserving transformation of “U” would represent the agent’s preferences just as well.

When an agent’s preferences in addition satisfy the independence condition and some other technical conditions, then they can be represented by an expected utility function (Harsanyi 1977b, ch. 4, Hernstein and Milnor 1953, Ramsey 1926, and Savage 1972). Such a function has two important properties. First, the expected utility of a lottery is equal to the sum of the (expected) utilities of its prizes weighted by their probabilities. Second, expected utility functions are unique up to a positive affine transformation. What this means is that if U and V are both expected utility functions representing the preferences of an agent, then for all objects of preference, X, V(X) must be equal to aU(X) + b, where a and b are real numbers and a is positive. In addition, the axioms of rationality imply that the agent’s degrees of belief will satisfy the axioms of the probability calculus.

A great deal of controversy surrounds the theory of rationality, and there have been many formal investigations into weakened or amended theories of rationality. For further discussion, see Allais and Hagen 1979, Barberà, Hammond and Seidl 1999, Kahneman and Tversky 1979, Loomes and Sugden 1982, Luce and Raiffa 1957, Machina 1987, and Gilboa and Schmeidler 2001.

5.2 Collective rationality and social choice

Although societies are very different from individuals, they have mechanisms to evaluate alternatives and make choices, and their evaluations and choices may be rational or irrational. It is not, however, obvious, what principles of rationality should govern the choices and evaluations of society. Transitivity is one plausible condition. It seems that a society that chooses X when faced with the alternatives X or Y, Y when faced with the alternatives Y or Z and Z when faced with the alternatives X or Z either has had a change of heart or is choosing irrationally. Yet, purported irrationalities such as these can easily arise from standard mechanisms that aim to link social choices and individual preferences. Suppose there are three individuals in the society. Individual One ranks the alternatives X, Y, Z. Individual Two ranks them Y, Z, X. Individual Three ranks them Z, X, Y. If decisions are made by pairwise majority voting, X will be chosen from the pair (X, Y), Y will be chosen from (Y, Z), and Z will be chosen from (X, Z). Clearly this is unsettling, but are possible cycles in social choices irrational?

Similar problems affect what one might call the logical coherence of social judgments (List and Pettit 2002). Suppose society consists of three individuals who make the following judgments concerning the truth or falsity of the propositions P and Q and that social judgment follows the majority.

  P if P then Q Q
Individual 1 true true true
Individual 2 false true false
Individual 3 true false false
Society true true false

The judgments of each of the individuals are consistent with the principles of logic, while social judgments violate them. How important is it that social judgments be consistent with the principles of logic?

Although social choice theory in this way bears on questions of social rationality, most work in social choice theory explores the consequences of principles of rationality coupled with explicitly ethical constraints. The seminal contribution is Kenneth Arrow’s impossibility theorem (1963, 1967). Arrow assumes that both individual preferences and social preferences are complete and transitive and that the method of forming social preferences (or making social choices) issues in some social preference ranking or social choice for any possible profile of individual preferences. In addition, Arrow imposes a weak unanimity condition: if everybody prefers X to Y, then Y must not be socially preferred. Third, he requires that there be no dictator whose preferences determine social preferences or choices irrespective of the preferences of anybody else. Lastly, he imposes the condition that the social preference between X and Y should depend on how individuals rank X and Y and on nothing else. Arrow then proved the surprising result that no method of relating social and individual preferences can satisfy all these conditions!

In the sixty years since Arrow wrote, there has been a plethora of work in social choice theory, a good deal of which is arguably of great importance to ethics. For example, John Harsanyi proved that if individual preferences and social evaluations both satisfy the axioms of expected utility theory (with shared or objective probabilities) and that social preferences conform to unanimous individual preferences, then social evaluations are determined by a weighted sum of individual utilities (1955, 1977a). Matthew Adler (2012) has extended an approach like Harsanyi’s to demonstrate that a form of weighted utilitarianism, which prioritizes the interests of those who are worse off, uniquely satisfies a longer list of rational and ethical constraints. When there are instead disagreements in probability assignments, there is an impossibility result: the unanimity condition implies that for some profiles of individual preferences, social evaluations will not satisfy the axioms of expected utility theory (Hammond 1983, Seidenfeld, et al. 1989, Mongin 1995). For further discussion of social choice theory and the relevance of utility theory to social evaluation, see the entry on social choice theory, Sen (1970) and for recent reappraisals Fleurbaey (2007) and Adler (2012).

