[Editor’s Note: The following new entry by John Marenbon replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]
“Medieval philosophy” has changed its meaning among specialists over the last twenty years. The change is not in chronology, where views remain divided (see §5): most agree that the period stretches at least from 500–1500, but some push the starting point back and/or the end point forward.
Rather, the change is about geography, and so language and culture. In the nineteenth and twentieth centuries, medieval philosophy was regarded as having taken place in Western Europe, mostly in Latin, with Paris and Oxford as its greatest centres. Islamic and Jewish thinkers writing in Arabic were included only in so far as their works were translated into Latin and influenced Christian thinkers. Nowadays, however, “medieval philosophy” is coming to be regarded as including not just the work of Christians writing in Latin (and sometimes in the European vernaculars), but of Christians in the Byzantine Empire writing in Greek, Muslims (and some Christians) writing in Arabic, and Jews in the Islamicate world writing in Arabic and in Christendom writing in Hebrew.
Although coverage of the different strands remains uneven, with Latin philosophy still most studied, work on Arabic philosophy increasing rapidly and the other areas still somewhat neglected, it is now widely recognized that medieval philosophizing in these different languages and countries should (though with some qualification) be seen as branches of a single tradition, going back to Greek antiquity and given coherence by a series of translation movements between the different languages. That is why this tradition (if it is called the “Western” tradition, “Western” must be understood much more broadly than usual) should be treated separately from the great achievements of philosophy from the same period in India, China, and elsewhere.
This entry begins with a section on the ingredients of medieval philosophy. It explains how medieval philosophy was based especially on texts and their commentary, and looks at how these texts were transmitted to the four branches of the medieval tradition and between them. The next section looks at the different styles of philosophizing in the period, and the following section focuses on three problems that highlight some of the special concerns of medieval philosophy, how religious concerns interact with reasoning and the differences between the four branches. The penultimate section is devoted to logic and its unusual importance during the period, and the last section discusses the chronological bounds of medieval philosophy.
- 1. The Ingredients of Medieval Philosophy
- 2. Styles of Medieval Philosophy
- 2.1 Byzantine Philosophy (c. 450–c. 1450)
- 2.2 The Rule and two Exceptions: Latin Philosophy, 800–1100
- 2.3 Falsafa
- 2.4 Kalām
- 2.5 The Twelfth-Century Parisian Schools
- 2.6 Islamic Spain, c. 1050–c. 1200
- 2.7 University Philosophy
- 2.8 Latin Philosophy Outside the Universities (c. 1200–c. 1500)
- 2.9 Jewish Philosophy in Christian Europe
- 2.10 Post-Classical Arabic Philosophy
- 3. Three Medieval Problems
- 4. The Importance of Logic
- 5. When Was Medieval Philosophy?
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. The Ingredients of Medieval Philosophy
1.1 Text and Commentary Traditions
In the Middle Ages, as in other periods, philosophy took many written forms, from encyclopaedias and compendia to monographs and short essays, from poetic, allegorical, and novelistic presentations to texts based directly on school and university practice (such as quodlibets) (see entry on Literary Forms of Medieval Philosophy). But there is one literary form that was used centrally in all the four traditions, but has lost its importance in modern times: the commentary. Much of the best medieval philosophy was done in commentaries, many of which were far from mere aids to understanding the text concerned. Whereas philosophers now, at least in the analytic tradition, think of their subject as made up of problems, which are tackled using what others have said and are saying as aids, medieval philosophizing was frequently based on (often, but not always, old and venerated) texts. But, although the aim was usually to interpret them, the practice of interpretation frequently led to new thinking, related only tangentially to the text under discussion.
The central texts for commentary in the Greek, Latin, Jewish branches, and among Arabic philosophers up to the twelfth century were Aristotle’s. The Byzantine philosophers used them in the original, Latin and Arabic philosophers in translation, and the Hebrew-writing Jewish philosophers usually indirectly, via epitomes and paraphrase commentaries translated from Arabic. No other ancient philosopher’s texts received anything remotely near to this level of attention, although various works of Boethius received multiple commentaries in the Latin tradition; commentary on Plato was sporadic. But the many commentaries on the Bible and on the Quran sometimes included substantial philosophical discussions.
In the Latin tradition, direct commentary on Aristotle remained central to most higher education until late in the seventeenth century (§5.2), but Arabic authors stopped commenting on his works directly after the twelfth century, and earlier outside Spain. Instead, they began to comment on Avicenna’s rethinking of Aristotle (§2.3, §2.10). Commentaries on his work continued to be written, but added to them were, successively, commentaries on later writers who had themselves rethought and rewritten Avicenna’s expositions. Islamic scholars saw commentary as a way of thinking not just on the basis of revered old texts, but on that of the best recent textbooks. Although this constant replacement of texts to be commented was foreign to the Latin tradition, three medieval Latin texts were themselves vehicles for many commentaries. The two set texts in the university theology faculties (§2.7) were the Bible and a work written circa 1155 by Peter the Lombard, the Sentences, where he set out systematically all the problematic questions in theology and proposed solutions, quoting extensively from Augustine (Evans and Rosemann 2002–14). Much of the best theological and philosophical work in the period from 1250–1550 was done in commentaries on the Sentences, but usually the Lombard’s text was just the springboard for debate. Peter of Spain’s popular logical Treatise (§4.2) received commentaries, as did the greatest philosophical poem of the period, Dante’s Commedia Divina (§2.8).
The types of commentaries were legion. They included: simple, literal glosses, designed to help beginners (e.g., Latin twelfth-century literal logic commentaries); sophisticated literal commentaries, explaining an author’s argument at a high level (e.g., Aquinas’s Aristotle commentaries); line by line commentary, with long discursive discussions and excursuses (e.g., Boethius and Abelard on Aristotelian logic; Averroes’s “Great” commentaries); paraphrase-type abbreviations and rewritings of the original texts, often with added material and ideas and a new emphasis (e.g., Averroes’s epitomes and “Middle” commentaries); discursive rethinkings of a whole area of a past author’s work (e.g., Avicenna’s and Albert the Great’s commentaries on Aristotle); allegorical readings of a text (e.g., some Biblical commentary, both Christian and Jewish, earlier medieval commentaries on Plato’s Timaeus and Book III, metrum 9 of Boethius’s Consolation, which epitomizes it, Dante commentaries). A distinctive form of commentary used in the Latin universities was the Question Commentary, where a book would be commented on by posing questions related to the content of its sections or even, more vaguely, its larger divisions (Bazán, Wippel, Fransen, & Jacquart 1985), with the text often a mere peg on which to fit the commentator's own agenda for philosophical discussion.
1.2 The Platonic Schools of Late Antiquity
The main root of the four branches of medieval philosophy—Greek, Latin, Arabic, and Jewish—is in the two great so-called Platonic Schools of Athens and Alexandria, although each tradition also had its own special roots (§1.4). The new version of Platonism formulated by Plotinus (d. 270) had replaced the Hellenistic Schools (Stoics, Epicureans, Sceptics etc.) as the dominant type of philosophy in the late Roman Empire. But Plotinus’s star pupil, Porphyry (c. 232–305), had given his master’s teaching a decisive twist. Plotinus considered Aristotle an opponent of Plato and regarded him with hostility. Porphyry held, rather, that Aristotle’s thought, which was about the sensibly-perceptible world, harmonized with Plato’s, about super-sensible reality. Following Porphyry’s lead, students at the “Platonic” Schools began by studying the whole Aristotelian corpus, logic first, and only then moved on to Plato’s dialogues. In all four branches, it was the Aristotelian curriculum that survived, in whole or part. Medieval philosophy is, therefore, to some extent the history of Aristotelianism, but transmitted within a Platonist context, shaped by the different religious traditions and transformed both by individual thinkers and various, changing cultural circumstances.
1.3 Translation Movements
Ancient texts were transmitted to medieval thinkers and the different branches of the medieval tradition influenced one another’s development through a series of translation movements.
1.3.1 Greek to Arabic
The School of Alexandria was closed by the Muslim conquest in 641, but between the eighth and the early tenth century, much of the treasury of Greek scientific and philosophical texts it left was put into Arabic, often by Syriac speaking Christians and sometimes through the intermediary of Syriac. Almost the whole of Aristotle was translated, along with commentaries from the Platonic schools and works by the Aristotelian, Alexander of Aphrodisias (working c. AD 200) (Gutas 1998). Reworked versions of texts by Plotinus and the fifth-century Platonist Proclus were also made in Arabic, but Plato himself was hardly known except through translations of epitomes. (See also Greek sources in Arabic and Islamic philosophy.)
1.3.2 Greek to Latin
Translation from Greek into Latin went on almost continuously. Writings by philosophically acute Greek Church Fathers were translated in antiquity; in the fourth century, Calcidius translated part of Plato’s Timaeus, with an extensive commentary. Boethius (476–c. 525) translated Aristotle’s logic and, in his commentaries and textbooks, translating, selecting and rethinking, made available in Latin large amounts of the teachings on Aristotelian logic from the Platonic Schools. His Consolation of Philosophy, written as a prosimetric dialogue when Boethius was under sentence of death, was one of the most widely read and translated texts in the Middle Ages: it was not a translation, but transmitted Boethius’s own understanding of late ancient Platonism. Translations of pseudo-Dionysius and Maximus the Confessor were made in the ninth century (§2.1, §2.2), and of John of Damascus (c. 660–c. 750) in the twelfth century. In the twelfth and thirteenth centuries, the rest of Aristotle untranslated by Boethius—his non-logical works and the Posterior Analytics—was put into Latin, sometimes first via Arabic; (Plato’s Phaedo and Meno were also translated, by Henry Aristippus, but they remained almost unknown). The greatest of these translators was William of Moerbeke (1215–1286), who made or produced by version very accurate, extremely literal translations from the Greek of all Aristotle’s works, and texts by the late ancient Platonists Proclus, Ammonius and Simplicius. In the fifteenth century, there were many more translations from the Greek, such as those of Plato and Plotinus by Marsilio Ficino (1433–99).
