First published Fri Aug 13, 2004; substantive revision Mon May 6, 2024

Darwinism designates a distinctive form of evolutionary explanation for the history and diversity of life on earth. Its original formulation is provided in the first edition of On the Origin of Species in 1859. This entry first formulates ‘Darwin’s Darwinism’ in terms of six philosophically distinctive themes: (i) probability and chance, (ii) the nature, power and scope of selection, (iii) adaptation and teleology, (iv) the interpretation of the concept of ‘species’, (v) the tempo and mode of evolutionary change, and (vi) the role of altruism and group selection in the explanation of morality. Both Darwin and his critics recognized that his approach to evolution was distinctive on each of these topics, and it remains true that, though Darwinism has developed in many ways unforeseen by Darwin, its proponents and critics continue to differentiate it from other approaches in evolutionary biology by focusing on these themes. This point is illustrated in the second half of the entry by looking at current debates in the philosophy of evolutionary biology on these six themes.

1. Introduction

Scientific theories are historical entities. Often you can identify key individuals and documents that are the sources of new theories—Einstein’s 1905 papers, Copernicus’ 1539 De Revolutionibus, Darwin’s On the Origin of Species. Sometimes, but not always, the theory tends in popular parlance to be named after the author of these seminal documents, as is the case with Darwinism.

But like every historical entity, theories undergo change through time. Indeed a scientific theory might undergo such significant changes that the only point of continuing to name it after its source is to identify its lineage and ancestry. This is decidedly not the case with Darwinism. As Jean Gayon has put it:

The Darwin-Darwinism relation is in certain respects a causal relation, in the sense that Darwin influenced the debates that followed him. But there is also something more: a kind of isomorphism between Darwin’s Darwinism and historical Darwinism. It is as though Darwin’s own contribution has constrained the conceptual and empirical development of evolutionary biology ever after. (Gayon 2003, 241)

Darwinism identifies a core set of concepts, principles and methodological maxims that were first articulated and defended by Charles Darwin and which continue to be identified with a certain approach to evolutionary questions.[1] We will thus need to begin with Darwin’s Darwinism as articulated in On the Origin of Species in 1859. We will then examine these same themes as they have been discussed by evolutionary biologists and philosophers of biology from the beginnings of the Neo-Darwinian Synthesis to the present.

Charles Darwin was not, as we use the term today, a philosopher, though he was often so described during his lifetime.[2] Nevertheless, for an encyclopedia of philosophy what is needed is a discussion of the impact of philosophy on Darwin’s Darwinism, and the impact of Darwin’s Darwinism on topics that both he, and we, would consider philosophical. We focus here on the impact of philosophical discussions about the nature of science during Darwin’s lifetime on Darwin’s scientific research, thinking and writing; and on the impact of that research, thinking and writing on philosophy. Taking the time to do such philosophical archaeology stems from a conviction that if the concept of Darwinism has legitimate application today, it is due to a set of principles, both scientific and philosophical, that were articulated by Darwin and that are still widely shared by those who call themselves ‘Darwinians’ or ‘neo-Darwinians’.

2. Darwin and Darwinism

2.1 Darwin’s Life

Charles Darwin was born February 12, 1809 and died April 18, 1882. It was a time of radical changes in British culture, and his family background put him in the midst of those changes. His grandfather, Erasmus Darwin, was a prosperous and highly respected physician living in Western England, south of Birmingham. He was also a philosophical radical, advocating Enlightenment ideas about human equality and liberty, including the liberty to think freely about the existence of God and about natural origins for the earth’s creatures. He wrote a number of very popular works of natural history, some in verse, in which he defended views about progress that included evolutionary speculations about the upward progress of living things from primordial beginnings.

Erasmus Darwin was an early member of an informal group of free thinkers self-styled the Lunar Society,[3] that met regularly in Birmingham to discuss everything from the latest philosophical and scientific ideas to the latest advances in technology and industry. The Society included James Watt, Joseph Priestley and Charles Darwin’s other grandfather, Josiah Wedgwood. Wedgwood, like Erasmus Darwin, lived in Staffordshire and was in the process of developing a family pottery works into a major industrial concern by applying new scientific and technological ideas to the production of ‘china’. The religious inclinations of the group were ‘non-conforming’ and included a number of Unitarians, a sect Erasmus Darwin referred to as ‘a featherbed to catch a falling Christian’. Looked upon with suspicion by High Church conservatives, they actively promoted in Great Britain the revolutionary philosophical, scientific and political ideas sweeping across Europe and the Americas. Most had spent considerable time absorbing Enlightenment ideas in Edinburgh, Scotland.

Under the circumstances, it is not surprising that Robert Darwin, Charles’ father, should follow in his father’s footsteps and become a doctor, nor that he should end up marrying Susannah Wedgwood, by all reports Josiah’s favorite offspring. Politically and philosophically engaged, Susannah worked to organize her children’s education in the town of Shrewsbury, where she and Robert took up residence. She sent her children to a day school operated by Unitarian minister Rev. George Case and this is where Charles began his education. Unfortunately, Susannah died in 1817 when Charles was only 8, and his father then transferred him to the Shrewsbury School, operated by Dr. Samuel Butler, grandfather of the novelist (and sometime satirist of Darwin’s work) of the same name. “Nothing could have been worse for the development of my mind than Dr. Butler’s school” Charles proclaimed in the autobiography he wrote for his family, and he escaped down the street to his home whenever he could.

His older siblings took good care of him, under the Doctor’s watchful eye. Early letters indicate that he and his brother Erasmus were enthusiastic amateur chemists, and after his brother went up to Cambridge their letters were often full of possible experiments, orders to purchase chemicals and equipment for their ‘laboratory’, and discussions of the latest discoveries. This was an obvious enough passion that his classmates nicknamed him ‘Gas’. During summers he helped his father on his rounds to his patients, and when only 16 his father sent him and his brother to Edinburgh for the best medical education Great Britain had to offer. Erasmus needed to move from Cambridge to a proper medical school to complete his medical education, and young Charles was taken out of Shrewsbury School early to accompany his brother to Edinburgh, apparently being prepared to follow in his father’s and grandfather’s footsteps in medicine. The two brothers arrived in Edinburgh in October of 1825. Erasmus left after the first year, leaving his brother on his own during his second year at Edinburgh.

Privately, Darwin early on decided he could not practice medicine. But his already serious inclination toward science was considerably strengthened at Edinburgh both by some fine scientific lectures in chemistry, geology and anatomy and by the mentoring of Dr. Robert Grant. Grant certainly knew that young Charles was Erasmus Darwin’s grandson; Grant expounded evolutionary ideas derived from Jean-Baptiste Lamarck and Charles’ grandfather. But his primary gift to Charles was introducing him to marine invertebrate anatomy and the use of the microscope as a scientific tool and as an aid to dissecting extremely small creatures dredged out of the Firth of Forth. Darwin joined an Edinburgh scientific society, the Plinean society, of which Grant was a prominent member, and presented two lectures that reported discoveries he had made while working with Grant. This interest in marine invertebrates was to be a life long obsession, climaxing in his massive four-volume contribution to the comparative anatomy and systematics of fossil and living Cirripedia or ‘barnacles’ (Barrett & Freeman 1988, vols. 11–13).

When he finally broke the news of his distaste for medicine to his father, he enrolled to take a degree in Divinity at Christ College, Cambridge University, from which he graduated in January of 1831. As with the Shrewsbury School and Edinburgh, his official course of study had very little impact on him, but while in Cambridge he befriended two young men attempting to institute serious reforms in the natural science curriculum at Cambridge, Rev. John Henslow, trained in botany and mineralogy, and Rev. Adam Sedgwick, a leading member of the rapidly expanding community of geologists. Henslow and his wife treated Darwin almost as a son, and through Henslow Darwin was introduced to the men whose ideas were currently being debated in geology and natural history, as well as to men whom we look back on as among the very first to take up the historical and philosophical foundations of science as a distinct discipline, Sir John Herschel and Rev. William Whewell. As he wrote in his autobiography:

During my last year at Cambridge, I read with care and profound interest Humboldt’s Personal Narrative. This work, and Sir J. Herschel’s Introduction to the Study of Natural Philosophy,[4] stirred up in me a burning zeal to add even the most humble contribution to the noble structure of Natural Science. No one or a dozen other books influenced me nearly so much as these two.

In the next section we will discuss the influence of the philosophical ideals of Herschel and Lyell on Darwin.

Furthering his scientific training, Adam Sedgwick on two occasions took Darwin on extended geological tours of England and Wales. In addition Darwin and a cousin, William Darwin Fox, a year ahead of him at Cambridge, developed what began as an amateur passion for bug collecting into serious entomology.