5.3 Game theory

When outcomes depend on what several agents do, one agent’s best choice may depend on what other agents choose. Although the principles of rationality governing individual choice still apply, arguably there are further principles of rationality governing expectations of the actions of others (and of their expectations concerning your actions and expectations, and so forth). Game theory occupies an increasingly important role within economics, and it is also relevant both to inquiries concerning rationality and inquiries concerning ethics. For further discussion see the entries on game theory, game theory and ethics, and evolutionary game theory.

6. Economics and ethics

As discussed above in Section 2.1 most economists distinguish between positive and normative economics, and most would argue that economics is relevant to policy mainly because of the (positive) information it provides concerning the consequences of policy. Yet the same economists also offer their advice concerning how to fix the economy, and there is a whole field of normative economics.

Economic outcomes, institutions, and processes may be better or worse in several different ways. Some outcomes may make people better off. Other outcomes may be less unequal. Others may restrict individual freedom more severely. Economists typically evaluate outcomes exclusively in terms of welfare. This does not imply that they believe that only welfare is of moral importance. They focus on welfare, because they believe that economics provides an excellent set of tools to address questions of welfare and because they hope that questions about welfare can be separated from questions about equality, freedom, or justice. As sketched below, economists have had some things to say about other dimensions of moral appraisal, but welfare takes center stage. Indeed normative economics is standardly called “welfare economics.”

6.1 Welfare

One central question of moral philosophy has been to determine what things are intrinsically good for human beings. This is a central question, because all plausible moral views assign an important place to individual welfare or well-being. This is obviously true of utilitarianism (which holds that what is right maximizes total or average welfare), but even non-utilitarian views are concerned with welfare, if they recognize the virtue of benevolence, or if they are concerned with the interests of individuals or with avoiding harm to individuals.

There are many ways to think about well-being, and the prevailing view among economists has shifted from hedonism (which takes the good to be a mental state such as pleasure or happiness) to the view that welfare should be measured by the satisfaction of preferences. A number of prominent economists are currently arguing for a return to hedonism, but they remain a minority. (See Bavetta et al. 2014. Clark Flèche 2018, Dolan and Kahneman 2014, Frey 2010, 2018, Frey and Stutzer 2001, Kahneman 1999, 2000a, 2000b, Kahneman and Krueger 2006, Kahneman and Sugden 2005, Kahneman and Thaler 2006, Layard 2006, Ormerod 2008, Radcliff 2013, Weimann and Knabe 2015 and for criticism Davies 2015, Etzioni 2018, and Hausman 2010.) Unlike hedonism, taking welfare to be preference satisfaction specifies how to find out what is good for a person rather than committing itself to any substantive view of a person’s good. Note that equating welfare with the satisfaction of preferences is not equating welfare with any feeling of satisfaction. If welfare can be measured by the satisfaction of preferences, then a person is better off if what he or she prefers comes to pass, regardless of whether that occurrence makes the agent feel satisfied.

Since mainstream economics attributes a consistent preference ordering to all agents, and since more specific models typically take agents to be well-informed and self-interested, it is easy for economists to accept the view that an individual agent A will prefer X to Y if and only if X is in fact better for A than Y is. This is one place where positive theory bleeds into normative theory. In addition, the identification of welfare with the satisfaction of preferences is attractive to economists, because it prevents questions about the justification of paternalism (to which most economists are strongly opposed) from even arising.

Welfare and the satisfaction of preferences may coincide because the satisfaction of preferences constitutes welfare or because people are self-interested and good judges of their own interests and hence prefer what is good for them. There are many obvious objections to the view that the satisfaction of preferences constitutes welfare. Preferences may be based on mistaken beliefs. People may prefer to sacrifice their own well-being for some purpose they value more highly. Preferences may reflect past manipulation or distorting psychological influences (Elster 1983). In addition, if preference satisfaction constitutes welfare, then policy makers can make people better off by molding their wants rather than by improving conditions. Furthermore, it seems unreasonable that social policy should attend to extravagant preferences. Rather than responding to these objections and attempting to defend the view that preference satisfaction constitutes well-being, economists can blunt these objections by taking preferences in circumstances where people are self-interested and good judges of their interests to be merely good evidence of what will promote welfare (Hausman and McPherson 2009, Hausman 2012). There are some exceptions, most notably Amartya Sen (1987a,b,c, 1992), but most economists take welfare to coincide with the satisfaction of preference.

