First published Tue Jan 23, 2007; substantive revision Tue Jan 24, 2023

Metaethics is the attempt to understand the metaphysical, epistemological, semantic, and psychological, presuppositions and commitments of moral thought, talk, and practice. As such, it counts within its domain a broad range of questions and puzzles, including: Is morality more a matter of taste than truth? Are moral standards culturally relative? Are there moral facts? If there are moral facts, what are their origin and nature? How is it that they set an appropriate standard for our behavior? How might moral facts be related to other facts (about psychology, happiness, human conventions…)? And how do we learn about moral facts, if there are any? These questions lead naturally to puzzles about the meaning of moral claims as well as about moral truth and the justification of our moral commitments. Metaethics explores as well the connection between values, reasons for action, and human motivation, asking how it is that moral standards might provide us with reasons to do or refrain from doing as they demand, and it addresses many of the issues commonly bound up with the nature of freedom and its significance (or not) for moral responsibility.[1]

1. General Observations

The range of issues, puzzles and questions that fall within metaethics’ purview are consistently abstract. They reflect the fact that metaethics involves an attempt to step back from particular substantive debates within morality to ask about the views, assumptions, and commitments that are shared by those who engage in the debate. By and large, the metaethical issues that emerge as a result of this process of stepping back can be addressed without taking a particular stand on substantive moral issues that started the process. In fact, metaethics has seemed to many to offer a crucial neutral background against which competing moral views need to be seen if they are to be assessed properly. Indeed, some metaethicists go so far as to hold that their own work makes no substantive moral assumptions at all and has no practical implications.[2] Whether any view that is recognizably still a view about the nature and status of ethics could manage this is dubious. But there is no doubt that, whatever metaethics’s substantive assumptions and practical implications might be, it involves reflecting on the presuppositions and commitments of those engaging in moral thought, talk, and practice and so abstracting away from particular moral judgments.

Such reflection quickly reveals the extent to which various aspects of morality might reasonably be seen as both intellectually and practically problematic. On the intellectual side, many have worried that there is no good way to vindicate the assumptions and commitments of morality. A careful and clear-eyed study of morality will reveal, some argue, that it is a myth that there are moral values, duties, or responsibilities; others argue that the various principles that are presented as authoritative standards for all are actually merely expressions of emotion or projections of the idiosyncratic attitudes of those advocating the principles; still others argue that in some other way morality is not what it pretends to be and not what it needs to be if it is to be legitimate. On the practical side, many have pressed the difficulty of getting people to judge themselves and others impartially; others have worried that, while we have an interest in convincing others to conform to morality, we ourselves rarely have any reason, really, to conform; still others have thought that the sort of freedom morality assumes is not available to humans as they actually are.

Of course these worries and arguments regularly find counterparts on the other side, with people maintaining that, properly understood, morality is no myth, that its pretensions can be vindicated, that we have all the reason we need to embrace morality and meet its demands, and that people, at least some people under some circumstances, have whatever sort of freedom it is that morality might require.

None of the arguments, on either side, can go quickly or easily. They all depend, first, on identifying and defending the presuppositions and commitments one takes to be at issue and then, second, on showing that those commitments either cannot, or can, be defended. What is at stake is, at least, an understanding of what is an important part of most peoples’ lives. Yet there is potentially a lot more at stake to the extent the presuppositions and commitments people take for granted turn out to be suspect. For then, not only will our understanding of moral thought, talk, and practice be compromised, our sense that morality is important may well disappear as well.

Despite the abstract and deeply controversial nature of metaethics, its central concerns arise naturally—perhaps even inevitably—as one reflects critically on one’s own moral convictions. So it is no surprise that, in Plato’s Republic, Polemarchus’ off-hand claim that being a just person enhances one’s life developed quickly into a decidedly metaethical discussion of the origin and nature of justice. Early in Book I, for instance, Thrasymachus defends the idea that justice is whatever is in the interest of the stronger, arguing that morality is a human creation designed by the rich and powerful to control and exploit others. A myth for the weak-minded, arranged for the advantage of a few, justice imposes burdens most have reason to set aside. So Thrasymachus argues. Glaucon follows up, in Book II, with an alternative, and less cynical, proposal. While he too sees morality as a human creation, he sees it as a salutary solution to the serious problems we would otherwise face. He argues that people naturally find themselves unable successfully to ensure that their own wills will rule while, simultaneously, being subject regularly to the will of others. The principles of justice are, he thinks, reasonably introduced and enforced by all as a good way to ensure peace and stability in society. Socrates, in contrast, rejects the idea that justice is a human invention and argues instead that justice provides independent and eternal standards against which human practices, conventions, and institutions can be judged. These different views will likely have implications for what value justice might have. At the same time, though, accepting one or the other view of the nature of justice is compatible with a range of substantive views about what, specifically, justice consists in and about its value. On the one hand, one might see justice as a social convention while still holding that the relevant conventions are in place whenever they are enforced by the powerful or that only mutually advantageous conventions establish justice. On the other hand, one might see justice as transcending human invention and conventions entirely and yet hold that they either demand treating others with respect or with promoting their happiness.