2.2 Darwin’s Darwinism

His Edinburgh and Cambridge mentors were to shape Darwin’s philosophical attitudes and scientific career decisively. It was Henslow who was the final link to Darwin in a chain connected to Captain Robert Fitzroy of H. M. S. Beagle. Fitzroy sought a gentleman companion who could also collect information on geology and natural history during a proposed circumnavigation of the globe. Henslow’s note to Darwin, asking if he would be interested in being recommended for this post, arrived at the Darwin home, ‘the Mount’, while Charles Darwin was on a geological survey of Northern Wales with Adam Sedgwick. After resistance from his father had been overcome, Darwin was offered the post and accepted it.

The combination of meticulous field observation, collection and experimentation, note taking, reading and thinking during what turned into the Beagle’s five year journey through a very wide cross-section of the earth’s environments was to set the course for the rest of his life. During the voyage he read and reread Charles Lyell’s newly published Principles of Geology, a three-volume work that articulated a philosophical vision of rigorously empirical historical science, oriented around five key ideas:

  1. The geologist investigates both the animate and inanimate changes that have taken place during the earth’s history.
  2. His principal tasks are to develop an accurate and comprehensive record of those changes, to encapsulate that knowledge in general laws, and to search for their causes.
  3. This search must be limited to causes that can be studied empirically—those ‘now in operation’, as Lyell puts it in the sub-title of his Principles, on the assumption that they have always operated, into the deep past, at the same intensity at which they now operate.
  4. The records or ‘monuments’ of the earth’s past indicate a constant process of the ‘introduction’ and ‘extinction’ of species, and it is the geologist’s task to search for the causes of these introductions and extinctions, according to the strictures note in 3., above.
  5. The only serious attempt to do so according to the idea that species are capable of ‘indefinite modification’, that of Jean Baptiste Lamarck, is a failure on methodological grounds. All the evidence supports the view that species variability is limited, and that one species cannot be transformed into another.

This vision influenced Darwin profoundly, as he freely admitted. While he became convinced by his observations and reading that the fossil record and current distribution of species could only be due to the gradual transformation of one species into another, he was determined to articulate a theory that measured up to Lyell’s principles. The crucial event in convincing him that this was to be his life’s work was likely a visit to Cape Town, South Africa during the Beagle’s return trip to England. John F. W. Herschel was in Cape Town on a mission to do for the Southern Hemisphere what his father William had done for the Northern, namely to develop a comprehensive star map with the new powerful telescopes developed by his father and aunt. As noted earlier, Darwin had been deeply impressed by Herschel’s Preliminary Discourse on the Study of Natural Philosophy when it first appeared a year before the Beagle set sail, and in his private journal he referred to his meetings with Herschel during a week long stop in Cape Town in June of 1836 as among the most profound events of the entire voyage. Just five months before meeting Darwin, Herschel had finished reading the 2nd edition of Lyell’s Principles. He sent Lyell a long letter filled with detailed constructive commentary. The letter opens by praising Lyell for facing the issue of the ‘introduction of new species’—which Herschel calls ‘that mystery of mysteries’—scientifically, and for advocating that we search for ‘intermediate causes’ to explain these ‘introductions’—code for natural, as opposed to ‘miraculous’, causes.[5] This part of the letter was quoted in Charles Babbage’s Bridgewater Treatise, published in 1837 while Darwin was struggling to develop just such a theory. Upon reading the Herschel quotation in Babbage, Darwin wrote in his private ‘species’ notebooks:

Babbage 2d Edit, p. 226.—Herschel calls the appearance of new species. the mystery of mysteries. & has grand passage upon problem.! Hurrah.—“intermediate causes”. (Barrett et al., 1987, 413; original punctuation)

He clearly recognizes that Herschel is here providing a philosophical justification for the project upon which Darwin was secretly working. And, in the very first paragraph of On the Origin of Species, Darwin looks back to this ‘Hurrah’, attributing the idea that the origin of species is ‘that mystery of mysteries’ to ‘one of our greatest philosophers’, without mentioning Herschel by name. The first mention of the possibility of an evolutionary solution to this problem is in his Ornithological Notebooks, in a note written shortly after departing Cape Town.[6]

Darwin’s theoretical task was, by the time he opened his species notebooks, tolerably clear: the only process that could produce the systematic patterns in the fossil record and the otherwise strange biogeographic distribution of species he now understood so widely and deeply was a process of slow, gradual transformation of species. He needed to come up with a natural, causal theory that would account for such transformations, and every element of that theory had to identify ‘causes now in operation’, causes that could be investigated empirically. The problem, and the methodological constraints, had been advocated by his geological hero, and now close friend, Charles Lyell; and they had been defended philosophically by his philosophical hero, Sir John Herschel.

Darwin, of course, expected, and got, outraged reactions from religiously conservative colleagues, such as his old geology teacher Sedgwick, who in a review expressed his “deep aversion to the theory; because of its unflinching materialism;–because it has deserted the inductive track,–the only track that leads to physical truth;–because it utterly repudiates final causes, and therby [sic] indicates a demoralized understanding on the part of its advocates.” What he had not expected was Lyell’s refusal to openly endorse his theory and Herschel’s decisive (if polite) rejection of its key elements. After we set out the theory in its Darwinian form, we can consider these reactions from those who apparently shared Darwin’s philosophical norms about scientific theory, explanation and confirmation.

The theory can be set out as a series of causal elements that, working together, will produce the needed transformations.

  1. Species are comprised of individuals that vary ever so slightly from each other with respect to their many traits.
  2. Species have a tendency to increase in numbers over generations at a geometric rate.
  3. This tendency is checked, to use the language of Thomas Malthus’ On the Principle of Population, by limited resources, disease, predation, and so on, creating a struggle for existence among the members of a species.
  4. Some individuals will have variations that give them a slight advantage in this struggle, variations that allow more efficient or better access to resources, greater resistance to disease, greater success at avoiding predation, and so on.
  5. These individuals will tend to survive better and leave more offspring.
  6. Offspring tend to inherit the variations of their parents.
  7. Therefore favorable variations will tend to be passed on more frequently than others and thus be preserved, a tendency Darwin labeled ‘Natural Selection’.
  8. Over time, especially in a slowly changing environment, this process will cause the character of species to change.
  9. Given a long enough period of time, the descendant populations of an ancestor species will differ enough both from it and each other to be classified as different species, a process capable of indefinite iteration. There are, in addition, forces that encourage divergence among descendant populations, and the elimination of intermediate varieties.

It will be noticed that there is no element of this theory that is incapable of empirical investigation—indeed by now the published confirmatory studies of this process would fill a small library.[7] One can understand why devout and orthodox Christians would have problems; but why Darwin’s philosophical and scientific mentors? It would seem to be the model of Herschelian/Lyellian orthodoxy.

2.3 Philosophical Problems with Darwin’s Darwinism

The answer lies in six philosophically problematic elements of the theory.

2.3.1 Probability and Chance

First, notice the use of the language of ‘tendencies’ and ‘frequencies’ in the above principles. Privately, Darwin learned, Herschel had referred to his theory as ‘the Law of higgledy-piggledy’, presumably a reference to the large element played in its key principles by chance and probability. Darwin’s theory is, as we would say today, a ‘statistical’ theory. One cannot say that every individual with favorable variation v will survive or will leave more offspring than individuals without it; one cannot say that no environment will ever support all of the offspring produced in a given generation, and thus that there must always be a competitive struggle. These are things that tend to happen due to clearly articulated causes, and this allows us to make accurate predictions about trends, at the level of populations, but not to make absolute claims about what must happen in each and every case. Only well after Herschel’s time did philosophers of science become comfortable with the idea of a theory of this sort, and the proper philosophical understanding of such explanations is still debated.

2.3.2 The Nature, Power and Scope of Selection

The core of Darwin’s theory is the concept of natural selection. Perhaps because of his use of the term selection, this core element of his theory apparently baffled nearly everyone. Could it be, as Lyell, Herschel and Darwin’s great American defender Asa Gray would ask, an ‘intermediate cause’, i.e. a causal principle instituted and sustained by God? Or is it, in its very nature, the antithesis of such a principle, as his old geology teacher Sedgwick believed? Could it possibly create species, or is it, by its nature, a negative force, eliminating what has already been created by other means? In one of his copies of On the Origin of Species, Alfred Russell Wallace crosses out ‘natural selection’ and writes ‘survival of the fittest’ next to it. Wallace always felt that ‘selection’ inappropriately imported anthropomorphic notions of Nature choosing purposefully between variants into natural history. And, in a devastating review, Fleeming Jenkin happily accepted the principle of natural selection but challenged its power to modify an ancestral species into descendent species, and thus limited its scope to the production of varieties. A number of reviewers, even some sympathetic ones, questioned the possibility of extending the theory to account for the evolution of those characteristics that differentiate humans from their nearest relatives.

