The Unity of Science

First published Thu Aug 9, 2007; substantive revision Tue Jan 9, 2024

The topic of unity in the sciences can be explored through questions such as the following: Is unity a feature of reality or of our modes of cognition? Is there one privileged, most basic or fundamental concept or kind of thing and, if not, how are the different concepts or kinds of things in the universe related? Can the various natural sciences (e.g., physics, astronomy, chemistry, biology) be unified into a single overarching theory, and can theories within a single science (e.g., general relativity and quantum theory in physics, or models of evolution and development in biology) be unified? How are the so-called human sciences related to the natural ones? Are theories or models the relevant connected units? What other connected or connecting units are there? Does the unification of these parts of science involve only matters of fact or are matters of value involved as well? What about matters of method, material, institutional, ethical and other aspects of intellectual cooperation? Moreover, what kinds of unity, not just units, in the sciences are there? And is the relation of unification one of reduction, translation, explanation, logical inference, collaboration or something else? What roles can unification play in scientific practices, their development, application and evaluation? Are those expressions of more general cognitive activities? How are all these questions to be investigated? Is unification an aim of inquiry or a guiding idea at the service of ulterior aims? Is it a question for philosophy, e.g., for metaphysics or epistemology? If so, how can examining scientific practices help? Or is philosophy, rather, a resource for understanding science?

1. Historical development in philosophy and science from Greek philosophy to Logical Empiricism in America

1.1 From Greek thought to Western science

Unity has a history as well as a logic. Different formulations and debates express intellectual and other resources and interests in different contexts. Questions about unity belong partly in a tradition of thought that can be traced back to pre-Socratic Greek cosmology, in particular to the preoccupation with the question of the One and the Many. In what senses is the world and, as a result, our knowledge of it one? A number of representations of the world in terms of a few simple constituents that were considered fundamental emerged: Parmenides’ static substance, Heraclitus’ flux of becoming, Empedocles’ four elements, Democritus’ atoms, Pythagoras’ numbers, Plato’s forms, and Aristotle’s categories. The underlying question of the unity of our types of knowledge was explicitly addressed by Plato in the Sophist as follows: “Knowledge also is surely one, but each part of it that commands a certain field is marked off and given a special name proper to itself. Hence language recognizes many arts and many forms of knowledge” (Sophist, 257c). Aristotle asserted in On the Heavens that knowledge concerns what is primary, and different “sciences” know different kinds of causes; it is metaphysics that comes to provide knowledge of the underlying kind.

With the advent and expansion of Christian monotheism, the organization of knowledge reflected the idea of a world governed by the laws dictated by God, its creator and legislator. From this tradition emerged encyclopedic efforts such as the Etymologies, compiled in the sixth century by the Andalusian Isidore, Bishop of Seville, the works of the Catalan Ramon Llull in the Middle Ages and those of the Frenchman Petrus Ramus in the Renaissance. Llull introduced iconic tree-diagrams and forest-encyclopedias representing the organization of different disciplines including law, medicine, theology and logic. He also introduced more abstract diagrams—not unlike some found in Cabbalistic and esoteric traditions—in an attempt to combinatorially encode the knowledge of God’s creation in a universal language of basic symbols. Their combination would be expected to generate knowledge of the secrets of creation and help articulate knowledge of universal order (mathesis universalis), which would, in turn, facilitate communication with different cultures and their conversion to Christianity. Ramus introduced diagrams representing dichotomies and gave prominence to the view that the starting point of all philosophy is the classification of the arts and sciences. The encyclopedia organization of knowledge served the project of its preservation and communication.

The emergence of a distinctive tradition of scientific thought addressed the question of unity through the designation of a privileged method, which involved a privileged language and set of concepts. Formally, at least, it was modeled after the Euclidean ideal of a system of geometry. In the late-sixteenth century, Francis Bacon held that one unity of the sciences was the result of our organization of records of discovered material facts in the form of a pyramid with different levels of generalities. These could be classified in turn according to disciplines linked to human faculties. Concomitantly, the controlled interaction with phenomena of study characterized so-called experimental philosophy. In accordance with at least three traditions—the Pythagorean tradition, the Bible’s dictum in the Book of Wisdom and the Italian commercial tradition of bookkeeping—Galileo proclaimed at the turn of the seventeenth century that the Book of Nature had been written by God in the language of mathematical symbols and geometrical truths, and in it, the story of Nature’s laws was told in terms of a reduced set of objective, quantitative primary qualities: extension, quantity of matter and motion. A persisting rhetorical role for some form of theological unity of creation should not be neglected when considering pre-twentieth-century attempts to account for the possibility and desirability of some form of scientific knowledge. Throughout the seventeenth century, mechanical philosophy and Descartes’ and Newton’s systematization from basic concepts and first laws of mechanics became the most promising framework for the unification of natural philosophy. After the demise of Laplacian molecular physics in the first half of the nineteenth century, this role was taken over by ether mechanics and, unifying forces and matter, energy physics.

1.2 Rationalism and Enlightenment

Descartes and Leibniz gave this tradition a rationalist twist that was centered on the powers of human reason and the ideal of system of knowledge founded on rational principles. It became the project of a universal framework of exact categories and ideas, a mathesis universalis (Garber 1992; Gaukroger 2002). Adapting the scholastic image of knowledge, Descartes proposed an image of a tree in which metaphysics is depicted by the roots, physics by the trunk, and the branches depict mechanics, medicine and morals. Leibniz proposed a general science in the form of a demonstrative encyclopedia. This would be based on a “catalogue of simple thoughts” and an algebraic language of symbols, characteristica universalis, which would render all knowledge demonstrative and allow disputes to be resolved by precise calculation. Both defended the program of founding much of physics on metaphysics and ideas from life science (Smith 2011) (Leibniz’s unifying ambitions with symbolic language and physics extended beyond science, to settle religious and political fractures in Europe). By contrast, while sharing a model of a geometric, axiomatic structure of knowledge, Newton’s project of natural philosophy was meant to be autonomous from a system of philosophy and, in the new context, still endorsed, for its model of organization and its empirical reasoning, values of formal synthesis and ontological simplicity (see the entry on Newton; also Janiak 2008).

Belief in the unity of science or knowledge, along with the universality of rationality, was at its strongest during the European Enlightenment. The most important expression of the encyclopedic tradition came in the mid-eighteenth century from Diderot and D’Alembert, editors of the Encyclopédie, ou dictionnaire raisonné des sciences, des arts et des métiers (1751–1772). Following earlier classifications by Nichols and Bacon, their diagram presenting the classification of intellectual disciplines was organized in terms of a classification of human faculties. Diderot stressed in his own entry, “Encyclopaedia”, that the word signifies the unification of the sciences. The function of the encyclopedia was to exhibit the unity of human knowledge. Diderot and D’Alembert, in contrast to Leibniz, made classification by subject the primary focus, and introduced cross-references instead of logical connections. The Enlightenment tradition in Germany culminated in Kant’s critical philosophy.

1.3 German tradition since Kant

For Kant, one of the functions of philosophy was to determine the precise unifying scope and value of each science. For him, the unity of science is not the reflection of a unity found in nature, or, even less, assumed in a real world behind the apparent phenomena. Rather, it has its foundations in the unifying a priori character or function of concepts, principles and of Reason itself. Nature is precisely our experience of the world under the universal laws that include such concepts. And science, as a system of knowledge, is “a whole of cognition ordered according to principles”, and the principles on which proper science is grounded are a priori (Preface to Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science). A devoted but not exclusive follower of Newton’s achievements and insights, he maintained through most of his life that mathematization and a priori universal laws given by the understanding were preconditions for genuine scientific character (like Galileo and Descartes earlier, and Carnap later, Kant believed that mathematical exactness constituted the main condition for the possibility of objectivity). Here Kant emphasized the role of mathematics coordinating a priori cognition and its determined objects of experience. Thus, he contrasted the methods employed by the chemist, a “systematic art” organized by empirical regularities, with those employed by the mathematician or physicist, which were organized by a priori laws, and he held that biology is not reducible to mechanics—as the former involves explanations in terms of final causes (see Critique of Pure Reason, Critique of Judgment and Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science). With regards to biology—insufficiently grounded in the fundamental forces of matter—its inclusion requires the introduction of the idea of purposiveness (McLaughlin 1991). More generally, for Kant, unity was a regulative principle of reason, namely, an ideal guiding the process of inquiry toward a complete empirical science with its empirical concepts and principles grounded in the so-called concepts and principles of the understanding that constitute and objectify empirical phenomena. (On systematicity as a distinctive aspect of this ideal and on its origin in reason, see Kitcher 1986 and Hoyningen-Huene 2013).

Kant’s ideas set the frame of reference for discussions of the unification of the sciences in German thought throughout the nineteenth century (Wood and Hahn 2011). He gave philosophical currency to the notion of worldview (Weltanschauung) and, indirectly, world-picture (Weltbild), establishing among philosophers and scientists the notion of the unity of science as an intellectual ideal. From Kant, German-speaking Philosophers of Nature adopted the image of Nature in terms of interacting forces or powers and developed it in different ways; this image found its way to British natural philosophy. In Great Britain this idealist, unifying spirit (and other notions of an idealist and romantic turn) was articulated in William Whewell’s philosophy of science. Two unifying dimensions are these: his notion of mind-constructed fundamental ideas, which form the basis for organizing axioms and phenomena and classifying sciences, and the argument for the reality of explanatory causes in the form of consilience of induction, wherein a single cause is independently arrived at as the hypothesis explaining different kinds of phenomena.

In face of expanding research, the unifying emphasis on organization, classification and foundation led to exploring differences and rationalizing boundaries. The German intellectual current culminated in the late-nineteenth century in the debates among philosophers such as Windelband, Rickert and Dilthey. In their views and those of similar thinkers, a worldview often included elements of evaluation and life meaning. Kant had established the basis for the famous distinction between the natural sciences (Naturwissenschaften) and the cultural, or social, sciences (Geisteswissesnschaften) popularized in theory of science by Wilhelm Dilthey and Wilhelm Windelband. Dilthey, Windelband, his student Heinrich Rickert, and Max Weber (although the first two preferred Kulturwissenschaften, which excluded psychology) debated over how differences in subject matter between the two kinds of sciences forced a distinctive difference between their respective methods. Their preoccupation with the historical dimension of the human phenomena, along with the Kantian emphasis on the conceptual basis of knowledge, led to the suggestion that the natural sciences aimed at generalizations about abstract types and properties, whereas the human sciences studied concrete individuals and complexes. The human case suggested a different approach based on valuation and personal understanding (Weber’s verstehen). For Rickert, individualized concept formation secured knowledge of historical individuals by establishing connections to recognized values (rather than personal valuations). In biology, Ernst Haeckel defended a monistic worldview (Richards 2008).

The Weltbild tradition influenced the physicists Max Planck and Ernst Mach, who engaged in a heated debate about the precise character of the unified scientific world-picture. Mach’s more influential view was both phenomenological and Darwinian: the unification of knowledge took the form of an analysis of ideas into biologically embodied elementary sensations (neutral monism) and was ultimately a matter of adaptive economy of thought. Planck adopted a realist view that took science to gradually approach complete truth about the world, and he fundamentally adopted the thermodynamical principles of energy and entropy (on the Mach-Planck debate see Toulmin 1970). These world-pictures constituted some of the alternatives to a long-standing mechanistic view that, since the rise of mechanistic philosophy with Descartes and Newton, had informed biology as well as most branches of physics. In the background was the perceived conflict between the so-called mechanical and electromagnetic worldviews, which resulted throughout the first two decades of the twentieth century in the work of Albert Einstein (Holton 1998).