2. The Euthyphro Problem

According to many, Socrates’s position fits well with morality’s pretensions. It fits well also with the thought that whatever standards humans might put in place are, one and all, liable to moral criticism. Of course, Socrates’s position brings along a suite of puzzles concerning the nature of these transcendent standards. What is their origin and from where do they derive their authority?

Many have thought the right answers to these questions are found in an appeal to God. On their view, moral principles are the expression of God’s will—they are His commands to us—and they get their authority from their source. In important ways, though, this merely shifts the puzzles back a step. Whatever problems one might have making sense of eternal transcendent standards re-emerge when trying to make sense of an eternal transcendent being who might issue commands. And, as Plato emphasized in Euthyphro, one is also left with the difficulty of explaining why God’s commands are authoritative.

One plausible answer might be that God’s perfect knowledge of right and wrong, or God’s own moral perfection, explains why his commands serve legitimately as standards for us. But that answer assumes that standards of morality exist independently of God’s will (either as objects of his knowledge or as standards in light of which He counts as morally perfect), in which case speaking of morality as consisting of God’s commands will not explain the origin or nature of these independently existing standards.

Alternatively, one might eschew an appeal to God’s knowledge or goodness and claim that there is no independent standard for God’s will and nature. But that leaves in place the puzzle concerning the authority of moral principles. If we reject the idea that God’s commands reflect His knowledge of right and wrong, and reject the idea that there is an independent standard for God’s will and nature (in light of which we recognize Him as all good), it seems reasonable to wonder why his commands have any special authority.[3]

One might here point to God’s power to punish or to His role in our creation. But neither consideration seems to establish legitimate authority on its own. In general, at least, the mere fact that one has the power to enforce one’s commands does not establish those commands as legitimate, nor does it ensure that one has a right to punish those who fail to conform to one’s commands. Similarly, in general, the mere fact that one created something does not establish that one properly has absolute control over what one has created. Of course, room remains to argue that there is something special about God’s power, or about His role as creator, that makes his commands distinctively legitimate. What is needed is an account of what is special. And, in this context, it needs to be an account that explains how God’s commands, as opposed to the commands that others might issue, have an authority. Moreover, if appealing to God is to solve the metaethical puzzle posed by Euthyphro, the account offered must not itself rely on, or presuppose, the sort of transcendent standards we have been attempting to explain.

3. Naturalism and Non-naturalism

One appealing feature of Glaucon’s account of morality as a mutually advantageous convention is that it renders morality’s origin and nature non-mysterious. Moral facts, on this sort of view, emerge as no more puzzling than facts about what is legal or polite. In each case, the standing of some behavior (as moral, or legal, or polite) depends on its conforming to, or conflicting with, various standards that have been put in place. Glaucon’s account also makes clear why it is that people might care deeply about morality’s demands (even as they are, in their own cases, tempted to violate them when they believe they can with impunity), since the relevant conventions are mutually advantageous.

Yet conventionalist views such as Glaucon’s have real difficulties fitting with the common idea that the fundamental principles of morality are universal. Conventions, after all, are contingent creations that differ from place to place and come in to, and go out of, existence. Moreover, conventions seem liable to arbitrariness in ways that threaten to undermine their claim to authority unless they are recognized (at least implicitly) as satisfying some convention-independent standard. That some convention demands something seems to provide reason to conform to the demand only when the convention is, itself, just or reasonable, or in some other way good. And this suggests that, to whatever extent specific moral rules and principles are products of convention, their claim to authority relies on some standards that are not products of convention.

Needless to say, these considerations are not decisive, and those who see morality as a kind of convention have a variety of plausible ways to address the worries mentioned above. As a result, the view remains attractive. Still, many—even many who think an appeal to convention is essential to making sense of morality—think that the proper account of morality cannot be a matter of conventions “all the way down”.[4] But that does not mean that they think that the standards that serve to justify the demands of (some) conventions are mysterious. Some, for instance, argue that what makes a convention good, and so serves to justify its demands, is its contribution to overall happiness, while others see the measure of conventions in their ability to advance the interests of each considered singly, and still others maintain that the value of conventions is found in their capacity to secure the approval of those who consider them impartially. On all such accounts, value is convention-independent, but it is nonetheless metaphysically non-mysterious. Each of these accounts portrays value as, at bottom, a familiar, completely natural, feature of the world. Moreover, while (on these accounts) particular claims concerning value will prove hard to establish and controversial, there is no special puzzle about what we would be trying to discover or what would count as relevant evidence.

These are all examples of naturalist accounts of morality that identify various moral properties with non-problematic natural features of the world. As a result, they are commonly characterized as versions of naturalism and are contrasted with non-naturalist views that see morality as presupposing, or being committed to, properties over and above those that would be countenanced by natural science.

Non-naturalism comes with two distinctive burdens: (i) accounting for how the realm of moral properties fits in with familiar natural properties and (ii) explaining how it is that we are able to learn anything about these moral properties. Naturalism, in contrast, avoids these metaphysical and epistemological burdens.

