History of Western Philosophy of Music: Antiquity to 1800

First published Tue Jul 13, 2021

Since its origins in ancient Greece, the Western philosophical tradition has investigated the nature and value of music. This entry examines the development of Western philosophy of music from Greek Antiquity to the end of the eighteenth century. Subsequent developments are covered by the entry on history of western philosophy of music: since 1800.

Aesthetic concerns remain in the background of Western philosophical thinking on music until the early modern period. Plato and Aristotle are interested in music chiefly because of its educational and political implications, and medieval thinkers typically relate music to metaphysical speculations. This relative neglect of music as an art may be surprising, but it is in line with the late emergence of aesthetics as a branch of philosophy.

Toward the end of the Middle Ages, music theorists begin to pay more attention to the sensuous dimension of music. Subsequent shifts in musical taste prompt questions regarding the origin and value of music’s capacity to express and arouse the emotions.

The eighteenth century develops a system of the arts as the imitation of nature. This raises the issue of how music may fit into such a system. As the instrumental repertoire increases in magnitude and refinement, it becomes clear that an account of music’s position among the arts will require an explanation of pure instrumental music’s meaning and value.

For book-length introductions to the history of Western philosophy of music, see: Fubini 1991; Lippman 1992; Bowman 1998; Martinelli 2012 [2019]; Young forthcoming. Excerpts from classic works are collected in: Strunk 1950; Le Huray and Day 1981; Barker 1990; Lippman 1990; Katz and Dahlhaus 1993; Fubini 1994.

1. Antiquity

Lippman (1992: chapter 1) observes that Greek Antiquity is responsible for two ideas that shaped Western musical thought until at least the seventeenth century. The first amounts to a metaphysical claim. While details vary greatly, this is the claim that the laws and structure of music correspond to those of the universe. This view is at times supplemented with the additional thought that celestial bodies themselves produce music as they follow their orbits. The Pythagorean concept of cosmic harmony, or harmony of the spheres, is the first known example of the metaphysical conception of music. The second idea is an ethical view, sometimes referred to as ethos theory. According to this view, music has the capacity to alter mood and mold personality, and thus may contribute to moral education (see Lippman 1964: chapter 2).

Some authors, especially those of Pythagorean persuasions, explicitly link the ethical view to the metaphysical one: if the whole universe is musical, so is the human soul, hence music’s power over it. In other authors, such as Aristotle, the ethical and educational value of music is construed as depending mainly on its capacity to imitate or arouse emotions.

1.1 The Universe as Harmony: Pythagoras and the Pythagoreans

No writings survive that are directly attributable to Pythagoras (c. 570–c. 490 BCE). His view of music must therefore be reconstructed from the works of other Pythagoreans, or from more or less sympathetic accounts provided by other authors (a useful collection of texts is found in Barker 1990: chapter 1). Central to Pythagorean philosophy is the notion of harmony as the unity of various parts. In this sense, the concept has a much broader application than to music, for harmony regulates the motion of celestial bodies as well as the human soul (on the concept of harmony in ancient Greek philosophical thought, see Lippman 1964: chapter 1). In the Pythagorean tradition, mathematics is the discipline that investigates harmony. Musical harmony is no exception to this, as the interval of the octave may be expressed as a numerical ratio (2:1). The octave may in turn be considered as the sum of a fifth (3:2) and a fourth (4:3). Pythagoras was generally credited with the discovery of the relations between these intervals. These are best illustrated using a monochord, an instrument constituted by a single string, the vibrating sections of which are determined by the position of a movable bridge. However, it is unclear whether the monochord was in fact used by Pythagoras (Barker 2014: 186), and it is also plausible to assume that instrument makers had some understanding of these relations before they became the object of intellectual speculation.

The series of numbers involved in these ratios (1 to 4, thus adding up to 10) was considered sacred by the Pythagoreans, who named it tetraktys. This metaphysical view of music as a reflection of cosmic order proved to be enormously influential in Western musical thought. As the harmony found in music is essentially the same principle as the one that regulates both the cosmos and the human soul, at least some Pythagoreans thought that their view could explain the effects of music on the listener’s mood and character.

The most notable opponent of the Pythagorean notion of celestial harmony was Aristotle. He offers two main reasons to reject this idea. First, he argues that physical bodies could not be composed of numbers, for the latter have no weight, whereas the former do (Metaphysics, 14.3). Second, he observes that loud sounds shatter glass and produce a physical effect upon us. The movement of planets in space, Aristotle argues, would produce an even greater effect on us, the absence of which is proof that celestial bodies produce no sound (On the Heavens, 2.9). In addition to rejecting the idea of a celestial harmony, Aristotle also rejects the related notion that the human soul is a kind of harmony (On the Soul, 1.4).

1.2 Mathematical and Empirical Harmonics

‘Harmonics’ is the Ancient Greek discipline that studied musical entities, from intervals to scalar systems (Barker 1990: 3). The Pythagorean tradition marked the start of an influential approach to harmonics, focused on the definition of musical entities in mathematical terms. Early contributors to this approach were Philolaus of Croton (c. 470–c. 385 BCE) and especially Archytas of Tarentum, a contemporary of Plato (Huffman 1993, 2005).

A mathematical treatment of harmonics informed by Pythagorean principles is also given in the Sectio Canonis, a treatise of debated authorship, but often attributed to Euclid. Nicomachus (fl. c. 100 CE) wrote an influential introduction to harmonics from the Pythagorean standpoint (source texts with commentary are collected in Barker 1990; Barker 2007 reconstructs the development of Pythagorean harmonics.)

Parallel to the Pythagorean tradition, an alternative approach sought to ground the laws of music in the way it appears to a competent listener, rather than in explanations from other domains of knowledge. This tradition attempted to provide descriptions of music in autonomously musical terms, and valued accordance with musical practice. This empirical approach to harmonics is in contrast to the mathematical approach adopted by the Pythagorean school (on the differences between the two schools, see Barker 2007 and Barker 1990: 3–8). The contrast between these two schools is of philosophical interest, insofar as it concerns the appropriate level of explanation for aesthetic phenomena. Additionally, mathematical harmonics often were taken to support the metaphysical worldview associated with the Pythagorean doctrine, whereas empirical harmonics tended to follow from an Aristotelian framework (see Barker 2007: chapter 4; Mathiesen 1999: 303).

By far the most important figure in the empirical tradition is that of Aristoxenus (see §1.4), although he relied on the work of previous theorists (Barker 2007: chapter 2). The mathematical and empirical traditions are often referred to as Pythagorean and Aristoxenian, respectively.

Theophrastus (c. 371–287 BCE), who followed Aristotle as the head of the Lyceum, is critical of the Pythagorean approach. He observes that we may find quantitative regularities in things other than musical intervals, yet we still consider these things as different from musical entities. This, he argues, must be due to the fact that intervals and melodies are essentially something other than numbers (Barker 1990: 111–114; Lippman 1964: 157–160; Barker 2007: chapter 15).

It is important to stress that the contrast between empirical and mathematical approaches was already evident to ancient theorists and commentators, who often passionately took sides. Ptolemais of Cyrene (fl. between the 3rd century BCE and the 1st century CE), the only known Greek woman music theorist, distinguishes between mousikoi and kanonikoi, a distinction that matches the one between Aristoxenians and Pythagoreans (Barker 2014: 185).

Some theorists developed hybrid views. Ptolemy (c. 100—c. 170 CE) is a case in point, as he explicitly faults both Pythagorean and Aristoxenian approaches (Harmonics, book I, 2). His philosophical outlook is clearly Pythagorean. For instance, he defends at length the notion of cosmic harmony, tracing parallels between musical and cosmological entities (Harmonics, book III, 9). However, he attempts to develop mathematical constructs that are better adherent to musical practice than the ones proposed by Pythagoreans, thus addressing a concern characteristic of the Aristoxenian approach.