In the same German tradition, and amidst the proliferation of work on energy physics and books on unity of science, the German energeticist Wilhelm Ostwald declared the twentieth century the “Monistic century”. During the 1904 World’s Fair in St. Louis, the German psychologist and Harvard professor Hugo Munsterberg organized a congress under the title “Unity of Knowledge”; invited speakers were Ostwald, Ludwig Boltzmann, Ernest Rutherford, Edward Leamington Nichols, Paul Langevin and Henri Poincaré. In 1911, the International Committee of Monism held its first meeting in Hamburg, with Ostwald presiding.[1] Two years later it published Ostwald’s monograph, Monism as the Goal of Civilization. In 1912, Mach, Felix Klein, David Hilbert, Einstein and others signed a manifesto aiming at the development of a comprehensive worldview. Unification remained a driving scientific ideal. In the same spirit, Mathieu Leclerc du Sablon published his L’Unité de la Science (1919), exploring metaphysical foundations, and Johan Hjorst published The Unity of Science (1921), sketching out a history of philosophical systems and unifying scientific hypotheses.

1.4 Positivism and logical empiricism

The German tradition stood in opposition to the prevailing empiricist views that, since the time of Hume, Comte and Mill, held that the moral or social sciences (even philosophy) relied on conceptual and methodological analogies with geometry and the natural sciences, not just astronomy and mechanics, as well as with biology. In the Baconian tradition, Comte emphasized a pyramidal hierarchy of disciplines in his “encyclopedic law” or order, from the most general sciences about the simplest phenomena to the most specific sciences about the most complex phenomena, each depending on knowledge from its more general antecedent: from inorganic physical sciences (arithmetic, geometry, mechanics, astronomy, physics and chemistry) to the organic physical ones, such as biology and the new “social physics”, soon to be renamed sociology (Comte 1830–1842). Mill, instead, pointed to the diversity of methodologies for generating, organizing and justifying associated knowledge with different sciences, natural and human, and the challenges to impose a single standard (Mill 1843, Book VI). He came to view political economy eventually as an art, a tool for reform more than a system of knowledge (Snyder 2006).

Different yet connected currents of nineteenth-century positivism, first in European philosophy in the first half of the century—Auguste Comte, J.S. Mill and Herbert Spencer—and subsequently in North American philosophy—John Fiske, Chauncey Wright and William James—arose out of intellectual tensions between metaphysics and the sciences and identified positivism as synthetic and scientific philosophy; accordingly, they were concerned with the ordering and unification of knowledge through the organization of the sciences. The synthesis was either of methods alone—Mill and Wright—or else also of doctrines—Comte, Spencer and Fiske. Some used the term “system” especially in relation to a common logic or method (Pearce 2015).

In the twentieth century the unity of science became a distinctive theme of the scientific philosophy of logical empiricism (Cat 2021). The question of unity engaged science and philosophy alike. In their manifesto, logical empiricists—known controversially also as logical positivists—and most notably the founding members of the Vienna Circle, adopted the Machian banner of “unity of science without metaphysics”. This was a normative criterion of unity with a role in social reform based on the demarcation between science and metaphysics: a unity of method and language that included all the sciences, natural and social. A common method did not necessarily imply a more substantive unity of content involving theories and their concepts.

A stronger reductive model within the Vienna Circle was recommended by Rudolf Carnap in his The Logical Construction of the World (1928). While embracing the Kantian connotation of the term “constitutive system”, it was inspired by recent formal standards: Hilbert’s axiomatic approach to formulating theories in the exact sciences and Frege’s and Russell’s logical constructions in mathematics. It was also predicated on the formal values of simplicity, rationality, (philosophical) neutrality and objectivity associated with scientific knowledge. In particular, Carnap tried to explicate such notions in terms of a rational reconstruction of science in terms of a method and a structure based on logical constructions out of (1) basic concepts in axiomatic structures and (2) rigorous, reductive logical connections between concepts at different levels.

Different constitutive systems or logical constructions would serve different (normative) purposes: a theory of science and a theory of knowledge. Both foundations raised the issue of the nature and universality of a physicalist language.

One such system of unified science is the theory of science, in which the construction connects concepts and laws of the different sciences at different levels, with physics and its genuine laws as fundamental, lying at the base of the hierarchy. Because of the emphasis on the formal and structural properties of our representations, objectivity, rationality and unity go hand in hand. Carnap’s formal emphasis developed further in Logical Syntax of Language (1934). Alternatively, all scientific concepts could be constituted or constructed in a different system in the protocol language out of classes of elementary complexes of experiences, scientifically understood, representing experiential concepts. Carnap subsequently defended the epistemological and methodological universality of physicalist language and physicalist statements. The unity of science in this context was an epistemological project (for a survey of the epistemological debates, see Uebel 2007; on different strands of the anti-metaphysical normative project of unity see Frost-Arnold 2005).

Whereas Carnap aimed at rational reconstructions, another member of the Vienna Circle, Otto Neurath, favored a more naturalistic and pragmatic approach, with a less idealized and reductive model of unity. His evolving standards of unity were generally motivated by the complexity of empirical reality and the application of empirical knowledge to practical goals. He spoke of an “encyclopedia-model”, opposed to the classic ideal of a pyramidal, reductive “system-model”. The encyclopedia-model took into account the presence within science of ineliminable and imprecise terms from ordinary language and the social sciences and emphasized a unity of language and the local exchanges of scientific tools. Specifically, Neurath stressed the material-thing language called “physicalism”, not to be confounded with the emphasis on the vocabulary of physics. Its motivation was partly epistemological, and Neurath endorsed anti-foundationalism; no unified science, like a boat at sea, would rest on firm foundations. The scientific spirit abhorred dogmatism. This weaker model of unity emphasized empiricism and the normative unity of the natural and the human sciences.

Like Carnap’s unified reconstructions, Neurath’s had pragmatic motivations. Unity without reductionism provided a tool for cooperation and it was motivated by the need for successful treatment—prediction and control—of complex phenomena in the real world that involved properties studied by different theories or sciences (from real forest fires to social policy): unity of science at the point of action. It is an argument from holism, the counterpart of Duhem’s claim that only clusters of hypotheses are confronted with experience. Neurath spoke of a “boat”, a “mosaic”, an “orchestration”, and a “universal jargon”. Following institutions such as the International Committee on Monism and the International Council of Scientific Unions, Neurath spearheaded a movement for Unity of Science in 1934 that encouraged international cooperation among scientists and launched the project of an International Encyclopedia of Unity of Science. It expressed the internationalism of his socialist convictions and the international crisis that would lead to the Second World War (Kamminga and Somsen 2016).

At the end of the Eighth International Congress of Philosophy, held in Prague in September of 1934, Neurath proposed a series of International Congresses for the Unity of Science. These took place in Paris, 1935; Copenhagen, 1936; Paris, 1937; Cambridge, England, 1938; Cambridge, Massachusetts, 1939; and Chicago, 1941. For the organization of the congresses and related activities, Neurath founded the Unity of Science Institute in 1936 (renamed in 1937 as the International Institute for the Unity of Science) alongside the International Foundation for Visual Education, founded in 1933. The Institute’s executive committee was composed of Neurath, Philip Frank and Charles Morris.

After the Second World War, a discussion of unity engaged philosophers and scientists in the Inter-Scientific Discussion Group, first as the Science of Science Discussion Group, in Cambridge, Massachusetts, founded in October 1940 primarily by Philip Frank and Carnap (themselves founders of the Vienna Circle), Quine, Feigl, Bridgman, and the psychologists E. Boring and S.S. Stevens. This would later become the Unity of Science Institute. The group was joined by scientists from different disciplines, from quantum mechanics (Kemble and Van Vleck) and cybernetics (Wiener) to economics (Morgenstern), as part of what was both a self-conscious extension of the Vienna Circle and a reflection of local concerns within a technological culture increasingly dominated by the interest in computers and nuclear power. The characteristic feature of the new view of unity was the ideas of consensus and, subsequently, especially within the USI, cross-fertilization. These ideas were instantiated in the emphasis on scientific operations (operationalism) and the creation of war-boosted cross-disciplines such as cybernetics, computation, electro-acoustics, psycho-acoustics, neutronics, game theory and biophysics (Galison 1998; Hardcastle 2003).

In the late 1960s, Michael Polanyi and Marjorie Grene organized a series of conferences funded by the Ford Foundation on unity of science themes (Grene 1969a, 1969b, 1971). Their general character was interdisciplinary and anti-reductionist. The group was originally called “Study Group on Foundations of Cultural Unity”, but this was later changed to “Study Group on the Unity of Knowledge”. By then, a number of American and international institutions were already promoting interdisciplinary projects in academic areas (Klein 1990). For both Neurath and Polanyi, the organization of knowledge and science, the Republic of Science, was inseparable from ideals of political organization.

Over the last four decades much historical and philosophical scholarship has challenged the ideals of monism and reductionism and pursued a growing critical interest in pluralism and interdisciplinary collaboration (see below). Along the way, the distinction between the historical human sciences and ahistorical natural sciences has received much critical and productive attention. One outcome has been the application and development of concepts and accounts in philosophy of history in understanding different human and natural sciences as historical, with a special focus on the epistemic role of unifying narratives and standards and problems in disciplines such as archeology, geology, cosmology and paleontology (see, for instance, Morgan and Wise 2017; Currie 2019). Another outcome has been a renewed critique of the autonomy of the social sciences. One concern is, for instance, the raising social and economic value of the natural sciences and their influence on the models and methods of the social sciences; another is the influence on both of certain particular political and economic views. Other related concerns are the role of the social sciences in political life and the assumption that humans are unique and superior to animals and emerging technologies (see, for instance, van Bouwel 2009b; Kincaid and van Bouwel 2023).

2. Varieties of Unity

The historical introductory sections have aimed to show the intellectual centrality, varying formulations, and significance of the concept of unity. The rest of the entry presents a variety of modern themes and views. It will be helpful to introduce a number of broad categories and distinctions that can sort out different kinds of accounts and track some relations between them, as well as additional significant philosophical issues. (The categories are not mutually exclusive, and they sometimes partly overlap. Therefore, while they help label and characterize different positions, they cannot provide a simple, easy and neatly ordered conceptual map.)

Connective unity is a weaker and more general notion than the specific ideal of reductive unity; this requires asymmetric relations of reduction (see below), which typically rely on assumptions about hierarchies of levels of description and the primacy—conceptual, ontological, epistemological and so on—of a fundamental representation. The category of connective unity helps accommodate and bring attention to the diversity of non-reductive accounts.

Another useful distinction is between synchronic and diachronic unity. Synchronic accounts are ahistorical, assuming no meaningful temporal relations. Diachronic accounts, by contrast, introduce genealogical hypotheses involving asymmetric temporal and causal relations between entities or states of the systems described. Evolutionary models are of this kind; they may be reductive to the extent that the posited original entities are simpler and on a lower level of organization and size. Others simply emphasize connection without overall directionality.

In general, it is useful to distinguish between ontological unity and epistemological unity, even if many accounts bear both characteristics and fall under both rubrics. In some cases, one kind supports the other salient kind in the model. Ontological unity is here broadly understood as involving relations between descriptive conceptual elements; in some cases, the concepts will describe entities, facts, properties or relations, and descriptive models will focus on metaphysical aspects of the unifying connections such as holism, emergence, or downwards causation. Epistemological unity applies to epistemic relations or goals such as explanation. Methodological connections and formal (logical, mathematical, etc.) models may belong in this kind. This article does not draw any strict or explicit distinction between epistemological and methodological dimensions or modes of unity.