Despite its advantages, naturalism has difficulty capturing well what people take to be the true nature of morality. In saying something is good or right or virtuous we seem to be saying something more than, or at least different from, what we would be saying in describing it as having certain natural features. Correspondingly, no amount of empirical investigation seems by itself, without some moral assumption(s) in play, sufficient to settle a moral question. (See the entries on moral realism; moral non-naturalism; moral naturalism; moral relativism; and supervenience in ethics.)

4. Is/Ought and the Open Question Argument

David Hume seemed to have these points in mind when he observed that an ‘ought’ cannot be derived from an ‘is.’[5] There is substantial debate about just what Hume meant, and similarly substantial debate as well about whether he was right. But at least part of Hume’s concern seems to have been that no set of claims about plain matters of fact (‘is’ claims) entail any evaluative claims (‘ought’ claims). He seems to have thought that one can infer the latter from the former only if, in addition to premises concerning plain matters of fact, one has on hand as well at least one evaluative premise. If, for instance, one infers from the fact that someone is feeling pain that something bad is happening, one is at least presupposing that pain is bad. That presupposition, in turn, is not entailed by any claims concerned solely with plain matters of fact. If Hume is right, every valid argument for an evaluative conclusion either includes or presupposes some evaluative premise. And, as a result, there is no value-neutral argument for an evaluative conclusion.

Coming at the same issues from a different direction, G. E. Moore argued (at the beginning of the twentieth century) that no naturalist account of morality could do justice to what we are actually thinking and claiming when we make moral judgments.[6] Moore had in mind a variety of naturalist views that, at the time, had come to be seen as, on balance, the most attractive accounts of the nature of morality. While these views differed among themselves as to what goodness, rightness, virtue, and justice might consist in, they shared a commitment to seeing morality as a wholly natural phenomenon and they all saw moral judgment as a matter of thinking that actions, institutions, or characters had some particular natural property or other. According to these views, moral properties are to be identified with some natural property or other (e.g., with what is pleasant, or what satisfies someone’s desire, or what conforms to social rules that are in force).

Considering specifically views that identified goodness either with pleasure or with being the object of a desire one desires to have, Moore maintained that such views confused the property goodness with some other property that good things might happen to have. In support of his claim, Moore offered a simple test. Take whichever account you will—say, one according to which to be good is to be pleasant—and then consider whether a person who understands the terms involved might nonetheless intelligibly ask whether something she acknowledges to be pleasant is good. It seems she could. And it seems too that in asking the question she would not then be revealing any kind of conceptual confusion or incompetence. The question is, as Moore put it, a genuinely open one. But then we must grant that to think something is pleasant is not identical to thinking it is good. Otherwise, wondering whether something that is, admittedly, pleasant, is good would be as senseless as wondering whether a given pleasant thing was pleasant. If, though, to think something good is different than thinking it pleasant, such thoughts (Moore assumed) must involve attributing distinct properties.

Moore was quick to point out that granting that the question is open, in the sense his argument supposes, is compatible with discovering that, as a matter of fact, everything that is pleasant is also good. Moore’s point is that the question is not settled—not closed—on conceptual grounds (whereas it would be if thinking something good were just a matter of thinking it pleasant). Because analogous questions remain open for all the candidate naturalist proposals, Moore argued that no such proposal could legitimately be defended as a conceptual truth and that they all failed to capture accurately what we are thinking in thinking of something that it is good.

Moore’s argument had a tremendous impact, striking most people at the time as decisive. As a result, non-naturalism got a new lease on life with a number of people working in metaethics trying to articulate, systematize, and defend accounts of morality that resisted the temptation to identify moral properties with natural properties.[7] Much of the attention was given, by those who have come to be called intuitionists, to defending the idea that moral knowledge, while not based on our senses and on the empirical data we might collect, was nonetheless on as secure a footing as, say, our knowledge of mathematics or of the fundamental concepts (of, say, causation and necessity) that play crucial roles in science. Much of the work in metaethics pursued a strategy of finding companions in guilt, of showing that the status of moral properties as non-natural and the attendant implications for what we must suppose about the nature of moral evidence, did not leave morality any worse off than other respected fields of knowledge.

Yet Moore’s casual slide from claims about what we are thinking to the nature of the properties we are attributing in thinking as we do, offered an important point of resistance. As Moore saw things, to make a moral claim is to express a distinctive belief (that might be true or false) about how things are. Specifically, it is to express the belief that some course of action, or institution, or character trait had the property of being right, or good, or virtuous. The challenge (Moore assumed) is to figure out what property it is that we are taking a thing to have, in thinking of it as right, or good, or virtuous. And the place to look, he thought, is at the content of our beliefs.