1.3.3 Arabic to Latin
In the twelfth and thirteenth centuries, especially in Toledo and Sicily, a large variety of Arabic texts were translated into Latin. They included Arabic translations of some of Aristotle’s own texts, which helped to fill in gaps before direct translations from the Greek were available, and works by the Arabic thinkers who worked in the tradition of Aristotle and the ancient philosophers: al-Kindī, al-Fārābī and Solomon ibn Gabirol (a Jew, but unrecognizable as such from his text) and, most important, parts, including the sections on the soul and on metaphysics, from Avicenna’s largest encyclopaedic reworking of Aristotle, and many of Averroes’s commentaries on Aristotle. These translations, along with the translations of Aristotle, transformed the university syllabuses in the thirteenth century (§2.7).
1.3.4 Arabic to Hebrew
When Jews living in Latin Europe began to engage in philosophy, using Hebrew, their language of law and liturgy, they turned primarily to works in Arabic. A central text was Maimonides’s Guide of the Perplexed (§2.4), translated into Hebrew twice soon after it was written, and a few other Jewish philosophical texts were also translated. During the thirteenth and early fourteenth centuries, translators also provided an almost complete Aristotelian curriculum but, although there were some direct translations, it was mostly by way of Averroes’s short and middle paraphrase commentaries, and al-Fārābī’s short commentaries for the logic. Other translations include al-Ghazālī’s Intentions of the Philosophers (§2.4) and Ibn Tufayl’s philosophical novel (§2.6).
1.3.5 Latin to Greek
One group of Byzantine philosophers in the thirteenth to fifteenth centuries was strongly interested by Latin thought. The texts its members translated into Greek included works by Augustine and Boethius, Thomas Aquinas, and Anselm, as well as part of Peter of Spain’s popular Treatise on logic.
1.3.6 Latin to Hebrew
In the fourteenth and fifteenth centuries some works by a variety of Latin university authors, among them Boethius, Aquinas, Albert the Great and William of Ockham were put into Hebrew, and also Peter of Spain’s Treatise (Manekin 1996). There was even a Hebrew translation of Averroes’s Great Commentary on On the Soul (§2.6) made in the fifteenth century from the Latin, because the Arabic original was lost.
1.3.7 Hebrew to Latin
Maimonides’s Guide (§2.6) was translated into Latin in the thirteenth century from one of its Hebrew translations. In the fifteenth and sixteenth centuries, there was a spate of Latin translations of Hebrew versions of Averroes, but very little of Jewish philosophy in Hebrew was ever put into Latin (Manekin 1996).
1.4 Other Philosophical Sources
As well as drawing on ancient Greek philosophy via the late ancient Platonic Schools, each of the four main branches of medieval philosophy had its own special sources.
- For Byzantine philosophy, there were philosophically educated Greek Christian authors, such as Origen (c. 184–c. 253) and from the fourth century Basil, Gregory of Nyssa and Gregory Nazianzen.
- The greatest influence on medieval Latin philosophy, as well as, by some chronologies, the founder of the tradition, was Augustine (354–430). Augustine’s thought was shaped in part by Plotinus and Porphyry, some of whose texts he read in Latin translation; in part by his personal experience of the competing faiths of his time—Christianity, Manichaeism, Graeco-Roman paganism; in part by a Latin philosophical and literary tradition; and in the greatest part by his own, relentless self-critical genius as a thinker. Latin philosophers also had direct access to eras of ancient philosophy earlier than the Platonism of Plotinus through Latin authors, such as Cicero (scepticism, stoicism), Seneca (stoicism).
- In Arabic, there was the tradition of kalām theology (§2.4). Philosophical thought about language was sometimes linked to Arabic grammatical thought and both it and ethics to adab, the tradition of literary and historical studies needed to make a person cultivated. Sufism—an Islamic mystical tradition—also deeply influenced some philosophers (§2.4, §2.6, §2.10).
- Jewish thinkers inherited, not just the written Law of the Torah, but oral law, recorded in the Mishna and the tradition of Talmudic commentary on it. The central Jewish philosopher, Maimonides (§2.6) is also the greatest of the Talmudic scholars.
2. Styles of Medieval Philosophy
2.1 Byzantine Philosophy (c. 450–c. 1450)
Thinkers in what had been the Eastern Roman Empire—they thought of themselves as Romans; we call them “Byzantines”—needed no translation movement to access the heritage of the ancient schools. In theory, the whole of the ancient tradition lay within their grasp. But not only did this lead to encyclopaedism, as in the case of Photius (820–91), whose Bibliotheca is an enormous collection from ancient authors, philosophers included. It also made the Church authorities suspect that commentators who went beyond logic would be guilty of “hellenism”—putting loyalty to their Greek cultural tradition above Christian doctrine. Of the three most adventurous Aristotelian commentators, Michael Psellus (1018–96), John Italos (1025–85) and Eustratius of Nicaea (c. 1050–c. 1120), only the first escaped condemnation. Four hundred years later, in the twilight of Byzantine civilization, Gemistos Plethon (c. 1360–1454), gave substance to these fears through his devotion to Plato and pagan Platonism (Siniossoglou 2011).
Some historians restrict Byzantine philosophy to this tradition, based on the ancient texts of Aristotle and, occasionally, Plato and his followers. But there were two other strands to philosophy in Byzantium. One is that of those thinkers after 1200 who looked to Latin thought (§1.3.5). The other goes back to the philosophically-inclined Greek Christian Fathers, and above all to the (probably) Syrian monk who, late in the fifth century, issued a set of writings under the name of Dionysius, the Athenian Areopagite (learned judge) converted by St Paul. The author had read the near contemporary pagan Platonist Proclus, who envisaged a many-tiered universe, deriving ultimately from a One, beyond even being. Pseudo-Dionysius substituted the Christian God for the One, and where Proclus accommodated the pagan pantheon on the elaborately triadic rungs of his pantheon, he placed the angels and the Church hierarchy. Maximus the Confessor, schooled in ancient philosophy though hostile to it, developed pseudo-Dionysius’s thinking, especially his negative theology. This line of Byzantine thinking has its most powerful later expression in the work of a monk of Mount Athos, Gregory Palamas (1296–1359), who combined the theme of God’s unknowability with the idea that he does make himself manifest even in this life to some people who are helped by a special sort of “hesychastic” (still, silent) prayer.
2.2 The Rule and Two Exceptions: Latin Philosophy, 800–1100
Philosophical thinking took place in the monasteries and, later, cathedral schools in Latin Europe in the ninth to eleventh centuries, although it was first stimulated at the end of the eighth century by Alcuin, Theodulf of Orleans and other scholars at the court of Charlemagne. Based on the seven Liberal Arts (the trivium: grammar, logic, rhetoric; the quadrivium: arithmetic, geometry, astronomy, music), it was usually focused on the first two. Grammar ran from elementary language learning to complex semantic analysis. Logic, at first known from encyclopaedic accounts and Roman textbooks, was studied from the late tenth century on the basis of Boethius’s translations of and commentaries on Porphyry’s Isagoge and Aristotle’s Categories and On Interpretation and his own textbooks. Boethius’s Short Theological Treatises and Consolation of Philosophy were also used as school texts. Augustine’s works were not, but they were extensively read and so provided another source, and inspiration, for philosophers. In these centuries Latin philosophy acquired the emphasis on linguistic analysis and logic it would develop further in the twelfth century and retain in the universities, even when there were many more ancient sources available.
The two outstanding Latin thinkers of the time shared to some extent this style of thinking and yet were in many respects complete exceptions to it. John Scottus Eriugena, an Irishman who worked at the court of Charles the Bald in northern France from c. 850–c. 870, learned Greek, translated pseudo-Dionysius and Maximus the Confessor and absorbed their ideas. His masterpiece, the Periphyseon, systematizes and takes to its rational conclusion the line of thought they drew from Proclus (and ultimately Plotinus and Plato). Eriugena uses his contemporaries’ favourite logical textbook, a Latin paraphrase of Aristotle’s Categories, to argue that God is not among the things that exist, before showing how he is manifest, never in himself, but in the appearances that make up the story of the world’s creation, the Fall, and the final Return of all things.
Born in Aosta, Anselm (1033–1109) became a monk at Bec in Northern France and, eventually, Archbishop of Canterbury. At a time when thinkers referred ostentatiously to their authoritative sources, ancient and patristic, Anselm wrote dialogues and monographs that scarcely mentioned an author. Having fully absorbed both Boethian logic and many facets of Augustine’s thought, he could use them to engage in his own reasoning. He not only hit on—by his own account in a flash of inspiration—an unprecedented argument for God’s existence (the “Ontological Proof”; see entry on ontological arguments), but elaborated and brilliantly advocated a notion of the will’s freedom Augustine had the sense to avoid, which cast a long shadow from Scotus to Kant and beyond.
The abundant translations of Greek philosophical texts (§1.3.1) made it possible for some thinkers in the Islamicate world themselves to engage in the Greek-style philosophizing they called falsafa. Its exponents (falāsifa; sing. faylasuf) did not, however, fit into the educational system, based around Islamic law. The earliest faylasuf was the prince and polymath al-Kindī (c. 801–66), who was especially attracted to Platonist material. In the next century, a circle of Peripatetics, Muslim and Christian, flourished in Baghdad, dedicated to the close study and exegesis of Aristotle’s texts. The most outstanding, al-Fārābī (c. 870–950/1), wrote shorter and longer commentaries on Aristotle, including a discursive exposition of On Interpretation full of original thought about both semantics and determinism. Elsewhere, he provides a naturalistic account of the origins of language, philosophy and religion, and he championed the view, adopted by other faylasuf, that in their discipline they provide demonstrative science (as described by Aristotle in the Posterior Analytics) (§4.1). His view of the ideal state is clearly influenced by knowledge of Plato (through epitomes) and is linked to his conception of the order of the universe, which melds Proclus’s theory of emanation from the One with Ptolemean cosmology (see entries on al-Farabi’s metaphysics, al-Farabi’s psychology and epistemology, al-Farabi’s philosophy of logic and language, al-Farabi’s philosophy of society and religion).