Additional possible categories and distinctions include the following: vertical unity or inter-level unity is unity of elements attached to levels of analysis, composition or organization on a hierarchy, whether for a single science or more, whereas horizontal unity or intra-level unity applies to one single level and to its corresponding kind of system (Wimsatt 2007). Global unity is unity of any other variety with a universal quantifier of all kinds of elements, aspects or descriptions associated with individual sciences as a kind of monism, for instance, taxonomical monism about natural kinds, while local unity applies to a subset. (Cartwright has distinguished this same-level global form of reduction, or “imperialism”, in Cartwright 1999; see also Mitchell 2003). Obviously, vertical and horizontal accounts of unity can be either global or local. Finally, the rejection of global unity has been associated with both isolationism—keeping independent competing alternative representations of the same phenomena or systems—as well as with local integration—the local connective unity of the alternative perspectives. A distinction of methodological nature contrasts internal and external perspectives, according to whether the accounts are based naturalistically on the local contingent practices of certain scientific communities at a given time or based on universal metaphysical assumptions broadly motivated (Ruphy 2017). (Ruphy has criticized Cartwright and Dupré for having adopted external metaphysical positions and defended the internal perspective, also present in the program of the so-called Minnesota School, i.e., Kellert et al. 2006.)

3. Epistemological unities

3.1 Reduction

The project of unity, as mentioned above, has long guided models of scientific understanding by privileging descriptions of more fundamental entities and phenomena such as the powers and behaviors of atoms, molecules and machines. Since at least the 1920s and until the 1960s, unity was understood in terms of formal approaches to theories, of semantic relations between vocabularies and of logical relations between linguistic statements in those vocabularies. The ideal of unity was formulated, accordingly, in terms of reduction relations to more fundamental terms and statements. Different accounts have since stood and fallen with any such commitments. Also, note that identifying relations of reduction must be distinguished from the ideal of reductionism. Reductionism is the adoption of reduction relations as the global ideal or standard of a proper unified structure of scientific knowledge; and distance from that ideal was considered a measure of its unifying progress.

In general, reduction reconciles ontological and epistemological considerations of identity and difference. Claims such as “mental states are reduceable to neurochemical states”, “chemical differences reduce to differences between atomic structures” and “optics can be reduced to electromagnetism” imply the truth of identity statements—a strong ontological reduction. However, the relations of reduction between entities or properties in such claims also get additional epistemic value from the expressed semantic diversity of conceptual content and the asymmetry of the relation described in such claims between the reducing and the reduced claims—concepts, laws, theories, etc. (Riel 2014).

Elimination and eliminativism are the extreme forms of reduction and reductionism that commit to aligning the epistemic content with the ontological content fixed by the identity statements: since only x exists and claims about x best meet scientific goals, only talk of x merits scientific consideration and use.

Two formulations of unification in the logical positivist tradition of the ideal logical structure of science placed the question of unity at the core of philosophy of science: Carl Hempel’s deductive-nomological model of explanation and Ernst Nagel’s model of reduction. Both are fundamentally epistemological models, and both are specifically explanatory, at least in the sense that explanation serves unification. The emphasis on language and logical structure makes explanatory reduction a form of unity of the synchronic kind. Still, Nagel’s model of reduction is a model of scientific structure and explanation as well as of scientific progress. It is based on the problem of relating different theories as different sets of theoretical predicates (Nagel 1961).

Reduction requires two conditions: connectability and derivability. Connectability of laws of different theories requires meaning invariance in the form of extensional equivalence between descriptions, with bridge principles between coextensive but distinct terms in different theories.

Nagel’s account distinguishes two kinds of reductions: homogenous and heterogeneous. When both sets of terms overlap, the reduction is homogeneous. When the related terms are different, the reduction is heterogeneous. Derivability requires a deductive relation between the laws involved. In the quantitative sciences, the derivation often involves taking a limit. In this sense the reduced science is considered an approximation to the reducing new one.

Neo-Nagelian accounts have attempted to solve Nagel’s problem of reduction between putatively incompatible theories. The following paragraphs list a few.

Nagel’s two-term relation account has been modified by weaker conditions of analogy and a role for conventions, requiring it to be satisfied not necessarily by the two original theories, \(T_1\) and \(T_2\), which are respectively new and old and more and less general, but by the modified theories \(T'_1\) and \(T'_2\). Explanatory reduction is strictly a four-term relation in which \(T'_1\) is “strongly analogous” to \(T_1\) and corrects, with the insight that the more fundamental theory can offer, the older theory, \(T_2\), changing it to \(T'_2\). Nagel’s account also requires that bridge laws be synthetic identities, in the sense that they be factual, empirically discoverable and testable; in weaker accounts, admissible bridge laws may include elements of convention (Schaffner 1967; Sarkar 1998). The difficulty lay especially with the task of specifying or giving a non-contextual, transitive account of the relations between \(T\) and \(T'\) (Wimsatt 1976).

An alternative set of semantic and syntactic conditions of reduction bears counterfactual interpretations. For instance, syntactic conditions may take the form of limit relations (e.g., classical mechanics reduces to relativistic mechanics for the value of the speed of light c 0 and to quantum mechanics for the value of the Planck constant h 0) and ceteris paribus assumptions (e.g., when optical laws can be identified with results of the theory of electromagnetism); then, each condition helps explain why the reduced theory works where it does and fails where it does not (Glymour 1969).

A different approach to reductionism acknowledges a commitment to providing explanation but rejects the value of a focus on the role of laws. This approach typically draws a distinction between hard sciences such as physics and chemistry and special sciences such as biology and the social sciences. It claims that laws that are in a sense operative in the hard sciences are not available in the special ones, or play a more limited and weaker role, and this on account of historical character, complexity or reduced scope. The rejection of empirical laws in biology, for instance, has been argued on grounds of historical dependence on contingent initial conditions (Beatty 1995), and as matter of supervenience (see the entry on supervenience) of spatio-temporally restricted functional claims on lower-level molecular ones, and the multiple realization (see the entry on multiple realizability) of the former by the latter (Rosenberg 1994; Rosenberg’s argument from supervenience to reduction without laws must be contrasted with Fodor’s physicalism about the special sciences about laws without reduction (see below and the entry on physicalism); for a criticism of these views see Sober 1996). This non-Nagelian approach assumes further that explanation rests on identities between predicates and deductive derivations (reduction and explanation might be said to be justified by derivations, but not constituted by them; see Spector 1978). Explanation is provided by lower-level mechanisms; their explanatory role is to replace final why-necessarily questions (functional) with proximate how-possibly questions (molecular).

One suggestion to make sense of the possibility of the supervening functional explanations without Nagelian reduction may rely on an ontological type of relation of reduction such as the composition of powers in explanatory mechanisms (Gillette 2010, 2016). The reductive commitment to the lower level is based on relations of composition, at play in epistemological analysis and metaphysical synthesis, but is merely formal and derivational. We may be able to infer what composes the higher level, but we cannot simply get all the relevant knowledge of the higher level from our knowledge of the lower level (see also Auyang 1998). This kind of proposal points to epistemic anti-reductionism.

Note that significant proposals of reductive unity rely on ontological assumptions about some hierarchy of levels organizing reality and scientific theories of it (more below).

A more general characterization views reductionism as a research strategy. On this methodological view reductionism can be characterized by a set of so-called heuristics (non-algorithmic, efficient, error-based, purpose-oriented, problem-solving tasks) (Wimsatt 2006): heuristics of conceptualization (e.g., descriptive localization of properties, system-environment interface determinism, level and entity-dependence), heuristics of model-building and theory construction (e.g., model intra-systemic localization with emphasis of structural properties over functional ones, contextual simplification and external generalization) and heuristics of observation and experimental design (e.g., focused observation, environmental control, local scope of testing, abstract shared properties, behavioral regularity and context-independence of results).

3.2 Antireductionism

Since the 1930s, the focus was on a syntactic approach, with physics as the paradigm of science, deductive logical relations as the form of cognitive or epistemic goals such as explanation and prediction, and theory and empirical laws as paradigmatic units of scientific knowledge (Suppe 1977; Grünbaum and Salmon 1988). The historicist turn in the 1960s, the semantic turn in philosophy of science in the 1970s and a renewed interest in special sciences has changed this focus. The very structure of hierarchy of levels has lost its credibility, even for those who believe in it as a model of autonomy of levels rather than as an image of fundamentalism. The rejection of such models and their emendations have occupied the last four decades of philosophical discussion about unity in and of the sciences (especially in connection to psychology and biology, and more recently chemistry). A valuable consequence has been the strengthening of philosophical projects and communities devoting more sustained and sophisticated attention to special sciences, different from physics.

The first target of antireductionist attacks has been Nagel’s demand of extensional equivalence. It has been dismissed as an inadequate demand of “meaning invariance” and approximation, and with it the possibility of deductive connections. Mocking the positivist legacy of progress through unity, empiricism and anti-dogmatism, these constraints have been decried as intellectually dogmatic, conceptually weak and methodologically overly restrictive (Feyerabend 1962). The emphasis is placed, instead, on the merits of the new theses of incommensurability and methodological pluralism.

A similar criticism of reduction involves a different move: that the deductive connection be guaranteed provided that the old, reduced theory was “corrected” beforehand (Shaffner 1967). The evolution and the structure of scientific knowledge could be neatly captured, using Schaffner’s expression, by “layer-cake reduction”. The terms “length” and “mass”—or the symbols \(l\) and \(m\)—for instance, may be the same in Newtonian and relativistic mechanics, or the term “electron” the same in classical physics and quantum mechanics, or the term “atom” the same in quantum mechanics and in chemistry, or “gene” in Mendelian genetics and molecular genetics (see, for instance, Kitcher 1984). But the corresponding concepts, it is argued, are not. Concepts or words are to be understood as getting their content or meaning within a holistic or organic structure, even if the organized wholes are the theories that include them. From this point of view, different wholes, whether theories or Kuhnian paradigms, manifest degrees of conceptual incommensurability. As a result, the derived, reducing theories typically are not the allegedly reduced, older ones; and their derivation sheds no relevant insight into the relation between the original, older one and the new (Feyerabend 1962; Sklar 1967).

From a historical standpoint, the positivist model collapsed the distinction between synchronic and diachronic reduction, that is, between reductive models of the structure and the evolution, or succession, of scientific theories. By contrast, historicism, as embraced by Kuhn and Feyerabend, drove a wedge between the two dimensions and rejected the linear model of scientific change in terms of accumulation and replacement. For Kuhn, replacement becomes partly continuous, partly non-cumulative change in which one world—or, less literally, one world-picture, one paradigm—replaces another (after a revolutionary episode of crisis and proliferation of alternative contenders) (Kuhn 1962). This image constitutes a form of pluralism, and, like the reductionism it is meant to replace, it can be either synchronic or diachronic. Here is where Kuhn and Feyerabend parted ways. For Kuhn, synchronic pluralism only describes the situation of crisis and revolution between paradigms. For Feyerabend, history is less monistic, and pluralism is and should remain a synchronic and diachronic feature of science and culture (Feyerabend, here, thought science and society inseparable, and followed Mill’s philosophy of liberal individualism and democracy).

A different kind of antireductionism addresses a more conceptual dimension, the problem of categorial reduction: Meta-theoretical categories of description and interpretation for mathematical formalisms, e.g., criteria of causality, may block full reduction. Basic interpretative concepts that are not just variables in a theory or model are not reducible to counterparts in fundamental descriptions (Cat 2000; the case of individuality in quantum physics has been discussed in Healey 1991; Redhead and Teller 1991; Auyang 1995; and, in psychology, in Block 2003).

3.3 Epistemic roles: From demarcation to explanation and evidence. Varieties of connective unity. Aesthetic value

Unity has been considered an epistemic virtue and goal, with different modes of unification associated with roles such as demarcation, explanation and evidence. It can also be traced to synthetic cognitive tasks of categorization and reasoning—also applied in the sciences—especially through relations of similarity and difference (Cat 2022b).