2.3.3 Selection, Adaptation and Teleology

Moreover, because Darwin was very fond of describing natural selection as a process that worked for the good of each species, Darwin’s followers seemed to have diametrically opposed views as to whether his theory eliminated final causes from natural science or breathed new life into them. In either case, there was also serious disagreement on whether this was a good thing or a bad thing.[8]

2.3.4 Species and the Concept of ‘Species’

There is a fundamental philosophical problem with the idea that a species can undergo a series of changes that will cause it to become one or more other species. To illustrate it, look carefully at the first question that Charles Lyell wishes to address in the second volume of the Principles of Geology:

…first, whether species have a real and permanent existence in nature; or whether they are capable, as some naturalists pretend, of being indefinitely modified in the course of a long series of generations. (Lyell 1831, II. 1)

Lyell pretty clearly assumes that to allow for evolution is to deny the reality of species. For a species to be ‘real’, it must have ‘permanent existence in nature’, or as he puts it elsewhere , “…fixed limits beyond which the descendants from common parents can never deviate from a certain type…”. (Lyell 1831, II. 23) To accept evolutionary change, on this view, you must become comfortable with a variety of nominalism about species. And Darwin seems to have become so.[9]

Hence I look at individual differences, though of small interest to the systematist, as of high importance for us, as being the first step towards such slight varieties as are barely thought worth recording in works on natural history. And I look at varieties which are in any degree more distinct and permanent, as steps leading to more strongly marked and more permanent varieties; and at these latter, as leading to sub-species, and to species. (Darwin 1859, 52)

Permanence, as applied to species, is for Darwin a relative concept, and there are no fixed limits to variability within a species. Given enough time the individual differences found in all populations can give rise to more permanent and stable varieties, these to sub-species, and these to populations that systematists will want to class as distinct species. Moreover, he concludes the Origin with very strong words on this topic, words bound to alarm his philosophical readers:

Systematists will be able to pursue their labours as at present; but they will not be incessantly haunted by the shadowy doubt whether this or that form be in essence a species. …In short, we will have to treat species in the same manner as those naturalists treat genera, who admit that genera are merely artificial combinations made for convenience. This may not be a cheering prospect; but we shall at least be freed from the vain search for the undiscovered and undiscoverable essence of the term species. (Darwin 1859, 485)

Lyell, Herschel, Whewell, Sedgwick and many of Darwin’s contemporaries certainly would not find this a cheering prospect, since they were unrepentant realists about species.[10] Members of a species possess a ‘type’ established in the original parents, and this type provides ‘fixed limits’ to variability. Lyell clearly feels this is an empirically verifiable fact—most of chapters 2–4 of Principles Vol. II is devoted to presenting the evidence that such ‘fixed limits’ exist; and after the Origin’s publication this evidence was canvassed again in Fleeming Jenkin’s review. If this is so, then species extinction is easy to account for—there are fixed limits to a species’ ability to track environmental change. But a naturalistic account of species origination is more difficult, since there will need to be, in sexually reproducing species, a natural production of a new pair of parents with a new type. On the other hand, to adopt the sort of nominalism that Darwin seems to be advocating in the above quotations has undesirable consequences as well.[11] How are we to formulate objective principles of classification? What sort of a science of animals and plants will be possible if there are no fixed laws relating their natures to their characteristics and behaviors? A good deal of chapter 2 of Darwin’s Origin is devoted to convincing the reader that current best practice among botanists and zoologists accepts a natural world organized as he is insisting rather than as his opponents claim:

It must be admitted that many forms, considered by highly competent judges as varieties, have so perfectly the character of species that they are ranked by other highly competent judges as good and true species. (Darwin 1859, 49)

From a Darwinian perspective, this is a predictable consequence of the fact that the organisms we today wish to classify as species are merely the most recent stage of a slow, gradual evolutionary process. Organisms within a genus have common ancestors, perhaps relatively recent common ancestors; some naturalists may see ten species with a few varieties in each; others may rank some of the varieties as species and divide the same genus into twenty species. Both classifications may be done with the utmost objectivity and care by skilled observers. As systematists like to say, some of us are ‘lumpers’, some of us are ‘splitters’. Reality is neither.

2.3.5 Tempo and Mode of Evolutionary Change

The question of nominalism versus realism regarding species points toward a final aspect of Darwin’s theory with which many of those otherwise sympathetic to him disagreed, his gradualism. For apart from the question of whether his views entailed ‘nominalism’ about natural kinds, they do seem to reflect a belief that the evolutionary process must be a slow and gradual one. It is perhaps here that we see the most lasting impact of Darwin’s careful study of Charles Lyell’s Principles of Geology while on H.M.S. Beagle. We stress slow and gradual, for it is clear that one could have a slow but non-gradual evolutionary process (perhaps the long periods of evolutionary stasis punctuated by geologically rapid periods of speciation postulated by Eldridge and Gould’s ‘punctuated equilibrium model’ is such); and one could have a rapid but gradual one (for example the process George Gaylord Simpson labeled ‘adaptive radiation’, where a population migrates to a location with a variety of unexploited niches, and rapidly evolves to exploit them). Darwin stresses over and over again that he conceives of natural selection ‘adding up infinitely small variations’, and that he imagines the process of speciation to take place over a very long period of time.

2.3.6 Evolutionary Ethics, Altruism, and Group Selection

Despite Darwin’s effort to eschew discussion of human beings in the Origin (famously writing only that “light will be thrown on the origin of man and his history”; Darwin 1859, 488), he clearly believed that an evolutionary account of the human “moral sense”—as Darwin described it, borrowing from James Mackintosh—could be offered. This account, as a sub-species of what we now would call (though Darwin did not use these terms) altruistic behavior in general (see the entry for biological altruism), quickly brought Darwin into contact with a host of difficult problems.

In the Descent of Man, he flirted with an explanation of the moral sense in terms of the characteristics not of moral individuals, who would seem to fare less well in the struggle for existence than their egoistic compatriots, but in terms of the characteristics of groups exhibiting moral virtues. In a case of struggle between two tribes of “primeval man,” he writes, the one with “a greater number of courageous, sympathetic, and faithful members, who were always ready to warn each other of danger, to aid and defend each other, this tribe would without doubt succeed best and conquer the other” (Darwin 1871, 1:162). Whether this involves a genuine appeal to what contemporary scholars would call “group selection” (see the entry on units and levels of selection), or whether this can be described solely in terms of individuals desiring to help themselves and their relatives (i.e., in terms of kin selection) remains the subject of much discussion.

One of the strongest arguments for insisting that ‘Darwinism’ as it is used today is isomorphic to Darwin’s Darwinism, as Gayon puts it, is that each of these questions is still hotly debated, and has been throughout the theory’s history. With all of the amazing changes that have been wrought by the genetic, biochemical, and molecular revolutions, with the development of mathematical models of population genetics and ecology, of sophisticated techniques for both field and laboratory investigation of evolutionary processes, and of cladistic analysis in systematics, it nevertheless remains true that one can find evolutionary biologists who adhere to Darwin’s Darwinism, and are recognized as doing so by both themselves and their critics. In the next section of this article, we will develop a portrait of contemporary Darwinism around each of these contested features.

By the same token, however, Darwinism has evolved. As one example of this truth, think for a moment of contemporary debates about the nature of selection. The problems people had with natural selection in the 19th century continue to be problematic, but there are a variety of problems that were either not discussed, or discussed very differently, in the 19th century. Can, and does, natural selection work at levels other than the level of Darwin’s focus, individual organisms; is there a non-vacuous way to formulate the theory abstractly; how are we to understand the relationships between the concepts of fitness, selection and adaptation? How strong are the constraints on the selection process, and what sorts of constraints are there? Are there other motors of evolutionary change besides selection, and if so, how important are they?

3. The Six Core Philosophical Problems Today

Theories need both essences and histories.
Stephen Jay Gould (2002, 1)

So reads the heading of the very first section of the first chapter of Gould’s monumental The Structure of Evolutionary Theory. Opening with a subtle reading of an exchange of letters in 1863 between paleontologist Hugh Falconer and Charles Darwin, Gould eventually explains what he has in mind by this section heading:

In short, “The structure of evolutionary theory” combines enough stability for coherence with enough change to keep any keen mind in a perpetual mode of search and challenge. (Gould 2002, 6)

Gould, of course, was both an unabashed admirer of Charles Darwin and one of the most outspoken critics of the ‘neo-Darwinian synthesis’. We will be using both his account of ‘the Essence of Darwinism’ in Part I of this magnum opus and his arguments for a ‘Revised and Expanded Evolutionary Theory’ in its Part II as touchstones and targets.