6.2 Efficiency

Because the identification of welfare with preference satisfaction makes it questionable whether one can make interpersonal welfare comparisons, few economists defend a utilitarian view of policy as maximizing total or average welfare. (Harsanyi is one exception, for another see Ng 1983). Economists have instead explored the possibility of making welfare assessments of economic processes, institutions, outcomes, and policies without making interpersonal comparisons. Consider two economic outcomes S and R, and suppose that some people prefer S to R and that nobody prefers R to S. In that case S is “Pareto superior” to R, or S is a “Pareto improvement” over R. Without making any interpersonal comparisons, one can conclude that people’s preferences are better satisfied in S than in R. If there is no state of affairs that is Pareto superior to S, then economists say that S is “Pareto optimal” or “Pareto efficient.” Efficiency here is efficiency with respect to satisfying preferences rather than minimizing the number of inputs needed to produce a unit of output or some other technical notion (Le Grand 1991). If a state of affairs is not Pareto efficient, then society is missing an opportunity costlessly to satisfy some people’s preferences better. A Pareto efficient state of affairs avoids this failure, but it has no other obvious virtues. For example, suppose nobody is satiated and people care only about how much food they get. Consider two distributions of food. In the first, millions are starving but no food is wasted. In the second, nobody is starving, but some food is wasted. The first is Pareto efficient, while the second is not.

The notions of Pareto improvements and Pareto efficiency might seem useless, because economic policies almost always have both winners and losers. Mainstream economists have nevertheless found these concepts useful in two ways. First, they have proved two theorems concerning properties of perfectly competitive equilibria (Arrow 1968). The first theorem says that equilibria in perfectly competitive markets are Pareto optimal, and the second says that any Pareto optimal allocation, with whatever distribution of income policy makers might prefer, can be achieved as a perfectly competitive market equilibrium, provided that one begins with just the right distribution of endowments among economic agents. The first theorem has been regarded as underwriting Adam Smith’s view of the invisible hand (Arrow and Hahn 1971, preface; Hahn 1973). This interpretation is problematic, because no economy has ever been or will ever be in perfectly competitive equilibrium. The second theorem provides some justification for the normative division of labor economists prefer, with economists concerned about efficiency and others concerned about justice. The thought is that the second theorem shows that theories of just distribution are compatible with reliance on competitive markets. The two fundamental theorems of welfare economics go some way toward explaining why mainstream economists, whether they support laissez-faire policies or government intervention to remedy market imperfections, think of perfectly competitive equilibria as ideals. But the significance of the theorems is debatable, since actual markets differ significantly from perfectly competitive markets and, when there are multiple market imperfections, the “theory of the second best” shows that fixing some of the imperfections may lead the society away from a perfectly competitive equilibrium (and diminish efficiency and welfare) rather than toward one (Lipsey and Lancaster 1956–7).

The other way that economists have found to extend the Pareto efficiency notions leads to cost-benefit analysis, which is a practical tool for policy analysis (Mishan 1971; Sugden and Williams 1978; Adler and Posner 2000, 2006; Broadman et al. 2010; Boadway 2016). Suppose that S is not a Pareto improvement over R. Some members of the society would be losers in a shift from R to S. Those losers prefer R to S, but there are enough winners — enough people who prefer S to R — that the winners could compensate the losers and make the preference for S′ (S with compensation paid) over R unanimous. S is a “potential Pareto improvement” over R. In other terms, the amount of money the winners would be willing to pay to bring about the change is larger than the amount of money the losers would have to be compensated so as not to object to the change. (Economists are skeptical about what one learns from asking people how much they would be willing to pay, and they attempt instead to infer how much individuals are willing to pay indirectly from market phenomena.) When S is a potential Pareto improvement over R, there is said to be a “net benefit” to the policy of bringing about S. According to cost-benefit analysis, among eligible policies (which satisfy legal and moral constraints), one should, other things being equal, employ the one with the largest net benefit. Note that the compensation is entirely hypothetical. Potential Pareto improvements result in winners and losers, the justice or injustice of which is irrelevant to cost-benefit analysis. Justice or beneficence may require that the society do something to mitigate distributional imbalances. Because there is a larger “pie” of goods and services to satisfy preferences (since compensation could be paid and everybody’s preferences better satisfied), selecting policies with the greatest net benefit serves economic efficiency (Hicks 1939, Kaldor 1939).