According to many, while Moore’s Open Question argument does show that moral thinking is distinctive and should not be treated as part and parcel of thinking about non-moral matters, Moore was wrong in holding that the important difference should be traced to the nature of the properties we are taking things to have. According to some of these critics, Moore’s mistake is in thinking we are attributing properties at all, when we think of something as right, or good, or virtuous; according to others, his mistake was in thinking that how we think of a property reveals the true nature of the property.[8]

The first line of criticism emerged soon after Moore first offered his Open Question Argument, with philosophers suggesting that in thinking morally we may well not be attributing properties at all.[9] Agreeing that it was a mistake to see moral claims as attributing natural properties to things, non-cognitivists argue that Moore’s mistake was in thinking that moral claims attribute any sort of property to things, and so he was also wrong in thinking that moral claims have propositional content and express genuine beliefs. The Open Question is always open, they argue, not because we are, in making a moral judgment, attributing some non-natural property to things, but because we are not attributing any property at all. We are not saying anything that might be true or false, nor are we expressing a belief. We are doing something altogether different: taking a stand, or expressing an emotion, or prescribing something. On these views, moral judgments express some attitude other than belief and lack the sort of cognitive content that would allow them to be true or false.

From the start, non-cognitivists have had an eye on both (i) the non-cognitive attitudes that are expressed in making a moral claim and (ii) what people are doing in making such claims. When focusing on the first, they emphasize that moral terms get their meaning not by their link to beliefs that represent the world as being a certain way, but by their connection to non-cognitive attitudes—e.g., reactions to the way the world is, or desires for how the world might be. Here, in giving an account of the “meaning” of moral terms, non-cognitivists focus on the conventionally-established connection between moral terms and certain attitudes. (Of course, people can use such a term without actually having the corresponding attitudes, but understanding the term, non-cognitivists argue, is a matter of seeing that it is a linguistically appropriate way to express the attitude.) When focusing on the second, non-cognitivists emphasize moral language’s role as tool for influencing others. Here their attention is on how moral claims guide actions. In saying that something is, say, wrong, people are consistently not just expressing their opposition to it but telling others not to do it, or working to persuade them not to, or in some other way working to direct action. The two ideas go together naturally, since if the first is right, then it would help explain why people can and do use moral language in the way the second suggests. But the ideas are separable. And many think that the expressivist idea advanced by the first goes to the heart of the matter, while concentrating on the directive or prescriptive use of moral language can at best be secondary.

Whatever the details, the non-cognitivists share the idea that one can admit that something is pleasant, or the object of a desire, or such that it conforms to some rule in force, and nonetheless not take a stand regarding it, or not have any particular emotion concerning it, or not have any interest in prescribing anything relating to it. The Open Question is open, they hold, precisely because the attitudes expressed by a moral judgment all involve something other than merely believing of something that it has certain features (whether natural or not). At the same time, the non-cognitivists’ proposals fit well with granting Hume’s claim concerning the gap between ‘is’ and ‘ought’: whatever facts one grants, whatever ‘is’ claims one endorses, there is no logical inconsistency involved in failing to take a relevant stand, or to express an emotion towards it, or to prescribe something related to it. Between the beliefs we might have and the other attitudes we might form, no entailment relations hold at all.

Non-cognitivists, of course, need to explain why it seems so plausible to see moral judgment as an expression of belief and as a matter of attributing properties to actions, institutions, and characters. And they need to explain why moral thought seems appropriately subject to the rules of logic, whereas the various attitudes that play central roles in the non-cognitivist accounts all seem to fall outside of that realm.[10] Taking the challenge head-on, recent versions of expressivism, flying the banner of “quasi-realism”, have taken as a central project explaining, on non-cognitivist foundations, how and why moral language has all the trappings of being cognitivist and realist. These views start with a picture of the world as having neither moral properties nor people believing in moral properties (though they have other beliefs), and then explain how a practice of thinking and talking about moral properties, moral beliefs, moral truth, and moral facts, might naturally and properly emerge. The central idea is that we can see our thought and talk as fundamentally a matter of our expressing our affective attitudes or commitments which gives rise to legitimate thought and talk about corresponding properties, beliefs, truths, and facts. Two moves underwrite this idea. One is to hold that talk of properties, beliefs, truths, and facts comes cheap: Once one holds sincerely that “Lying is wrong”, no additional commitments come with adding “Lying has the property of being wrong” or “I believe that lying is wrong” or “It is true that lying is wrong” or that “It is a fact that lying is wrong”. These are all, in effect, just different ways of saying the same thing. And if, in the first place, sincerely saying “Lying is wrong” is a matter of expressing an attitude or a commitment then so too are these alternative ways of saying the same thing. The second move that underwrites quasi-realism is pointing out that the question of whether realist-sounding moral discourse is legitimate is, itself, an evaluative question judged in light of one’s attitudes and commitments. There is, on this view, no independent standard of, say, “matching the world” that one can deploy without, in choosing that standard, expressing one’s attitudes and commitments.