Demarcation. Certain models of unity, which we may call container models, attempt to demarcate science from non-science. The criteria adopted are typically methodological and normative, not descriptive. Unlike connective models, they serve a dual function of drawing up and policing a boundary that (1) encloses and endorses the sciences and (2) excludes other practices. As noted above, some demarcation projects have aimed to distinguish between natural and special sciences. The more notorious ones, however, have aimed to exclude practices and doctrines dismissed under the labels of metaphysics, pseudo-science or popular knowledge. Empirical or not, the applications of standards of epistemic purity are not merely identification or labeling exercises for the sake of carving out scientific inquiry as a natural kind or mapping out intellectual landscapes. The purpose is to establish authority and the stakes involve educational, legal and financial interests. Recent controversies include not just the teaching of creation science, but also polemics over the scientific status of, for instance, homeopathy, vaccination and models of plant neurology and climate change.

The most influential demarcation criterion has been Popper’s original anti-metaphysics barrier: the condition of empirical falsifiability of scientific statements. It required the logically possible relation to basic statements, linked to experience, that can prove general hypotheses to be false with certainty. For this purpose, he defended the application of a particular deductive argument, the modus tollens (Popper 1935/1951). Another demarcation criterion is explanatory unity, empirically grounded. Hempel’s deductive-nomological model characterizes the scientific explanation of events as a logical argument that expresses their expectability in terms of their subsumption under an empirically testable generalization. Explanations in the historical sciences too must fit the model if they are to count as scientific. They could then be brought into the fold as bona fide scientific explanations even if they could qualify only as explanation sketches.

Since their introduction, Hempel’s model and its weaker versions have been challenged as neither generally applicable nor appropriate. The demarcation criterion of unity is undermined by criteria of demarcation between natural and historical sciences. For instance, historical explanations have a genealogical or narrative form, or else they require the historian’s engaging problems or issuing a conceptual judgment that brings together meaningfully a set of historical facts (recent versions of such decades-old arguments are in Cleland 2002, Koster 2009, Wise 2011). According to more radical views, natural sciences such as geology and biology are historical in their contextual, causal and narrative forms; as well, Hempel’s model, especially the requirement of empirically testable strict universal laws, is satisfied by neither the physical sciences nor the historical sciences, including archeology and biology (Ereshefsky 1992).

A number of legal decisions have appealed to Popper’s and Hempel’s criteria, adding the epistemic role of peer review, publication and consensus around the sound application of methodological standards. A more recent criterion has sought a different kind of demarcation: it is comparative rather than absolute; it aims to compare science and popular science; it adopts a broader notion of the German tradition of Wissenschaften, that is, roughly of scholarly fields of research that include formal sciences, natural sciences, human sciences and the humanities; and it emphasizes the role of systematicity, with an emphasis on different forms of epistemic connectedness as weak forms of coherence and order (Hoyningen-Huene 2013).

Explanation. Unity has been defended in the wake of authors such as Kant and Whewell as an epistemic criterion of explanation or at least fulfilling an explanatory role. In other words, rather than modeling unification in terms of explanation, explanation is modeled in terms of unification. A number of proposals introduce an explanatory measure in terms of the number of independent explanatory laws or phenomena conjoined in a theoretical structure. On this representation, unity contributes understanding and confirmation from the fewest basic kinds of phenomena, regardless of explanatory power in terms of derivation or argument patterns (Friedman 1974; Kitcher 1981; Kitcher 1989; Wayne 1996; within a probabilistic framework, Myrvold 2003; Sober 2003; Roche and Sober 2017; see below).

A weaker position argues that unification is not explanation on the grounds that unification is simply systematization of old beliefs and operates as a criterion of theory-choice (Halonen and Hintikka 1999).

The unification account of explanation has been defended within a more detailed cognitive and pragmatist approach. The key is to think of explanations as question–answer episodes involving four elements: the explanation-seeking question about \(P, P\)?, the cognitive state \(C\) of the questioner/agent for whom \(P\) calls for explanation, the answer \(A\), and the cognitive state \(C+A\) in which the need for explanation of \(P\) has disappeared. A related account models unity in the cognitive state in terms of the comparative increase of coherence and elimination of spurious unity—such as circularity or redundancy (Schurz 1999). Unification is also based on information-theoretic transfer or inference relations. Unification of hypotheses is only a virtue if it unifies data. The last two conditions imply that unification yields also empirical confirmation. Explanations are global increases in unification in the cognitive state of the cognitive agent (Schurz 1999; Schurz and Lambert 1994).

The unification–explanation link can be defended on the grounds that laws make unifying similarity expectable (hence Hempel-explanatory), and this similarity becomes the content of a new belief (Weber and Van Dyck 2002 contra Halonen and Hintikka 1999). Unification is not the mere systematization of old beliefs. Contra Schurz, they argue that scientific explanation is provided by novel understanding of facts and the satisfaction of our curiosity (Weber and Van Dyck 2002 contra Schurz 1999). In this sense, causal explanations, for instance, are genuinely explanatory and do not require an increase of unification.

A contextualist and pluralist account argues that understanding is a legitimate aim of science that is pragmatic and not necessarily formal, or a subjective psychological by-product of explanation (De Regt and Dieks 2005). In this view explanatory understanding is variable and can have diverse forms, such as causal-mechanical and unification, without conflict (De Regt and Dieks 2005). In the same spirit, Salmon linked unification to the epistemic virtue or goal of explanation and distinguished between unification and causal-mechanical explanation as forms of scientific explanatory understanding (Salmon 1998).

Explanation may also provide unification of different fields of research through explanatory dependence so that one uses the other’s results to explain one’s own (Kincaid 1997).

The views on scientific explanation have evolved away from the formal and cognitive accounts of the epistemic categories. Accordingly, the source of understanding provided by scientific explanations has been misidentified according to some (Barnes 1992). The genuine source for important, but not all, cases lies in causal explanation or causal mechanism (Cartwright 1983; Cartwright 1989; see also Glennan 1996; Craver 2007). Mechanistic models of explanation have become entrenched in philosophical accounts of the life sciences (Darden 2006; Craven 2007). As an epistemic virtue, the role of unification has been traced to the causal form of the explanation, for instance, in statistical regularities (Schurz 2015). The challenge extends to the alleged extensional link between explanation on the one hand, and truth and universality on the other (Cartwright 1983; Dupré 1993; Woodward 2003). In this sense, explanatory unity, which rests on metaphysical assumptions about components and their properties, also involves a form of ontological or metaphysical unity. (For a methodological criticism of external, metaphysical perspectives, see Ruphy 2016.)

Similar criticisms extend to the traditionally formalist arguments in physics about fundamental levels; there, unification fails to yield explanation in the formal scheme based on laws and their symmetries. Unification and explanation conflict on the grounds that in biology and physics only causal mechanical explanations answering why-questions yield understanding of the connections that contribute to “true unification” (Morrison 2000;[2] Morrison’s choice of standard for evaluating the epistemic accounts of unity and explanation and her focus on systematic theoretical connections without reduction has not been without critics, e.g., Wayne 2002; Plutynski 2005; Karaca 2012).[3]

Methodology. Unity has long been understood as a methodological principle, primarily, but not exclusively, in reductionist versions (e.g., for the case of biology, see Wimsatt 1976, 2006). This is different from the case of unity through methodological prescriptions. One methodological criterion appeals to the epistemic virtues of simplicity or parsimony, whether epistemological or ontological (Sober 2003). As a formal probabilistic principle of curve-fitting or average predictive accuracy, the relevance of unity is objective. Unity plays the role of an empirical background theory.

The methodological role of unification may track scientific progress. Unlike in the case of the explanatory role of unification presented above, this account of progress and interdisciplinarity relies on a unifying role of explanation: as in evo-devo in biology, unification is a process of advancement in which two fields of research are in the process of unification through mutual explanatory relevance, that is, when results in one field are required to pose and address questions in the other, raising explananda and explanations (Nathan 2017).

Heuristic dependence involves one influencing, accommodating, contributing to and addressing the other’s research questions (for examples relating chemistry and physics see Cat and Best 2023).

Evidence. As in the relation of unification to explanation, unification is considered an epistemic criterion of evidence in support of the unified account (for a non-probabilistic account of the relation between unification and confirmation, see Schurz 1999). The resulting evidence and demonstration may be called synthetic evidence and demonstration. Synthetic evidence may be the outcome of synthetic modes of reasoning that rely on assumptions of similarity and difference, for instance in cases of robustness, cross-checking and meta-analysis (Cat 2022b).

Like probabilistic models of explanation, recent formal discussions of unity and coherence within the framework of Bayesianism place unity in evidentiary reasoning (Forster and Sober 1994, sect. 7; Schurz and Lambert 2005 is also a formal model, with an algebraic approach). More generally, the probabilistic framework articulates formal characterizations of unity and introduces its role in evaluations of evidence.

A criterion of unity defended for its epistemic virtue in relation to evidence is simplicity or parsimony (Sober 2013, 2016). Comparatively speaking, simpler hypotheses, models or theories present a higher likelihood of truth, empirical support and accurate prediction. From a methodological standpoint, however, appeals to parsimony might not be sufficient. Moreover, the connection between unity as parsimony and likelihood is not interest-relative, at least in the way that the connection between unity and explanation is (Sober 2003; Forster and Sober 1994; Sober 2013, 2016).

On the Bayesian approach, the rational comparison and acceptance of probabilistic beliefs in the light of empirical data is constrained by Bayes’ Theorem for conditional probabilities (where \(h\) and \(d\) are the hypothesis and the data respectively):

\[ \P(h \mid d) = \frac{\P(d \mid h) \cdot \P(h)}{P(d)} \]

One explicit Bayesian account of unification as an epistemic, methodological virtue, has introduced the following measure of unity: a hypothesis \(h\) unifies phenomena \(p\) and \(q\) to the degree that given \(h, p\) is statistically/probabilistically relevant to (or correlated with) \(q\) (Myrvold 2003; for a probabilistically equivalent measure of unity in Bayesian terms see McGrew 2003; on the equivalence, Schupbach 2005). This measure of unity has been criticized as neither necessary nor sufficient (Lange 2004; Lange’s criticism assumes the unification–explanation link; in a rebuttal, Schupbach 2005 rejects this and other assumptions behind Lange’s criticism). In a recent development, Myrvold argues for mutual information unification, i.e., that hypotheses are said to be supported by their ability to increase the amount of what he calls the mutual information of the set of evidence statements (see Myrvold 2017). The explanatory unification contributed by hypotheses about common causes is an instance of the information condition.

Evidentiary unification may contribute to the unification of different fields of research in the form of evidentiary dependence: Evidentiary dependence involves the appeal to the other’s results in the evaluation of one’s own (Kincaid 1997).

Aesthetic value. Finally, epistemic values of unity may rely on subsidiary considerations of aesthetic value. Nevertheless, consideration of beauty, elegance or harmony may also provide autonomous grounds for adopting or pursuing varieties of unification in terms of simplicity and patterns of order (regularity of specific relations) (McAllister 1996; Glynn 2010; Orrell 2012). Whether aesthetic judgments have any epistemic import depends on metaphysical, cognitive or pragmatic assumptions.

Unification without reduction. Reduction is not the sole standard of unity, and models of unification without reduction have proliferated. In addition, such models introduce new units of analysis. An early influential account centers around the notion of interfield theories (Darden and Maull 1977; Darden 2006). The orthodox central place of theories as the unit of scientific knowledge is replaced by that of fields. Examples of such fields are genetics, biochemistry and cytology. Different levels of organization correspond in this view to different fields: Fields are individuated intellectually by a focal problem, a domain of facts related to the problem, explanatory goals, methods and a vocabulary. Fields import and transform terms and concepts from others. The model is based on the idea that theories and disciplines do not match neat levels of organization within a hierarchy; rather, many of them in their scope and development cut across different such levels. Reduction is a relation between theories within a field, not across fields.