Aristides Quintilianus (3rd–4th century CE), an author known uniquely for his treatise De Musica, also attempts a fusion of Aristoxenian and Pythagorean elements. While his view of harmonics is indebted to Aristoxenus, his philosophy of music bears a strong Pythagorean influence. Book III of his De Musica illustrates parallels between musical elements and the most disparate parts of reality, from the senses, to virtues, all the way to celestial bodies. Aristides Quintilianus defends the ethical value of music, and in doing so he explicitly refers to Plato’s and Aristotle’s views on the issue. He argues that music imitates moral actions in a way that is superior to that of the other arts, because it achieves mimesis in more than one way, that is, through words and melodic movement (De Musica, book II, chapter 4). Aristides Quintilianus also classifies musical elements, from modes to instruments, as masculine, feminine, or a mixture of the two (modes are scales that divide up the octave in different sequences of tones and semitones; though the names of Greek modes are identical to the later Church modes, they name different scales). This classification is supposed to help in determining the ethos of musical pieces and instruments, feminine elements being associated with smoothness, and masculine ones with roughness (De Musica, book II, chapter 12).

1.3 Music, Emotions, and Society: Plato and Aristotle

A central concern in ancient Greek philosophy of music is the connection between music’s capacity to imitate emotions and its social value. Plato (427/28–347 BCE) and Aristotle (384–322 BCE) both develop an account of this relation, and are particularly interested in the pedagogical consequences of their theories.

When they talk about ‘music’ (mousikē), Plato and his contemporaries often have in mind a broader set of art forms than the ones we associate with music today. In this broad sense, mousikē denoted “a seamless complex of instrumental music, poetic word, and co-ordinated physical movement” (Murray & Wilson 2004: 7). Plato sometimes also uses the term in a narrower sense to indicate melodic and rhythmic elements that we would consider today as properly musical (for a brief discussion of the broad and narrow sense of mousikē in Plato, see Schofield 2010: 230–231).

Plato believes that music may contribute to the education of the youth, and more generally to the correct functioning of society, but also holds that it may pose dangers. Underlying Plato’s concerns about the musical education of citizens is the wider assumption that changes in musical taste must be avoided or at least closely scrutinized, as they will produce changes in society (Republic, 4.424b–d, Laws 2.660a-b). In the Laws, Plato goes so far as to describe the changes in musical taste that followed the Persian wars as the trigger for subsequent rejection of authority and societal unrest (Laws, 700a-701b).

According to Plato, the sensible world is an imperfect copy of perfect and immutable ideas. Plato’s general view of the arts, including music, is that they are an imitation (mimesis) of objects found in the sensible world. This leads to his famous condemnation of art in Book X of his Republic. For, if our world is already a copy, then the arts provide us with copies of a copy. Thus, Plato’s metaphysics motivates his dismissive view of art’s epistemic value.

However, Plato also holds that the musical imitation of some human emotions may be ethically beneficial, especially at the stage when children are too young to be responsive to ethical education that relies on a discursive and rational basis. Plato first describes the emotions in question indirectly, one as the emotion of a person who is steadfast and resolute in misfortune or while fighting, the other as the state of “someone engaged in a peaceful, unforced, voluntary action” (Republic, 3.399b). Plato holds that these emotions, which he then refers to explicitly as courage and moderation, are best imitated through the Dorian and Phrygian modes, which

imitate the violent or voluntary tones of voice of those who are moderate and courageous, whether in good fortune or in bad. (Republic, 3.399c)

Thus, Plato construes musical imitation of emotions as grounded on the resemblance of music to human expressive behavior, particularly vocal. At least on one occasion, he also seems to hold that music imitates the bodily movements associated with emotions (Laws, 2.654e-655a). This could be considered the first defense of the idea that musical expressiveness is due to the music’s resemblance to human expressive behavior, a position that remains popular to this day (see the entry on href="../hist-westphilmusicsince-1800/#AnalPhilMusi" history of western philosophy of music: since 1800, section 2.6).

How does the musical imitation of courage and moderation achieve its educational purpose? At least some passages suggest that Plato thought music to be capable of influencing human character in virtue of the common harmonic nature shared by the soul, music, and the universe. For instance, in the Republic, Socrates tells Glaucon that

rhythm and harmony permeate the inner part of the soul more than anything else, affecting it most strongly and bringing it grace, so that if someone is properly educated in music and poetry, it makes him graceful, but if not, then the opposite. (Republic, 3.401d; see also Republic, 3.412a, Timaeus, 47d-e, and Laches, 188d)

Young (forthcoming) observes that Plato seems elsewhere to reject the Pythagorean view of the soul as harmony (Phaedo, 89–95). On this basis, Young holds that Plato’s view of the ethical benefits of music is best interpreted as simply relying on the music’s imitative capacity. Regardless of what one makes of Plato’s view of the soul as harmony, it is clear that he was influenced by the Pythagorean view of the universe as governed by harmony, especially in the Timaeus.

On the surface, Aristotle’s view may appear close to Plato’s. Both philosophers hold music’s value to reside in its imitation of emotions. However, Aristotle’s view is considerably more nuanced.

In the Poetics (1447a), Aristotle makes clear that all the arts are imitative, although they differ in the means, object, and manner of imitation. Aristotle has a more positive view of imitation than Plato, observing that humans are prone to it since childhood, and granting that we may learn through imitation. This cognitive value of imitations also explains why we feel pleasure when engaging with them, even when they imitate things we would find ugly or repulsive in real life (Poetics, 1448b 5–20).

Discussing the object of musical imitations, Aristotle introduces an interesting distinction between mere indications or signs (sēmeia) of emotional states and the states themselves. Signs of emotional states are the observable behavior that accompanies the occurrence of such states. Aristotle holds that the visual arts merely imitate signs of emotions. For instance, a painter may represent a man weeping or smiling. However, music is able to imitate the emotional states themselves. A plausible reading of Aristotle’s view is that he regarded music as capable of arousing the emotions it imitates, and that this capacity ultimately explains how music may imitate emotional states themselves, as opposed to their manifestations. On this analysis, the object of musical imitation cannot be specified separately from the emotional response the music arouses in the listener (Halliwell (2002: 248) stresses this point; Sörbom 1994 offers an alternative interpretation).

To understand the relation between Aristotle’s view of musical imitation and its educational role, it is useful to examine this passage:

Besides, when men hear imitations, even apart from the rhythms and tunes themselves, their feelings move in sympathy. Since then music is a pleasure, and excellence consists in rejoicing and loving and hating rightly, there is clearly nothing which we are so much concerned to acquire and to cultivate as the power of forming right judgments, and of taking delight in good dispositions and noble actions. (Politics, 1340a)

Here Aristotle seems to be arguing the following: music imitates character, that is, various dispositions and emotional states; the musical imitation of such states generates pleasure in the listener; so, if we restrict musical imitations to those of morally praiseworthy states, listeners will be pleased at such states in real life. Aristotle is relying on the assumption that the pleasure accompanying our engagement with an imitation will extend to the experience of the imitated object in real life. As he expresses it:

The habit of feeling pleasure or pain at mere representations is not far removed from the same feeling about realities. (Politics, 1340a)

Therefore, the moral value of musical education depends on the capacity of mimetic representations to induce pleasure in those who appreciate them. While this capacity may be shared by both music and the visual arts, it is only music, according to Aristotle, that is able represent states of character, as opposed to merely representing their manifestations.

An additional function of music, according to Aristotle, is catharsis. Music may help individuals who are in states of extreme enthusiasm, pity, or fear return to a more balanced state (Politics, 1342a). The details of this process are hard to reconstruct, because they are tied to the debated concept of catharsis, introduced by Aristotle in his definition of tragedy (Poetics, 1449b). It seems clear that Aristotle thought of the cathartic process as requiring music expressive of emotions akin to the ones to be purged. For example, a state of uncontrolled religious frenzy could be subdued by means of frenzied music.

Plato and Aristotle come apart also with regard to the role of the pleasure we take in listening to music. Plato’s approach is a pragmatic one. The aspects of music he values are all and only those that contribute to its ethical role. Such a principle governs Plato’s observations on musical pleasure. He does not deny that music may be able to induce pleasure. However, this pleasure is only valuable insofar as it attracts listeners to music that is good for their moral education (Laws, 2.668a-b).

Plato also notes that pleasurable responses may become associated with music of the morally questionable sort, as such responses depend also on habituation (Laws, 7.802c-d). From this he concludes that it is of great importance to control children’s musical environment.

