Notes to Medieval Philosophy

1. Although Jewish philosophers writing in Arabic fit within the Islamicate cultural tradition (see, e.g., Maimonides in (§2.6), there is a strong continuity between Jewish philosophy in Arabic and in Hebrew, which is lost if medieval Jewish philosophy is not regarded as a single branch of the tradition. In §2, however, for the sake of space, pre-1200 Jewish philosophy is treated alongside other philosophy in Arabic in §2.4 and §2.6. Besides the four main branches there were others, such as philosophy in Syriac from the fourth to the thirteenth century, in Georgian and Armenian, and in Persian (attached to the Arabic tradition).

2. The term “medieval”, meaning “belonging to the middle (medium) age (aevum)”, was coined by Renaissance scholars to designate (in a derogatory way) the period between the end of antiquity and their own time. But there is no need to stick to this original sense, in which it would apply only to the Latin tradition (and perhaps the Jewish tradition, which had by then rooted itself in the Latin world); and, indeed, it is argued below (§5.2) that the Renaissance does not mark the end of the Latin tradition of medieval philosophy.

3. Boethius’s Consolation of Philosophy (§1.3) was frequently commented on, from the ninth to fifteenth century, and his short theological treatises and logical textbooks especially before 1150. There were early medieval (800–1200) Latin gloss and commentary traditions also on Martianus Capella’s Marriage of Mercury and Philology, a late ancient encyclopaedic work with philosophical content and on Macrobius’s commentary on Cicero’s Dream of Scipio.

4. The Timaeus was translated into Latin (incompletely) in the fourth century by Calcidius, who also wrote a commentary. The Timaeus was commented on by William of Conches in the twelfth Century, and in the same period Averroes commented on an epitome of the Republic, whilst in the fifteenth century Marsilio Ficino commented on works by Plato and Platonists. There was a Latin tradition of commentary on pseudo-Dionysius and on a modified version of Proclus’s Elements of Theology, originally made in Arabic, called the Liber de causis (see Calma 2016). In 1340–61 Berthold of Moosburg wrote a vast commentary on the Elements of Theology itself.

5. There was also a tradition of commentary on writings by al-Suhrawardī (§2.10), and on kalām (§2.4) textbooks.

6. The Dartmouth Dante project,, gives access to 32 commentaries on the Commedia written before 1600.

7. Pasnau 2014 allows most of these movements to be traced, using Appendix B, “Medieval Translations” (793–832), which list

  1. Greek Aristotelian works translated into Latin;
  2. (Other) Greek philosophical works translated into Latin;
  3. Greek philosophical works translated into Arabic;
  4. Arabic philosophical works translated into Latin;
  5. Latin philosophical works translated into Greek;
  6. Ancient philosophical works and commentaries translated into Hebrew.

8. Tatakis 2003 is a translation of a book published in French in 1949; balanced discussions are given in Kaldellis and Siniossoglou 2017, sections IV and V, and Bruns, Kapriev and Mudroch 2019, Part I; the entry on Byzantine philosophy concentrates on the Aristotelian commentary tradition, and Kapriev 2005 on the Christian Platonic tradition.

9. See Börje Bydén and Katerina Ierodiakonou (2012: 29–30). For discussion about what “Byzantine Philosophy” means, see Trizio 2007 and Gutas & Siniossoglou 2017.

10. See Marenbon 1983 (outdated, but unfortunately not yet replaced).

11. Adamson and Taylor 2005 is a good introductory survey, mainly on this period; Rudolph 2021 is much more detailed, and goes up to the end of the twelfth century. This period is covered in the course of a wider treatment of Arabic philosophy in Taylor & Lopéz-Farjeat 2016 and El-Rouayheb & Schmidtke 2017; see also entries on Arabic and Islamic metaphysics, Arabic and Islamic natural philosophy and natural science, Arabic and Islamic psychology and philosophy of mind, causation in Arabic and Islamic Thought.

12. Kalām, especially before al-Ghazālī, is often excluded from surveys of Arabic philosophy. Frank 1978 is the classic study of early kalām metaphysics and Van Ess 1991–95 (now being translated—part already available) is fundamental.