Unquestionably the most important faylasuf—fundamental to the subsequent Arabic Islamic tradition, but highly influential too on Jewish and Latin philosophy—was Ibn Sīnā (before 980–1037; known in Latin as “Avicenna”, see entries on Ibn Sina’s logic, Ibn Sina’s metaphysics, Ibn Sina’s natural philosophy). Avicenna was born in present-day Uzbekistan and spent his life in the Eastern part of the Islamicate world, serving various princes in the area (he was also a renowned doctor and writer on medicine). He distinguished his approach sharply from that of the “Westerners”, the Baghdad Peripatetics. Like them, he considered himself an Aristotelian. But whereas they sought to expound Aristotle’s texts line by line, Avicenna believed his genius allowed him to present the underlying truth in Aristotle’s thought, by rearranging, rethinking and systematizing it. His output consisted mostly, therefore, of philosophical encyclopaedias each covering much of the range of Aristotle’s work, longer—such as The Cure—or shorter—such as Pointers and Reminders, the presentation most distant from Aristotle’s texts and most studied by his Arabic successors.
For Avicenna, as for al-Fārābī, God moves the universe not just as final cause, but as that from which emanate the series of Intelligences and celestial spheres, down to the Agent Intellect, giver of forms to our sublunar world and so assurer of the continued regularity of nature. His innovation was to identify this first cause as the one necessary being, that which is necessary through itself: its nature is to exist and so it cannot but exist. All other things are merely possible in themselves, but necessary through another—that is, through God, the necessary being. Since Avicenna’s God, like that of al-Fārābī, the Platonists and Aristotle himself, is not a being that chooses and wills, his theory of necessity in itself and through another binds the whole history of the universe to a very strict Principle of Sufficient Reason.
A century before al-Kindī, a different style of philosophizing had grown up in the Islamic world: kalām. It has, indeed, been suggested that falsafa originated as a rival to kalām—claiming to be a better way of explaining the world than it could offer. Kalām was based on problems suggested by the Quran, but it was also inspired by the need to defend Islamic doctrine against philosophically based attacks by Christians and may have been informed by some ideas from the ancient Greek tradition. The dominant school of kalām in the ninth century were the Muʿtazilites. They were very confident in the ability of human reason to reach moral truth, to which, they held, God’s justice must correspond. They strongly emphasized God’s unity and, in common with other kalām thinkers, developed an atomistic, materialistic physics, very different from Aristotle’s picture of a stable world of substances belonging to natural kinds. A Jewish version of kalām is found in the work of Saadya (882–942).
Al-Ash‘arī (d. 935/6) changed the direction of kalām. He stressed the absolute omnipotence of God, who, he said, from instant to instant is responsible for the arrangement of the atoms, and for human will and action. A century later, however, al-Juwaynī (1028–85) began to introduce Avicennian notions into kalām. His pupil, al-Ghazālī (1058–1111) went far further.
Al-Ghazālī studied kalām theology, Avicennian philosophy and Sufism, a type of Islamic mysticism, and he wrote about them all, as well as being one of the greatest Muslim legal theorists. Among these writings are not just The Intentions of the Philosophers, based on Avicenna’s shortest philosophical encyclopaedia (in Persian), but The Incoherence of the Philosophers, directed against falsafa as presented by Avicenna. This book was very influential, and al-Ghazālī used to be thought of as a diehard enemy of philosophy, who helped to bring about the end of philosophizing in the Islamic world. In fact, however, there are just three doctrines on which al-Ghazālī convicts Avicenna and his followers of heresy: the eternity of the world (§3.1), the restriction of God’s knowledge to universals and the denial of the bodily resurrection (§3.3). His critique thus showed that, in general, so long as these conclusions are avoided, Avicennian philosophy is acceptable for Muslims. Indeed, al-Ghazālī himself accepted it, but with two important further changes. God, he insists, has will and is capable of real choices between alternatives. Moreover—and this is the central point of the Incoherence—the philosophers such as Avicenna do not, as they claim (§2.3), provide demonstrative knowledge, because the starting points for their arguments are not all self-evident. Like the theologians, their reasoning is dialectical (Griffel 2009).
2.5 The Twelfth-Century Parisian Schools
Paris became the centre of philosophy in Latin Europe in the twelfth century, in part because the cathedral authorities, rather than just running one school, allowed many, competing ones: masters flocked there, and students began to head to Paris from all over Europe.
Many of these masters concentrated on the logical curriculum, little changed since the late tenth century, but now its texts had been thoroughly absorbed. This curriculum gave them the opportunity, not just to make advances in what is still considered logic, but also to develop a whole metaphysics, starting not from Aristotle’s Metaphysics—which they did not know—but his Categories. The boldest of all these metaphysicians was Peter Abelard (1079–1142). Aristotle’s Categories seems to imply that, as well as particular substances (this man, that dog) and particular forms (this rationality, that whiteness), there are also universal substances and forms. Abelard did not agree, and he tried to construct the world and interpret Aristotle without admitting that any universals exist. He also attended to the ontological status of what sentences say—their dicta. Dicta play a central role in his understanding of truth and of the basis of logical consequence, but, he insists, they are not things at all. Gilbert of Poitiers (c. 1085–90–1154) constructed an even more complex metaphysical system, based on the distinction between types of discourse (natural, “mathematical”, theological, ethical).
Both men, and their often innovative followers (Abelard’s were the nominales, Gilbert’s the Porretani) in the second half of the century, also wrote on theology. Indeed, Gilbert’s surviving works are all theological, the most important of them a commentary on Boethius’s short theological treatises. Gilbert tried, unsuccessfully, to establish the method Boethius used in his Short Theological Treatises—of going as far as possible with parallels between natural phenomena and sacred mysteries, and pointing out where he has to stop—as standard. Abelard’s own particular theological ideas—which included an (arguably) rationalizing approach to the Trinity, and the view that, unlike humans, God cannot act otherwise than he does—were generally rejected, and some of them condemned. But his method of trying to reconcile apparently contradictory authoritative texts through conceptual analysis was widely adopted by his contemporaries and would form the basis for later medieval theology.
Other approaches to philosophy, less centred on logic and theology, were also developed, especially outside Paris. William of Conches (d. after 1155) concentrated on expounding texts such as Boethius’s Consolation and Plato’s Timaeus, and on physical science, in which he regarded Plato as an authority.
2.6 Islamic Spain, c. 1050–c. 1200
Just as a very particular way of doing philosophy grew up in twelfth-century Paris, so at much the same time Islamic Spain was marked out by its own distinctive style of thinking, which for the most part placed great emphasis on the importance of science and philosophy in the Greek tradition. The earliest important thinker was the Jew, Solomon ibn Gabirol (1021/2(?)–1057/8(?)), heavily influenced by Platonism, but insistent that the universe was produced at God’s will, not by necessary emanation, and that matter is present at every level of creation, even in intellectual creatures.
Ibn Tufayl (before 1110–1185) is known through a single work, Hayy ibn Yaqzān, a philosophical novel, which tells how Hayy, spontaneously generated on a desert island, teaches himself, through observation and rational thought, a system of philosophy that corresponds not only perfectly to Avicenna’s, but also to the inner, spiritual meaning of Islamic teaching.
Ibn Rushd (“Averroes” in Latin; 1126–98) was an Islamic judge and legal theorist, servant of the harshly anti-Jewish and anti-Christian Almohad regime, and also perhaps the most devoted Aristotelian of the Middle Ages. Whereas scholars in the Islamic East used Avicenna for studying falsafa, Averroes commented the letter of Aristotle’s text, as the Baghdad Peripatetics had done. He wrote short and “Middle” paraphrase commentaries on almost the entire Aristotelian corpus, and “Great” (detailed section by section expositions) on some of the texts. These detailed expositions of Aristotle proved invaluable to the Jewish and Christian scholars who read them in translation (§1.3.3, §1.3.4), although his interpretation of On the Soul in his Great commentary would prove very controversial (§3.3) (see also entry on Ibn Rushd’s natural philosophy) .
Moses ben Maimon (Maimonides in Latin; in Jewish scholarship “Rambam”; 1138–1204) was educated in Spain (see entry on the influence of Islamic thought on Maimonides) but was forced to flee by Almohad policy and settled in Egypt. Like Averroes, Maimonides looked back to Aristotle himself and al-Fārābī, and believed that Aristotle had achieved as perfect a science as possible. But how far was that science compatible with Jewish teaching? In his voluminous writings on Jewish law, he seems to have been willing to accept Aristotelian demonstration as providing the literal truth. In the Guide of the Perplexed, written late in his life, Maimonides undertakes a profound investigation of this question of (in)compatibility, ostensibly arguing against Aristotle’s central contention that the world is eternal (§3.1), which, he says, destroys Jewish law. At the beginning of the Guide, however, he explains that he will sometimes disguise his meaning, and some scholars believe that, correctly interpreted, the Guide supports the Aristotelian view, whilst others see its ultimate conclusions as sceptical.
2.7 University Philosophy
By about 1200, the Paris schools had become a university, and at much the same time a university developed at Oxford. Universities were split into Arts Faculties and the higher Faculties of Theology, Law and Medicine. Arts Faculties had by far the most students, and those who studied the higher disciplines were older and had usually been trained in the Arts Faculty or its equivalent. Grammar and logic were studied there from the beginning, but, as translations of the complete Aristotle gradually became available in the course of the thirteenth century, after some decades of ecclesiastical opposition, Arts Faculties became in effect Aristotelian Faculties, with the curriculum divided up according to his texts. Although universities were under the aegis of the Church, study in the Arts Faculties was supposed to be limited to natural knowledge, of which Aristotle, a pagan, was considered by almost all to be the supreme representative. Discussion of revealed truth—in a highly argumentative manner, with many purely philosophical digressions—took place in the Theology Faculties, which quickly came to be dominated by Franciscan and Dominican friars.