In the preceding section of this essay, we organized our discussion of the problems that Darwin’s allies had with Darwin’s Darwinism around six issues: [i] the role of chance as a factor in evolutionary theory and the theory’s apparently probabilistic nature; [ii] the nature of selection; [iii] the question of whether selection/adaptation explanations are teleological; [iv] the ontological status of species and the epistemological status of species concepts; [v] the implications of Darwin’s insistence on the slow and gradual nature of evolutionary change; and [vi] the impact of natural selection on ethics and altruistic behavior. We claimed that one very good reason for continuing to characterize one dominant approach to evolutionary biology, that represented by the so-called ‘Neo-Darwinian Synthesis’, as ‘Darwinism’ is that its proponents side with Darwin on these issues, to the extent that Darwin had a clear position on them (and on many less fundamental ones besides). That in itself is remarkable, but it is the more so because the Darwinian position on each of these issues is under as much pressure from non-Darwinian evolutionary biologists today as it was in the wake of the Origin. It is not surprising, given the situation as we have just characterized it, that historians and philosophers of biology have made significant contributions to the discussion, especially in pointing out the underlying philosophical issues and conceptual confusions and ambiguities that stand in the way of resolving the issues at hand, and their historical origins.

It is our conviction that a full understanding of the underlying philosophical disagreements on these questions will only come from a patient historical study of how the ‘Synthesis’ positions on these various issues, and those of their critics, arose. That we cannot do here. Rather, in what follows we will simply be presupposing certain answers to these questions of historical origins. The list of references at the end of this essay includes a number of excellent pieces of work on this subject for those who share our convictions about its importance.

3.1 The Roles of Chance in Evolutionary Theory

Let us begin with the language Darwin uses when he first sketches his theory at the beginning of the fourth chapter of the Origin:

Can it, then, be thought improbable, seeing that variations useful to man have undoubtedly occurred, that other variations useful in some way to each being in the great and complex battle of life, should sometimes occur in the course of thousands of generations? If such do occur, can we doubt (remembering that many more individuals are born than can possibly survive) that individuals having any advantage, however slight, over others, would have the best chance of surviving and of procreating their kind? (Darwin 1859, 80–81, emphasis added)

Unlike Darwin’s contemporaries, and despite Darwin’s own apparent hesitation, the founders of the synthesis of Mendelian genetics and Darwinian selection theory, Sewall Wright, Ronald Fisher and J. B. S. Haldane, were entirely comfortable with a selection theory formulated in such terms. This was a substantial shift in the presentation of evolution, from a reluctantly probabilistic picture to a thoroughly mathematized, statistical, and probabilistic theory, which occurred in the first several decades after the publication of the Origin (Gayon 1998; Pence 2022).

On this issue, contemporary Darwinism has adopted an approach every bit as ‘chancy’ as that of Darwin. Note one clear statement of the Principle of Natural Selection from the philosophical literature:

If a is better adapted than b to their mutual environment E, then (probably) a will have greater reproductive success than b in E. (Brandon 1990, 11).

The theory trades pervasively in probabilities. Given the fact that evolutionary biologists, especially in so far as they take their cues from population genetics, deal with large populations conceived as ‘gene pools’, and think of evolution as long run changes in the frequencies of different combinations of genes from generation to generation, it is clear that, in the sense of making use of probabilistic or statistical reasoning, chance permeates contemporary Darwinism. The models of population biology provide a means of assigning probabilities to various outcomes, given information about population size, rates of mutation and migration (themselves given as averages and estimates). That is, as Darwin notes, being relatively better adapted increases an organism’s ‘chances’, i.e. increases its probability, of leaving viable offspring. It does not guarantee it. Since natural selection is a stochastic process, Darwinians from Darwin to the present rightly characterize it in terms of influencing the ‘chances’ of a given outcome, given variables such as selection pressure, population size or mutation rates.

Conceptual confusion arises, however, from the fact that ‘chance’ and ‘randomness’ are often contrasted, not with ‘deterministic’ or ’non-probabilistic’ outcomes, but with ‘selected’ outcomes. The evolutionary process, as Darwin understood it, involves both the generation of variation and a process producing a differential perpetuation of variation. One way to think about chance in Darwinism is in relation to a logical space of alternatives, by means of the following variation grid:

  Generation Perpetuation
Fitness Biased Lamarck
Asa Gray
Asa Gray
Not Fitness Based Darwin

On this second sense of chance, what seems to make a theory ‘chancy’ is the fact that generation of variation and perpetuation of variation have both been, for some of these theorists, independent of future utility or fitness. As we see from the grid, a contrast on both scores is found in the evolutionary philosophy of Jean-Baptiste Lamarck. Lamarck’s is a materialistic argument against the variation in nature being a matter of chance. On the Lamarckian view, variations arise in an organism as a direct response to environmental stress or demand, giving rise to a stimulus, which in turn elicits a physiological response, which finally can be passed on via reproduction to offspring. Variations are not chance or random, since they are an appropriate response to an environmental stress. Here ‘chance’ signals a lack of relation or connection to adaptive needs.

The concept of ‘random variation’ is today often used as a synonym for ‘chance variation’ in precisely this latter sense. Here are two examples of this notion of chance or randomness as used by contemporary Darwinians.

…mutation is a random process with respect to the adaptive needs of the species. Therefore, mutation alone, uncontrolled by natural selection, would result in the breakdown and eventual extinction of life, not in adaptive or progressive evolution. (Dobzhansky 1970, 65)

Thus the production of variations may be a ‘chance’ process in that there are a number of possible outcomes with assignable probabilities, but it is also a ‘chance’ process in the sense that the probability assignments are not biased by ‘adaptive needs’ or ‘fitness’.

Referring now to perpetuation rather than generation of variation, when John Beatty describes ‘random drift’ as ‘changes in frequencies of variations due to chance’ in the following passage, he presumably has something like a contrast with changes in frequencies due to selection in mind.

In Darwin’s scheme of things, recall, chance events and natural selection were consecutive rather than alternative stages of the evolutionary process. There was no question as to which was more important at a particular stage. But now that we have the concept of random drift taking over where random variation leaves off, we are faced with just such a question. That is, given chance variations, are further changes in the frequencies of those variations more a matter of chance or more a matter of natural selection? (Beatty 1984, 196)

Notice that in the above quote we first get a substitution of ‘random’ for ‘chance’ in the phrases ‘random variation’ and ‘chance variation’, and then at least the suggestion that the concept of ‘random drift’ can be characterized as ‘changes in frequencies of variations due to chance’, where the contrast class consists of similar changes due to natural selection.

With respect to the generation of variation, chapter 5 of On the Origin of Species opens with the following apology:

I have hitherto sometimes spoken as if the variations—so common and multiform in organic beings under domestication, and in a lesser degree in those in a state of nature—had been due to chance. This, of course, is a wholly incorrect expression, but it serves to acknowledge plainly our ignorance of the cause of each particular variation. (Darwin 1859, 131)

Here Darwin is noting that, though to speak of ‘chance variations’ may seem to be citing chance as the cause of the variations, in fact it is simply acknowledging that they ‘appear to have no assignable cause’. But it is important to keep historical context in mind here. Whether Darwin himself ever flirted with the idea of ‘directed’ variation or not, he was acutely aware of two views from which his needed to be distinguished, very different from each other, but both holding to the view that variations arose for a purpose.[12] The most widely shared alternative was that found in natural theology. To quote the Reverend William Paley’s Natural Theology, regarding a beautiful instance of adaptation: “A conformation so happy was not the gift of chance”. Likewise, among Darwin’s followers, the American botanist Asa Gray, in an essay entitled ‘Natural Selection and Natural Theology’, uses the same contrast to advise Darwin against the notion of ‘chance variation’: “…we should advise Mr. Darwin to assume, in the philosophy of his hypothesis, that variation has been led along certain beneficial lines.”

Gray is here insisting that, since Darwin admits that using the term ‘chance’ merely signals ignorance of the true cause, and since the pervasive adaptations in nature suggest design, Darwin should avoid the suggestion that variations are due to chance in the sense of ‘absence of design’. This introduces yet a third sense of ‘chance’ that has been instrumental in the interpretation of evolutionary theory (Shanahan 1991, 264).

Darwin, in fact never refers to ‘chance variations’ in the Origin, though occasionally he will note that if a beneficial variation ‘chances [i.e. happens] to appear’, it will be favored by selection (see pp. 37, 82) What Darwin has in mind, however, is clear from his concluding remarks in his chapter on Laws of Variation:

Whatever the cause may be of each slight difference in the offspring from their parents—and a cause of each must exist—it is the steady accumulation, through natural selection, of such differences, when beneficial to the individual, that gives rise to all the more important modifications of structure… (Darwin 1859, 170)

Whatever the cause of the generation of a variation may be, the role of selection is to accumulate those already present variations that happen to be beneficial, a process that, while probabilistic, is not at all independent of fitness (and hence not ‘chancy’ in our second sense). As Beatty put it, the generation of variations and their selection are ‘consecutive’ processes. But to call the generation of variation a ‘chance’ process is to use ‘chance’ in either the second or the third sense, meaning either that such generation is independent of the future utility of variations for the organism, or that it is not by design, not for some end.