13. But this picture should be nuanced: see Vasalou 2008.

14. For general histories of medieval Jewish philosophy, see note 23.

15. See Dronke 1988; Cesalli, Imbach, de Libera, & Ricklin 2021 (very thorough); and Giraud 2020.

16. The first study to look at the philosophical culture of Islamic Spain as a whole is Stroumsa 2019. See also entries on Arabic and Islamic metaphysics, al-Farabi’s psychology and epistemology, causation in Arabic and Islamic.

17. For general histories of medieval Jewish philosophy, see note 23.

18. Cross 2014 (The Medieval Christian Philosophers) gives a philosophically sophisticated introduction to the main figures; Cross and Paasch 2021 (Routledge Companion to Medieval Philosophy) is a multi-author survey, arranged by topic and also philosophically acute. Kenny 2005 (Medieval Philosophy) is beautifully written and lucid. Although, as indicated, the titles suggest a wider survey, these books concentrate especially on University Philosophy. For the thirteenth century, Brungs, Mudroch, & Schulthess 2017 provides unrivalled detail; it also considers to a limited extent non-university philosophy in the period. Flasch 1986 [2000] is unusual because, though staying with the Latin tradition, it sees university philosophy only as a limited part of its field.

19. This, of course, vastly oversimplifies the complicated story of the use of Arabic sources in Latin University Philosophy: see entry on influence of Arabic and Islamic philosophy on the Latin West.

20. This area has not been much explored: Imbach & König-Pralong 2013 assembles some of the important articles or chapters written by these two pioneers; Casagrande & Fioravanti 2016 also considers University Philosophy (in Italy), but is mainly oriented to philosophy outside universities, or at least outside the Arts and Theology Faculties there. In the Jewish and Islamic traditions there was also philosophy directed towards a wider public, although it has been little studied by historians of philosophy: Abram, Harvey and Muehlethaler 2022 contains essays on the whole area (Latin, Jewish, and Islamicate worlds), and see Adamson 2016: 344–350 (on Rūmī).

21. These figures are customarily called “Renaissance Philosophers”: see below, (§5.2).

22. On how female mystics might be thought about in connection with philosophy, see Christina Van Dyke 2018, and cf. the chapters in Adamson 2019 on Hildegard (2019: 128–34), Hadewijch and Mechthild of Magdeburg (2019: 222–27), Marguerite Porete (2019: 368–73), English Mysticism (2019: 489–94), and Catherine of Siena (2019: 509–15).

23. Sirat 1985 provides a thorough guide to the whole range of medieval Jewish philosophy, as does Frank & Leaman (2003: 258–445 are on philosophy in Hebrew) and Nadler & Rudavsky 2009 (arranged by topic). The SEP entry on influence of Arabic and Islamic philosophy on Judaic thought covers the Jewish Arabic and Hebrew tradition: it provides important qualifications to the simplified picture presented here and in §2.6 about the sources used by Jewish philosophers.

24. The best general information will be found in the relevant chapters of El-Rouayheb & Schmidtke 2017 and Adamson 2016: 295–420. There is a lively historiographical debate about what elements in later Arabic thought and culture should be considered to be philosophy. Adamson takes a broad view, Gutas 2018– who, however, was one of the first to suggest the interest of “post-classical Arabic philosophy”—a narrow one, whilst there is a nuanced discussion in Griffel 2021: see especially 565–71. Cf also: entries on Arabic and Islamic metaphysics, mysticism in Arabic and Islamic philosophy.

25. At much the same time, al-Aḥsa’ī (d. after 1501) brought together “kalām, Peripatetic and Illuminationist philosophy, and philosophical mysticism” (Schmidtke 2017: 398).

26. For a brief discussion, mainly of Arabic authors, see Kukkonen 2014: 237–43. Fuller treatments include Sorabji 1983 and Davidson 1987 (Islamic and Jewish writers) and Dales 1990 and Rudavsky 2000 (Jewish authors).

27. A good survey is given in the entry on medieval theories of future contingents and, with use of formal notation, Bornholdt 2017. Both of these are restricted to the Latin tradition. For a wider view, see Rudavsky 1985.