In the mid-thirteenth century, university philosophers were enthused by the newly available Aristotelian material, complimented by Avicenna’s presentations and understood with the aid of Averroes’s commentaries. The two most famous Parisian Arts masters, Siger of Brabant and Boethius of Dacia, working in the 1260 and 1270s, tried to develop Aristotelianism within its own terms, not merely independently of revealed doctrine (as they were required to do in the Faculty of Arts), but also irrespective of whether it contradicted Christian teaching. The Dominican theologian Thomas Aquinas (1225–74) was no less enthusiastic an Aristotelian, but he had an almost unlimited confidence that Aristotle had reached demonstrative conclusions which must, therefore, be true and, equally, because true, not be in contradiction with Christian doctrine (though Christian doctrine also included elements that could not be known except through revelation) (§3.1, §3.3). Siger and Boethius of Dacia were among the targets of a condemnation directed by the Bishop of Paris in 1277 (see entry on the Condemnation of 1277) against thinkers in the university. Aquinas, recently dead, did not escape completely, and he remained a controversial figure, though an authority for Dominicans (see also Aquinas’s moral, political, and legal philosophy).
In the next generation, Henry of Ghent (d. 1293), a member of the commission that drew up the condemnations, was the most influential Paris theologian. But it was John Duns Scotus (1265/5–1308), an Oxford Franciscan who was then sent to teach at Paris, who transformed the subject. He thoroughly absorbed Aristotelianism, but held that Aristotle’s conception of God was wrong, because it did not allow for divine choices (§3.2). He rejected the Aristotelian conception of modality (§3.2), stressed divine omnipotence and made divine will the determinant of good and evil. In his metaphysics, he introduced a range of subtle distinctions, vastly complicating the Aristotelian scheme. William of Ockham (c. 1287–1347), a Franciscan theologian who worked at Oxford and London before joining the Emperor, Ludwig of Bavaria, in order to flee a papal investigation, followed Scotus’s line on God’s will, but substituted for his metaphysics a very sparse ontology in which the distinctions Scotus had thrust on reality are made through a mental language. Ockham was also a dedicated logician, and he and his brilliant Oxford generation made great use of logical and linguistic analysis, not unlike Abelard and the twelfth-century Paris thinkers (§4.2). In Paris, John Buridan (d. 1360), the leading Arts Master for decades, and an outstanding logician, followed a similar programme, and, as an Aristotelian commentator, strove to be at once faithful to the pagan texts and yet respect the ultimate truth of Christian doctrine.
Although most accounts of Latin university philosophy tail off in the mid-fourteenth century, this style of philosophizing continued vigorously for at least three centuries (§5.2), and in this period universities were established all over Europe. Late in the fourteenth century, John Wyclif (d. 1384), trained at Oxford, elaborated a sophisticated and idiosyncratic system of philosophy and theology, aspects of which were taken up by Paul of Venice (d. 1429), the greatest logician of his time. The Arts Faculties of Italian universities flourished especially in the late fifteenth and sixteenth centuries; Pietro Pomponazzi (1462–1525) was the most famous of these teachers, and the most audacious in defending the prerogative of Arts Masters to expound the genuine thought of Aristotle, whatever its differences from Christian doctrine (§3.3). This tradition of university philosophy continued for nearly two more centuries, with thinkers like Giacomo Zabarella (d. 1589) in Italy and a host of important figures in Spain and Portugal (§5.2).
2.8 Latin Philosophy Outside the Universities (c. 1200–c. 1500)
Philosophy was also done in the medieval Latin world outside the universities, although historians are only just beginning to recognize it. Indeed, some of the most famous and widely studied vernacular literary masterpieces of the period are also works of philosophy. The most obvious example is Dante’s Divina Commedia, a study in Italian verse of love and moral conduct through an allegory of humans’ post mortem destiny. Although without a university education, Dante (who also wrote a highly original Latin treatise on politics) engages with the great thirteenth-century thinkers—Aquinas and his teacher, Albert the Great and, especially, the Arts Masters—on equal terms and as an original thinker (Imbach 1996; De Libera, Brenet, & Rosier-Catach 2019).
Dante was working in a tradition that went back to Boethius’s Consolation of Philosophy, a philosophical discussion using personification and an elaborate prose and verse literary form. The Consolation was translated into almost every European vernacular; its influence mixed with that of twelfth-century Latin works that looked back to it, such as Bernardus Silvestris’s Cosmographia (based also on the Timaeus) and Alain of Lille’s Complaint of Nature. The first of the vernacular philosophical poems to draw on this heritage was the continuation in the 1270s of the Roman de la Rose by Jean de Meun, a lawyer who had close connections with the University of Paris (Morton & Nievergelt 2020). With both the Roman and the Commedia in mind, the late fourteenth-century English writers Chaucer and Langland wrote philosophical poetry (Troilus and Criseyde, Piers Plowman) (Coleman 1981).
Moreover, some highly educated philosophers writing mainly in Latin worked outside the universities. Ramon Llull (1232–1315/16) wrote prolifically in Catalan as well as Latin and reportedly also in Arabic, devising his own logical system, unrelated to university logic, for thinking about God and his attributes and demonstrating the truth of Christianity. In the fifteenth century, non-university philosophers included the Cardinal and papal diplomat Nicholas of Cusa (1401–64), courtier and papal secretary Lorenzo Valla (1407–57), Marsilio Ficino (1433–99), protégé of the Medici in Florence, and the nobleman Pico della Mirandola (1463–94). They all developed their ideas in forms different from those common in the universities and held classical antiquity in high regard; Ficino was a noted Platonist (§1.3.2), Pico aimed to find wisdom in every available source, from the Kabbala to … university theology.
Women were excluded from most forms of higher education in the Middle Ages, but there were opportunities, none the less, for them to study and engage in certain forms of philosophy. Some of those described as “mystics” (such as Hildegard of Bingen, Margaret Porete, Mechthild of Magdeburg and others) engaged with philosophical issues. And there was Christine de Pizan (1364–c. 1430), a married woman, educated by her father, astrologer to the King of France, who supported her family by writing French poetry when her husband died. Her writing, at first lyrical verse, became philosophical, with Boethius but also Aquinas as points of reference, informed by a strong consciousness both of the restrictions placed on women and of their capabilities (König-Pralong 2012).
2.9 Jewish Philosophy in Christian Europe
Although distinctively Jewish philosophy in the Islamic world, written in Arabic, died out after Maimonides, it began to flourish, in Hebrew and using Hebrew translations of Arabic texts (§1.3.4), in the Jewish communities of Christian Europe, especially those in Spain, southern France and Italy. The central texts were Maimonides’s Guide and Averroes’s commentaries, especially his Middle ones, which Jewish thinkers often used in preference to Aristotle’s own texts and on which some wrote super-commentaries.
As explained (§2.6), Maimonides left it open how his Guide should be interpreted. While some Jewish thinkers in the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries thought that, even on a literal interpretation, his book conceded too much to philosophical ideas, a number of them, such as Samuel ibn Tibbon (d. 1232), responsible for one of the Hebrew translations, favoured an esoteric reading, which made the book more radically Aristotelian. Moses of Narbonne (d. after 1362) also read the Guide in this way and accepts most of Averroes’s views, including the idea that philosophy teaches the complete truth and religion provides a metaphorical version of it, suitable to be understood by ordinary people.
Levi ben Gershom (1288–1344; “Gersonides”) was also a keen reader of Maimonides and Averroes, but tried to reach his own view on the most debated questions, after reviewing the arguments on all sides; and, in his masterpiece, The Wars of the Lord, he also explains how his conclusions, based on argument, do in fact accord with the Torah. His views on divine prescience (§3.2) and the immortality of the soul (§3.3) are particularly striking examples of his wish to follow a philosophical position through to its ultimate consequences.
The Wars of Lord competes with Light of the Lord, by Hasdai Crescas (c. 1340–1410/11) as the most profound and adventurous medieval Hebrew philosophical treatise. Crescas too developed a bold theory about divine prescience, completely opposed to Gersonides’s (§3.2). Crescas considered himself an upholder of Jewish orthodoxy in opposition to Aristotelianism and found powerful arguments to challenge many of the fundamental tenets of Aristotelian science: he argued for the existence of a vacuum, the plurality of worlds, time without bodies and common laws governing sublunar and superlunar worlds.
Jewish thinkers were influenced not only by their own and the Arabic traditions. Gersonides may well, informally, have come to know about problems and techniques of Christian University Philosophy (Sirat, Klein-Braslavy, & Weijers 2003). Latin works were translated into Hebrew, and in the fifteenth century some Jewish thinkers, such as Abraham Bibago (d. before 1489) and Judah Messer Leon (d. 1498) had read widely in Latin philosophy (Zonta 2006), whilst Elijah Delmedigo (d. 1493) wrote in both Latin and Hebrew, mixed in Paduan university circles and translated for Pico della Mirandola.
2.10 Post-Classical Arabic Philosophy
“Post-classical” is the telling epithet used by specialists to denote Arabic philosophy after Avicenna, apart from that in twelfth-century Spain. It represents the mass of material that has not until recently been studied historically (although it remained a living tradition in some places even until the twentieth century). It is now exciting frontier territory for research.
Besides the widespread study of logic (§4.1), four factors shape philosophizing in this period: Avicenna, kalām, Sufism and al-Ghazālī, whose thinking already combined the first three. Avicenna’s encyclopaedias almost completely replaced Aristotle’s texts as points of reference and a commentary tradition on them, especially Pointers, continued for centuries. New encyclopaedias, on Avicennian lines, were written and themselves received commentaries. Although Avicenna had some faithful followers, the attitude to his work was usually critical. In his Book of What has Been Carefully Considered, Abū-l-Barakāt al-Baghdādī (born c. 1077), a Jew who converted to Islam only at the end of his life, sets out his differences from Avicenna on many points. His critical stance was taken up in the influential commentary on Pointers by Fakhr al-Dīn al-Rāzī (c. 1150–1210), some of whose attacks were answered in the commentary written by the leading thinker of the next generation, the polymathic al-Tūsī ((1201–74). Al-Rāzī was also a leading kalām theologian: he responded to al-Ghazālī’s criticism of falsafa by, it seems, teaching two different sets of doctrines, accepting—despite his criticisms—many of Avicenna’s central doctrines—in his commentary, but rejecting them in his kalām writings (Griffel 2021). But, as even al-Rāzī’s own case shows—since he wrote in both disciplines, in the post-classical period the distinctions between kalām and philosophy (no longer usually known by the Greek-derived term falsafa but as hikma—“wisdom”) were softened. For example, the very influential Book of Stations in Kalām by al-Ījī (d. 1355), which was commented on by al-Jurjānī (and that commentary in its turn gathered super-commentaries), sets out large parts of Avicenna’s teaching, although it argues against most of it (Dhanani 2017).