Various versions of non-cognitivism, and in particular versions of quasi-realist expressivism, remain among the most attractive ways of resisting the non-naturalist implications of Moore’s Open Question Argument.[11] But they are not the only option. Many argue that, while Moore’s argument shows that thinking something is good is different than thinking it is pleasant (or the object of a desire, or such as to conform to some norm that is in force), it does not show that being good is different from being pleasant (or the object of a desire, or such as to conform to some norm that is in force). After all, they point out, thinking that some liquid is H2O is different from thinking it is water and one might intelligibly wonder whether what one grants to be water really is H2O. Yet that does not show that being water is anything other than being H20. Far from it. A difference between the thoughts does not establish a difference in the properties. Thus, for all the Open Question Argument shows, it might turn out that a naturalist account of the nature of moral properties is correct. The naturalist account cannot be defended simply as a conceptual truth but it also cannot be rejected, as Moore thought it could be, as obviously confusing one property (the natural property) for another one (the moral property). This sort of cognitivism has no trouble explaining why it seems so plausible to see moral judgment as an expression of belief and as a matter of attributing properties to actions, institutions, and characters. Moral judgments are in fact, on this sort of account, the expression of belief and they do involve attributing properties to actions, institutions, and characters (though the account holds that the true nature of the property being attributed is something that might come as a surprise to some). Similarly, this sort of cognitivism can explain why moral thought seems appropriately subject to the rules of logic: it seems appropriately subject to these rules because it is. Problems emerge, however, when it comes to explaining the apparently distinctive nature of moral thinking. If thinking that something is good or right is a matter of attributing to the thing some natural property or other, then what explains the apparently distinctive nature of moral thought?

Cognitivists and non-cognitivists face a common challenge: to account for the nature of moral thought and talk that simultaneously does justice to its distinctive nature without failing to appreciate the significant ways in which it is continuous with non-moral thought and talk. Cognitivism has a relatively easy time accommodating the continuity between moral and non-moral thought and talk, but, especially when combined with naturalism, it faces a real challenge in marking the distinctive nature of moral thought and talk; non-cognitivism has no trouble making room for the distinctive nature of moral thought and talk, but it has trouble accommodating the continuity. (See the entry on moral cognitivism vs. non-cognitivism.)

What has always been attractive about Moorean non-naturalism is its capacity to combine the continuity and the difference into a coherent picture. There is room, at least, to account for moral thought’s continuity with other thought by emphasizing that it is all a matter of attributing properties (albeit different properties) to things; and there is room too for locating the distinctive nature of moral thought in the putatively authoritative standing of the properties attributed. Of course, leaving room for an account is not the same as actually providing one, and Moore himself does not actually offer much at all by way of an explanation of the normative authority (as we might call it) of moral properties. In any case, what has always been troubling about Moore’s view is that the coherent picture that emerges seems to presuppose (i) the existence of metaphysically dubious properties that fall outside the causal nexus and, so, are such that (ii) it would be a complete mystery how we could ever reliably learn anything about them, if they were to exist. Moore, and the intuitionists who followed him, work in various ways to address these concerns. Error theorists, in contrast, hold that the coherent picture painted by Moore is, at least roughly, the right account of what moral thought and talk involves, but they go on to argue that the metaphysically and epistemically troubling implications of that picture properly undermine its credibility. They argue that we have compelling reasons to reject moral thought, at least to the extent Moore was right about what moral thought presupposes.[12] That is of course compatible with thinking that we should use the same language meaning something different by it, or replacing it altogether with some other way of thinking and speaking.

The error theorists’ position regarding morality is the counterpart, with respect to moral thought, of the atheist’s position with respect to views concerning God’s will and ways. In both cases, the suggestion is that the thoughts at issue involve a mistake or a failed presupposition, and that, because of this, they cannot be true. The error theorist’s position, it is worth noting, requires establishing two claims that have each met a lot of resistance: that moral thought really has the presuppositions the error theorist supposes and that those presuppositions are as untenable as the error theorist maintains. At the same time, though, anyone who hopes to vindicate moral thought has the burden of showing that its actual presuppositions and implications are, after all, defensible. (See the entry for moral anti-realism.)

5. Moral Epistemology

Anyone mounting such a defense needs to offer some account of how it is we might successfully justify one set of moral judgments as over against others. When we turn to morality, what counts as good grounds for holding one view rather than another? What sort of evidence might be available? If Hume and Moore are right, no evidence that appeals solely to non-evaluative considerations will be sufficient (unless we presuppose some principle of inference that connects non-moral premises to moral conclusions). But if we need to rely on evaluative premises or principles in order to infer substantive moral conclusions from non-moral premises (e.g., non-moral premises regarding the impact of a course of action on pleasure or on the satisfaction of human interests), the question immediately arises, “How might we justify these evaluative premises or principles?”

One answer often offered is that, at a suitably abstract level, there are premises or principles that everyone in fact accepts. Perhaps ‘Murder is wrong’, or ‘pain is bad’, or ‘everyone should be treated equally’, are candidates. But clearly such claims hardly do much work since questions immediately arise about which killings constitute murder and about how different pains should be compared and about which way of treating people counts as treating them equally in the relevant way. No moral claim that is plausibly offered as actually accepted by all, or nearly all, people can possibly be substantive enough to help settle on one set of moral judgments rather than another as better justified.