Despite the practical importance of cost-benefit analysis, the technique and the justification for it sketched in the previous paragraph are problematic. One technical difficulty is that it is possible for S to be a potential Pareto improvement over R and for R to be a potential Pareto improvement over S (Scitovsky 1941, Samuelson 1950)! That means that the fact that S is a potential Pareto improvement over R does not imply that there is a larger economic “pie” in S than in R, because there cannot, of course, be a larger economic pie in S than in R and a larger economic pie in R than in S. A second problem is that willingness to pay for some policy and the amount one would require in compensation if one opposes the policy depend on how much wealth one has as well as on one’s attitude to the policy. Cost-benefit analysis weights the preferences of the rich more than the preferences of the poor (Baker 1975). It is possible to compensate roughly for the effects of income and wealth (Harburger 1978, Fankhauser et al. 1997), but it is bothersome to do so, and cost-benefit analysis is commonly employed without any adjustment for wealth or income.

A further serious difficulty for traditional welfare economics, which has been as it were hiding in plain sight, is the fact that choices are imperfect indicators of preferences, which are in turn imperfect indicators of what enhances well-being. The same facts that show that preference satisfaction does not constitute well-being (false beliefs, lack of information, other-directed and non-rational preferences) show that choices and preferences are sometimes misleading indicators of well-being. Moreover, once one recognizes that preferences are good indicators of welfare only if agents are good judges of what will benefit them, one is bound to recognize that agents are not always good judges of what will benefit themselves, even when they have all the information they need. In some contexts, these problems may be minor. For example, people’s preferences among new automobiles are largely self-interested, thoughtful, and well-informed. In other contexts, such as environmental protection, preferences for ignoring the problems are often badly informed, while preferences to take action are typically not self-interested. Either way, popular preferences among policies to address environmental problems are unlikely to be a good guide to welfare.

Ignoring these problems has been a great convenience to normative economics. If what people choose reveals their preferences, which in turn indicate what is good for them, then, as noted before, government action to steer someone’s choices can never make that person better off, and so questions about whether to endorse paternalistic policies cannot arise. But whether or not it is advisable, successful paternalism is not impossible; and recent work by behavioral economists, which document a wide variety of systematic deliberative foibles, has put questions concerning paternalism back on the table (Ariely 2009, Kahneman 2011). Some economists have searched for ways to identify an agent’s “true” preferences (as described by Infante et al. 2016). Others have argued that policy makers must respect the preferences of agents among their ends or objectives, while overruling preferences among means when these are distorted by bad judgment or false beliefs (Thaler and Sunstein 2008, Le Grand and New 2015). Moreover, Thaler and Sunstein’s proposal that government explore non-coercive methods of influencing people to make better choices (“nudges”) has been popular among policy makers and has arguably shifted philosophical discussion of paternalism away from Mill’s (1859) focus on avoiding coercion (Shiffrin 2000, Hausman and Welch 2010, Le Grand and New 2015).