A different stream of reaction to Avicenna is found in the work of al-Suhrawardī (executed in 1191). He accepts Platonic Forms, while rejecting Aristotle’s view that there are universal forms within particulars: rather, we know real, particular things better directly through their presence than through discursive reasoning. Al-Suhrawardī initiated a School of “Illuminationist” (ishraqī) philosophers. Sufism was elaborated, with rich philosophical vocabulary and close reference to the philosophical tradition, though at a distance from it, by Ibn ‘Arabī (1165–1240), whose ideas were put into a more systematic form by al-Qūnawī (d. 1273/4).
All these elements were combined in succeeding years. For instance, in a famous debate at the beginning of the flowering of philosophy in Iran, al-Dawānī (d. 1501) read Avicenna in a manner influenced by Suhrawardī (on whom he commented) and Ibn ‘Arabī; whereas his critics, the al-Dashtakīs, father and son (d. 1498, d. 1542), kept closer to the text.
3. Three Medieval Problems
The three problems that will be discussed now in more detail—the eternity of the world; divine omniscience and human freedom; the soul and immortality—have been chosen for three reasons. They were each considered very important in all the traditions of medieval philosophy. They are, in the form discussed, specifically medieval (given the long and broad understanding of the Middle Ages advocated here), although closely linked to philosophical issues discussed before and since. Moreover—and it is for this reason above all that these three topics and not others were selected—they each cast a light on how religious concerns interacted with reasoning and on the different ways in which this took place within the spheres of each of the different religious traditions, and between these spheres.
3.1 The Eternity of the World
For Aristotle, the universe has no beginning, because every change requires a preceding change. The system of nature has always been as it is, and so it will continue.
The Aristotelian eternity of the world (everything apart from God) was acceptable to the late ancient Platonists, who held that the intelligible world emanates from God, but not to most Jews, Christians and Muslims. Their revealed religions hold that the world had a beginning, when it was created by God. Moreover, it seemed to them that God cannot be a creator, if the world is eternal.
John Philoponus (c. 490–570s), a Monophysite Christian who studied at the still pagan School of Alexandria, was eager to show, using their own tools, that his masters were wrong about the eternity of the world. According to his argument, taken up later in the Middle Ages, the world’s eternity is incompatible with Aristotle’s own principles. Aristotle held that there could not be an actual infinity: the infinity of days that precedes today if the world is eternal is merely potential. Philoponus claims, however, that, because each day is countable, an eternity of past time would be actually infinite. Since that is impossible, the world must have had a beginning (Philoponus, On Aristotle Physics 3 [1994: 428–430, 467–478] and Against Aristotle on the Eternity of the World [1987: 143–146]; Sorabj 1983: 214–215)
Exponents of falsafa from al-Fārābī onwards took a different approach. They accepted that the world is eternal, although they also maintained, in accord with Islamic teaching, that God is its agent and maker. In al-Ghazālī’s view (Incoherence, third discussion [2000: 55–77]), however, because they accepted the eternity of the world (and for some other reasons), they were entitled to use these descriptions only metaphorically. Averroes tried to rebut this accusation, minimizing the difference between his position and that of the theologians (Incoherence of the Incoherence, third discussion [1954: 87–155]). He claims (Decisive Treatise; [2001: 14–15]) that faylasuf and kalām theologians agree that there are three sorts of things: the bodies that make up the world, which are caused and the existence of which is preceded by time; God, who is uncaused and is not preceded by time; and the world as a whole, which time does not precede (because time does not exist without the motion of bodies), but which is brought into existence by an agent. The only difference is that the faylasuf hold that time has been going on infinitely, which the theologians deny.
By contrast, Maimonides—at least on a literal reading of his Guide of the Perplexed—rejects any attempt to reconcile the eternity of the world with the creative role of the Abrahamic God, which for him involves will and choice. Rather, he denies that Aristotle had succeeded in demonstrating the eternity of the world and claims even that Aristotle himself accepted he had not done so (II, 15 [1963: II, 289–293]). He does not, however, like Philoponus, try to demonstrate that the world has a beginning, but just provides strong, but non-demonstrative arguments for the position. The strongest of them binds his views here even more tightly with his idea of God as a wilful agent. Maimonides argues that his account of physics in the sublunary world, Aristotle’s account of how the universe derives from the One (Maimonides has in mind the emanation theory developed by al-Fārābī) is explanatorily insufficient. The only way he sees that the required explanation can be provided is through God’s will: it happens in this way, because God so chooses. But God can will and choose, Maimonides thinks, only if the world he created has a beginning (II, 19–25 [1963: II, 302–330]).
For Christians, it was clear Church doctrine that the world has a beginning, and in the thirteenth-century Latin universities some theologians tried to use Philoponian arguments to claim this position could be demonstrated. Like Maimonides, Boethius of Dacia (Boethius of Dacia ), the leading Arts Master in the 1260s–70s, did not accept that either these arguments, or those for the eternity of the world, are demonstrative. But he also thought that a practitioner of Aristotelian natural science (one of the roles of an Arts Master) had to go further and actually deny the world has a beginning, because natural science is founded on the principle that every change requires a preceding change. In order to save Arts Masters from heresy, Boethius advocates a limited relativism. When natural scientists state that the world has no beginning, they are saying that the world has no beginning according to the principles of natural science, a position in harmony with the true Christian doctrine, according to which it does have a beginning.
In his On the Eternity of the World, Aquinas’s position is in some ways similar. He accepts on faith that, in fact, the world had a beginning, but rejects rather contemptuously the Philoponian arguments used by some of his contemporaries. He wishes, however, to argue for a different point: that it could have been the case that the world has always existed and yet “is caused by God according to everything that is in it”. Aquinas sharply distinguishes this position from the view that “something other than God could have always existed, as if something could exist and not be made by him”—which, he says, not just Christian teaching, but the philosophers reject as an “abominable error”. He is right, indeed, that the philosophers—not Aristotle, but Avicenna and Averroes!—did hold that the world was “made” by God. But, as al-Ghazālī pointed out, it is very unclear how—within the Aristotelian modal scheme Avicenna, Averroes and he all accepted (§3.2)—an eternal world leaves room for God to make the world in the sense Aquinas certainly meant: that of willing and choosing it.
3.2 Divine Omniscience and Human Freedom: The Problem of Prescience
God, according to almost every late ancient and medieval philosopher, whether pagan, Jew, Christian, or Muslim, is omniscient, and so, they believed, he knows the future. But if he already knows my future volitions and actions, how can they be free, since it would seem that I cannot will or act otherwise than as he knows I shall? There are ways of formulating this Problem of Prescience in which it becomes a pseudo-problem, based on failing to see that the wide scope necessity that necessarily (if God—or anyone—knows that p, then p) does not entail the necessity of p. Peter Abelard thought that, by pointing out this fallacious reasoning, he had solved the problem. His solution was influential, but it misses what Boethius had noticed, six centuries previously in his Consolation, Book V (Marenbon 2005: 55–116). There is a genuine problem, because God does not just know, but foreknows. Boethius sees the argument as follows (see entry Boethius, §6). Future contingent events are ones that may turn out one way or the other, but to be known—rather than opined or guessed about—the future must be fixed. For God to know the future, as he does, it must therefore be fixed, and so there are no contingent events. But this, he believes, removes the foundation for morality and the value of prayer. Boethius rejects this unwelcome conclusion by appealing to the principle that
everything that is perceived is grasped not according to its own force but rather according to the capability of those who perceive it (Consolation V, pr. 4.25 [2001: 138])
a principle that relativises cognition to different types of cognizer. On its basis, he can say that many future events (such as those that depend on the exercise of my will) are in themselves unfixed and contingent, but they are fixed and necessary as known by God. This divine mode of cognition can to some extent be explained by God’s relation to time. He exists in eternity, not time. According to many interpreters, God is thereby atemporal, but it is more likely that Boethius meant that God has a special relationship to time, by which he intellectually grasps all its fleeting moments at once and so he perceives every moment of time as if it were the present. Just as we can watch a chariot race and know who is in the lead, without thereby constraining the competitors, so God knows all things, past, present and future, as if they were present.
Aquinas followed Boethius, though with greater understanding of the logical structure of the question. Scotus, however, took a completely different approach (Lectura I 39 ). Almost all medieval thinkers accepted that God’s knowledge does not depend on its objects, as human knowledge does, but brings them about. Boethius put this problem aside, but Scotus faces up directly to explaining how, if God brings about all things about by knowing them, anything can be contingent. The incompatibility is avoided, Scotus argues, if and only if God himself wills contingently. But the understanding of necessity most thirteenth-century university thinkers took from Aristotle would not allow God to will or act contingently. What is necessary, they held, is equivalent to what is always the case, and so the will of God, who all agreed exists always and never changes, is necessary. Scotus made explicit a different understanding of modality, in which possibility and necessity are not reducible to temporal conditions. God’s will is unchanging through all time, but it might have been different. (Knuuttila 1993: 139–149; and entry on medieval theories of modality).
Avicenna and Averroes, who followed Aristotle in holding that God does not know particulars, but only universals, do not face the Problem of Prescience. Rather, both thinkers felt the need to explain how, in some indirectway, God’s knowledge is not strictly limited to universals. Maimonides tried to reconcile both the tension between Aristotle’s God and a providential one, and divine prescience and contingency, through his radically negative theology, according to which everything about God’s essence, as opposed to his effects, is unknowable for us. “Know” as applied to God, he explains, is used equivocally from “know” as we usually employ the word, about humans. We cannot understand what it means for God to know (although we can gain some glimmer of understanding by thinking of the special grasp a maker has of what he makes), but we can be sure that he knows everything, including future contingents (Maimonides, Guide III, 20 [1963: 480–484]).