One might, in light of this, offer a more substantive principle, not as one that people actually all accept, but as one that they are all, in fact, committed to (though they may not realize it). This strategy offers the prospect of identifying a principle rich enough in content to serve as the justifying ground for other moral judgments. Yet it requires showing how the principle(s) identified work to justify the more specific judgments they are meant to support. Moreover, one who takes this approach needs also to justify the claim that people are actually committed to the principle in the first place. And this raises the suspicion that claiming there are certain principles to which everyone is committed simply relocates the original challenge, without actually meeting it.

In any case, even if there are suitably substantive principles to which people are committed, and this can be shown, and even if there is a way to establish as well that the principles in question would (if right) actually justify more specific moral judgments, one might understandably worry about the status of the resulting structure. Why not think of it as a castle in the sky, a structure with no appropriate foundation? After all, the fact that we happen to accept, or are committed to accepting, some principle, seems a long way from showing that the principle is true or right.

Our moral judgments (about particular cases as well as about general principles) seem to float disconcertingly free from our normal sources of evidence concerning the nature of the world. We cannot see, touch, taste, or smell value or rightness or virtue, even as we can see, touch, taste, or smell some of the things that have value or that are right or that manifest virtue. So how do we learn about value and rightness and virtue themselves? What grounds do we have for thinking our various moral judgments link up appropriately with what they are judgments of?

Of course, moral judgments are not the only judgments that face such a challenge. Many mathematical, modal, and religious judgments face a similar challenge. They all apparently concern matters that are not directly available to the senses and that are, in various ways, mysterious. That establishes some companions in guilt, but also provides the hope that reasonable accounts of how we might learn (or not) about numbers, possibility and necessity, and God, might provide insight into the evidence (if any) we are able to secure concerning morality.

One approach is to argue, as Kant (1785) does, that the relevant moral commitments, although neither immediately obvious nor universally acknowledged, can be known a priori.[13] On his account, the concept of a rational agent contains within it the resources to ground the unconditional demands, on such agents, that they (i) act always either to take the necessary means to their ends or abandon (or adjust) those ends and (ii) act always to treat themselves and others as ends and never solely as means. The first, on Kant’s account, structures practical rationality generally, the second structures morality specifically. Both are, as Kant sees it, inescapable demands on rational agents.

It is worth emphasizing that positive theories of moral epistemology are inevitably bound up with accounts of the nature of moral judgment and their metaphysical presuppositions and commitments. On some accounts, there is nothing to know, so there is no need for a theory of moral knowledge. On others, a proper understanding of moral judgments will reveal that justifying them is of a piece with justifying other judgments for which we have, or hope to have, a plausible epistemology, so the epistemology of morality will be continuous with epistemological theories of other domains (see McGrath 2020). On still other accounts, moral judgments are such that only a sui generis epistemology would make sense of our capacity to acquire moral knowledge. No matter which of these options one takes, epistemological skepticism looms as a threat. And in the first case, where there is by implication nothing to know, it does not merely loom, it arrives inevitably. Even if one succeeds in developing a positive theory of moral epistemology in light of which moral knowledge might be possible, the substantive challenge of showing that knowledge has actually been secured remains formidable.

Moreover, the deep and apparently irresolvable moral disagreements, even among those who in other respects regard each other as peers, calls into question the idea that people are even justified in holding the views they do. After all, if someone equally informed, smart, concerned, and sensitive know that they arrive at different moral conclusions, how can either regard themselves as justified in their opinion. On what grounds? Thanks to what evidence? (See the entry on disagreement.)

One way to respond to this worry is to maintain that apparent peers actually are not peers either because they lack relevant evidence, or they suffer from distorting evidence, or they fail, at least when it comes to moral matters, to give the proper weight to their evidence in their reasoning. Taking this line commits one to some view or other of what evidence is the relevant evidence and what is involved in giving it the proper weight in moral reasoning. Not surprisingly, there is a huge variety of views on these matters concerning, for instance, whether one’s moral judgments are justified only if they have their foundation in, say, distinctive set of moral intuitions (see Moore 1903; Ross 1930; Huemer 2005); or only if one’s moral judgments cohere properly with one another, with one’s principles connecting and supporting one’s more particular moral judgments (see Rawls 1971; Daniels 1979; Sayre-McCord 1996); or only if they can be grounded in an inescapable aspect of rational agency (Korsgaard 1996).)

Any moral epistemology is likely to inherit virtually all the complexity that comes with epistemology in general, including not just the challenge of disagreement among peers, and the debate between foundationalists and coherentists about justification, but worries about our access to the relevant truths (if such there be), and the persistent looming threat of skepticism (see Enoch 2011; Sinnott-Armstrong 2006). When that is added to the apparently distinctive nature of moral thought, the challenges are daunting. (See the entries on moral epistemology and moral skepticism.)