There are, therefore, at least three forms of ‘chance’ at play in contemporary evolutionary theory: an invocation of probabilistic or statistical inferences, an invocation of processes that act independently of current or future fitness, and an invocation of the absence of design. To these we might add, as mentioned above, chance as ignorance of causes, and chance as historical contingency, though we lack the space to discuss either of those notions further here, bringing the total to five (see, e.g., Shanahan 1991, 263–267). Eble (1999, 76) drops the notion of probabilistic or statistical inference and adds the idea, less relevant in evolutionary contexts, that ‘chance’ can refer to uncaused events (see analysis in Millstein 2000, 609–613).

One further example can illustrate how all this interacts in the broader context of contemporary evolutionary theory (for more such examples, see the contributions to Ramsey and Pence 2016). Here, a champion of the neutral theory of molecular evolution characterizes his position:

…the great majority of evolutionary changes at the molecular (DNA) level do not result from Darwinian natural selection acting on advantageous mutants but, rather, from random fixation of selectively neutral or very nearly neutral mutants through random genetic drift, which is caused by random sampling of gametes in finite populations. (Kimura 1992, 225)

Here, it will be noticed, the focus is not on the generation of variations but on the perpetuation of variations. The contrast is between a random sampling of gametes that leads to the fixation of selectively neutral alleles and natural selection favoring advantageous variations. That is, the contrast between ‘chance’ and ‘fitness biased’ processes is now being used to distinguish different means of perpetuating certain variations. We are contrasting two sampling processes. Drift samples without concern for adaptation; selection samples discriminately on the basis of differences in fitness. Both samplings are ‘probabilistic’, of course, but that in no way obviates the above contrast.

However, as Beatty has pointed out, it was quite common until fairly recently to characterize natural selection in such a way as to make it almost indistinguishable from random drift (cf. Lennox 1992, Lennox and Wilson 1994). Numerous accounts of fitness characterized the fitness of a genotype as defined by its relative contribution to the gene pool of future generations—the genotype contributing the larger percentage being the fitter. But of course that could easily be the result of a ‘random’—non-fitness biased—sampling process; which organisms would be declared ‘fitter’ by this method might have nothing to do with natural selection. In order to provide a proper characterization of the role of chance in evolutionary change, then, it is critical to provide a more robust and sophisticated account of fitness. (For further information, see the entry on fitness.) This, in turn, requires that we discuss the conceptual network that includes the notions of adaptation and natural selection, to which we will turn shortly.

For now, let us assume that there is a way of characterizing fitness such that there is a substantial empirical question of what role indiscriminate sampling of genotypes (or phenotypes) plays in evolutionary change. This issue was first placed squarely before evolutionary biologists by Sewall Wright in the early 1930s. As Wright pointed out, genes that are neutral with respect to fitness can, due to the stochastic nature of any process of sampling from a population, increase their representation from one generation to the next. The likelihood of this happening goes up as effective population size goes down. Since Wright imagined that a quite typical scenario in evolutionary change was for species to be broken up into relatively small, relatively isolated, populations (or ‘demes’), with significantly more breeding within than between demes, the likelihood that such ‘neutral genotypes’ could become fixed at relatively high levels was significant. Though he gradually toned down this aspect of his work, a significant school of mathematical population geneticists in the 1960s and 70s took these ideas and ran with them, developing a ‘Neutralist’ approach to evolutionary change. This is the position characterized by Kimura (one of its most eloquent defenders) in the passage quoted above. Whether or not such a process plays a significant role in evolution is not a philosophical issue, but it is highly relevant to whether evolutionary biology should be seen as predominantly Darwinian. For if any view is central to Darwinism, it is that the evolutionary process is predominantly guided by the fitness-biasing force of natural selection, acting on variations that arise by chance. It is to natural selection and related concepts that we now turn.

3.2 The Nature, Power and Scope of Selection

The greatest number of females will, of course, fall to the share of the most vigorous males; and the strongest individuals of both sexes, by driving away the weakest, will enjoy the best food, and the most favourable situations, for themselves and for their offspring. A severe winter, or a scarcity of food, by destroying the weak and the unhealthy, has had all the good effects of the most skilful selection.

The words of Charles Darwin? No; these are the words of John Sebright, penned in The Art of Improving the Breeds of Domestic Animals in 1809, the year of Charles Darwin’s birth and fifty years before On the Origin of Species was published. Darwin refers to this passage in Notebook C of his Species Notebooks.[13] It will be noticed that Sebright is not discussing domestic selection, but is quite clearly saying that processes leading to differential survival and reproduction in nature will have ‘all the good effects of the most skilful selection’. Darwin, then, did not need to read Malthus to see what is here so plainly and clearly stated—namely, that the struggle for survival in nature will have the same ‘selective’ effects as the actions of the domestic breeder of plants and animals.

As this passage, and the argument of the Origin, shows, ‘natural selection’ began life as the product of analogical reasoning. Sebright sees clearly that the natural processes he is describing will have the same effects as the breeder’s selection, but he is not about to describe those processes as selection processes. Darwin took that step, and Darwinism has followed.

Darwin himself consistently refers to natural selection as a power of preserving advantageous, and eliminating harmful, variations. As noted in the last section, whether a particular variation is advantageous or harmful is, in once sense of that term, a matter of chance; and whether an advantageous variation is actually preserved by selection is, in another sense of the term, also a matter of chance. For Darwinism, selection is the force or power that biases survival and reproduction in favor of advantageous variations, or to look ahead to the next section, of adaptations. It is this that distinguishes selection from drift.

Recent years have seen significant challenges to the idea that this framework is sufficient to explain all evolutionary phenomena, or even to explain an important fraction of evolutionary phenomena of interest. On one side we find partisans of the so-called “extended evolutionary synthesis” (EES), who argue that features like niche construction, developmental bias, phenotypic plasticity, and non-genetic inheritance entail the existence of a theory that at least radically supplements, if not transcends entirely, the Darwinian perspective (for an introduction, see Laland et al. 2014; further references include Pigliucci and Müller 2010; Uller and Laland 2019). On the other side we could put scholars like George C. Williams, who has vigorously defended the explanatory sufficiency of Darwinian selection theory (Williams 1992), or a number of proposals arguing that sufficiently reformulated concepts from “traditional” evolutionary theory can allow it to take on the challenge of the EES without radical changes (e.g., the gene for Lu and Bourrat 2017, or adaptationism for Welch 2017; see also the entries on the gene, adaptationism, and population genetics).

We can distinguish two broad categories into which we might sort these non-Darwinian amendments: [i] proposed limitations on natural selection as an evolutionary force; and [ii] expansions of the scope of natural selection to include new ‘targets’, ‘processes’ or ‘mechanisms’, and ‘levels’. It will be noted that in neither case is it obvious that the theory itself requires modification in the face of such challenges—in principle these might be nothing more than challenges to the theory’s range of application. However, if it turned out that most evolutionary change could be explained without recourse to natural selection, this would be grounds for arguing that evolutionary biology was no longer Darwinian. And if it turned out that the theory of natural selection could only be integrated with our new understanding of the processes of inheritance and development by a wholesale modification of its foundations, it might be best to see the new theory as a modified descendent of Darwinism, rather than Darwinism itself. Theories may need essences, as Gould claims; but if what is fundamental to the theory has changed, then so has its essence. To borrow a phrase from Paul Griffiths, perhaps it is not that theories need histories and essences—perhaps what they need are historical essences.

Alfred Russell Wallace regularly urged Darwin to jettison the term ‘selection’ as misleadingly anthropomorphic, and substitute Herbert Spencer’s ‘survival of the fittest’. Darwin went halfway—in later editions he added ‘or Survival of the Fittest’ to ‘Natural Selection’ in the title of chapter 4. As the theory developed in the mid-20th century, the expression ‘survival of the fittest’ was gradually eliminated from any serious presentation of Darwinian selection theory. On the other hand, the concept of ‘fitness’ has played a prominent, and problematic, role. In the mathematical models used in population genetics, ‘fitness’ refers either to the abilities of the different genotypes in a population to leave descendants, or to the measures of those abilities, represented by the variable W. Here is a rather standard textbook presentation of the relevant concepts:

In the neo-Darwinian approach to natural selection that incorporates consideration of genetics, fitness is attributed to particular genotypes. The genotype that leaves the most descendants is ascribed the fitness value W=1, and all other genotypes have fitnesses, relative to this, that are less than 1. … Fitness measures the relative evolutionary advantage of one genotype over another, but it is often important also to measure the relative penalties incurred by different genotypes subject to natural selection. This relative penalty is the corollary of fitness and is referred to by the term selection coefficient. It is given the symbol s and is simply calculated by subtracting the fitness from 1, so that: s = 1 − W. (Skelton 1993, 164)

The problem lies in the fact that the concept of fitness plays dual roles that are instructively conflated in this quotation. For when fitnesses are viewed as measures of differential abilities of organisms with different genotypes to leave different numbers of offspring, the language of fitness encourages us to suppose that ‘fitness’ refers to the relative selective advantages of genotypes. On the other hand, if ‘fitness’ simply refers to the measure of reproductive success, it is a quantitative representation of small scale evolutionary change in a population, and leaves entirely open the question of the causes of the change. But then the assumed connections among the concepts of fitness, adaptation and natural selection are severed. ‘Selection coefficients’ may have nothing to do with selection; what W represents may have nothing to do with selective advantage.