Aristotle’s view of musical pleasure is far more positive. It is clear from the above that pleasure plays a role in Aristotle’s account of music’s educational value. But Aristotle also thinks that pleasure generated by music is valuable for two other reasons. First, music may provide relaxation to those that are tired from work. In this sense, the pleasure it produces is similar to that produced by eating or sleeping (Politics, 1339a-b). Second, and perhaps more interestingly, Aristotle holds that the pleasure of music should be part of a cultivated life (Politics, 1339b; for a discussion of the functions of music in Aristotle, see Lippman 1964: 130–131.)

Both Plato and Aristotle comment on the value of instrumental music. Plato’s pragmatic attitude grounds his injunction against complexity and subtlety in music (Republic, 3.399c-e). He holds that music should have a vocal part, and argues that the musical elements should conform to the emotional state described by the piece’s lyrical content (Republic, 3.400d). This concern with clear and unequivocal musical imitation also motivates Plato’s stance on the value of instrumental music. While it is clear that Plato holds the purely musical elements of melody and rhythm to have an imitative potential, he attributes little value to instrumental music, presumably because he believes that it is unable to provide an unequivocal imitation of courage and moderation (Laws 2.669 d-e).

Aristotle is again more nuanced. According to him, both vocal and instrumental music produce pleasure (Politics, 1339b). In general, despite his reservations concerning the aulos (an instrument comprising two, linked, reed pipes) (Politics, 1341a), Aristotle’s attitude toward instrumental music is far less critical than Plato’s. For example, Aristotle is clear in conceding that even purely instrumental music can arouse distinct emotions, due to both its melodic and rhythmic elements (Politics, 1340a-b).

1.4 Aristotelian Empirical Harmonics: Aristoxenus

A disciple of Aristotle, Aristoxenus (fl. 4th century BCE) argues that harmonics should not be concerned with an explanation of musical phenomena in mathematical terms, but rather describe musical structures through the analysis of musical elements as objects of perception. For example, Aristoxenus distinguishes between the speaking and singing voice, the former being characterized by a continuous movement across pitch space, the latter by intervallic movement from one pitch to another (Elementa Harmonica, book I, 9–10). On the basis of this distinction, he provides a definition of note (phthongos) as any pitch on which the voice rests and that has a position in a given melodic line (Elementa Harmonica, book I, 9–10; for a detailed discussion of Aristoxenus as a music theorist, see Mathiesen 1999: 294–344).

Another striking element in Aristoxenus’ conception is his view of musical understanding, which he thinks involves the faculties of perception and memory,

for we have to perceive what is coming to be and remember what has come to be. There is no other way of following the contents of music. (Elementa Harmonica, book II, 38–39)

Note that perception is not described as the mere awareness of what is present to our senses at a given time, but includes an anticipation of “what is coming to be”. Here, Aristoxenus seems to anticipate an account of musical understanding similar to the one recently defended by Jerrold Levinson (1997).

Aristoxenus’ view of the moral effects of music is harder to reconstruct. While it is clear that he thought music to be a proper object of ethical evaluation, he likely had a less dogmatic conception of the link between given modes and their moral value than Aristotle (see Rocconi 2012 and Barker 2007: 245 ff.).

1.5 Music and Moral Education: Skeptical Views

Some ancient philosophers reject the view that music is valuable beyond the pleasurable experience it affords. In doing so, they question the educational value of music.

In his De Musica, the epicurean Philodemus (c. 110–c. 30 BCE) rejects the widespread view that music may imitate the passions, claiming that music is no better able to represent psychological states than the art of cooking (see Wilkinson 1938). Philodemus appeals to Democritus (c. 460–c. 370 BCE), but evidence regarding the latter’s views is scant. While it is clear that Democritus held music to stand lower than other arts in terms of utility, it is probably not true that he thought this deprived it of educational value (see Brancacci 2007: 193–95).

Sextus Empiricus (fl. 3rd century CE), in Against the Musicians, also denies that music could have any positive educational role. While he concedes that we may enjoy music, he denies that the study of music could contribute to such enjoyment. In support of this, he also compares music to cookery, arguing that in both cases enjoyment is independent of our understanding of the thing enjoyed (Against the Musicians, 24–25).

2. Late Antiquity and the Middle Ages

Despite spanning about one thousand years, the period that goes from late Antiquity to the end of the Middle Ages brought little new to Western philosophy of music.

A prominent feature of this period is the emergence of the Christian worldview. Christian thinking on music adapts some of the views it had inherited from Greek Antiquity, chief among them the Pythagorean harmony of the spheres and the idea that music may influence character.

The medieval approach to music is biased toward the point of view of the theoretician. Music is typically grouped together with scientific disciplines. The sensory pleasure of the listener is rarely remarked upon, and at times considered with suspicion. The individuality and creativity of the composer is also neglected, and the role of performing musicians almost entirely ignored or dismissed (Schuller 1988, and Young forthcoming (chapter 2) are extensive introductions to medieval musical aesthetics).

2.1 Early Christian Views of Music: Augustine and Boethius

Saint Augustine of Hippo (354–430), philosopher and Father of the Church, devoted to music his treatise De Musica. Although mostly technical in character, the book is an early statement of the medieval view of music as first and foremost a science, rather than a practical occupation. Augustine defines music as “the science of mensurating well” (scientia bene modulandi—this last word is at times rendered as ‘modulation’), that is, the discipline concerned with the attainment of measure and proportion (De Musica, book I, 2).

An almost identical definition of music is found in Cassiodorus (485–c. 585) who states that “Music indeed is the knowledge of apt modulation” (Institutiones, 5), as well as in Isidore of Seville’s (560–636) Etymologiarum:

Music is an art of modulation consisting of tone and song called music by derivation from the Muses. (Etymologiarum, book III, 15)

Augustine’s attitude toward the sensory pleasure derived from music was conflicted. On the one hand, he recognizes music’s power in worship. On the other hand, he is aware that this could also lead the faithful to stray away from the religious content of the experience (Confessions, II).

The philosopher Anicius Manlius Severinus Boethius (c. 480–525/26), normally referred to simply as Boethius, had a fundamental role in shaping medieval musical thinking. Through commentated translations of Greek authors and original expositions of their views, Boethius allowed classical Greek philosophical ideas to survive into the Middle Ages. He did so in the field of music by writing De Institutione Musica. In this work, Boethius summarizes music theory as found in the Greek treatises he knew. The book also distinguishes between three types of music: musica mundana, humana, and instrumentalis. Musica mundana is the harmony of the cosmos, a Pythagorean concept that found widespread acceptance over the course of the Middle Ages, though it was recast in Christian terms. Musica humana is described only briefly by Boethius, though it is clear that it is the harmony between the various elements that compose the human body. Some modern accounts of Boethius’s thought identify musica humana with singing, but this is incorrect, though it is true that later medieval thinkers used the term in such a way (see Dyer 2007: 59; 64; 69). Finally, musica instrumentalis is sounding music, vocal and instrumental. While this is undoubtedly regarded today as the core of music, Boethius considers it as music only in a derivative sense. Boethius’s tripartite division is repeated and accepted by numerous medieval writers on music.

Boethius also takes from Greek Antiquity the Platonic view that music may arouse emotions and influence human character. He observes that this sets music apart from other mathematical disciplines (De Institutione Musica, book I, 1).

2.2 Christian Thought and Music

The impact of Christianity on medieval musical thinking is evident in the religious interpretation given of two philosophical views from Antiquity, the harmony of the spheres and the ethos theory, according to which music may shape the listener’s character. Both of these ideas were held by Boethius (see the preceding section) and found widespread acceptance among medieval writers.

The Christian take on the harmony of the spheres consists in the claim that such harmony was imposed on the universe by the Creator. The beauty of music, including sounding music, is thus traced back to music’s partaking in that divine harmony. John Scottus Eriugena (c. 800–c. 877) expresses such a view in his Periphyseon, as evident from his very definition of music:

Music is the art which by the light of reason studies the harmony of all things that are in motion that is knowable by natural proportions. (Periphyseon, 475B)

That the harmony of the spheres could be interpreted in Christian terms did not prevent philosophers from rejecting it, especially once Aristotle’s works had become available. Albert the Great (Albertus Magnus) (c. 1200–1280) is an example of a prominent philosopher who rejects the idea of a celestial harmony. Appealing to arguments based on the structure of the cosmos, he discards the idea that the movement of celestial bodies could produce harmonious sounds (Liber de Causis Proprietatum Elementorum, book II, 2.1; on the harmony of the spheres in the thirteenth century, see Mews 2011).