At the same time, much of morality seems clearly a matter of knowing how—how to respond to the need of others, how to respond to threats, how to carry oneself in various situations—and not primarily (if at all) a matter of knowing that something is the case. No doubt, focusing on knowing how, rather than knowing that, does not address skepticism concerning the claims we might make as to which know-how is morally significant. But paying attention to the degree to which people count as moral (or immoral) not because of what they say or believe, but because of how they act, is important to appreciating both the nature of morality and what all a plausible account of moral knowledge must encompass.

6. Morals, Motives, and Reasons

Among morality’s distinctive features, all agree, is its apparently intimate connection to action. In making moral judgments, for instance, we seem to be making a claim that, if true, establishes that someone or other has a reason to act or be a certain way. This marks an important difference between moral claims and claims concerning, say, color. The claim that something is red is, even if true, only contingently connected to whether anyone has any reason at all to act or be a certain way. Whereas if a certain thing is morally good it seems that everyone necessarily has at least some reason (perhaps overridable or defeasible, but still some reason) to promote, pursue, protect, or respect it—at least if they recognize that it is good. Moreover, many have thought, to judge sincerely that something is good (whether or not one is right) is to have some motivation (again, perhaps overridable or defeasible, but still some motivation) to promote, pursue, protect, or respect it.

Thus there seem to be necessary connections between moral properties and reasons and also between moral judgments and motivations. Some have thought as well that there is a necessary connection between moral judgments and reasons, such that if one judges that something is good or right then (whether one is correct or not) one had a reason to act or be a certain way. Others have thought that there is a connection, again, a necessary connection, between there being a reason for someone to act or be a certain way and that person being, or at least being able to be, motivated in a certain way.[14] This last suggestion, that (say) one can have reason to do only what one might be motivated to do, has implications as well for what might count as good, if something is good only if one has a reason to act in a certain way with respect to it.[15]

Each of these supposed necessary connections is controversial and yet each has plausibly been taken to be at the heart of what is distinctive about morality.[16] At the same time, different proposed connections fit more or less well with different accounts of morality and at least some of the supposed connections are flat out incompatible with some of the accounts. Thus those versions of non-cognitivism that see making a moral judgment as a matter of expressing some motivating attitude have an easier time explaining the internal connection (if there is one) between sincerely making a moral judgment and having an appropriate motive, while certain naturalist cognitivist proposals, for instance those that identify goodness with having the capacity to garner approval from someone who is fully informed, must hold that a person might sincerely judge that something would secure that approval and yet be utterly unmotivated by that fact.[17] (See the entries on moral motivation and reasons for action: internal vs external.)

Working through the ways in which a proper appreciation of the relations between morality, reasons, and motivation constrain and inform an account of morality has been a central issue in metaethics. In fact, Glaucon’s original proposal concerning the nature of morality (according to which morality is a conventional solution to problems we would otherwise have to face) was introduced as a way of pressing a worry about morality: Morality pretends to provide reason to all, virtue is supposed to be its own reward, and a person is told she should do the right thing because it is right and not because she hopes for some reward, yet, in the face of the demands morality sometimes makes, these claims concerning its nature and value all seem dubious. Specifically, if morality is (as Glaucon’s proposal would have it) constituted solely by a set of conventional rules we put in place to secure the benefits we receive from the restraint of others, it looks as if the only reason (and the only motive) we would each have for conforming to the rules would be found in the consequences we hope such compliance would secure. In cases where we could get the benefits without the restraint (as when our failure to restrain ourselves would be undetected) we would have neither reason nor motive not to violate the rules. Thus, if Glaucon is right about the nature of morality, then morality (properly understood) would only provide reason to some, under some circumstances, not reason to all, always. Moreover, virtue would not be its own reward. And morality would not be such that it would make sense for a person to do the right thing (as defined by the rules in place) for its own sake, since the sole value of the relevant rules is found in the benefits that come from others complying with those rules.

Glaucon’s ultimate hope was Socrates would provide an account of morality that—unlike his own—would serve to vindicate morality’s pretensions. Glaucon assumed that if no such account is forthcoming morality’s claim on our allegiance is undermined, even as we might continue to have our own reasons for perpetuating the myth and for working to see that others comply with its rules. Much of the Republic is then given over to Socrates’ first, developing an account of the nature of morality (specifically, of justice) and then, second, arguing that being moral is valuable regardless of the consequences. Socrates’ concern, in showing that being moral is valuable, is to show specifically that it is valuable to the person who is moral, that the virtuous person, and not just others, benefits from her virtue. Indeed, he tries to show that being moral is so valuable to the person who is moral, that whatever the consequences of injustice might be, however great the rewards, they could never be valuable enough to outweigh the loss of one’s virtue.

Socrates’ own account of the metaphysical and epistemological underpinnings of his view (his appeal to eternal, non-physical Platonic Forms and to our intellectual access to those Forms) commits him unmistakably to non-naturalism and to something like intuitionism. Yet his account of the nature of justice (as a matter of people successfully being ruled by reason) and the specific features of justice that he takes to establish its value (specifically its connection to freedom), are as available to a naturalist as to a non-naturalist (as long as reason and freedom can be understood naturalistically).