There is, however, a way of formulating the theory in its modern guise which maintains an essentially Darwinian character. Since there are a number of confirmed ways in which natural populations can evolve in the absence of natural selection, and since balancing selection, i.e. countervailing selection forces, may prevent a population from evolving in its presence, it is clear that establishing, by measuring different reproductive rates among its members, that the genetic make-up of a population has changed does not establish that natural selection was the source of that change; nor does the fact that no change has been measured establish that natural selection is not operative. Population genetics and its associated models should be treated as the ‘kinematics’, not the ‘dynamics’ of evolutionary processes (on this distinction, see also Pence 2021). That is, it is a way of establishing that a population either is or is not in equilibrium, and it provides sophisticated tools for measuring rates of change in a population across generations. Moreover, like the kinematics of any physical theory, if it establishes cross-generational change, it also tells us that there are causes to be found—the detailed contours of those measures may even provide suggestions as to where to look for those causes. What it cannot do on its own is provide knowledge of the forces at work. To use language introduced by Elliott Sober, fitness, unlike natural selection, is causally inert. (For further information, see the entry on population genetics.)

That means that, as valuable as population genetics is, it should not be equated with the theory of natural selection. Too often in both biological presentations of the theory and philosophical discussions of it, this is forgotten. For example:

Most people are familiar with the basic theory of natural selection. Organisms vary in a heritable fashion. Some variants leave more offspring than others; their characteristics, therefore, are represented at a greater frequency in the next generation. (Wilson 1984, 273)

This is a presentation of ‘the basic theory of natural selection’ that makes no reference to natural selection at all!

Natural selection, if it is to resemble the Darwinian concept that bears that name, must be reserved for reference to an interaction between a variable, heritable feature of an organic system and the environment of that system. That interaction may or may not change the proportions of those features across generations, and those proportions may change for reasons other than those interactions. But a plausible natural selection hypothesis must posit some such interaction. (Whether this interaction is accurately described as causal is another much-debated topic in recent years; see Pence 2021 for a high-level summary.) On this issue we will give the last word to Stephen Jay Gould:

…when we consider natural selection as a causal process, we can only wonder why so many people confused a need for measuring the results of natural selection by counting the differential increase of some hereditary attribute (bookkeeping) with the mechanism that produces relative reproductive success (causality). (Gould 2003, 619)

The concept of natural selection has to this point been presented broadly because of the other two critical questions surrounding the contemporary Darwinian concept of natural selection that we mentioned earlier—questions having to do with possible limiting constraints on natural selection and about the sorts of objects that can be viewed as appropriate organismic/environmental ‘interactors’ in the selection process.

If we suppose that for Darwin natural selection was almost exclusively thought of as an interaction between individual organisms and their organic and inorganic environments, then we can see two challenges to Darwinism today with respect to levels of selection. There are those, such as G. C. Williams, Richard Dawkins (1976) and, more recently, J. Arvid Ågren (2021), who argue that selection is always and only of genes. Here is a clear statement:

These complications [those introduced by organism/environment interactions] are best handled by regarding individual [organismic] selection, not as a level of selection in addition to that of the gene, but as the primary mechanism of selection at the genic level. (Williams 1993, 16)

Dawkins’ preferred mode for making the same point is to refer to organisms—or interactors—as the vehicles of their genes, in fact vehicles constructed by the genome for its own perpetuation.

The original impulse for this approach, especially clear in Williams’ classic Adaptation and Natural Selection (1966), was philosophical—it was to use a sort of Ockham’s razor strategy against group selection hypotheses, showing that alleged group selection effects could be explained by explanations operating at the level of the genome (an approach more recently taken by the controversial Nowak et al. 2010). Throughout that book, selection is always said to be of individual alleles, regardless of the role environments at various levels may play in the process.

This view has been extensively challenged by philosophers of biology on both methodological and conceptual grounds, though there are, among philosophers, enthusiastic supporters (cf. Dennett 1995). In all the give and take, it is seldom noticed that defenders of this view claim to be carrying the Darwinian flag (Gayon 1998 and Gould 2003 are exceptions). Yet it is certainly not a position that Darwin would recognize—and not merely because he lacked a coherent theory of the units of inheritance. It is not a Darwinian view because for Darwin it was differences in the abilities of organisms at various stages of development to respond to the challenges of life that had causal primacy in the explanation of evolutionary change. Among evolutionary biologists from the ‘neo-Darwinian synthesis’ on, it is those who stress the role of organisms in populations interacting differentially to ever-variable ecological conditions in causing changes in the gene pools of those populations who are the card-carrying Darwinians. Such a “return of the organism” (Nicholson 2014) in evolutionary explanations marks a profound link between proponents of an extended evolutionary synthesis (e.g., Walsh 2015) and Darwin himself.

Darwinism also has challenges from the opposite direction. In the 1970s a number of biologists working in the fields of paleontology and systematics challenged the Neo-Darwinian dogma that you could account for ‘macro-evolution’ by means of long term extrapolation from micro-evolution. Gould, in particular, opens Part II of The Structure of Evolutionary Theory (Towards a Revised and Expanded Evolutionary Theory), with a chapter entitled ‘Species as Individuals in the Hierarchical Theory of Selection’. That chapter title combines two conceptually distinct theses that connect debates about the fundamentals of natural selection to patterns in macroevolution: first, the thesis defended by Michael Ghiselin (Ghiselin 1997) and championed and refined by David Hull (Hull 2001), that species are, in a robust sense of the term, ‘individuals’; and second, that there may well be selection among groups of organisms, qua groups (see section 3.6). These debates over the importance of selective and non-selective processes and the relationship between these mechanisms of biological change and broader patterns of diversification and adaptation comprise some of the most important and heated discussions currently underway in evolutionary theory.

3.3 Selection, Adaptation and Teleology

Early in the Introduction to On the Origin of Species, Darwin observes that the conclusion that each species had descended from others “even if well founded, would be unsatisfactory, until it could be shown how the innumerable species inhabiting this world have been modified so as to acquire that perfection of structure and co-adaptation which most justly excites our admiration” (Darwin 1859, 3). One might say this was the central promise of Darwinism—to account for both phylogenic continuity and adaptive differentiation by means of the same principles; or as Darwin puts it, to integrate in one theory the supposed opposition between Unity of Type and Conditions of Existence.

But it is here that even the most sympathetic of Darwin’s theistic supporters were forced to qualify their support for the theory of descent with modification by means of natural selection. In Darwin’s day the reactions of Asa Gray and John Herschel are perhaps the most interesting in this respect. Both men saw in Darwin’s theory a way to account for ‘that mystery of mysteries,’ the regular appearance of new species by means of natural, or as they might say, ‘intermediate’ causes. However both instinctively recoiled from the irreducible and central role of ‘chance’ in the theory. They did not, but easily could have, said ‘God does not play dice with the universe.’ But as Darwin stated repeatedly, if gently, to Gray—if God ordained that variations should be along beneficial lines, natural selection would be redundant. Moreover, the evidence from the study of variation in domestic and natural populations put the lie to any claim that God directs all or most variation along beneficial lines. Darwinian selection theory is a two-step process—the production of variation unrelated to the adaptive requirements of the organism, and differential perpetuation of those variations that serve adaptive needs. Again, a theory of evolution that could not be so described would not be a Darwinian theory.

The nature of ‘selection explanations’ is a topic to which much philosophical attention has been devoted in recent years. Here we want to focus on only one important question—to what extent is the teleological appearance of such explanations simply that, an appearance masking a causal process in which goals play no role?

The appearance of teleology is certainly present in Darwinian explanations, and has been since Darwin spoke of natural selection working solely for the good of each being. The appearance of teleology stems from the ease with which both evolutionary biology and common sense take it for granted that animals and plants have the adaptations they do because of some benefit or advantage to the organism provided by those adaptations.