The idea that music may influence character was widely accepted over the course of the Middle Ages. It was supported by the exaggerated accounts of music’s powers that had survived from Antiquity. The medieval Christian version of the ethos theory normally stresses the devotional potential of music.

2.3 Music among the Liberal Arts

Following Martianus Capella’s (fl. c. 410) The Marriage of Philology and Mercury, medieval thinkers classified music as one of the liberal arts. These were divided into the arts of the trivium (grammar, logic and rhetoric) and the quadrivium (arithmetic, geometry, astronomy and music). The arts of the trivium were referred to as artes sermocinales, because they are related to discourse and language. The arts of the quadrivium were instead the artes reales, studying the mathematical and physical constitution of the universe. The classification of music as one of the artes reales is unsurprising in light of the Pythagorean-Boethian view of music as primarily concerned with proportions and harmony.

While this classification remained mostly unchallenged, there were some important dissenting voices (for an overview, see Dyer 2007). These disputes regarding the proper classification of music are important because they reflect underlying concerns with music’s nature and purposes. From the thirteenth century onwards, theorists and philosophers became more concerned with the practical and acoustic sides of music-making, and less with its theological implications. For instance, the English grammarian John of Garland (1195–1272) distinguishes between plainsong, mensural music, and instrumental music, and does so on the bases of historical and musicological differences between such repertoires (see Fubini 1991: 94).

The progressive assimilation of Aristotle’s work in medieval thought meant that the physical, sounding aspects of music began to be considered as important as its mathematical ones. Evidence of this is Thomas Aquinas’s classification of music as one of the scientie medie, that is, disciplines that apply mathematics to the study of natural objects (see Dyer 2007: 67–68).

2.4 Islamic Philosophy of Music: Al-Kindi, al-Farabi, and Ibn Sina

As observed by Young (forthcoming: chapter 2), it is appropriate to include medieval Islamic philosophy in a survey of Western musical thinking, as Islamic philosophers relied largely on the same Greek authors that were central to the European tradition. In fact, translations of Greek works were more widely available in the Islamic world. Partly because of their earlier contact with Aristotle’s philosophy, Islamic philosophers are more inclined to value the sensory character of music and to accept it as an object of aesthetic appreciation.

The philosopher al-Kindi (c. 800–870) holds a broadly Pythagorean view of music (see Shehadi 1995: chapter 1, and Adamson 2007: 172–180). According to him, a relationship of affinity holds between musical elements and parts of the cosmos. This affinity allows Kindi to trace correspondences between musical elements and the extra-musical world. Kindi’s acceptance of Pythagorean views is also exemplified by his claim that music exercises a power of the human body in virtue of the affinity between its constitution and that of various musical instruments.

Al-Farabi (872–950) is a notable representative of the Aristotelian current in medieval Islamic philosophy of music (see Shehadi 1995: chapter 3). Farabi rejects the harmony of the spheres. Rather than speculating about music’s origin in the structure of the cosmos, he attempts to understand it as a human phenomenon, suggesting that vocal music may have developed out of necessities such as the expression of pleasant and unpleasant states. Farabi also distinguishes three types of melody, according to the effect it produces in the listener. Some melodies are pleasing to the ear, others evoke images, and yet others express psychological states. It is possible for a melody to do more than one of these things, and in fact Farabi holds that the best melodies tend to have all three such effects.

Ibn Sina, known in the West as Avicenna (980–1037) describes music as a mathematical science, but argues that a theory of music should be primarily concerned with the explanation of music as heard. This emphasis on the appropriate level of explanation is reminiscent of Aristoxenus (see §1.4), who exercised a clear influence on Islamic philosophy of music. Ibn Sina also revives the Aristotelian view that music may imitate human character and psychological states (on Ibn Sina’s philosophy of music, see Shehadi 1995: chapter 4).

3. Early Modern Period

3.1 Music and Sensory Pleasure: Tinctoris and Zarlino

From the fifteenth century, writers on music begin to elaborate on the aesthetic aspects of musical experience. The theorist and composer Johannes Tinctoris (c. 1435–1511) exemplifies various aspects of this new outlook on music. He defines harmony and consonance in terms of their appearance to the listener, rather than through mathematical notions. Harmony is thus described as the pleasing effect produced by sounds, whereas consonance and dissonance are respectively characterized as combinations of sounds that bring sweetness to the ear or hurt it (Liber de arte contrapuncti, chapter 2). In his Complexus effectuum musices, Tinctoris lists prominent effects of music, most of which involve emotional arousal, while the dedication of his Proportionale Musices refers back to Antiquity and the alleged emotional potency of its music.

Tinctoris thus prefigures two tendencies typical of early modern thinking about music: first, the focus on the subjective experience of music, and on the feelings of pleasure and displeasure that accompany it; second, the value attributed to music’s expressive power, and the related idea that ancient music’s capacity to arouse emotions was greater than that of the music of their time.

The first of these tendencies is also embodied in the work of Gioseffo Zarlino (1517–1590). A towering figure in Western music theory, Zarlino is normally considered as the theorist who initiated the move away from medieval modality and toward tonal harmony. According to Zarlino, rules of composition are good insofar as they produce beautiful music, whose purpose is to “improve” and “delight” (Zarlino 1558: book III, 71). However, Zarlino does not reject the role of rationality, and especially of mathematics, because its laws ultimately underlie the senses of sight and hearing (Zarlino 1588: 34–36).

3.2 Melody and Expression: The Florentine Camerata

In Book II of his Dodecachordon (1547), the humanist Heinrich Glarean (also known as Glareanus) (1488–1563) argues that composers of polyphonic music are inferior to those who set a single melodic line to a text. He speculates that the latter was the way Greeks, Romans, and early Christian communities composed music. Monody is superior on the grounds that it requires an exercise in invention, whereas the polyphonist merely borrows a melodic line and then carries out a task that is predominantly intellectual. According to Glareanus, monody has a natural character and an expressive immediacy that is lost in subsequent development. Less than half a century later, both the reference to a classical model and the vindication of monody became crucially important in Italian musical thinking and practice. Toward the end of the sixteenth century, a group of Florentine intellectuals and musicians gathered around the figure of Giovanni de’ Bardi, a nobleman and amateur musician. This group is normally referred to as the Florentine Camerata, or Camerata de’ Bardi. Its goal was to recover the expressive potential of music, as described in ancient Greek and Roman sources. Music’s power to arouse emotions was thought to have been lost during the Middle Ages, as polyphony developed. The envisaged solution was a return to monody, and more precisely to a melodic line that would follow and emphasize the prosodic features of impassioned speech (Palisca 2006: chapter 7; Palisca 1989 is an influential collection of source readings). Thus, the main goal of the Camerata seems to have been expression, to be intended here as the arousal of emotion, while the imitation of speech prosody was considered a means to that end. This is philosophically significant in that it indicates a revival of the classical Greek idea that music is expressive in virtue of its resemblance to the way human beings express their emotions (see §1.3).

This resulted in the birth of the so-called stile rappresentativo, the vocal style characteristic of early opera, of which Claudio Monteverdi’s (1567–1643) L’Orfeo (1607) is considered the first masterpiece. Giulio Caccini (1550–1618) and Jacopo Peri (1561–1633) were active members of the Camerata, and have both left explicit discussion of the theories that informed their musical style (relevant textual excerpts are collected in Strunk 1950: 370–392).

While Monteverdi may be considered the most representative musician associated with this turn to melody and expression, the Camerata’s most significant theoretical figure was Vincenzo Galilei (c. 1520–1591), an accomplished composer and lutenist, father of the astronomer Galileo. In his Dialogue of Ancient and Modern Music (1581), Galilei takes issue with contemporary practices, particularly with counterpoint. He concedes that the polyphonic music of his time is a source of aural pleasure, but faults it for its incapacity to move the listener,

[f]or its sole aim is to delight the ear, while that of ancient music is to induce in another the same passion that one feels oneself. (Galilei 1581 [1950: 317])

Both Monteverdi and Galilei faced the reaction of more conservative figures. Giovanni Maria Artusi (c. 1540–1613), in L’Artusi or Of the Imperfections of Modern Music (1600), attacks the work of an unnamed composer, though it is apparent that he has in mind composers such as Monteverdi and Carlo Gesualdo (1566–1613). Artusi concedes that the newly developed monodic style is expressive, but denies that expression is worth the sacrifice of compositional rules that are dictated by reason. The dispute between Artusi and Monteverdi crystallized the clash between the so-called prima and seconda prattica, the former indicating the old polyphonic style, the latter the new preference for accompanied monody.