In any case, the question underlying Glaucon’s concern is—Why should I be moral?—has consistently been at the center of attempts to explain the connection between morality and what we have reason to do.[18] Some have argued that the question is misplaced, at least if it assumes there must be some non-moral reason to be moral. Others have held that the question is easily answered on the grounds that the fact that some action is morally required, for instance, entails that one has reason to do it. And still others have maintained that the question presses the single most important challenge to morality’s legitimacy, since morality’s claim on our allegiance depends on our having reason to comply with its demands, yet explaining why we might have those reasons is extraordinarily difficult.

Whatever view one ends up adopting concerning the connections that hold (or do not hold) among moral properties, moral judgments, reasons for action, and effective motivations, no account is plausible as a vindication of morality unless it makes sense of how and why moral considerations might properly figure in practical deliberation that results in decision and action. Doing this successfully is, in principle, compatible with thinking moral properties do not always provide reasons, compatible too with holding that moral judgments sometimes fail to motivate, and, finally, compatible as well with the idea that one might have a reason to perform some action that one has no motivation to perform. Of course, these various views are each quite controversial and involve rejecting what others have thought to be necessary truths.

7. Freedom and Responsibility

Making sense of how moral considerations might figure in practical deliberation is especially important when it comes to explaining when and why people are responsible for what they do or fail to do. Some of that explanatory job is a matter of moral theory, not metaethics, and involves figuring out what counts as good excuses, legitimate justifications, and appropriate burdens. A theory of moral responsibility inevitably relies on substantive moral theory.

Yet there are important metaethical issues bound up in giving an account of moral responsibility. They emerge most sharply as one considers the nature and significance of free will. Does responsibility presuppose free will? If so, when does someone count as having a free will? It cannot merely be a matter of her will being uncaused. After all, a person whose will was utterly random, responsive neither to her nor to the reasons she had for doing things, would be a person no freer (in the relevant sense) than a person whose will was fully and directly controlled by someone else as a puppeteer might control a puppet. What would it take for her will to count as appropriately responsive, either to her or to her reasons? Is this appropriate responsiveness a matter of being undetermined or of being determined by the right things or in the right way? In any case, if one has the sort of free will that moral responsibility requires (whatever that turns out to be) how are we to understand the connection between the will, and what influences it, on the one hand, and the various psychological and physical causes that apparently determine the behavior that is identified as the action one performs willingly, on the other? How do agents with a free will fit within a natural world?

Not surprisingly, the range of answers that have been offered to these questions covers an exceedingly broad spectrum. Some hold that moral responsibility requires a certain kind of freedom and then argue that we lack that sort of freedom or, alternatively, that we at least sometimes have it. Others, though, maintain that freedom is irrelevant and that holding people morally responsible makes sense only if we see their wills as determined. And others identify a truly free will not with a will that is undetermined, but with one that is determined by reason. And still others argue that the right understanding of moral responsibility will show that metaphysical questions concerning the nature of the will are irrelevant. (See the entries on free will and moral responsibility.)

8. Moral Principles and Particular Judgments

The history of moral theory is a history of attempts to identify, articulate, and defend general moral principles that serve to explain when and why various types of action, institutions, or characters count as right or wrong, just or unjust, virtuous or vicious. The assumption has consistently been that there is a general and principled account of morality to be given. And this assumption has survived the fact that few people think any particular set of principles that we have actually succeeded in articulating, is fully adequate. What explains the assumption? Why not hold, as particularists do, that there may well be no set of general principles that adequately mark moral distinctions? Or, why not think, as skeptics do, that our repeated failures actually to identify fully adequate principles shows that morality is a chimera? (See the entries on moral particularism and moral particularism and moral generalism.)

Wrestling with these questions returns one immediately and directly to wondering about the nature of morality and the role it is supposed to play in human life. What is it about morality’s nature, or its role, that would make sense of the idea that general principles are essential to it? Why not suppose that one case of cruelty might be wrong, and another not wrong, without there being any ground that would justify treating them as different? Why is it so natural to suppose that there must be some other difference—say a difference in their consequences, or a difference in what has led up to the act of cruelty—that underwrites and justifies the thought that one is wrong, but not the other? Why not grant that one of the two just happened to be wrong and the other happened not to be? Could not moral properties just happen to have been distributed randomly so that, in the end, there is no justification for one action having a certain moral standing while another, otherwise the same, has a different standing? These suggested possibilities are, I believe, not real possibilities at all. They would each entail that moral demands are fundamentally arbitrary in a way that is incompatible with morality’s claim to authority. But what is it about morality that precludes it being fundamentally arbitrary? A good answer, I suspect, will lead one away from the idea that moral properties are merely there in the world to be found, wholly independent of our concerns and practices. But a good answer is needed. And a good answer is not provided simply by supplying, if one could, a consistent and coherent set of principles that successfully systematized particular moral judgments about acts, institutions, and characters. The challenge here is not simply to show that moral judgments can be seen to fit a pattern; the challenge is to show that the pattern they fit—the principle(s) to which they conform—work to explain and justify their importance.


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