This is a hotly contested question, and we will here simply sketch a case that selective explanations of adaptations are robustly teleological. The interested reader may want to refer to the literature on this question referred to in the discussion and listed in the list of readings provided at the end of this entry. The serious philosophical issue can be put simply and directly: in selection explanations of adaptations, are the functions served by adaptations a central and irreducible feature of the explanans in such explanations? If the answer is yes, the explanations are teleological.[14]

A good place to begin is with a simple, yet realistic, example. In research carried out over many years and combining painstaking field work and laboratory experimentation, John Endler was able to demonstrate that the color patterns of males in the guppy populations he was studying in rivers feeding into the southern Caribbean were a consequence of a balance between mate selection and predator selection. To take one startling example, he was able to test and confirm a hypothesis that a group of males, with a color pattern that matched that of the pebbles on the bottoms of the streams and ponds they populated except for bright red spots, have that pattern because a common predator in those populations, a prawn, is color blind for red. Red spots did not put their possessors at a selective disadvantage, and were attractors for mates (Endler 1983, 173–190). We may refer to this pattern of coloration as a complex adaptation that serves the functions of predator avoidance and mate attraction. But what role do those functions play in explaining why it is that the males in this population have the coloration they do?

This color pattern is an adaptation, as that term is used in Darwinism, only if it is a product of natural selection (Williams 1966, 261; Brandon 1985; Burian 1983). In order for this to be true, there must be an array of color variation available in the genetic/developmental resources of the species wider than this particular pattern but including this pattern. Which factors are critical, then, in producing differential survival and reproduction of guppies with this particular pattern? The answer would seem to be the value-consequences this pattern has compared to others available in promoting viability and reproduction. In popular parlance (and the parlance favored by Darwin), this color pattern is good for the male guppies that have it, and for their male offspring, and that is why they have it (Binswanger 1990; Brandon 1985; Lennox 2002). This answer strengthens the ‘selected effects’ or ‘consequence etiology’ accounts of selection explanations by stressing that selection ranges over value differences. The reason for one among a number of color patterns having a higher fitness value has to do with the value of that pattern relative to the survival and reproductive success of its possessors.

Selection explanations are, then, a particular kind of teleological explanation, an explanation in which that for the sake of which a trait is possessed, its valuable consequence, accounts for the trait’s differential perpetuation and maintenance in the population.

3.4 Species and the Concept of ‘Species’

In listing the topics we would discuss under the heading of neo-Darwinism, we distinguished the question of the ontological status of species from the epistemological status of the species concept. Though they are closely related questions, it is important to keep them distinct. As will become clear as we proceed, this distinction is rarely honored. Moreover, it is equally important to distinguish the species concept from the categories of features that belong in a definition of species (Rheins 2011). Advances in our theoretical understanding may lead us to reconsider the sorts of attributes that are most important for determining whether a group of organisms is a species, and thus whether it deserves to be assigned a name at that taxonomic level. It should not be assumed that such changes constitute a change in the species concept, though at least some such changes may lead us to restrict or expand the range of taxa that are designated as species. In his contribution to the Neo-Darwinian Synthesis, Systematics and the Origin of Species, Ernst Mayr titled chapter five ‘The Systematic Categories and the New Species Concept’. Recall that Darwin made a point of treating the species category as continuous with ‘well-marked variety’ and ‘sub-species’, and made the radical suggestion that its boundaries would be just as fluid. Without explicitly acknowledging Darwin, Mayr takes the same tack, discussing ‘individual variants’ and ‘sub-species’ as a preliminary to discussing the species concept. Mayr notes that for someone studying the evolutionary process, speciation is a critical juncture; “…his interpretation of the speciation process depends largely on what he considers to be the final stage of this process, the species.” (Mayr 1942/1982, 113) With this in mind, he offers the following definition, the so-called ‘biological species concept’ (BSC):

Species are groups of actually or potentially interbreeding natural populations, which are reproductively isolated from other such groups (Mayr 1942/1982, 120; 1976, 518)

Mayr was well aware of the limitations of this definition, and treated it somewhat as a ‘regulative ideal’. Dobzhansky in 1937 gave what he claimed to be a definition of species, but which seems, as Mayr noted (Mayr 1976, 481), much more a definition of speciation:

…that stage of evolutionary process, “at which the once actually or potentially interbreeding array of forms becomes segregated in two or more separate arrays which are physiologically incapable of interbreeding.” (312)

Simpson (1943) and others built even more historicity into the concept. These are all, of course, intended as definitions of the species category, and they attempt to provide a test (or a ‘yardstick’: Mayr 1976, 479) that in principle will permit a researcher to decide whether a group of individuals should all be identified by a single species-level concept such as ‘homo sapiens’. The test for species membership is the capacity to interbreed; the test distinguishing two species is incapacity to interbreed. Dobzhansky makes the importance of this test transparent—the transition from a single interbreeding population to two reproductively isolated ones is the process of speciation.

Now in each of these definitions, little attention is paid to the actual methods used by taxonomists and systematists in differentiating between varieties of a species and distinct species, something to which Darwin gave a great deal of attention. Darwin’s apparent nominalism regarding the species concept likely stemmed from his close attention to his own taxonomic practices and those of other specialists.

Mayr, on the contrary, relates different approaches to the species concept to the philosophical distinction between essentialism and nominalism (for the history of this argumentative move, see Witteveen 2015; 2016). He associates what he calls essentialism (and what we called above “realism” about species) with the view that a species concept refers to a universal or type. This view of the referent of the concept leads to the Typological Species Concept, which he traces from Linnaeus back to Plato and Aristotle, and which he claims ‘is now universally abandoned’ (1976, 516). It is worth noting that serious doubt has been cast both on the historical and the philosophical credentials of Mayr’s ‘Typological Species Concept’ (see, e.g. Lennox, 1987; repr. in Lennox 2001b; Winsor 2001, 2006; Walsh 2006; Wilkins 2009). At the opposite extreme is nominalism, which combines the view that only individuals exist in nature and that species are concepts invented for the purpose of grouping these individuals collectively.

Mayr claims that his Biological Species Concept (BSC) is an advance on both; individual species members are objectively related to one another not by a shared relation to a type but by causal and historical relationships to one another. He can thus be understood as arguing for a new, objective way of understanding the epistemological grounds for grouping individuals into species. This new way of grouping stresses historical, genetic and various ecological relationships among the individuals as the grounds for determining species membership. His claim is that this is more reliable and objective than similarities of phenotypic characteristics. This makes sense of the importance he eventually places on the fact the BSC defines species relationally:

…species are relationally defined. The word species corresponds very closely to other relational terms such as, for instance, the word brother. … To be a different species is not a matter of degree of difference but of relational distinctness. (Mayr 1976, 518)

Mayr has in mind that brothers may or may not look alike; the question of whether two people are brothers is determined by their historical and genetic ties to a common ancestry. Notice, however, that this is a claim about which characteristics, among the many that they have, should be taken most seriously in determining the applicability to them of the concept ‘brother’. That is, it is a defense of a sort of essentialism.

A number of critics have pointed out that essentialism need not be committed to ‘types’ understood as universalia in re; and on certain accounts of essences any species taxon that meets the standards of BSC does so in virtue of certain essential (though relational and historical) properties. At one extreme, Michael Ghiselin and David Hull have argued that this causal/historical structure of species provides grounds, at least within evolutionary biology, for considering species to be individuals.[15] Organisms are not members of a class or set, but ‘parts’ of a phylogenetic unit. Taking a very different tack, Denis Walsh has recently argued that a form of ‘evolutionary essentialism,’ bearing a striking resemblance to the essentialism of Aristotle’s zoological work, is implicit in the work of a number of evolutionary developmental theorists (Walsh, 2006).

A critical issue in this debate over the account of the species concept most appropriate for Darwinism is the extent to which the process of biological classification—taxonomy—should be informed by advances in biological theory. Besides those already discussed, the moderate pluralism associated with Robert Brandon and Brent Mischler or the more radical pluralism defended by Philip Kitcher, argues that different explanatory aims within the biological sciences will require different criteria for determining whether a group constitutes a species (perhaps, controversially, including non-epistemic value commitments; see Garnett and Christidis 2017; Conix 2019). Cladists, on the other hand, employ strictly defined phylogenetic tests to determine species rank (see Rheins 2011).

Unlike many of the other topics that define the history of Darwinism, there is no clear-cut position on this question that can be identified as ‘Darwinian’ or ‘neo-Darwinian’. In a recent collection of papers defending most of the alternatives currently being advanced (Ereshefsky 1992), our suspicion is that virtually every author in that collection would identify himself as Darwinian. This may be because, as different as they are, a number of positions currently being defended have their roots in Darwin’s own theory and practice (see Beatty 1985; reprinted in Ereshefsky 1992).

3.5 Tempo and Mode of Evolutionary Change

Contemporary debates over the tempo and mode of evolutionary change often travel with those concerning the role of “non-Darwinian” processes in evolutionary biology, as discussed in section 3.2. As was argued above, the classical Darwinist position on questions of tempo and mode is usually taken to be a strict gradualism, with natural selection slowly pushing populations toward adaptive peaks (see the entry on adaptationism). From Darwin’s day to our own, a number of processes other than natural selection that significantly impact the speed and direction of population change have been increasingly emphasized. The oldest among them was genetic drift, which draws our attention toward selectively neutral (sometimes, as we saw above, described as “random”) change in populations. If one emphasizes processes of this sort, evolution might still be gradual, but it would not necessarily, or even not usually, be adaptively directed.