Galilei faced criticism from his former teacher Zarlino. In his Sopplimenti musicali (1588), Zarlino argues that the imitation of impassioned speech belongs to the art of rhetoric or to declaimed poetry, not music. Musicians should confine themselves to the imitation of the text’s content, rather than to its possible delivery, and they should do so through the choice of appropriate harmonies (Zarlino 1588: 316–318). Zarlino’s reservations about expressive melody are of particular importance, as they may be seen as the first manifestation of a recurring contrast between two opposite tendencies, epitomized by the clash between Rousseau and Rameau (see §3.5). Whereas one strand locates music’s chief source of expression in melody, the other defends the primacy of harmony, often downplaying the role of possible resemblances between melodic contour and human expressive behavior (Young, forthcoming, names the two tendencies empiricism and rationalism, respectively, following their development and occasional overlap).

Despite their disagreements, both approaches valued expression in music set to a text. A full vindication of the expressive power of instrumental music was not among the programmatic goals of either the Camerata or of those who, like Zarlino, stress the importance of harmonic elements. Caccini is critical of music that obscures the text, because

such music and musicians gave no other delight than what harmony could give the ear, for, unless the words were understood, they could not move the understanding. (Caccini 1600 [1950: 378])

Zarlino, following Plato, claims that melody and harmony should be suitable to the text, and cashes out this suitability in terms of similarity:

we must also make a choice of a harmony and a rhythm similar to the nature of the matters contained in the speech in order that from the combination of these things, put together with proportion, may result a melody suited to the purpose. (Zarlino 1558: book IV, 32 [1950: 256])

Moreover, these authors unanimously hold that it is the music that has to be adapted to a text, rather than the other way around. In the foreword to Monteverdi’s Scherzi Musicali (1607), his brother Giulio Cesare claims that Claudio’s goal was “to make the words the mistress of the harmony and not the servant” (Monteverdi 1607 [1950: 406]).

While this stress on the priority of the text was the product of a renewed interest in emotional expression in vocal music, Church authorities also became concerned with the confused polyphonic styles and the way they obfuscated liturgical content, and thus they also promoted textural clarity in polyphonic music (see Fellerer 1953).

3.3 Sense and Rationality: Mersenne, Descartes, Leibniz

While it is important to note that the early modern period mitigated the medieval insistence on a mathematical treatment of music with an approach that paid greater attention to its sensory appearance, it would be incorrect to say that the search for mathematical regularities was altogether abandoned. On the one hand, the budding scientific outlook favored the extension of the experimental method to the realm of sound, an operation that obviously included mathematical modeling. Thus, rather than giving up on mathematical descriptions of music altogether, early modern theorists abandoned the abstract framework in which these descriptions had been formulated. On the other hand, accounts of music in mathematical terms continued to survive in the metaphysical speculations of music theorists and philosophers.

Exemplary of these tendencies is the French mathematician Marin Mersenne (1588–1648), who was interested in a number of questions connected to the mathematical nature of music. While he understood the importance of empirical verification, Mersenne was also convinced of a fundamental harmony between the mathematical order of music and that of the whole cosmos, as evident from the title of his most important work, Harmonie Universelle (1636).

A particularly interesting theme in this sprawling treatise is the contrast between the rational structure of music and its sensuous appearance, best illustrated through Mersenne’s discussion of consonance. Having defined consonance in terms of coincidence in air vibrations, Mersenne had to explain why consonance and sensory agreeableness do not always go hand in hand. For instance, the major third is more agreeable than the fourth, although this is more consonant. Mersenne had an interesting correspondence with Descartes on the matter, in which the former manifests his wish to provide a definition of agreeableness that is as objective as that of consonance, while the latter expresses skepticism about the project, and claims that agreeableness is dependent on variation in taste, as well as in musical context (see Jorgensen 2012).

Early in his life, René Descartes (1596–1650) devoted a treatise to music, the Compendium Musicae (written in 1618 and published posthumously in 1650). This work is dominated by scientific concerns rather than philosophical ones, but the very start of the treatise is characteristic of its age, as Descartes states that music’s goal is “to please and to arouse various Affections in us” (Descartes 1650). But Descartes’s most important impact on philosophy of music is actually due to his treatise on emotions, The Passions of the Soul (1649). In this work, Descartes defines emotions as the result of the action produced by external objects on the animal spirits, a thin air-like substance that stirs our passions whenever it is set in motion. Descartes also distinguishes six basic emotions: wonder, love, hatred, desire, joy, and sadness.

This taxonomy of emotions and the mechanistic description of their functioning will prove important to the so-called Affektenlehre, or doctrine of the affections, the eighteenth century view that a piece of music should arouse a specific emotion in the listener. Affektenlehre theorists believed that this goal could be achieved through the use of specific musical devices, each associated with a given emotion. The German composer Johann Mattheson may be considered the most prominent representative of this tradition. He explicitly endorses Descartes’ theory of emotions in his treatise Der vollkommene Capellmeister (Mattheson 1739: I, iii, §51).

Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646–1716), philosopher and mathematician, devoted to music only scattered observations. Yet, his view of music’s value is of particular interest, as it is indicative of the attempt to reconcile rational and sensuous elements in our appreciation of music (see Fubini 1991: 149). Leibniz accepts that the main goal of music is to move us. In fact, he notes that, while music is obviously so apt to do so, “this main purpose is not usually sufficiently noticed or sought after” (Leibniz, On Wisdom). However, Leibniz also specifies that this sensuous pleasure is the result of the automatic and unconscious apprehension through music of the rational structure of the universe. He writes:

Music charms us, although its beauty consists only in the agreement of numbers and in the counting, which we do not perceive but which the soul nevertheless continues to carry out, of the beats or vibrations of sounding bodies which coincide at certain intervals. (Leibniz 1714: 614)

3.4 Imitation and Expression in the Eighteenth Century

Two related questions may be asked with regard to imitation in music. The first is whether music may imitate extra-musical objects, and what value this imitation may have. The second concerns the role of such imitation in the musical expression of emotions. Over the course of the eighteenth century, answers to both questions were characterized by a growing skepticism toward imitation (see Lippman 1992: chapter 6). The gradual rise of instrumental music was certainly partly responsible for this change in attitude. Its increasing formal, melodic, and harmonic complexity made it less plausible to argue that it imitated the speaking voice, and yet this complexity only heightened music’s power to express and arouse the emotions.

A natural way out of this impasse is to explicitly define expression in terms of emotional arousal, distinguishing it from the mere musical depiction of worldly objects, including the external manifestations of human emotions. This is the option taken by Charles Avison (1709–1770) in his Essay on Musical Expression, first published in 1752. Avison distinguishes between music resembling extra-musical objects, including manifestations of emotions, such as laughter, and music that is able to provoke an emotional response in the listener. The former case is musical ‘imitation’, which Avison claims produces “a reflex act of the understanding” (Avison 1775: 50), while the latter is ‘expression’. Avison argues that the goal of music is to pursue expression, which is achieved by the competent use of melody and harmony. While the idea that music is valuable because it moves the listener was not new, Avison’s clarity in decoupling it from imitation is noteworthy.

However, other theorists were not as explicit and careful as Avison with their terminology, nor as ready to jettison imitation, which the eighteenth century considered essential to the fine arts. Moreover, it had been customary since the Camerata’s time to construe expression as dependent on imitation (see Palisca 2006: chapter 10). Thus, a number of authors adopted conservative positions, defending a qualified concept of musical imitation, or simply accepting that music’s imitative capacities are limited. In the second half of the century, imitation gradually took on a more peripheral role, and philosophers started to focus on alternative sources of value for music as an art, from formal structure to emotional arousal.