Interdependence and hybridity. In general, the higher-level theories (for instance, cell physiology) and the lower-level theories (for instance, biochemistry) are ontologically and epistemologically interdependent on matters of informational content and evidential relevance; one cannot be developed without the other (Kincaid 1996; Kincaid 1997; Wimsatt 1976; Spector 1977). The interaction between fields (through researchers’ judgments and borrowings) may provide enabling conditions for subsequent interactions. For instance, Maxwell’s adoption of statistical techniques in color research enabled the introduction of similar ideas from social statistics in his research on reductive molecular theories of gases. The reduction, in turn, enabled experimental evidence from chemistry and acoustics; similarly, different chemical and spectroscopic bases for colors provided chemical evidence in color research (Cat 2014).

The emergence and development of hybrid disciplines and theories is another instance of non-reductive cooperation or interaction between sciences. Noted above is the post-war emergence of interdisciplinary areas of research: the so-called hyphenated sciences such as neuro-acoustics, radioastronomy, biophysics, etc. (Klein 1990, Galison 1997) On a smaller scale, in the domain of, for instance, physics, one can find semiclassical models in quantum physics or models developed around phenomena where the limiting reduction relations are singular or catastrophic, such as caustic optics and quantum chaos (Cat 1998; Batterman 2002; Belot 2005). Such semiclassical explanatory models have not found successful quantum substitutes and have placed structural explanations at the heart of the relation between classical and quantum physics (Bokulich 2008). The general form of pervasive cases of emergence has been characterized with the notion of contextual emergence (Bishop and Atmanspacher 2006) where properties, behaviors and their laws on a restricted, lower-level, single-scale domain are necessary but not sufficient for the properties and behaviors of another, e.g., higher-level one, not even of itself. The latter are also determined by contingent contexts (contingent features of the state space of the relevant system). The interstitial formation of more or less stable small-scale syntheses and cross-boundary “alliances” has been common in most sciences since the early twentieth century. Indeed, it is crucial to development in model building and growing empirical relevance in fields ranging anywhere from biochemistry to cell ecology, or from econophysics to thermodynamical cosmology. Similar cases can be found in chemistry and the biomedical sciences.

Conceptual unity. The conceptual dimension of cross-cutting has been developed in connection with the possibility of cross-cutting natural kinds that challenges taxonomical monism. Categories of taxonomy and domains of description are interest-relative, as are rationality and objectivity (Khalidi 1998; his view shares positions and attitudes with Longino 1989; Elgin 1996, 1997). Cross-cutting taxonomic systems, then, are not conceptually inconsistent or inapplicable. Both the interest-relativity and hybridity feature prominently in the context of ontological pluralism (see below).

Another, more general, unifying element of this kind is Holton’s notion of themata. Themata are conceptual values that are a priori yet contingent (both individual and social). They are forming and organizing presuppositions that factor centrally in the evolution of the science and include continuity/discontinuity, harmony, quantification, symmetry, conservation, mechanicism and hierarchy (Holton 1973). Unity of some kind is itself a thematic element. A more complex and comprehensive unit of organized scientific practice is the notion of the various styles of reasoning, such as statistical, analogical modeling, taxonomical, genetic/genealogical or laboratory styles; each is a cluster of epistemic standards, questions, tools, ontology, and self-authenticating or stabilizing protocols (Hacking 1996; see below for the relevance of this account of a priori elements to claims of global disunity—the account shares distinctive features of Kuhn’s notion of paradigm).

Another model of non-reductive unification is historical and diachronic: it emphasizes the genealogical and historical identity of disciplines, which has become complex through interaction. The interaction extends to relations between specific sciences, philosophy and philosophy of science (Hull 1988). Hull has endorsed an image of science as a process, modeling historical unity after a Darwinian-style pattern of evolution (developing an earlier suggestion by Popper). Part of the account is the idea of disciplines as evolutionary historical individuals, which can be revised with the help of more recent ideas of biological individuality: hybrid unity as an external model of unity as integration or coordination of individual disciplines and disciplinary projects, e.g., characterized by a form of occurrence, evolution or development whose tracking and identification involves a conjunction with other disciplines, projects and domains of resources, from within science or outside science. This diachronic perspective can accommodate models of discovery, in which genealogical unity integrates a variety of resources that can be both theoretical and applied, or scientific and non-scientific (an example, from physics, the discovery of superconductivity, can be found in Holton, Chang and Jurkowitz 1996). Some models of unity below provide further examples.

A generalization of the notion of interfield theories is the idea that unity is interconnection: Fields are unified theoretically and practically (Grantham 2004). This is an extension of the original modes of unity or identity that single out individual disciplines. Theoretical unification involves conceptual, ontological and explanatory relations. Practical unification involves heuristic dependence, confirmational dependence and methodological integration. The social dimension of the epistemology of scientific disciplines relies on institutional unity. With regard to disciplines as professions, this kind of unity has rested on institutional arrangements such as professional organizations for self-identification and self-regulation, university mechanisms of growth and reproduction through certification, funding and training, and communication and record through journals.

Many examples of unity without reduction are local rather than global. These are not merely a phase in a global and linear project or tradition of unification (or integration), and they are typically focused on science as a human activity. From that standpoint, unification is typically understood or advocated as a piecemeal description and strategy of collaboration (see Klein 1990 on the distinction between global integration and local interdisciplinarity). Cases are restricted to specific models, phenomena or situations.

Material unity. A more recent approach to the connection between different research areas has focused on a material level of scientific practice, with attention to the use of instruments and other material objects (Galison 1997; Bowker and Star 1999). For instance, the material unity of natural philosophy in the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries relied on the circulation, transformation and application of objects in their concrete and abstract representations (Bertoloni-Meli 2006). The latter correspond to the imaginary systems and their representations, which we call models. The evolution of objects and images across different theories and experiments and their developments in nineteenth-century natural philosophy provide a historical model of scientific development, but the approach is not meant to illustrate reductive materialism, since the same objects and models work and are perceived as vehicles for abstract ideas, institutions, cultures, etc., or are prompted by them. On one view, objects are regarded as elements in so-called trading zones (see below) with shifting meanings in the evolution of twentieth-century physics, such as with the cloud chamber which was first relevant to meteorology and next to particle physics (Galison 1997). Alternatively, material objects have been given the status of boundary objects, which provide the opportunity for experts from different fields to collaborate through their respective understandings of the system in question and their respective goals (Bowker and Star 1999).

Graphic unity. At the concrete perceptual level, recent accounts emphasize the role of visual representations in the sciences and suggest what may be called graphic unification of the sciences. Their cognitive roles, methodological and rhetorical, include establishing and disseminating facts and their so-called virtual witnessing, revealing empirical relations, testing their fit with available patterns of more abstract theoretical relations (theoretical integration), suggesting new ones, aiding in computations, serving as aesthetic devices etc. But these uses are not homogeneous across different sciences and make visible disciplinary differences. We may equally speak of graphic pluralism. The rates in the use of diagrams in research publications appear to vary along the hard–soft axis of pyramidal hierarchy, from physics, chemistry, biology, psychology, economics and sociology, and political science (Smith et al. 2000). The highest use can be found in physics, intuitively identified by the highest degree of hardness understood as consensus, codification, theoretical integration and factual stability, to the highest interpretive and instability of results. Similarly, the same variation occurs among sub-disciplines within each discipline. The kinds of images and their contents also vary across disciplines and within disciplines, ranging from hand-made images of particular specimens to hand-made or mechanically generated images of particulars standing in for types, to schematic images of geometric patterns in space or time, or to abstract diagrams representing quantitative relations. Importantly, graphic tools circulate like other cognitive tools between areas of research that they in turn connect (Galison 1997; Daston and Galison 2007; Lopes 2009; see also Lynch and Woolgar 1990; Baigrie 1996; Jones and Galison 1998; Galison 1997; Cat 2014; Kaiser 2005).

Disciplinary unity and collaboration. The relation between disciplines or fields of research has often been tracked by relations between their respective theories or epistemic products. But disciplines constitute broader and richer units of analysis of connections in the sciences characterized, for instance, by their domain of inquiry, cognitive tools and social structure (Bechtel 1987).

Unification of disciplines, in that sense, has been variously categorized, for instance, as interdisciplinary, multidisciplinary, crossdisciplinary or transdisciplinary (Klein 1990; Graff 2005; Kellert 2008; Repko 2012). It might involve a researcher borrowing from different disciplines or the collaboration of different researchers. Neither modality of connection amounts to a straightforward generalization of, or reduction to, any single discipline, theory, etc. In either case, the strategic development is typically defended for its heuristic problem-solving or innovative powers, as it is prompted by a problem that is considered complex in that it does not arise or cannot be fully treated within the purview of one specific discipline unified or individuated around some potentially non-unique set of elements such as scope of empirical phenomena, rules, standards, techniques, conceptual and material tools, aims, social institutions, etc. Indicators of disciplinary unity may vary (Kuhn 1962; Klein 1990; Kellert 2008). Interdisciplinary research or collaboration creates a new discipline or project, such as interfield research, often leaving the existence of the original ones intact. Multidisciplinary work involves the juxtaposition of the treatments and aims of the different disciplines involved in addressing a common problem. Crossdisciplinary work involves borrowing resources from one discipline to serve the aims of a project in another. Transdisciplinary work is a synthetic creation that encompasses work from different disciplines (Klein 1990; Kellert 2008; Brigandt 2010; Hoffmann, Schmidt and Nersessian 2012; Osbeck et al. 2011; Repko 2012). These different modes of synthesis or connection are not mutually exclusive.

Models of interdisciplinary cooperation and their corresponding outcomes are often described using metaphors of different kinds: cartographic (domains, boundaries, trading zone, etc.), linguistic (pidgin language, communication, translation, etc.), architectural (building blocks, tiles, etc.), socio-political (imperialism, hierarchy, republic, orchestration, negotiation, coordination, cooperation, etc.) or embodied (cross-training). Each selectively highlights and neglects different aspects of scientific practice and properties of scientific products. Cartographic and architectural images, for instance, focus on spatial and static synchronic relations and simply connected, compatible elements. Socio-political and embodied images emphasize activity and non-propositional elements (Kellert 2008 defends the image of cross-training).

In this context, methodological unity often takes the form of borrowing standards and techniques for the application of formal and empirical methods. They range from calculational techniques and tools for theoretical modeling and simulation of phenomena to techniques for modeling of data, using instruments and conducting experiments (e.g., the culture of field experiments and, more recently, randomized control trials across natural and social sciences). A key element of scientific practice, often ignored by philosophical analysis, is expertise. As part of different forms of methodological unity, it is key to the acceptance and successful appropriation of techniques. Recent accounts of multidisciplinary collaboration as a human activity have focused on the dynamics of integrating different kinds of expertise around common systems or goals of research (Collins and Evans 2007; Gorman 2002). The same perspective can accommodate the recent interest in so-called mixed methods, e.g., different forms of integration of quantitative and qualitative methods and approaches in the social sciences (but mixed-method approaches do not typically involve mixed disciplines).

As teamwork and collaboration within and between research units has steadily increased, so has the degree of specialization (Wutchy et al. 2007). Between both trends, new reconfigurations keep forming with different purposes and types of institutional expression and support; for example, STEM, Earth sciences, physical sciences, mind–brain sciences, etc., in addition to hybrid fields mentioned above. Yet, in educational research and funding, disciplinarity has acquired new normative purchase in opposite directions: while funding agencies and universities promote interdisciplinarity, university administrations encourage both disciplinary competition and more versatile adisciplinarity (Griffiths 2022). In the face of defenses of different forms of interdisciplinarity (Graff 2015), there is also a renewed attention to the critical value of autonomy of disciplines, or disciplinarity, as the key resource in division of labor and collaboration alike (Jacobs 2013).