Gersonides was, understandably, dissatisfied with Maimonides’s position. Maimonides was celebrated for insisting that belief in God’s incorporeality is fundamental to Judaism: anyone who denies it is not a Jew. But if language used about God is really equivocal, Gersonides points out, how does Maimonides know that “God is a body” is false? (Wars III.3 [1987: 107–115]). Gersonides himself is willing, not unlike Avicenna and Averroes, to restrict God’s knowledge to the general outlines of how the world is ordered, but he holds that the precise details of humans’ lives, though not the rest of nature, are determined by him indirectly, through the stars. He escapes the determinism that this might imply, however, by allowing for an exception. Humans have the power, by using their intellects, to change what is astrally determined for them. Suppose it is astrally determined that I spend this evening partying, I am none the less able to grasp intellectually that it would be better to devote it to reading Gersonides and, despite the stars, stay at home with The Wars of the Lord (Wars III, 3–4 [1987: 107–131]).
By contrast, Crescas firmly held that God foreknows the particular events of people’s lives, and that these are causally determined, ultimately by God. He accepts the deterministic consequences of this view, because, like compatibilists today, he does not think them inconsistent with human striving to achieve ends and being punished for misdeeds. He distinguishes between what an agent does because of its nature and what it does because it is causally determined (the latter, he says, is possible in itself, but necessary through another). If humans became rich as part of their nature, then their efforts to make money would be in vain. But, given that this is not the case, the fact that their efforts are causally necessary does not make them futile: on the contrary, they belong to the chain of causes that results in becoming rich. Similarly, although, if I desist in the future from committing some crime it will be causally necessary that I do so, the punishment laid down for it is valuable because it (through its deterrent effect) is part of that causal chain.
3.3 The Soul and Immortality
Plato thought of human souls as distinct substances from their bodies, capable of existing separately and being reincarnated. The late ancient Platonists retained this dualism and aimed so far as possible even in their mortal lives to release their souls from their bodies and find union with the One. By contrast, for Aristotle the soul is the form of a living body, that which accounts for its life functions, just as the form of a non-living thing—the form of stoneness in a stone—accounts for its being the sort of thing it is. A plant, then, grows and goes through its life cycle in virtue of its vegetative soul. A non-human animal’s soul is not just vegetative but also sensitive: it accounts for the animal’s ability to move and to perceive with its senses. The human soul accounts for all these capabilities, and it also has intellect: it can think intellectually about universals. If the soul is the form of a body, survival independently of the body would seem impossible in principle. There are, however, passages in Aristotle’s On the Soul (especially 430a [Chapter 5]) that suggest that the intellect is imperishable, but they probably are not intended to refer to individual human souls.
By contrast with both Plato and Aristotle, a core belief for Jews, Christians, and Muslims is in a bodily resurrection, which is linked to punishment for sins and reward for a good life. Christians also developed the doctrine that, in the period between death and the Final Judgement, people’s souls survive separately and can be rewarded, purged, or consigned to eternal punishment.
Avicenna went against the Islamic doctrine of bodily resurrection and, reading Aristotle from a Platonist perspective, argued that each human has an intellect which, unlike the other parts of the soul, is immaterial—if it were not immaterial, he argues, it could not perceive universals—and, being immaterial, is immortal (see, e.g., the passage from The Salvation translated in Khalidi 2005: 27–58). Averroes, too, was unwilling to accept bodily resurrection in any straightforward way, and, in face of al-Ghazālī’s criticisms of Avicenna in this regard, he falls back on saying that philosophers uphold resurrection because they hold that the masses should believe this widely-held religious doctrine and so they do not contradict it publicly (Averroes Incoherence [1954: 359–363]). Averroes does not, however, at all follow Avicenna’s Platonizing interpretation of Aristotle’s views about the soul: in his Great Commentary on On the Soul, he argues that there is, indeed, an imperishable intellect, but it is an independently existing immaterial being. It needs humans, however, for thinking to take place, since thinking requires images, which humans process in their corporeal brains. Just as the book in front of me makes the visual perception I am having of it veridical, so the processed images in our brains of bodily things enable the one independent, immaterial intellect to think truly using universals.
Maimonides considered that the only genuine pleasures are intellectual ones, and the type of bodily rewards that were often associated with the Resurrection are not only without value, except as incentives for those who lack wisdom, but also misleading, because we should act in accord with God’s law for love of God, not from hope of reward (Commentary on Mishnah, Introduction to Sanhedrin [translated in “Maimonides on the Jewish Creed”, 1906]). He none the less asserted the Resurrection as part of the Jewish creed, and rejected criticisms that he had ever denied it. As in many places, his genuine position is open to interpretation.
Avicenna’s interpretation of Aristotle proved very attractive to the earlier thirteenth-century Latin university thinkers, since it harmonized with Augustine’s dualistic view of soul and body, which had predominated until On the Soul became known (see Hasse 2000). Once it was understood properly, Averroes’s theory was recognized as clearly contrary to Christian teaching, since it excluded individual immortality. But many Arts Masters from the 1260s through to the sixteenth century continued to champion it as the correct interpretation of Aristotle and the best theory so far as natural reason is concerned, although wrong, because contradicted by revealed truth. Aquinas, however, castigated Averroes’s theory as a misunderstanding of Aristotle, and also as incoherent, since it makes humans into the objects of thought rather than thinkers. He also rejected Avicenna’s dualist reading, insisting that each human has their own intellective soul, which is the form of their body. He then explained the separate survival of the human soul by arguing that its special activity, thinking intellectually, is one that does not take place in a corporeal organ (as sight takes place in the eyes), and so it is a subsisting thing, independent of the body.
The fiercest medieval criticism of Aquinas’s theory was in On the Immortality of the Soul, published by Pietro Pomponazzi in 1516. Pomponazzi begins by declaring that he accepts the immortality of the human soul as a truth, known by revelation, and that Aquinas’s argument for its immortality is the best that can be made. He opposes both Averroes’s view and a Platonic dualism, which Ficino had quite recently revived. But he seems to have just as many objections to Aquinas. In particular, he points out that, according to Aristotle, although intellectual thinking is immaterial, it cannot take place without there going on at the same time a play of mental images, which are sensible things and require a bodily organ, the brain. The human intellect is, therefore, dependent on the body, not in the activity of thinking itself, but with respect to a necessary condition for it. Some historians think that, given the strength of his attack, and the fact that he goes on to explain why a rejection of the soul’s immortality need not have bad moral consequences, Pomponazzi did not really accept Christian teaching about the afterlife. It is more plausible, however, that he—like Boethius of Dacia in the thirteenth century—was mainly concerned to protect the prerogative of Arts Masters to interpret Aristotle and work within natural reason, even when that meant contradicting Church doctrine.
4. The Importance of Logic
In the Ancient World, sophisticated systems of logic were developed by Aristotle and by the Stoics, but, unlike rhetoric, logic was never a standard part of education then. By contrast, in both the Islamic world and in Latin Europe during the Middle Ages logic became a fundamental discipline, not just within philosophy (as it has been for the last century in the Anglophone world), but for anyone receiving more than the most basic education.
4.1 Arabic Logic
By the early tenth century, the whole of Aristotle’s Organon was available in Arabic. It was an extended Organon, which included the Rhetoric and the Poetics. Logic was seen as providing the rules for different sorts of discourse, of varying levels of intellectual value. At the bottom were poetic syllogisms, then rhetoric, then the dialectical syllogisms of the Topics and finally, as the peculiar preserve of philosophers, demonstration, the theory set out in the Prior Analytics and applied to knowledge in the Posterior Analytics and, so it was thought, according to which Aristotle constructed his entire system of thought. Avicenna did not reject this overall view, but he was mainly interested in refashioning Aristotle’s (demonstrative) syllogistic, even more thoroughly than he reshaped his metaphysics and natural science. He combined categorical and hypothetical syllogistic into a single theory, and he vastly complicated Aristotle’s system by introducing temporal qualifications into every sort of syllogism (see entry on Ibn Sina’s logic). Except in Islamic Spain, Avicenna’s logic replaced Aristotle’s.
Falsafa, however, always remained the pursuit of a small minority, at the edges of the world of Islamic education. The position of logic was transformed by al-Ghazālī. Whereas his attitude to falsafa was ambiguous, he declared that logic—he had in mind Avicenna’s version of Aristotelian syllogistic—was useful, even essential, for the Islamic sciences, such as law, that occupied much of the curriculum in the madrasas, which were beginning to flourish in his time. Following his lead, logic became a fixed part of madrasa education. In the thirteenth century, succinct logical textbooks were written, such as al-Abharī’s Īsāghūjī and al-Kātibī’s Shamsiyya, which were then the subject of many commentaries. The concerns of madrasa logic were formal: developing further Avicenna’s path in syllogistic, especially modal syllogistic, relational syllogisms and the Liar Paradox. This tradition was continued in Iran, Turkey and India, each of these regions increasingly separated from the others, down to the nineteenth century. (See the entry on Arabic and Islamic philosophy of language and logic.)
4.2 Latin Logic
In the Latin world, the pattern of education established from c. 800 in monasteries and cathedral schools (§2.2) gave logic a central role, in what was the mainstream of higher education, despite very limited access to the ancient sources.
Although the sophisticated philosophy developed in this context by thinkers like Abelard was the preserve of the elite twelfth-century Paris schools, it had by then become normal for everyone being trained intellectually in Latin Europe to learn at least basic Aristotelian logic and the theory of topical inference, as developed in later antiquity and transmitted by Boethius. With the founding of the universities and the expansion of the syllabus to include the whole range of disciplines covered by Aristotle, it might seem that logic lost its preeminent position. But it had not, for two reasons. First, the early years of the Arts course were almost entirely devoted to logic, and many students did not remain at university any longer; moreover, they would often have received some instruction in logic before coming (in their early teens) to university, and there was further study of logic in the higher faculties of Law and Medicine (see Brumberg 2021: 95–97). Second, while the influx of new texts made many of the leading thirteenth-century university thinkers more interested in metaphysics, natural science, epistemology and ethics than in logic, the Oxford thinkers of the 1320s—not just Ockham, but his fellow Franciscans Walter Chatton (d. 1343/4) and Adam Wodeham (d. 1358) and the Dominican Robert Holcot/Holkot (d. 1349)—made frequent use of sophisticated logical techniques in their theological discussions, setting a fashion that would also be imitated in Paris (see Courtenay 1987: 171–306).