This gradual rejection of the idea of music as an imitative art is perhaps best manifested in France. This might seem puzzling, as the eighteenth century view of imitation as the hallmark of fine arts found its most famous expression in The Fine Arts Reduced to a Single Principle (1746), by Charles Batteux (1713–1780). In this work, Batteux defines art as the imitation of beautiful nature (belle nature). Different arts imitate different parts of nature. Music imitates the human expression of emotions. It is interesting to note that Batteux repeatedly states that music expresses the emotions, as opposed to imitating them, although the discrepancy seems to be merely terminological. Batteux can conceive of music that fails to be imitative, but does not consider it valuable:

It would be like a chromatic harpsichord that offers us colours and series of colours. It would amuse the eyes, perhaps, but bore the mind. (Batteux 1746: part III, section III, chapter 2)

Earlier than Batteux, Jean-Baptiste Du Bos (1670–1742) had similarly construed music as an imitative art in his Critical Reflections on Poetry and Painting (1719). Du Bos attempts to show that, in vocal music, melody, harmony, and rhythm all contribute to the imitation of impassioned speech. Instrumental music imitates natural sounds instead. While he recognizes that music may charm the senses, Du Bos thinks that the only valuable response to music is the one that comes from its appreciation as an imitation. Music may still please without imitating, but it is only when it imitates that it really moves. Consequently, Du Bos condemns music that fails to be imitative.

The Encyclopedists Jean Le Rond D’Alembert (1717–1783) and Didier Diderot (1713–1784) also hold onto the idea that music is essentially imitative. D’Alembert states that

[t]he composers of instrumental music will make nothing but an empty noise as long as they do not have in their heads […] an action or an expression to be represented. (D’Alembert 1759: XXXVIII)

In the dialogue Rameau’s Nephew (1760), Diderot claims that

[s]ong is an imitation of physical noises or of the accents of the passions, through the sounds of a scale invented by art or inspired by nature, whichever you please, either with the voice or with an instrument. (Diderot 1760: 104ndash;5)

Musical imitation is also defended by Jean-Jacques Rousseau, but in an importantly qualified version (see the following section).

From the 1770s onwards, the view of music as an imitative art appears increasingly untenable, and the idea that music is expressive of the emotions because it imitates human expressive behavior also comes under attack. This new trend is evident in works such as André Morellet’s (1727–1819) Of Expression in Music and Imitation in the Arts (1771), as well as Musical Expression Placed Among the Chimeras (1779). This latter work was written by Boyé, whose biographical details are unknown. Boyé’s treatise pairs the rejection of imitation with the claim that melody and harmony are worthy of appreciation in themselves:

The principal object of music is to please us physically, without the mind putting itself to the trouble of searching for useless comparisons to it. (quoted in Lippman 1992: 95)

The composer and theorist Michel-Paul Guy de Chabanon (1730–1792) is arguably the most representative and radical example of the new skeptical mentality. In his Observations on Music and Principally on the Metaphysics of Art (1779), Chabanon offers a variety of arguments against the idea that the musical expression of emotions depends on the imitation of their vocal manifestations. Children respond emotionally to music, he observes, yet they cannot appreciate musical imitation. The same is true of individuals who are unfamiliar with the Western musical tradition. Moreover, imitation is insufficient for expression. For example, laughter is naturally associated with gaiety, but a musical imitation of laughter would fail to result in gay music. Thus, music may express emotions without imitating their external manifestations. Conversely, Chabanon observes that music may express emotions that do not have any typical manifestation:

Many of our passions have no particular cry associated with them, and yet music may express them. (Chabanon 1779: VIII)

In addition to the already mentioned Avison, other English writers questioned the role of imitation in music (see Schueller 1948). Francis Hutcheson (1694–1746), in An Inquiry concerning Beauty, Order, Harmony, Design (1725), distinguishes between original and comparative beauty, the former being judged independently of any comparison, with the latter depending instead on imitation. According to Hutcheson, music is an example of original beauty, although its melodic element also allows for comparative beauty, in that it may resemble impassioned speech. In detecting this resemblance,

we shall be touched by it in a very sensible manner, and have melancholy, joy, gravity, thoughtfulness excited in us by a sort of sympathy or contagion. (Hutcheson 1725: section VI, XII)

This passage is significant because it gives a clear account of how music may express an emotion (through the imitation of its characteristic vocal expression), while at the same time arousing it in the listener.

In his Observations on the Correspondence between Poetry and Music (1769), the Irish writer Daniel Webb (1719–1798) explains the emotional effects of music by appealing to a physiological theory of emotions similar to Descartes’s. According to this view, music may give us impressions, that is, it may put us in a state of mind, which may be further specified by accompanying words. In comparing music with painting and sculpture, Webb notes that the latter may act on our emotions only through their imitations, that is, their represented content, whereas music may do so through both imitations and impressions (Webb 1769: 28). In this way, Webb acknowledges that the expressive potential of music is greater than that of the visual arts, and that this privileged position is not due to imitation.

James Beattie (1735–1803), a Scottish philosopher, voices concerns similar to those of Chabanon when he observes that there are emotions that music may express, that do not have a typical vocal manifestation. On the basis of this, he rejects the view that music is of necessity imitative, though he concedes that it may be. More significantly, Beattie claims that there is a crucial difference between music and the paradigmatically imitative art of painting. While good paintings are of necessity good imitations, and bad paintings are necessarily bad ones, good and bad works of music may be either good or bad imitations (Beattie 1779: part I, chapter VI, section 1).

The Scottish philosopher Thomas Reid (1710–1796) argues that perception presents us with sensations, which function as signs of objective qualities. Some sensations are artificial signs, instituted by human agreement. Such are words—the connection between ‘cat’ and the animal sitting on my lap being arbitrary. Other sensations are natural signs, and function independently of human agency—for instance, the connection between smoke and fire. Natural signs typically require us to learn their connection to the signified objective quality, as in the case of smoke and fire. However, in some cases a natural sign signifies without requiring prior experience—a child can detect the anger in an angry face and responds to it immediately. Musical expression is explicitly described by Reid as an example of this category:

One kind of music inspires grief, another love, another rage or fury. These are all material representations of some affection of the mind. None of these are gained by experience. (Lectures on the Fine Arts, “Mind and Body”)

Thus, musical expression “is nothing but the fitness of certain sounds to produce certain sentiments in our minds” (Lectures on the Fine Arts, “Taste and the Fine Arts”). As for the imitation of birdsong, battles, and the like, Reid maintains that these only marginally contribute to the beauty of music. The importance of Reid’s view resides in his philosophically grounded view of expression, which does not involve imitation at all.

The economist and philosopher Adam Smith (1723–90) traces a sharp distinction between vocal and instrumental music. He holds that the greater the disparity between medium and imitated object, the more pleasure an imitative art will occasion (Of the Nature of that Imitation that Takes Place in what are called The Imitative Arts, part I, 6–7). Vocal music may thus only slightly resemble impassioned speech, but precisely because of this it will delight us when it successfully imitates it (Of the Nature of that Imitation, part II, 12). Instrumental music, however, lacking a text and deprived of vocal articulation, cannot imitate any object successfully, as we can hardly ever recognize anything in it unless prompted by a description (Of the Nature of that Imitation, part II, 17). Smith develops an alternative view of musical expression, which he illustrates with an interesting parallel. Just as a natural landscape may be gloomy without imitating anything, so may music. In both cases the description ‘gloomy’ ascribes a dispositional property, that is, it refers to the capacity the landscape and piece of music have of making us gloomy (Of the Nature of that Imitation, part II, 23). Once more, expression and imitation go separate ways.

Although perhaps less radically than their French or English counterparts, German intellectuals also increasingly questioned the role of imitation in music.

The philosopher and scientist Johann Georg Sulzer (1720–1779) still adheres to a rather orthodox view of imitation in music, holding that music imitates impassioned speech (Sulzer 1774, “Melody” [1792: III, 370–371; 1995: 91–92]). He also extends this account to instrumental music, and holds that music that fails to express emotions is worthless (Sulzer 1774, “Instrumental music” [1792: II, 677–679; 1995: 95–97]).