The social epistemology of interdisciplinarity is complex. It develops both top-down from managers and bottom-up from practitioners (Mäki 2016; Mäki and MacLeod 2016), relying on a variety of kinds of interactions with heuristic and normative dimensions (Boyer-Kassem et al. 2018). More generally, collaborative work arguably provides epistemic, ethical and instrumental advantages, e.g., more comprehensive relevant understanding of complex problems, expanded justice to interests of direct knowledge users and increased resources (Laursen et al. 2021). Yet, collaboration relies on a plurality of values or norms that may lead to conflicts such as a paralyzing practical incoherence of guiding values and moral incoherence and problematic forms of oppression (Laursen et al. 2021; see more on the limits of pluralism below).

Empirical work in sociology and cognitive psychology on scientific collaboration has led to a broader perspective, including a number of dimensions of interdisciplinary cooperation involving identification of conflicts and the setting of sufficient so-called common ground integrators. These include shared (pre-existing, revised and newly developed) concepts, terminology, standards, techniques, aims, information, tools, expertise, skills (abstract, dialectical, creative and holistic thinking), cognitive and social ethos (curiosity, tolerance, flexibility, humility, receptivity, reflexivity, honesty, team-play) social interaction, institutional structures and geography (Cummings and Kiesler 2005; Klein 1990; Kockelmans 1979; Repko 2012). Sociological studies of scientific collaboration can in principle place the connective models of unity within the more general scope of social epistemology, for instance, in relation to distributive cognition (beyond the focus on strategies of consensus within communities).

The broad and dynamical approach to processes of interdisciplinary integration may effectively be understood to describe the production of different sorts and degrees of epistemic emergence. The integrated accounts require shared (old or new) assumptions and may involve a case of ontological integration, for instance in causal models. Suggested kinds of interdisciplinary causal-model integration are the following: sequential causal order in a process or mechanism cutting across disciplinary divides; horizontal parallel integration of different causal models of different elements of a complex phenomenon; horizontal joint causal model of the same effect; and vertical or cross-level causal integration (see emergent or top-down causality, below) (Repko 2012; Kockelmans 1979).

The study of the social epistemology of interdisciplinary and collaborative research has been carried out and proposed from different perspectives that illuminate different dimensions and implications. These include historical typology (Klein 1990), formal modeling (Boyer-Kassem et al. 2018), ethnography (Nersessian 2022), ethical, scientometrics and multidimensional philosophical perspectives (Mäki 2016). Other approaches aim to design and offer tools that facilitate collaboration such as the Toolbox Dialogue Initiative (Hubbs et al. 2020). The different forms of plurality and connection also ultimately inform the organization of science in the social and political terms of diversity and democracy (Longino 1998, 2001). In terms of cooperation and coordination, unity, in this sense, cannot be reduced to consensus (Rescher 1993; van Bouwel 2009a; Repko 2012; Hoffmann, Schmidt and Nersessian 2012.)

A general model of local interconnection, which has acquired widespread attention and application in different sciences, is the anthropological model of trading zone, where hybrid languages and meanings are developed that allow for interaction without straightforward extension of any party’s original language or framework (Galison 1997). Galison has applied this kind of anthropological analysis to the subcultures of experimentation. This strategy aims to explain the strength, coherence and continuity of science in terms of local coordinations of intercalated levels of symbolic procedures and meanings, instruments and arguments.

At the experimental level, instruments, as found objects, acquire new meanings, developments and uses as they bridge over the transitions between theories, observations or theory-laden observations. Instruments and experimental projects in the case of Big Science also bring together, synchronically and interactively, the skills, standards and other resources from different communities, and they change each in turn (on interdisciplinary experimentation see also Osbeck et al. 2011). Patterns of laboratory research are shared by the different sciences, including not just instruments but the general strategies of reconfiguration of human researchers and the natural entities researched (Knorr-Cetina 1992). This includes statistical standards (e.g., statistical significance) and ideals of replication. At the same time, attention has been paid to the different ways in which experimental approaches differ among the sciences (Knorr-Cetina 1992; Guala 2005; Weber 2005) as well as to how they have been transferred (e.g., field experiments and randomized control trials) or integrated (e.g., mixed methods combining quantitative and qualitative techniques).

Interdisciplinary research has been claimed to revolve shared boundary objects (Gorman 2002) and to yield evidentiary and heuristic integration through cooperation (Kincaid 1997). Successful interdisciplinary research, however, does not seem to require integration, e.g., evolutionary game theory in economics and biology (Grüne-Yanoff 2016). Heuristic cooperation has also led to new stable disciplines through stronger integrative forms of problem solving. In the life sciences, for instance, computational, mathematical and engineering techniques for modeling and data collection in molecular biology have led to integrative systems biology (MacLeod and Nersessian 2016; Nersessian 2022). Similarly, constraints and resources for problem-solving in physics, chemistry and biology led to the development of quantum chemistry (Gavroglu and Simões 2012; see also the case of nuclear chemistry in Cat and Best 2023).

4. Ontological unities

4.1 Ontological unities and reduction

Since Nagel’s influential model of reduction by derivation, most discussions of the unity of science have been cast in terms of reductions between concepts and the entities they describe, and between theories incorporating the descriptive concepts. Ontological unity is expressed by a preferred set of such ontological units. In this regard, it should be noted that the selection of units typically relies on assumptions about classification or natural order such as commitments to natural kinds or a hierarchy of levels.

In terms of concepts featured in preferred descriptions, explanatory or not, reduction endorses taxonomical monism: a privileged set of fundamental kinds of things. These privileged kinds are often known as so-called natural kinds; although, as it has been argued, monism does not entail realism (Slater 2005) and the notion admits of multiple interpretations, ranging from the more conventionalist to the more essentialist (Tahko 2021; see a critique in Cat 2022a). Natural kindness has further been debated in terms, for instance, of the contrast between so-called cluster and causal theories. Connectedly, pluralism does not entail anti-realism (Dupré 1993), nor does realism entail monism or essentialism (Khalidi 2021). Without additional metaphysical assumptions, the fundamental units are ambiguous with respect to their status as either entity or property. Reduction may determine the fundamental kinds or level through the analysis of entities.

A distinctive ontological model is as follows. The hierarchy of levels of reduction is fixed by part-whole relations. The levels of aggregation of entities run all the way down to atomic particles and field parts, rendering microphysics the fundamental science (Gillett 2016). The focus of recent accounts has been placed on the relation between the causal powers at different levels and how lower-level entities and powers determine higher-level ones. Discussions have centered on whether the relation is of identity between types or tokens of things (Thalos 2013; Gillette 2016; Wilson 2021; see more below) or even if causal powers are the relevant unit of analysis (Thalos 2013).

A classic reference to this compositional type of account is Oppenheim and Putnam’s “The Unity of Science as a Working Hypothesis” (Oppenheim and Putnam 1958; Oppenheim and Hempel had worked in the 1930s on taxonomy and typology, a question of broad intellectual, social and political relevance in Germany at the time). Oppenheim and Putnam intended to articulate an idea of science as a reductive unity of concepts and laws reduced to those of the most elementary elements. They also defended it as an empirical hypothesis—not an a priori ideal, project or precondition—about science. Moreover, they claimed that its evolution manifested a trend in that unified direction out of the smallest entities and lowest levels of aggregation. In an important sense, the evolution of science recapitulates, in the reverse, the evolution of matter, from aggregates of elementary particles to the formation of complex organisms and species (we find a similar assumption in Weinberg’s downward arrow of explanation). Unity, then, is manifested not just in mereological form, but also diachronically, genealogically or historically.

A weaker form of ontological reduction advocated for the biomedical sciences with the causal notion of partial reductions: explanations of localized scope (focused on parts of higher-level systems only) laying out a causal mechanism connecting different levels in the hierarchy of composition and organization (Schaffner 1993; Schaffner 2006; Scerri has similarly discussed degrees of reduction in Scerri 1994). An extensional, domain-relative approach introduces the distinction between “domain preserving” and “domain combining” reductions. Domain-preserving reductions are intra-level reductions and occur between \(T_1\) and its predecessor \(T_2\). In this parlance, however, \(T_2\) “reduces” to \(T_1\). This notion of “reduction” does not refer to any relation of explanation (Nickles 1973).

The claim that reduction, as a relation of explanation, needs to be a relation between theories or even involve any theory has also been challenged. One such challenge focuses on “inter-level” explanations in the form of compositional redescription and causal mechanisms (Wimsatt 1976). The role of biconditionals or even Schaffner-type identities, as factual relations, is heuristic (Wimsatt 1976). The heuristic value extends to the preservation of the higher-level, reduced concepts, especially for cognitive and pragmatic reasons, including reasons of empirical evidence. This amounts to rejecting the structural, formal approach to unity and reductionism favored by the logical-positivist tradition. Reductionism is another example of the functional, purposive nature of scientific practice. The metaphysical view that follows is a pragmatic and non-eliminative realism (Wimsatt 2006). As a heuristic, this kind of non-eliminative pragmatic reductionism is a complex stance. It is, across levels, integrative and intransitive, compositional, mechanistic and functionally localized, approximative and abstractive. It is bound to adopting false idealizations, focusing on regularities and stable common behavior, circumstances and properties. It is also constrained in its rational calculations and methods, tool-binding and problem-relative. The heuristic value of eliminative, inter-level reductions has been defended as well (Poirier 2006).

The appeal to formal laws and deductive relations is dropped for sets of concepts or vocabularies in the replacement analysis (Spector 1978). This approach allows for talk of entity reduction or branch reduction, and even direct theory replacement, without the operation of laws, and it circumvents vexing difficulties raised by bridge principles and the deductive derivability condition (self-reduction, infinite regress, etc.). Formal relations only guarantee, but do not define, the reduction relation. Replacement functions are meta-linguistic statements. As Sellars argued in the case of explanation, this account distinguishes between reduction and the testing for reduction, and it highlights the role of derivations in both. Finally, replacement can be in practice or in theory. Replacement in practice does not advocate elimination of the reduced or replaced entities or concepts (Spector 1978).

As indicated above, reductive models and associated organization of scientific theories and disciplines assume an epistemic hierarchy grounded on an ontological hierarchy of levels of organization of entities, properties or phenomena, from societies down to cells, molecules and subatomic elements. Patterns of behavior of entities at lower, more fundamental levels are considered more general, stable and explanatory.

Levels forming a hierarchy are discrete and stratified so that entities at level n strongly depend on entities at level \(n-1.\) The different levels may be distinguished in different ways: by differences in scale, by a relation of realization and, especially, by a relation of composition such that entities at level n are considered composed of, or decomposable into, entities at level \(n-1.\)

This assumption has been the target of criticism (Thalos 2013; Potochnik 2017). Neither scales, realization nor decomposition can fix an absolute hierarchy of levels. Critics have noted, for instance, that entities may participate in causal interactions at multiple levels and across levels in physical models (Thalos 2013) and across biological and neurobiological models (Haug 2010; Eronen 2013).

In addition, the compartmentalization of theories and their concepts or vocabulary into levels neglects the existence of empirically meaningful and causally explanatory relations between entities or properties at different levels. If they are neglected as theoretical knowledge and left as only bridge principles, the possibility of completeness of knowledge is jeopardized. Maximizing completeness of knowledge requires a descriptive unity of all phenomena at all levels and anything between these levels. Any bounded region or body of knowledge neglecting such cross-boundary interactions is radically incomplete, and not just confirmationally or evidentially so; we may refer to this problem as the problem of cross-boundary incompleteness at either intra-level or horizontal incompleteness and, on a hierarchy, the problem of inter-level or vertical incompleteness (Kincaid 1997; Cat 1998).

If levels cannot track, for instance, same-level causal relations, either their causal explanatory relevance is derivative and contextual (Craver 2007), their role is cognitive and pragmatic as in the role as conceptual coordinate systems or, more radically, altogether dispensable (Thalos 2013; Potochnik 2017). As a result, they fail to fix a corresponding hierarchy of fields and subfields of scientific research defended by reductionist accounts.