In the Arabic tradition, Aristotelian logic was at first studied by close reading of Aristotle’s own texts, but Avicenna then replaced Aristotle as the authority, and then often later textbooks replaced his work (§1.1). Almost the reverse process took place in the Latin world. From consisting mainly of encyclopaedic accounts, the logical syllabus moved to being constituted of a couple of Aristotle’s works, supplemented by Porphyry and Boethius (the logica vetus) by the eleventh century, and once the rest of the Organon (the logica nova) became available, by the early thirteenth century, Aristotle’s logic (augmented just by Porphry’s Introduction and a twelfth-century text supplementing the Categories) was studied in detail in the universities, continuing to the sixteenth century, and even later in Spain. This tradition of commentary, although never abandoning Aristotle’s text, often resulted in sorting out the difficulties in his presentation and reworking his logic (as, for example, in the commentary on the Prior Analytics by Robert Kilwardby from the 1240s: see Thom 2019).
From the late twelfth century there also developed in the Latin tradition what was called the logica modernorum (“contemporary logic”)—a variety of new branches of the subject not found in Aristotle. The most important of them concern the properties of terms (the analysis of the reference of words—their “supposition”—within the context of sentences (see entry on Medieval theories: properties of terms); consequentiae (propositional logic, by contrast with Aristotelian term logic—see entry on medieval theories of consequence); sophismata (deliberately ambiguous sentences and/or ones with apparently puzzling consequences that can be explained by semantic analysis, such as “Something white will be black”); insolubles (insolubilia—paradoxes, such as that of the Liar); and obligations (an argument game, involving counterfactual statements and testing the contestants’ ability to remain consistent). Specialized treatises were written on each of these topics, but the most popular textbook of all, the Treatise, known as the Summule logicales, written by Peter of Spain probably c. 1125–50, which combines the logica vetus and nova with a long exposition of the theory of the property of terms. Peter (whoever he was: see Peter of Spain Summaries, 1–9) was not in fact an outstanding logician, but his work, by then the standard textbook, was adapted, with enormous licence, in the mid-fourteenth century as a vehicle for his also very widely-read Summule de dialectica, by the greatest logician of the time, John Buridan. Work within the logica modernorum went on until the mid-sixteenth century.
4.3 Logic in Byzantium and among the Jews
Although logic did not have the same prominent place in Byzantine education as in the Latin schools and universities, or in the madrasas, there was a continuous tradition of its study, based on exegesis of the Organon and strongly influenced by the late ancient School of Alexandria.
There were no outstanding logicians among the Jews in the Islamicate world, but in Christian Europe from the thirteenth century onwards a lively tradition of logic grew up. It was based initially on Hebrew translations of al-Fārābī’s short commentaries and Averroes’s middle commentaries on Aristotle’s Organon and the logical part of al-Ghazālī’s Opinions. But Jewish scholars also became familiar with some Latin material, such as Peter of Spain’s Treatise (especially the parts on the logica vetus). Gersonides was an original logician, who wrote widely-studied supercommentaries on Averroes’s middle commentaries, where he is often critical of Averroes, and a treatise, the Book of the Correct Syllogism, remarkable for its degree of formalization (see Manekin 2012).
5. When Was Medieval Philosophy?
Whereas specialists are mostly agreed, in theory at least, about the new, broad conception of the geography of medieval philosophy, opinion about the period’s chronology remains divided. There is, indeed, a widespread view (e.g., De Rijk 1985: 1–64; Luscombe 1997: 1; Flasch 1986 [2000: 27–29]; Lagerlund 2020: v) that period divisions are unimportant and are chosen for purely practical reasons in order to allow for a division of labour. But, as will emerge below, the choice of period divisions makes a great difference to how the history of philosophy is written, and arguments can be made from the continuity and breaks in traditions for different periodizations (Marenbon 2011).
5.1 When Did Medieval Philosophy Begin?
There are three main points commonly chosen for the beginning of medieval philosophy:
- c. 500, a date often chosen by historians for the start of the Middle Ages and corresponding roughly to the end of the Roman Empire in the West (the last Emperor was deposed in 476);
- with the earliest Christian philosophers in the second century (but usually omitting the pagan Greek tradition; or
- around 800, because this was the time of both the philosophical stirrings at Charlemagne’s court and the start of falsafa in Baghdad.
There are problems with each view:
- The justification for c. 500 applies only to Latin philosophy, and
- that for the second century only to Christian philosophy; while
- ignores Greek philosophy and also threatens to leave Latin philosophy between 500 and 800, which historians of classical philosophy disdain, outside consideration.
If the medieval tradition is being envisaged in all four of its main branches, there is some virtue in seeing the point of departure in the work of Plotinus (d. 270) and Porphyry (d. 305?) and including too the other Greek pagan material. All four branches are rooted in the so-called Platonic Schools, and they took their orientation from these two philosophers. Of course, historians of ancient philosophy will also want to include some of the thinkers in the earliest centuries of this period in their field, but that is not a problem, because there is no reason why periods in the history of philosophy should not overlap.
5.2 When Did Medieval Philosophy End?
Many different answers might be given to this question, but a plausible (and to many people surprising) one is: around about 1700, except that the Arabic tradition, in logic especially, lasted rather longer.
The Arabic tradition continued, especially in Persia, Turkey and India through the seventeenth century and, especially in logic (see §4.1), beyond. The outstanding centre was Safavid Iran, where Ṣadr al-Din Shīrāzī (known as Mullā Ṣadrā, 1571–1636) developed an original system of thought on the basis of Avicennian Aristotelianism itself, and as modified by Suhrawardī, and the mystical ideas of Ibn ‘Arabi. New research shows that in the seventeenth century the Ottoman Empire, too, was the home to innovative philosophizing, sometimes taking the earlier Iranian tradition as its starting point (El-Rouayheb 2015).
The tradition of Jewish philosophy in Hebrew in Christian Europe largely came to an end with the expulsion of the Jews from Spain in 1492, though it continued for another century in Turkey (see Tirosh-Samuelson 1997: 529–545). But Jewish philosophy in Europe continued with the Dialogues of Love by Judah Abrabanel, known as Leone Ebreo (d. after 1521), preserved and probably written in Italian. If, as proposed below, the Latin tradition of medieval philosophy is considered to stretch on until around 1700, then perhaps Spinoza (1632–77), who wrote in Latin and, rarely, in Dutch, an outcast from his people and a critical admirer of Descartes, but also steeped in the thought of Maimonides and Ḥasdai Crescas, should be regarded as the last of the medieval Jewish philosophers.
The Byzantine tradition was afflicted by the Fall of Constantinople in 1453, but theological and philosophical speculation in Greek continued under Turkish rule, strongly linked with the earlier tradition, but influenced by Latin scholastic thinking in the seventeenth century, and by new trends in European thinking in the eighteenth (Podskalsky 1988).
Fixing the end point of the Latin medieval tradition is difficult. Although the traditional and still widespread date of 1500 is often today said to have no significance, that year has often been chosen by general historians to mark the beginning of modern times, as a round figure near to 1492, the date of Columbus’s first voyage to the New World, and 1517, the beginning of the Reformation, which would destroy the apparent unity of Catholic Europe. Many medieval historians now, however, do not wish to place a boundary at this time and stress the continuities in economic and social life that lasted until the Industrial Revolution. In any case, there is no reason why periodizations in the history of philosophy should coincide with those in other areas.
In many multi-part or multi-volume presentations, Medieval Philosophy is followed by Renaissance Philosophy and then by (Early) Modern Philosophy, beginning with Descartes. “Renaissance philosophers” are identified as usually working outside the universities; many of them enthusiasts for Plato and other ancient philosophers, as well as, or instead of, Aristotle; many eager to write elegant classical Latin and to learn Greek, and to use literary forms such as the dialogue. There was indeed a group of such philosophers, but they do not fit into a chronology that places Renaissance Philosophy after Medieval Philosophy: the most famous of them are Marsilio Ficino and Pico della Mirandola (§2.8), neither of whom survived until 1500.
University philosophy continued in its established patterns, with some important changes (such as dropping study of the Metaphysics) in Protestant countries, until late in the seventeenth century. In the Iberian peninsula, the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries were the period in which philosophical theology, studied in the established university manner, flourished (see entry on the School of Salamanca). The tradition is continuous with the earlier Parisian one, since its founder, Francisco de Vitoria (1486–1546) was a pupil of the last of the great Paris University theologians, the Scot John Major (1467–1550). Among Vitoria’s well-known successors were Domingo de Soto (d. 1560), Luis de Molina (d. 1600)—who held that God has a special knowledge of the choices we shall make, but that he does not control these choices, and Francisco Suárez (b. 1548), one of the deepest and most powerful thinkers in the whole Latin tradition. One of the few big differences from earlier medieval university thinking was the central importance given to Aquinas (although Suárez was also influenced by Scotus and Ockham), whose Summa Theologiae was now an object of commentary. Suárez’s death in 1617 (more than twenty years after Descartes’s birth) does not mark the end of this university tradition, but its development into the adventurous thought, striking out in new directions in metaphysics and meta-ethics, of until recently forgotten thinkers such as Pedro Hurtado de Mendoza (d. 1641), his pupil, Rodrigo de Arriaga (d. 1667) and Juan Caramuel y Lobkowitz (d. 1682).
The interest of this “baroque scholasticism” is now beginning to be recognized (see Novotný 2009). At the same time, some of the best scholars in the field have written studies that deliberately cut across the usual medieval to modern philosophy divide, looking at metaphysics from 1274 to 1671 (Pasnau 2011) or theories about emotion from 1270 to 1670 (Perler 2011 ). These approaches still tend to accept the standard idea that medieval philosophy ended, and modern philosophy began sometime around 1500 or at least before 1600, underlining continuities or pleading for the existence of “medieval philosophy after the Middle Ages”. A radical suggestion, however, would be to place the ending of medieval Latin philosophy round about 1700 (allowing, of course, for an overlap with early modern philosophy), since it was only by then that the effects of the New Science and Cartesianism had worked their way into university education and the Aristotelian tradition was disappearing (although by no means everywhere in Europe).
A. General Histories of Medieval Philosophy
This list includes only those that cover more than one branch of the tradition. Those devoted to one branch exclusively are cited in the relevant sections, and their details are in the References section below.