Johann Mattheson (1681–1764), the chief Affektenlehre theorist, embraces a Cartesian, physiological explanation of musical expression as the arousal of emotion produced by music’s action on the animal spirits (this is the standard view of Mattheson’s theory—see Lippman 1992: 115–116; for an alternative interpretation, see Kivy 1984). Thus, the musician who wishes to compose music expressive of an emotion will have to conform to the movements of the animal spirits associated with that emotion. This view alters the connection between emotional expression and imitation, as expression is no longer dependent on the imitation of impassioned speech.

Johann Gottfried von Herder (1744–1803) retains the idea that music is an imitative art, whose subjects are

all such things and incidents as are most eminently characterized by motion and sound; these include all species of motions, sounds, voices, passions expressed through sounds, and so on. (Herder 1769: I, 19)

This follows from the nature of music: whereas painting is the art of spatial coexistence, music is that of succession. It is by respecting these natural boundaries that the arts may achieve their effects. Thus,

music, which works wholly through the succession of time, must never make the depiction of objects in space its main object, as inexperienced bunglers do. (Herder 1769: I, 16)

There are similarities between Herder’s philosophy of music and Rousseau’s. Herder also proposes that today’s music and language may have a common ancestor, the main function of which was expressive (Herder 1772: part I, section III, 1; Herder 1769: IV, 8).

Herder is skeptical with regard to the role of mathematical or physical explanations in musical aesthetics, as these fail to explain our first-person hedonic and emotional responses. Much like Rousseau, he finds fault in Rameau on these grounds (Herder 1769: IV, 6). However, Herder does not abandon scientific explanations altogether, and in fact appeals to physiology to advance his own hypothesis (Herder 1769: IV, 6). While the details of this proposed explanation might be uninteresting, it is noteworthy that, by appealing to a causal explanation, Herder is weakening the link between expression and imitation.

3.5 The Primacy of Melody: Rousseau

Music was a lifelong concern for Jean-Jacques Rousseau (1712–1778), whose musical writings touch on an impressive variety of topics, from music notation and theory to core philosophical concerns such as musical value and expressiveness. Rousseau was also the author of a remarkably successful opera, Le Devin du Village (1752), performed around four hundred times over the course of the fifty years following its premiere.

A contributor to Diderot and D’Alembert’s Encyclopédie (1751), Rousseau embarked on a systematic rejection of the views defended by Jean-Philippe Rameau (1683–1764), the leading music theorist at the time. Rousseau’s rejection of Rameau was not simply a rejection of his music theory, but rather of the entire musical practice it was supposed to justify, that is, French music of the time.

Rousseau’s Letter on French Music (1753) may be seen as an episode in the so-called querelle des bouffons, a dispute concerning the relative merits of Italian and French opera that was prompted by the 1752 Paris performance of Giovanni Battista Pergolesi’s La serva padrona. In the Letter, Rousseau takes the side of Italian music, holding that its superiority over French music is ultimately due to the Italian language, which is more melodious and better articulated than French. French music attempts to address the shortcoming of its language by adopting complex harmonic structures, but Rousseau believes that this only further hinders its expressive potential. He observes how Italian music is more moving not in spite of its use of chords that are not completely filled out, but precisely because of this feature. In the Letter, Rousseau also develops the principle of “unity of melody” (unité de mélodie), according to which music ought to present the listener with one single salient melody at any time, the other voices playing a subsidiary and supportive role. It is from this melodic unity that music derives its capacity to move the listener, and in this resides music’s value. The concept of unity of melody is further elaborated in a dedicated entry of Rousseau’s Dictionary of Music (1768), where he also states that his Devin du Village was an attempt to put that principle into practice (Rousseau 1768, “Unity of Melody”; on unity of melody, see Riley 2004: chapter 2, and Waeber 2009).

Rousseau’s polemical view of harmony as a hindrance to melodic development, as well as the consequent condemnation of French music, found a natural target in Rameau, who defended himself on various occasions (Rameau’s responses are collected in Scott 1998; on the debate, see Verba 2016: chapters 2 and 3). In his Traité de l’harmonie (1722), Rameau had already stated that melody is merely a part of harmony, and in his subsequent Nouveau système de musique théorique, he had attempted to ground the tonal system in the phenomenon of upper partial harmonics, the faint overtones that are produced whenever any note is struck. This means that there is strictly speaking no pure melody, as no note is ever heard in isolation from the harmonics it generates. The ascending series of upper harmonics, Rameau argues, contains the key to tonal harmony. In his Encyclopédie article “Dissonance”, Rousseau accepts that harmony may be partly grounded in the structure of the harmonic series, but presses Rameau on the origin of the minor third, an interval that is as crucial to tonal harmony as it is absent from the series. More important than these technical qualms is Rousseau’s fundamental methodological difference from Rameau. While Rameau’s musical aesthetics depends on a theory of music including mathematical and physical constructs inaccessible from the mere experience of listening, Rousseau considers such experience the ultimate judge of musical value, and holds that it points to melody as the part of music that is responsible for its emotional impact on the listener (see O’Dea 1995: 19–20). Insofar as it concerns the appropriate level of explanation of musical phenomena, the contrast between Rousseau and Rameau is not unlike the one between Aristoxenian and Pythagorean approaches to harmonics (see §1.2).

Rousseau’s views on the expressive power of music are further elaborated in his Essay on the Origin of Languages (1781), in which he argues that music and natural languages developed out of a common source, a language used for the expression of feelings (Rousseau 1781: chapter XII, “Origin of music”; see Thomas 1995: chapter 5). Following this common origin, both language and music underwent a process of decay. Languages developed in order to communicate increasingly complex thoughts, but lost expressive power, especially after the emergence of writing (Rousseau 1781: chapters V–VI). Thus, Plato’s Greece, Rousseau states, had no shortage of philosophers, but lacked musicians (Rousseau 1781: chapter XIX). Regarding this remark, Martinelli (2012 [2019: 62]) observes:

Anticipating the line of reasoning that would later be adopted by Nietzsche, Rousseau openly contrasted music and philosophy, strongly undermining the tradition that saw them as sisters.

According to Rousseau, music degenerated along with language and gradually lost its original expressive power. This happened as free melodic phrases progressively turned into regimented musical systems, in which harmony and counterpoint were introduced in order to compensate for the loss of natural melody (Rousseau 1781: chapter XIX).

It is tempting, though perhaps imprecise, to see in Rousseau’s view a precursor of the musilanguage hypothesis, recently proposed by Steven Brown (1999; on this, see Waeber 2013; Mithen 2005 advances a view similar to Brown’s).

As is apparent from his hypothesis concerning the origins of music, Rousseau thinks that the expression of emotions is music’s main function. A qualified notion of imitation plays a crucial role in this. While Rousseau accepts the eighteenth century view of art as imitation (Rousseau 1768, “Imitation”), he is also clear in stating that musical imitation is different from the kinds we find in other art forms. Music does not imitate the human passions or other objects by presenting us with their sonic equivalent, but rather by arousing in the listener the emotions that the object would give rise to. In Rousseau’s words,

It will not represent these things directly, but will arouse the same movements in the soul that are experienced in seeing them. (Rousseau 1768, “Imitation”)

It is because of this that musical imitation is not confined to one sense modality. If painting may represent only objects of sight,

[m]usic would seem to have the same limits with respect to hearing; nevertheless, it portrays everything, even objects which are only visible: by an almost inconceivable magic trick it seems to put the eye in the ear, and the greatest marvel of an Art that acts only by motion is to be able to form even the image of rest. Night, sleep, solitude, and silence are counted among Music’s great portraits. (Rousseau 1768, “Imitation”; similar claims on musical imitation are made elsewhere in Rousseau’s oeuvre, see Rousseau 1768, “Opera”, and Rousseau 1781: chapter XVI)

Effectively, the imitation that Rousseau considers central to music is the arousal of an emotion that is specific enough to be associated with a given object. Thus, while Rousseau is not skeptical with regard to music’s capacity to imitate worldly objects, he is able to defend this view because he redefines imitation in terms of emotional arousal. In this sense, he is still representative of a progressive shift away from a view of music as imitation.