The most radical form of reduction as replacement is often called eliminativism. The position has made a considerable impact in philosophy of psychology and philosophy of mind (Churchland 1981; Churchland 1986). On this view the vocabulary of the reducing theories (neurobiology) eliminates and replaces that of the reduced ones (psychology), leaving no substantive relation between them (which is only a replacement rule) (see also eliminative materialism).

From a semantic standpoint, one may distinguish different kinds of reduction in terms of four criteria, two epistemological and two ontological: fundamentalism, approximation, abstract hierarchy and spatial hierarchy. Fundamentalism implies that the features of a system can be explained in terms only of factors and rules from another realm. Abstract hierarchy is the assumption that the representation of a system involves a hierarchy of levels of organization with the explanatory factors being located at the lower levels. Spatial hierarchy is a special case of abstract hierarchy in which the criterion of hierarchical relation is a spatial part-whole or containment relation. Strong reduction satisfies the three “substantive” criteria, whereas weak reduction only satisfies fundamentalism. Approximate reductions—strong and hierarchical—are those which satisfy the criterion of fundamentalism only approximately (Sarkar 1998; the merit of Sarkar’s proposal resides in its systematic attention to hierarchical conditions and, more originally, to different conditions of approximation; see also Ramsey 1995; Lange 1995).

The semantic turn extends to more recent notion of models that do not fall under the strict semantic or model-theoretic notion of mathematical structures (Giere 1999; Morgan and Morrison 1999). This is a more flexible framework about relevant formal relations and the scope of relevant empirical situations. It is implicitly or explicitly adopted by most accounts of unity without reduction. One may add the primacy of temporal representation and temporal parts, temporal hierarchy or temporal compositionality, first emphasized by Oppenheim and Putnam as a model of genealogical or diachronic unity. This framework applies to processes both of evolution and development (a more recent version is in McGivern 2008 and in Love and Hütteman 2011).

The shift in the accounts of scientific theory from syntactic to semantic approaches has changed conceptual perspectives and, accordingly, formulations and evaluations of reductive relations and reductionism. However, examples of the semantic approach focusing on mathematical structures and satisfaction of set-theoretic relations have focused on syntactic features—including the axiomatic form of a theory—in the discussion of reduction (Sarkar 1998; da Costa and French 2003). In this sense, the structuralist approach can be construed as a neo-Nagelian account, while an alternative line of research has championed the more traditional structuralist semantic approach (Balzer and Moulines 1996; Moulines 2006; Ruttkamp 2000; Ruttkamp and Heidema 2005).

4.2 Ontological unities and antireductionism

From the opposite direction, arguments concerning new concepts such as multiple realizability and supervenience, introduced by Putnam, Kim, Fodor and others, have led to talk of higher-level functionalism, a distinction between type-type and token-token reductions and the examination of its implications. The concepts of emergence, supervenience and downward causation are related metaphysical tools for generating and evaluating proposals about unity and reduction in the sciences. This literature has enjoyed its chief sources and developments in general metaphysics and in philosophy of mind and psychology (Davidson 1969; Putnam 1975; Fodor 1975; Kim 1993).

Supervenience, first introduced by Davidson in discussions of mental properties, is the notion that a system with properties on one level is composed of entities on a lower level and that its properties are determined by the properties of the lower-level entities or states. The relation of determination is that no changes at the higher-level occur without changes at the lower level. Like token-reductionism, supervenience has been adopted by many as the poor man’s reductionism (see the entry on supervenience). A different case for the autonomy of the macrolevel is based on the notion of multiple supervenience (Kincaid 1997; Meyering 2000).

The autonomy of the special sciences from physics has been defended in terms of a distinction between type-physicalism and token-physicalism (Fodor 1974; Fodor countered Oppenheim and Putnam’s hypothesis under the rubric “the disunity of science”; see the entry on physicalism). The key logical assumption is the type-token distinction, whereby types are realized by more specific tokens, e.g., the type “animal” is instantiated by different species, the type “tiger” or “electron” can be instantiated by multiple individual token tigers and electrons. Type-physicalism is characterized by a type-type identity between the predicates/properties in the laws of the special sciences and those of physics. By contrast, token-physicalism is based on the token-token identity between the predicates/properties of the special sciences and those of physics; every event under a special law falls under a law of physics and bridge laws express contingent token-identities between events. Token-physicalism operates as a demarcation criterion for materialism. Fodor argued that the predicates of the special sciences correspond to infinite or open-ended disjunctions of physical predicates, and these disjunctions do not constitute natural kinds identified by an associated law. Token-physicalism is the only alternative. All special kinds of events are physical, but the special sciences are not physics (for criticisms based on the presuppositions in Fodor’s argument, see Sober 1999).

The denial of remedial, weaker forms of reductionism is the basis for the concept of emergence (Humphreys 1997; Bedau and Humphreys 2008; Wilson 2021). Different accounts have attempted to articulate the idea of a whole being different from or more than the mere sum of its parts (see the entry on emergent properties). Emergence has been described beyond logical relations, synchronically as an ontological property and diachronically as a material process of fusion, in which the powers of the separate constituents lose their separate existence and effects (Humphreys 1997). This concept has been widely applied in discussions of complexity. Unlike the earliest antireductionist models of complexity in terms of holism and cybernetic properties, more recent approaches track the role of constituent parts (Simon 1996). Weak emergence has been opposed to nominal and strong forms of emergence. The nominal kind simply represents that some macro-properties cannot be properties of micro-constituents. The strong form is based on supervenience and irreducibility, with a role for the occurrence of autonomous downwards causation upon any constituents (see below). Weak emergence is linked to processes stemming from the states and powers of constituents, with a reductive notion of downwards causation of the system as a resultant of constituents’ effects (Wilson 2021); however, the connection is not a matter of Nagelian formal derivation, but of so-called universality classes (Batterman 2002; Thalos 2013), self-organization (Mitchell 2012) and implementation through computational aggregation, compression and iteration. Weak emergence, then, can be defined in terms of simulation: a macro-property, state or fact is weakly emergent if and only if it can be derived from its macro-constituents only by simulation (Bedau and Humphreys 2008) The denial of remedial, weaker forms of reductionism is the basis for the concept of emergence (Humphreys 1997; Bedau 2008); see the entry on simulations in science).

Computational models of emergence or complexity straddle the boundary between formal epistemology and ontology. They are based on simulations of chaotic dynamical processes such as cellular automata (Wolfram 1984, 2002). Their supposed superiority to combinatorial models based on aggregative functions of parts of wholes does not lack defenders (Crutchfield 1994; Crutchfield and Hanson 1997; Humphreys 2004, 2007, 2008; Humphreys and Huneman 2008; Huneman 2008a, 2008b, 2010).

Connected to the concept of emergence is top-down or downward causation, which captures the autonomous and genuine causal power of higher-level entities or states, especially upon lower-level ones. The most extreme and most controversial version includes a violation of laws that regulate the lower level (Meehl and Sellars 1956; Campbell 1974). Weaker forms require compatibility with the microlaws (for a brief survey and discussion see Robinson 2005; on downward causation without top-down causes, see Craver and Bechtel 2007; Bishop 2012). The very concept has become the subject of some interdisciplinary interest in the sciences (Ellis, Noble and O’Connor 2012).

Another general argument for the autonomy of the macrolevel in the form of non-reductive materialism has been a cognitive type of functionalism, namely, cognitive pragmatism (Van Gulick 1992). This account links ontology to epistemology. It discusses four pragmatic dimensions of representations: the nature of the causal interaction between theory-user and the theory, the nature of the goals to the realization of which the theory can contribute, the role of indexical elements in fixing representational content, and differences in the individuating principles applied by the theory to its types (Wimsatt and Spector’s arguments above are of this kind). A more ontologically substantive account of functional reduction is Ramsey’s bottom-up construction by reduction: transformation reductions streamline formulations of theories in such a way that they extend basic theories upwards by engineering their application to specific context or phenomena. As a consequence, they reveal, by construction, new relations and systems that are antecedently absent from a scientist’s understanding of the theory—independently of a top or reduced theory (Ramsey 1995). A weaker framework of ontological unification is categorial unity, wherein abstract categories such as causality, information, etc., are attached to the interpretation of the specific variables and properties in models of phenomena.

5. Disunity and pluralism

A more radical departure from logical-positivist standards of unity is the recent criticism of the methodological values of reductionism and unification in the sciences and also its position in culture and society. From the descriptive standpoint, many views under the rubric of disunity are versions of positions mentioned above. The difference is mainly normative and a matter of emphasis, scope and perspective. Such views reject global or universal standards of unity—including unity of method—by emphasizing disunity and endorsing different forms of epistemological and ontological pluralism.

5.1 The Stanford School

An influential picture of disunity comes from related works by members of the so-called Stanford School such as John Dupré, Ian Hacking, Peter Galison, Patrick Suppes and Nancy Cartwright. Disunity is, in general terms, a rejection of universalism and uniformity, both methodological and metaphysical. Through their work, the rubric of disunity has acquired a visibility parallel to the one once acquired by unity, as an inspiring philosophical rallying cry.

From a methodological point of view, members of the school have defended, from analysis of actual scientific practice, a model of local unity such as the so-called trading-zone, (Galison 1998), a plurality of scientific methods (Suppes 1978), a plurality of scientific styles with the function of establishing spaces of epistemic possibility and a plurality of kinds of unities (Hacking 1996; Hacking follows the historian A.A. Crombie; for a criticism of Hacking’s historical epistemology see Kusch 2010).

From a metaphysical point of view, the disunity of science can be given adequate metaphysical foundations that make pluralism compatible with realism (Dupré 1993; Cartwright 1983, 1999). Dupré opposes a mechanistic paradigm of unity characterized by determinism, reductionism and essentialism. The paradigm spreads the values and methods of physics to other sciences that he thinks are scientifically and socially deleterious. Disunity appears characterized by three pluralistic theses: against essentialism—there is always a plurality of classifications of reality into kinds; against reductionism—there exists equal reality and causal efficacy of systems at different levels of description (that is, the microlevel is not causally complete, leaving room for downward causation); and against epistemological monism—there is no single methodology that supports a single criterion of scientificity, nor a universal domain of its applicability, leaving only a plurality of epistemic and non-epistemic virtues. The unitary concept of science should be understood, following the later Wittgenstein, as a family-resemblance concept. (For a criticism of Dupré’s ideas, see Mitchell 2003; Sklar 2003.)

Against the universalism of explanatory laws, Cartwright has argued that laws cannot be both universal and exactly true, as Hempel required in his influential account of explanation and demarcation; there exist only patchworks of laws and local cooperation. Like Dupré, Cartwright adopts a kind of scientific realism but denies that there is a universal order, whether represented by a theory of everything or a corresponding a priori metaphysical principle (Cartwright 1983). Theories apply only locally, where and to the extent that their interpretive models fit the phenomena studied, ceteris paribus (Cartwright 1999). Cartwright’s pluralism is not just opposed to vertical reductionism but also horizontal imperialism, or universalism and globalism. She explains their more or less general domain of application in terms of causal capacities and arrangements she calls nomological machines (Cartwright 1989, 1999). The regularities they bring about depend on a shielded environment. As a matter of empiricism, this is the reason that it is in the controlled environment of laboratories and experiments, where causal interference is shielded off, that factual regularities are manifested. The controlled, stable, regular world is an engineered world. Representation rests on intervention (cf. Hacking 1983; for criticisms see Winsberg et al. 2000; Hoefer 2003; Sklar 2003; Howhy 2003; Teller 2004; McArthur 2006; Ruphy 2016).