The same is true for the increasing interaction between evolution and developmental biology, or evo-devo. If processes like phenotypic plasticity, in which an organism with a static genotype may exhibit radically different phenotypes as a developmental response to environmental influences, are extremely prevalent, then the kind of gradual walk toward an adaptive peak which it is clear Darwin had in mind would be regularly punctuated by fits and starts of various kinds, as new portions of evolutionary space became available as a result of developmental novelty. In turn, this could lead to the non-gradual (potentially even non-Darwinian) pattern of punctuated equilibrium, Stephen Jay Gould’s term for this oscillation between periods of stasis and rapid change across the history of the tree of life (see the entry on macroevolution). Examples of this sort could be multiplied (e.g., biased mutation, epigenetics), though we lack the space to do so here.

To be sure, it is not clear that Darwin himself would have considered any of these to be “anti-Darwinian” approaches. As counter-examples to Darwin’s gradualism accumulated in his own day, especially those driven by (misplaced, we now know) concerns about the age of the earth like those raised by William Thomson, Lord Kelvin, Darwin began to increase the importance of “sports” in later revisions of his works, large variations that could cause brief periods of rapid phenotypic change. That said, when a reference is made in contemporary work to the “Darwinian” position on tempo and mode, it is clearly his early, extreme gradualism that authors have in mind.

3.6 Evolutionary Ethics, Altruism, and Group Selection

In-depth discussions of the contemporary state of the field on evolutionary ethics and biological altruism would take us too far afield for our purposes here, and each is the subject of a separate article in this encyclopedia (see morality and evolutionary biology; biological altruism). In short, ethical behavior seems to pose at least two prima facie challenges for evolutionary explanations. First, how could genuinely altruistic behavior, which seems to involve organisms making sacrifices for others, evolve under the strict optimizing regime of natural selection? And second, what is the relationship between evolutionary explanations of our mental and perceptual capacities and our understanding of moral knowledge? Must evolutionary theory undermine or “debunk” any claims to true moral beliefs (see the entry on moral epistemology)?

It is worth underlining here, however, that debate around Darwin’s own position on these issues has turned on whether or not Darwin was genuinely offering us a “group-selection” explanation for moral traits in human beings (e.g., Ruse and Richards 2016). This question, in addition to testing the limits of our ability to interpret precious little source material found in Darwin’s own writings, is difficult also because of the host of issues that might be implicated in the effort to explicate just what we mean by “a group-selection explanation” of a particular phenomenon.

As we mentioned in section 3.2 above, in linking the question of species’ metaphysical individuality to the hierarchy of natural selection, Stephen Jay Gould offers us a window onto the conceptual complexity to which this debate can lead. His title exemplifies one approach to group selection—the unit of selection is always the individual, but there are individuals other than individual organisms that are subject to selection. A very different result emerges if one assumes that groups of organisms such as demes, kin-groups, or species, though not individuals, are nevertheless subject to selection. Adding to the conceptual complexity, some researchers propose that the term ‘group selection’ be restricted to the process whereby group-level traits provide advantages to one group over another, in which case there are strict conditions delimiting cases of group selection. Others define group selection primarily in terms of group level effects. Thus a debate analogous to that earlier discussed regarding the definitions of ‘fitness’ emerges here—by group selection do we mean a distinct type of causal process that needs to be conceptually distinguished from selection at the level of individual organism or gene, or do we merely mean a tendency within certain populations for some well-defined groups to displace others over time? (For further discussion, see Sterelny and Griffiths 1999, 151–179; Hull 2001, 49–90; and see the entry on levels and units of selection.)

4. Conclusion

We hope that this survey has demonstrated, first and foremost, the rich past and present of philosophical reflections both about and inspired by Darwin’s theory of evolution by natural selection. Furthermore, as we have seen, Darwin’s own positions and works remain touchstones for such reflections, not only because he was the theory’s first proponent, but also because his positions still offer us a useful frame of reference as well as a host of sophisticated insights. To be sure, the philosophy and practice of biology have advanced significantly in the intervening nearly two hundred years since Darwin’s first notebooks on natural selection. But if history is any guide, considering whether and how these innovations depart from Darwin’s own views on the subject will be a fruitful enterprise well into the theory’s next century.



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Further Reading

Charles Darwin’s Life

  • Browne, E. J. 1995, Charles Darwin: A Biography. Vol. 1: Voyaging, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, 2000, Charles Darwin: A Biography. Vol. 2: The Power of Place, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Desmond, A. and Moore, J., 1992, Darwin: The Life of a Tormented Evolutionist, New York: Norton.
  • Herbert, S., 2005, Charles Darwin, Geologist, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.

Charles Darwin: Primary Sources

  • Barrett, P. H. (ed.), 1977, The Collected Papers of Charles Darwin, 2 Vols., Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Burkhardt, F. (ed.), 1985–2023, The Correspondence of Charles Darwin, Volumes 1–30, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Chancellor, G. and John van Wyhe (eds.), 2009, Charles Darwin’s Notebooks from the Voyage of the Beagle, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Keynes, R. (ed.), 2000, Charles Darwin’s Zoology Notes & Specimen Lists from H.M.S. Beagle, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Peckham, M. (ed.), 1959, The Origin of Species by Charles Darwin: A Variorum Text, Philadelphia: University of Pennsylvania Press. [1st Paperback edition, 2006]
  • Weinshank, D. et al. (eds.), 1990, A Concordance to Charles Darwin’s Notebooks, 1836–1844, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.

Charles Darwin’s Context

  • Hodge, J. and Radick, G. (eds.), 2003, The Cambridge Companion to Darwin, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Owen, R., 1837/1992, The Hunterian Lectures in Comparative Anatomy, May and June 1837 (Edited and with an Introductory Essay and Commentary by Phillip Reid Sloan), Chicago: Chicago University Press.
  • Rudwick, M., 1997, George Cuvier, Fossil Bones and Geological Catastrophes, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Ruse, M., 1999, The Darwinian Revolution: Science Red in Tooth and Claw (Revised edition), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Ruse, M. and Richards, R. J. (eds.), 2009, The Cambridge Companion to the Origin of Species, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Snyder, L., 2010, The Philosophical Breakfast Club, New York: Broadway Books.

The Evolution of Darwinism

  • Amundson, R., 2005, The Changing Role of the Embryo in Evolutionary Thought: Roots of Evo-Devo, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Depew, D. and Weber, B., 1995, Darwinism Evolving: Systems Dynamics and the Genealogy of Natural Selection, Cambridge MA: MIT Press.
  • Kohn, D. (ed.), 1995, The Darwinian Heritage, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Mayr, E., 1976, Evolution and the Diversity of Life, Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Ruse, M. (ed.), 2013, The Cambridge Encyclopedia of Darwin and Evolutionary Thought, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Philosophy and Evolutionary Theory

  • Brandon, R. N., 1996, Concepts and Methods in Evolutionary Biology, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Burian, R. M., 2005, The Epistemology of Development, Evolution, and Genetics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Godfrey-Smith, P., 2009, Darwinian Populations and Natural Selection, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2014, The Philosophy of Biology, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Hull, D. and Ruse, M. (eds.), 1998, The Philosophy of Biology, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Lloyd, E., 1994, The Structure and Confirmation of Evolutionary Theory, 2nd edition Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Pence, C. H., 2021, The Causal Structure of Natural Selection, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Okasha, S., 2006, Evolution and the Levels of Selection, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 2019, Philosophy of Biology: A Very Short Introduction, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Sober, E., 1984, The Nature of Selection: Evolutionary Theory in Philosophical Focus, Cambridge MA: MIT Press.
  • ––– (ed.), 1994, Conceptual Issues in Evolutionary Biology, 2nd edition, Cambridge MA: MIT Press.
  • –––, 2008, Evidence and Evolution: The Logic Behind the Science, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2024, The Philosophy of Evolutionary Theory: Concepts, Inferences & Probabilities, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Smith, David Livingstone (ed.), 2017, How Biology Shapes Philosophy: New Foundations for Naturalism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Other Internet Resources

Though there are an abundance of web sites on Darwinism, the three most useful sites meeting the highest of academic standards are listed below. The first is the official site for the publication of material in the extensive Darwin Archives at Cambridge University, but has grown to become the default site for Darwin texts and related literature as well. The second is the official site for on-line publication of Darwin’s extensive correspondence. The third site is a very good starting point amd links to sites related to Charles Darwin’s historical context.

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James Lennox <jglennox+@pitt.edu>
Charles H. Pence <charles@charlespence.net>

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