Despite its charm, Rousseau’s view of musical imitation does not seem to withstand critical scrutiny. It is unconvincing as an explanation of the musical imitation of emotions. It may be though that an emotion we perceive always corresponds to another emotion we feel, and thus that we could depict the former by arousing the latter. But in fact, we may respond to, e.g., rage with a variety of emotions, from more rage, to fear, disappointment, schadenfreude, etc. The theory is only more implausible when it comes to the depiction of objects other than emotions, as the same object may arouse very different emotions, depending on the subject’s disposition and beliefs about it.

3.6 Music between Form and Content: Kant

While his comments on music are at times disparaged as lacking artistic sensitivity, Immanuel Kant (1724–1804) is arguably the first major modern philosopher to discuss instrumental music in the context of a systematic account of the arts. His influence on subsequent musical thinking, and particularly on the formalist strand, is undeniable (see the entry on history of western philosophy of music: since 1800, section 1.6), but more controversial is whether he himself defends a variety of formalism. Kant’s main discussion of music is contained in the first section of the Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790), but some remarks are also found in his Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View (1798).

Kant’s views on music follow from an account of beauty that must be briefly reconstructed. Kant contrasts the beautiful, which aspires to universality, with the agreeable, which is subjective and idiosyncratic. According to Kant, when we ascribe beauty to objects we are making judgments of taste. These are subjective judgments, and include a feeling of pleasure. In this sense, judgments of taste are quite like judgments of agreeableness. The beautiful, however, is different from the agreeable in that it requires disinterested pleasure (interessenloses Wohlgefallen), that is, pleasure that does not presuppose the existence of its object. For example, I may find beautiful an imagined tune or painting, but I can’t find a refreshing drink agreeable if I merely think about it (Kant 1790: §2).

As they do not depend on concepts, and essentially include a subjective element of pleasure, judgments of taste are non-cognitive, and cannot therefore aspire to the same general validity as, say, mathematical proofs. However, judgments of taste are universal. When one judges an object to be beautiful, one is also at the same time asserting that anyone ought to find it beautiful (Kant 1790: §6–7). This again stands in contrast with the agreeable. When I judge the taste of calvados to be pleasant, I am not requiring general assent; in contrast, the pleasure associated with a work of music is one I expect anyone to feel—it is a beautiful piece of music.

The non-conceptual universality of judgments of taste is grounded in what Kant calls “the free play of the imagination and the understanding” (Kant 1790: §9). Ordinary perceptual and cognitive activities require the cooperation of imagination and understanding (here it is important to keep in mind that Kant considers imagination to be involved in perception) but in these cases imagination is guided by concepts. In the free play required by judgments of taste, imagination and understanding interact unconstrained by concepts, but in a way that is common to all human beings (Kant 1790: §20 ff.).

Kant distinguishes between agreeable and beautiful arts. While both involve pleasure, agreeable arts merely aim at arousing enjoyment, whereas beautiful arts involve cognition (Kant 1790: §44). The apparent ambiguity in Kant’s remarks on music runs so deep that he may seem to contradict himself even on the status of music as a beautiful art. He lists Tafelmusik (light music composed to be a background accompaniment to dining) alongside the art of telling amusing stories and jokes as an example of agreeable art, and adds that this kind of music is supposed to encourage conversation “without anyone paying the least attention to its composition” (Kant 1790: §44). In the “Remark” that concludes the first section of the Critique, Kant once more lists music alongside the joke as an agreeable art. However, elsewhere in the same work Kant clearly counts music a beautiful art, ranking it alongside poetry and painting (§44, 191). More importantly, Kant discusses music in §51, where he introduces his division of the beautiful arts. Samantha Matherne (2014: 135–138) has argued that Kant’s apparent hesitation is actually grounded in a different attitude we may take to music. If we attend to the bodily effect of the piece, music will be merely agreeable, whereas a focus on the formal structure of the work will make possible a judgment of taste, and thus music may be found beautiful.

A final point on musical beauty is worthy of mention. Kant distinguishes between free and adherent (anhängend) beauty. Adherent beauty presupposes a concept of the object’s purpose. Thus, a work of architecture is judged beautiful or not according to its success or otherwise in housing people, institutions, or businesses. The resulting judgment of taste is characterized by Kant as impure. Free beauty does not presuppose any concept. As examples of free beauty, Kant mentions abstract patterns, and instrumental music, “indeed all music without a text” (Kant 1790: §16). In general, when Kant discusses music he has pure instrumental music in mind. If one considers that previous thinkers devoted almost exclusive attention to vocal music, this is a significant shift in focus, and one that will be confirmed by the philosophy of music following Kant.

A further ambiguity is represented by Kant’s apparent commitment both to a variety of musical formalism, according to which musical beauty uniquely resides in the relationship between its component parts, and to the idea that music is expressive of emotions. This is a manifestation of a general tension in Kant’s aesthetics (see Guyer 1977). A formalist tendency is evident when Kant claims that the proper object of the pure judgment of taste in music is composition, by which he means the arrangement of tones (Kant 1790: §14). Later on, Kant states that music “merely plays with sensations” (Kant 1790: §53), offering this in support of his claims regarding music’s low rank among the arts.

Despite these apparent professions of formalism, Kant also stresses music’s connection to the sphere of emotions. Particularly, he seems to accept a version of the Affektenlehre, according to which works of music may arouse specific emotions in the listener. In §53, Kant affirms that music may convey an emotion because of its analogy with the tone of voice typical of impassioned speech (see also Kant 1798: §18).

In the face of these textual ambiguities, an option is to adopt a formalist interpretation and hold that Kant was merely paying lip service to the Affektenlehre (Kivy 2009: 50 ff.; Schueller 1955: 224–25). However, other scholars deny that Kant was a formalist. Young (2020) attributes to him an imitation theory of expressiveness: music imitates the tones characteristic of impassioned speech. Matherne (2014) attempts to reconcile formalist and expressivist elements in Kant’s thought. Crucial to her interpretation is the concept of an aesthetic idea, which Kant defines as

that representation of the imagination that occasions much thinking though without it being possible for any determinate thought, i.e., concept, to be adequate to it. (Kant 1790: §49)

Aesthetic ideas are imaginative representations that cannot be exhausted by any given concept—think of an abstract painting and of the multitude of things it could look like or symbolize. Aesthetic ideas are crucially involved in our experience of the beautiful, and Kant goes as far as to define beauty as the expression of aesthetic ideas (Kant 1790: §51). In his discussion of music, Kant states that the form of a composition—he explicitly mentions “harmony and melody”—expresses

the aesthetic ideas of a coherent whole of an unutterable fullness of thought, corresponding to a certain theme, which constitutes the dominant affect in the piece. (Kant 1790: §53)

Here the expression of a piece’s overarching emotional character, a central concern for the Affektenlehre, is explicitly linked to the piece’s formal structure. Matherne (2014: 134) concludes that Kant is defending what she terms “expressive formalism”, a view according to which music is able to express aesthetic ideas pertaining to the realm of emotions, and does so by means of its formal structure.

Kant’s view of music’s relative value as an art has also been an object of critical attention (Weatherston 1996; Parret 1998). Kant ranks the arts according to two distinct criteria. When it comes to “charm and movement of the mind” (Kant 1790: §53), music is first among all of the arts, as it arouses emotions more deeply than any other art form. It is clear that Kant does not consider this criterion particularly important to artistic value. Additionally, music occupies the bottom of the hierarchy when one ranks the arts according to the second criterion, that is, “in terms of the culture that they provide for the mind” (Kant 1790: §53). To provide culture for the mind is described by Kant as to contribute to the enlargement of the faculties of imagination and understanding—think again of an abstract painting, and how it may enrich our capacity to give visible form to some ideas.

While they may raise various difficult interpretive issues, Kant’s views on music have more than a purely historical interest. Some contemporary commentators and philosophers of music have suggested that they might be brought to bear on current debates (see Bicknell 2002; Ginsborg 2011: 337; Matherne 2014: 139–140).

Regardless of whether Kant’s formalism is or not a nineteenth century construction, his awareness of music’s purely formal aspect signals a change in Western philosophy of music. Vocal music is no longer the center of theoretical speculation. The philosophical problems that music poses are first and foremost those posed by pure instrumental music, and it is its nature that must be clarified if one is to understand music’s relation to language, concepts, and emotions.


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Thanks to Stephen Davies, Andrew Kania, James O. Young, and an anonymous reviewer for helpful comments on a draft of this entry.

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