6.3 Other directions in normative economics

Although welfare economics and concerns about efficiency dominate normative economics, they do not exhaust the subject, and in collaboration with philosophers, economists have made important contributions to contemporary work in ethics and normative social and political philosophy. Section 5.2 and Section 5.3 gave some hint of the contributions of social choice theory and game theory. In addition economists and philosophers have worked on the problem of providing a formal characterization of freedom so as to bring tools of economic analysis to bear (Pattanaik and Xu 1990, Sen 1988, 1990, 1991, Carter 1999, Sugden 2018). Others have developed formal characterizations of social welfare functions that prioritize the interests of those who are less well off or that favor equality of resources, opportunity, and outcomes and that separate individual and social responsibility for inequalities (Pazner and Schmeidler 1974, Varian 1974, 1975, Roemer 1986b, 1987, Fleurbaey 1995, 2008, Fleurbaey and Maniquet 2014, Greaves 2015, McCarthy 2015, 2017). John Roemer has put contemporary economic modeling to work to offer precise characterizations of exploitation (1982). Amartya Sen and Martha Nussbaum have not only developed novel interpretations of the proper concerns of normative economics in terms of capabilities (Sen 1992, Nussbaum and Sen 1993, Nussbaum 2000), which Sen has linked to characterizations of egalitarianism and to operational measures of deprivation (1999). There are many lively interactions between normative economics and moral philosophy. See also the entries on libertarianism, paternalism, egalitarianism, and economics [normative] and economic justice.

7. Conclusions

The frontiers between economics and philosophy concerned with methodology, rationality, ethics and normative social and political philosophy are buzzing with activity. This activity is diverse and concerned with very different questions. Although many of these are related, philosophy of economics is not a single unified enterprise. It is a collection of separate inquiries linked to one another by connections among the questions and by the dominating influence of mainstream economic models and techniques.


The following bibliography is not comprehensive. It generally avoids separate citations for methodological essays in collections. It does not list separately the essays on economic methodology from special issues on philosophy and economics. A large number of essays on philosophy of economics can be found in the journals, Economics and Philosophy, The Journal of Economic Methodology and the annual series Research in the History of Economic Thought and Methodology.

Readers may want to consult the Journal of Economic Methodology, Vol. 8, No. 1, March 2001 Millennium symposium on “The Past, Present and Future of Economic Methodology” the and Binder et al. 2016. For an encyclopedic overview of economic methodology, see the Handbook of Economic Methodology edited by Davis, Hands, and Mäki. For a comprehensive bibliography of works on economic methodology through 1988, see Redman 1989. Essays from economics journals are indexed in The Journal of Economic Literature, and the Index of Economic Articles in Journal and Collective Volumes also indexes collections. Since 1991, works on methodology can be found under the number B4. Works on ethics and economics can be found under the numbers A13, D6, and I3. Discussions of rationality and game theory can be found under A1, C7, D00, D7, D8, and D9.

Economic methodology

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  • Ariely, D., 2009, Predictably Irrational: The Hidden Forces That Shape Our Decisions, New York, Harper.
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  • Arrow, K. and F. Hahn, 1971. General Competitive Analysis, San Francisco: Holden-Day.
  • Aruka, Y., 2015. Evolutionary Foundations of Economic Science: How Can Scientists Study Evolving Economic Doctrines from the Last Centuries?, New York: Springer.
  • Auerbach, P., 2016, Socialist Optimism: An Alternative Political Economy for the Twenty-First Century, New York: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • Ayer, A., 1936. Language, Truth and Logic, 2nd edition, reprinted New York: Dover, 1946.
  • Backhouse, R. (ed.), 1994. New Perspectives on Economic Methodology, London: Routledge.
  • –––, 1997. Truth and Progress in Economic Knowledge, Cheltenham: Edward Elgar.
  • –––, 2009. “The Rise and fall of Popper and Lakatos in Economics”, pp. 25-48 of Mäki, et al, (2009).
  • –––, 2010. The Puzzle of Modern Economics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Backhouse, R., D. Hausman, and U. Mäki (eds.), 1998. Economics and Methodology: Crossing Boundaries, London: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • Backhouse, R. and S. Medema, 2009. “The Definition of Economics”, Journal of Economic Perspectives, 23(1): 221–33.
  • Backhouse, R. and P. Fontaine (eds.), 2010. The Unsocial Social Science? Economics and Neighboring Disciplines since 1945, Durham, NC: Duke University Press.
  • Backhouse, R.E. and B.W. Bateman, 2011. Capitalist Revolutionary: John Maynard Keynes, Cambridge and London: Harvard University Press.
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Other Internet Resources



There are now a large number of blogs by prominent economists. Though not predominantly concerned with methodology and typically not exclusively concerned with economics, these blogs show economists arguing with one another, responding to current events, and formulating and reformulating their views. The following are of particular interest, but there are many more:

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