28. Aquinas’s most important discussions of the problem are at On Truth, q. 2, a.12; Summa contra Gentiles, I, 67; Summa Theologiae I, q. 14, a. 13.

29. Avicenna puts his idea in The Cure at Metaphysics VIII.6 (Avicenna [2005: 287–290]). Averroes rejects Avicenna’s view, but his own is not really very different ( Metaphysics Book Lam, 197–98).

30. Crescas sets out his argument for compatibilism mainly in Book II, Parts (“Cornerstones”) 1 and 5, which are conveniently translated in Manekin 2012: 192–235: see especially Part 5, chapter 3 at 222–223; in the full translation, Crescas [2018: 120–142, 188–205].

31. Averroes changed his interpretation of Aristotle’s On the Soul during his career. Apart from some fragments, his Great Commentary survives only in the Latin translation by Michael Scotus, and it probably, but not certainly, represents his latest view on the question. See Averroes Long Commentary [2009: esp. 304–329].

32. Although this comment is justified, and Aquinas was right to say that, on Averroes’s view, one cannot say “This human thinks”, it misses the point. Averroes did not think that humans could be the agents in the immaterial process of intellectual thinking, in the way that they are in sensible perception. Rather, he provided a way for humans, although not themselves immaterial, to take part in immaterial thinking. For Aquinas’s text, see Thomas Aquinas On There Being Only One Intellect [1993].

33. Aquinas sets out his ideas succinctly in Qq. 75–76 of his Summa Theologiae, Part 1.

34. Dutilh Novaes and Read 2016 provides a detailed account, by the best experts, of both the Latin and Arabic traditions of logic.

35. The tradition of Arabic logic from the twelfth century onwards has been brought out of obscurity, first by the work of Tony Street (see Stanford Encyclopedia entry cited at the end of the section), and most recently, reaching right up to the nineteenth century, in El-Rouayheb 2019. See also El-Rouayheb 2016.

36. Gabbay & Woods 2008 provides the fullest survey of the Latin tradition of medieval logic, but its coverage of the material is patchy. Besides the relevant parts of Dutilh Novaes & Read 2016, Cross & Paasch 2021 Part I (Bulthuis 2021, Bäck 2021, Uckelman 2021, Johnston 2021, Paasch 2021) gives an excellent, brief but philosophically pertinent account of some of the main areas. See also entry on Medieval theories of the syllogism.

37. The influence of Arabic logic on the Latin tradition was far more limited than that of Arabic metaphysics, philosophy of mind and natural philosophy, and the distinctive features of Avicennian logic were never known: see Lagerlund 2008.

38. A number of the fourteenth-century logicians who worked especially on the logica modernorum have special entries devoted to them here: as well as Buridan and Ockham (already given), Albert of Saxony, Burley, Heytesbury, Kilvington, Richard the Sophister, William of Sherwood.

39. The best introduction to Byzantine logic is Erismann 2017; for Jewish logic, see Manekin 2009.

40. For c. 500, see, e.g., De Rijk 1985 and Lagerlund 2020, as cited above; the second century was favoured by Étienne Gilson and Paul Spade; c. 800 is followed by Robert Pasnau and, according him (Pasnau 2014: 1) is the object of “some consensus”. In early work, John Marenbon accepted (c).

41. “Renaissance Philosophy” has its own general histories, which of course overlap in chronology and often in the figures and works covered with general histories of medieval philosophy. Schmitt & Skinner 1988; Copenhaver & Schmitt 1992; and Hankins 2007 are all very valuable, as is a book that deliberately avoids the label “Renaissance” and concentrates on philosophy in the sixteenth century: Lagerlund & Hill 2017. See also entries on Aristotelianism in the Renaissance, natural philosophy in the Renaissance.

42. This is the title of Jacob Schmutz’s illuminating 2012 essay.

43. This has been suggested in various places (e.g., Marenbon 2012b: 7). In their Introduction to a collection of articles on “baroque scholasticism”, Dvořák & Schmutz (2019: 187) write that

the paradigm of a “long scholastic” age, stretching from the thirteenth to the eighteenth century, is now imposing itself as an alternative to the classical narrative of the early-modern scientific and philosophical “revolution”,

and so maybe the suggestion is no longer too radical.

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