Disunity and autonomy of levels have been associated, conversely, with antirealism, meaning instrumentalist or empiricist heuristics. This includes, for Fodor and Rosenberg, higher-level sciences such as biology and sociology (Fodor 1974; Rosenberg 1994; Huneman 2010). It is against this picture that Dupré’s and Cartwright’s attacks on uniformly global unity and reductionism, above, might seem surprising by including an endorsement, in causal terms, of realism.[4] Rohrlich has defended a similar realist position about weaker, conceptual (cognitive) antireductionism, although on the grounds of the mathematical success of derivational explanatory reductions (Rohrlich 2001). Ruphy, however, has argued that antireductionism merely amounts to a general methodological prescription and is too weak to yield uncontroversial metaphysical lessons; these are in fact based on general metaphysical commitments external to scientific practice (Ruphy 2005, 2016).

5.2 Pluralism

Unlike more descriptive accounts of plurality, pluralism is a normative endorsement of plurality. The question of the metaphysical significance of disunity and anti-reductionism takes one straight to the larger issue of the epistemology and metaphysics (and aesthetics, social culture and politics) of pluralism. And here one encounters the familiar issues and notions such as conceptual schemes, frameworks and worldviews, incommensurability, relativism, contextualism and perspectivalism about goals and standards of concepts and methods (for a general discussion see Lynch 1998; on perspectivalism about scientific models see Giere 1999, 2006; Rueger 2005; Massimi and McCoy 2020).

In connection with relativism and instrumentalism, pluralism has typically been associated with antirealism about taxonomical practices. But it has been defended from the standpoint of realism (for instance, Dupré 1993; Chakravartty 2011). Pluralism about knowledge of mind-independent facts can be formulated in terms of different ways to distribute properties (sociability-based pluralism), with more specific commitments about the ontological status of the related elements and their plural contextual manifestations of powers or dispositions (Chakravartty 2011; Cartwright 2007).

From a more epistemological standpoint, pluralism applies widely to concepts, explanations, virtues, goals, methods, models and kinds of representations (see above for graphic pluralism), etc. In this sense, pluralism has been defended as a general framework that rejects the ideal of consensus in cognitive, evaluative and practical matters, against pure skepticism (nothing goes) or indifferentism (anything goes), including a defense of preferential and contextual rationality that notes the role of contextual rational commitments, by analogy with political forms of engagement (Rescher 1993; van Bouwel 2009a; Cat 2012).

Consider at least four distinctions—they are formulated about concepts, facts, and descriptions, and they apply also to values, virtues, methods, etc.:

  • Vertical vs. horizontal pluralism. Vertical pluralism is inter-level pluralism, the view that there is more than one level of factual description or kind of fact and that each is irreducible, equally fundamental, or ontologically/conceptually autonomous. Horizontal pluralism is intra-level pluralism, the view that there may be incompatible descriptions or facts on the same level of discourse (Lynch 1998). For instance, the plurality of explanatory causes to be chosen from or integrated in biology or physics has been defended as a lesson in pluralism (Sober 1999).
  • Global vs. local pluralism. Global pluralism is pluralism about every type of fact or description. Global horizontal pluralism is the view that there may be incompatible descriptions of the same type of fact. Global vertical pluralism is the view that no type of fact or description reduces to any other. Local horizontal and vertical pluralism is about one type of fact or description (Lynch 1998). It may also concern situated standpoints informed by, among others, social differences (Wylie 2015).
  • Difference vs. integrative pluralism. Difference pluralism has been defended in terms of division of labor in the face of complexity and cognitive limitations (Giere 2006), epistemic humility (Feyerabend 1962 and his final writings in the 1990s; Chang 2002), scientific freedom, empirical testability and theory choice (Popper 1935; Feyerabend 1962) and underdetermination.

Underdetermination arguments concern choices from a disjunction of equivalent types of descriptions (Mitchell 2003, 2009) or of incompatible partial representations or models of phenomena in the same intended scope (Longino 2002, 2013). The representational incompatibility may be traced to competing values or aims, or assumptions in ceteris paribus laws.

Critiques of difference pluralism point to different consequences such as failure to address complex and boundary phenomena and problems in, for instance, the life and social sciences (Gorman 2002; Mitchell 2003; 2008); detrimental effects of taxonomic instability (Sullivan 2017) and so-called intraconcept variability (Cunningham 2021) in the mind-brain sciences. When the variability characterizes what are taken to be the same concepts and terminology, several contexts of detrimental effect have been identified: (1) science education, (2) collaborative research, intra- and cross-disciplinary (e.g., the practical and moral problems of value conflicts mentioned above), (3) clinical practice, and (4) metascientific research (Cunningham 2021).

Integrative, or connective, types of pluralism are the conjunctive or holistic requirement of different types of descriptions, methods or perspectives (Mitchell 2003, 2009; contrast with the more isolationist position in Longino 2002 and her essay in Kellert, Longino and Waters 2006; Longino 2013).

To a merely syncretistic or tolerant, non-interactive pluralism, a recent body of literature has opposed a dynamic, coordinated, interactive disciplinary kind of pluralism (Chang 2012; Wylie 2015; Sullivan 2017). The former requires only respectful division of labor; the latter may involve either a limited cross-fertilization through communication and assimilation—borrowing or co-optation—or a more robust, integrative epistemic engagement. The latter may involve, for instance, communicative expertise—also known as interactional expertise—without having contributory expertise in the other practice, exchange and collaboration on the same project.

Borrowing and cross-fertilization across divides and over distances concern more than theories and change the respective practices, processes and products. They extend to data, concepts, models, methods, evidence, heuristic techniques, technology and other resources. To mention one distinction, while theoretical integration concerns concepts, ontology, explanations, models, etc., practical integration concerns methods, heuristics and testing (Grantham 2004). Thus, accounts including different versions of taxonomical pluralism range from the more conventional and contingent (from Elgin 1997 to astronomical kinds in Ruphy 2016) and the more grounded in contexts of practices (categorization work in Bowker and Star 1999; life sciences and chemistry in Kendig 2016) and the interactive (Hacking’s interactive kinds in the human sciences) to the more metaphysically substantive. Some methodological prescriptions of pluralism rely on pluralism in metascientific research including history (Chang 2012).

Connective varieties of pluralism have been endorsed on grounds of their epistemic value. Considerations of empirical adequacy and predictive power can be traced back to Neurath, the explanatory and methodological value of cross-fertilization, the epistemic benefits of a stance of openness to new kinds of facts and ways of inquiry and learning (Wylie 2015) and evidential value.

From the standpoint of evidence, we find second-order varieties of mixed evidence patterns—triangulation, security and integration—that connect different kinds of evidence to provide enhanced evidential value. The relevant plurality or difference requires independence, a condition to be explicated in different ways (Kuorikoski and Marchionni 2022). Regarding triangulation, enhanced evidence results from multiple theory-laden but theoretically independent lines of evidence in, for instance, microscopy (Hacking 1983), archeology (Wylie 1999) and interdisciplinary research in the social sciences, for example, neuroeconomics in support of existence claims about phenomena and descriptions of phenomena but not to more general theories about them (Kuorikoski and Marchionni 2016).

Connective forms of pluralism have been modeled in terms of relations between disciplines (see above) and defended at the level of social epistemology by analogy with political models of liberal democracy and as a model of social governance between the extremes of so-called consensual mainstreaming and antagonistic exclusivism (van Bouwel 2009a). Through dialogue, a plurality of represented perspectives enables the kind of critical scrutiny of questions and knowledge claims that exposes error, bias, unexamined norms of justification and acceptance and the complexity of issues and relevant implications. As a result, it has been argued, pluralism supports a corresponding standard of critical objectivity (Longino 2002; Wylie 2015).

  • Internal vs. external pluralism. From a methodological standpoint, an internal perspective is naturalistic in its reliance on the contingent plurality of scientific practice by any of its standards. This has been defended by members of the so-called Minnesota School (Kellert, Longino and Waters 2006) and Ruphy (2016). The alternative, which Ruphy has attributed to Dupré and Cartwright, is the adoption of a metaphysical commitment external to actual scientific practice.

As a matter of actual practice, pluralism has been identified as part of a plurality of projects and perspectives in, for instance, cognitive and mind-brain sciences, where attitudes towards a plurality of ways of researching and understanding cognition vary (Milkowski and Hohol 2021). These attitudes include (1) lamenting the variability of meaning and systems of classification (Sullivan 2007; Cunningham 2021); (2) embracing complementarity between hierarchical mechanistic and computational approaches—in the face of, for instance, models with propositional declarative and lawlike statements and computational models with software codes; (3) seeking integration with mutual consistency and evidential support; (4) seeking reduction privileging neural models; and (5) seeking grand unification that values simplicity and generality over testability.

5.3 Metapluralism

The preference for one kind of pluralism over another is typically motivated by epistemic virtues or constraints. Meta-pluralism, or pluralism about pluralism, is obviously conceivable in similar terms, as it can be found in the formulation of the so-called pluralist stance (Kellert, Longino and Waters 2006). The pluralist stance replaces metaphysical principles with scientific or empirical methodological rules and aims that have been “tested”. Like Dupré’s and Cartwright’s metaphysical positions, its metascientific position must be empirically tested. Metascientific conclusions and assumptions cannot be considered universal or necessary, but are local, contingent and relative to scientific interests and purposes. Thus, on this view, complexity does not always require interdisciplinarity (Kellert 2008), and in some situations the pluralist stance will defend reductions or specialization over interdisciplinary integration (Kellert, Longino and Waters 2006; Cat 2012; Rescher 1993).

6. Conclusion: Why unity? And what difference does it really make?

From Greek philosophy to current debates, justifications for adopting positions on matters of unification have varied from the metaphysical and theological to the epistemic, social and pragmatic. Whether as a matter of truth (Thalos 2013) or consequence, views on matters of unity and unification make a difference in both science and philosophy, and, by application, in society as well. In science they provide strong heuristic or methodological guidance and even justification for hypotheses, projects, and specific goals. In this sense, different rallying cries and idioms such as simplicity, unity, disunity, emergence or interdisciplinarity, have been endowed with a normative value. Their evaluative role extends broadly. They are used to provide legitimacy, even if rhetorically, in social contexts, especially in situations involving sources of funding and profit. They set a standard of what carries the authority and legitimacy of what it is to be scientific. As a result, they make a difference in scientific evaluation, management and application, especially in public domains such as healthcare and economic decision-making. For instance, pointing to the complexity of causal structures challenges traditional deterministic or simple causal strategies of policy decision-making with known risks and unknown effects of known properties (Mitchell 2009). Last but not least is the influence that implicit assumptions about what unification can do have on science education (Klein 1990).

Philosophically, assumptions about unification help choose what sort of philosophical questions to pursue and what target areas to explore. For instance, fundamentalist assumptions typically lead one to address epistemological and metaphysical issues in terms of only results and interpretations of fundamental levels of disciplines. Assumptions of this sort help define what counts as scientific and shape scientistic or naturalized philosophical projects. In this sense, they determine, or at least strongly suggest, what relevant science carries authority in philosophical debate.

At the end of the day, one should not lose sight of the larger context that sustains problems and projects in most disciplines and practices. We are as free to pursue them as Kant’s dove is free to fly, that is, not without the surrounding air resistance to flap its wings upon and against. Philosophy was once thought to stand for the systematic unity of the sciences. The foundational character of unity became the distinctive project of philosophy, in which conceptual unity played the role of the standard of intelligibility. In addition, the ideal of unity, frequently under the guise of harmony, has long been a standard of aesthetic virtue, although this image has been eloquently challenged by, for instance, John Bailey and Iris Murdoch (Bailey 1976; Murdoch 1992). Unities and unifications help us meet cognitive and practical demands upon our life as well as cultural demands upon our self-images that are both cosmic and earthly. It is not surprising that talk of the many meanings and levels of unity—the fundamental level, unification, system, organization, universality, simplicity, atomism, reduction, harmony, complexity or totality—can place an urgent grip on our intellectual imagination.


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