- Adamson, Peter, 2015–2022, A History of Philosophy
without any Gaps, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- volume 2, Philosophy in the Hellenistic and Roman Worlds, 2015
- volume 3, Philosophy in the Islamic World, 2016
- volume 4, Medieval Philosophy, 2019
- volume 6, Byzantine and Renaissance Philosophy, 2022
[Jewish philosophy in Hebrew is considered briefly in volume 3, 249–91. Volume 4 stops just after 1400; Volume 3 continues to modern times. These books are based on a podcast (https://historyofphilosophy.net/, which continues.]
- De Libera, Alain, 1993, La philosophie
médiévale, Paris: Presses universitaires de France.
[This book pioneered the idea of presenting the four branches of medieval philosophy together: it begins c. 500 and ends with the fifteenth century.]
- Grundriss der Geschichte der Philosophie. Die Philosophie des
Mittelalters. Philosophie in der islamischen Welt, Berlin:
[The Grundriss—“the New Ueberweg”—is conceived as a comprehensive handbook to the history of philosophy. In Die Philosophie des Mittelalters series, there have been published
- volume 1 on philosophy in Byzantium and among the Jews (a short essay) (see below Brungs, Kapriev, and Mudroch 2019),
- volume 3 on Latin philosophy in the twelfth century (see below Cesalli, Imbach, De Libera, and Ricklin 2021), and
- volume 4 on Latin philosophy in the thirteenth century (see below Brungs, Mudroch, and Schulthess 2017).
In Philosophie in der islamischen Welt, there have been published
- volume I, on eighth–tenth centuries (see below Rudolph 2012) and
- volume II, Part 1, on eleventh–twelfth centuries in the East and Central areas (see below Rudolph 2021).
An online translated version of Volume 1 of the Islamic series has been produced by Brill under the title Philosophy in the Islamic World Online: 8th–10th Centuries)]
- Lagerlund, Henrik (ed.), 2020, Encyclopedia of Medieval
Philosophy, second edition, Dordrecht, Heidelberg, London and New
York: Springer. doi:10.1007/978-94-024-1665-7
[Covers all four branches, 500–1500 CE, articles on individual figures and sources (very wide range) and a smaller number of topical articles. Treatment normally less full than in Stanford Encyclopedia, when there is an entry there.]
- Marenbon, John, 2007, Philosophy: An Historical and
Philosophical Introduction, London/New York: Routledge.
[Covers all four branches, but scant on Arabic philosophy post-1100 except in Spain. Stops at 1400.]
- ––– (ed.), 2012a, The Oxford Handbook of
Medieval Philosophy, New York: Oxford University Press.
[Covers all four branches, but weak on on Arabic philosophy post-1100 except in Spain. Part One contains historico-geographical chapters, Part Two studies of philosophical topics. The focus of most of the topical chapters, in practice though not by design, is on Latin philosophy, 1100–1350.]
- Pasnau, Robert (ed.), 2014, The Cambridge History of Medieval
Philosophy, second edition, 2 volumes, Cambridge: Cambridge
University Press. doi:10.1017/CHO9781107446953
[Organized topically. Strong focus on Latin tradition in most, though not all, chapters.]
B. Useful Anthologies of Translated texts
- Foltz, Bruce (ed.), 2019, Medieval Philosophy: A Multicultural
Reader, London and New York: Bloomsbury.
[Extracts from existing translations of texts from all four branches]
- Khalidi, Muhammad (ed.), 2005, Medieval Islamic Philosophical
Writings, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
[Selections from central texts, in new translations.]
- Klima, Gyula (ed.), 2007, Medieval Philosophy: Essential
Readings with Commentary, Oxford: Blackwell.
[Selections, ordered by topic, of existing translations from Latin tradition, up to 1350]
- Manekin, Charles (ed.), 2008, Medieval Jewish Philosophical
Writings, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
[Selections from central texts, in new or revised translations.]
- Schoedinger, Andrew, 1996, Readings in Medieval
Philosophy, New York: Oxford University Press.
[Large selection of texts, many well-known, mainly but not entirely from Latin tradition, some newly translated.]
- The Cambridge Translations of Medieval Philosophical
Texts, Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press
- Volume 1: Logic and the Philosophy of Language, Norman Kretzmann and Eleonore Stump (eds.), 1988. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139171557
- Volume 2: Ethics and Political Philosophy, Arthur Stephen McGrade, John Kilcullen, and Matthew Kempshall (eds.), 2001. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511609183
- Volume 3: Mind and Knowledge, Robert Pasnau (ed.), 2002. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511606243
[New translations of less well known but important material in the Latin tradition]
Marenbon, John, “Medieval Philosophy”, Oxford Bibliographies (abstract is freely available on-line, the rest of the content is available by subscription)
There are many other bibliographies in this series relevant to the field: Ashworth, Jenny, “Medieval Logic”; Penner, Sidney, “Scholasticism and Aristotelianism: fourteenth to seventeenth centuries” and on Aquinas, Boethius, Dante, Duns Scotus, Pico della Mirandola, William of Ockham.
D.1 Primary Texts
- Al-Ghazali, The Incoherence of the Philosophers: A Parallel English-Arabic Text (Tahāfut al-Falāsifah), Michael E. Marmura (trans.), Provo, UT: Brigham Young University Press, 2000.
- Aquinas, Thomas, Aquinas against the Averroists. On There Being Only One Intellect (De unitate intellectus contra Averroistas, Ralph McInerny (trans.) (parallel text), West Lafayette, IN: Purdue University Press, 1993.
- Averroes, Tahafut al-Tahafut (The Incoherence of the Incoherence), 2 volumes, Simon van den Bergh (trans.), Cambridge: Gibb Memorial Trust, 1954.
- –––, Decisive Treatise and Epistle Dedicatory (Faṣl al-maqāl fīmā bayna al-sharīʻah wa-al-ḥikmah min al-ittiṣāl), parallel text, Charles E. Butterworth (trans.), Provo, UT: Brigham Young University Press, 2001.
- –––, Long Commentary on the “De Anima” of Aristotle (Sharḥ Kitāb al-nafs), Richard C. Taylor (trans.), New Haven, CT/London: Yale University Press, 2009.
- –––, Metaphysics Book
Lam: Ibn Rushd’s Metaphysics, Charles
Gennequand (trans.) Leiden: Brill, 1984 (Islamic Philosophy
and Theology: Texts and Studies, 1).
(Islamic Philosophy and Theology: Texts and Studies, 1), pp. 197–8.
- Avicenna, The Metaphysics of ‘The Healing’: A Parallel English-Arabic Text (al-Ilahīyāt min al-Shifāʼ), Michael E. Marmura (trans.), Provo, UT: Brigham Young University Press, 2005.
- Boethius, Anicius Manlius Severinus, On the Consolation of Philosophy (De consolatione philosophiae), Joel Relihan (trans.), Indianapolis, IN/Cambridge: Hackett, 2001.
- Boethius of Dacia, On the Supreme Good : On the Eternity of the World : On Dreams (De summo bono, De aeternitate mundi, and De somniis), John F. Wippel (trans.), Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, 1987.
- Crescas, Ḥasdai, Light of the Lord (Or Hashem), Roslyn Weiss (trans.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2018.
- Duns Scotus, John, Contingency and Freedom. Lectura I 39, A. Vos Jaczn, H. Veldhuis, A. H. Looman-Graaskamp, E. Dekker, and N. W. Den Bok (trans/eds), (New Synthese Historical Library 42), Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1994.
- Gersonides, Wars of the Lord (Milḥamot ha-Shem) volume 2 (includes Books II–IV), Seymour Feldman (trans.), Philadelphia/New York/Jerusalem: Jewish Publication Society, 1987.
- Maimonides, Moses, The Guide of the Perplexed, Shlomo Pines (trans.), Chicago/London: University of Chicago Press, 1963
- –––, “Maimonides on the Jewish Creed”, The Jewish Quarterly Review (commentary on the tenth chapter of the Mishna Tractage Sanhedrin), J. Abelson (trans.), 1906, 19(1): 24–58. doi:10.2307/1451103
- Peter of Spain, Summaries of Logic. Text, Translation, Introduction, and Notes, Brian P. Copenhaver, Calvin G. Normore, and Terence Parsons (trans. and ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press
- Philoponus, John, Against Aristotle on the Eternity of the World (De aeternitate mundi contra Aristotelem), Christian Wildberg (trans.), London: Duckworth and Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1987.
- –––, On Aristotle Physics 3 (Eis to 3. tēs Aristotelous Physikēs akroaseōs), Mark J. Edwards (trans.), London: Duckworth and Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1994.
- Pomponazzi, Pietro, 1516, On the Immortality of the Soul (Tractatus de immortalitate animae), translated by William Henry Hay II and John Herman Randall, Jr, in The Renaissance Philosophy of Man, Ernst Cassirer, Paul Oskar Kristeller, and John Herman Randall, Jr. (eds), Chicago/London: University of Chicago Press, 1948, 280–381.
D.2 Secondary Works
- Abram, Marieke, Steven Harvey, and Lukas Mühlethaler (eds.), 2022, The Popularization of Philosophy in Medieval Islam, Judaism, and Christianity, (Philosophy in the Abrahamic Traditions of the Middle Ages 3), Turnhout: Brepols.
- Adamson, Peter and Richard Taylor, 2004, The Cambridge Companion to Arabic Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
- Bäck, Allan, 2021, “Qualification”, in Cross and Paasch 2021: 19–30.
- Bazán, Bernardo C., John W. Wippel, Gérard Fransen, and Danielle Jacquart (eds.), 1985, Les Questions disputées et les questions quodlibétiques dans les facultés de théologie, de droit et de médecine, (Typologie des sources du Moyen Age occidental, fasc. 44–45), Turnhout: Brepols.
- Bornholdt, Jon, 2017, Walter Chatton on Future Contingents: Between Formalism and Ontology, (Investigating Medieval Philosophy 11), Leiden: Brill.
- Brumberg-Chaumont, Julie, 2021, “The Rise of Logical Skills and the Thirteenth-Century Origins of the ‘Logical Man’”, in Logical Skills: Social-Historical Perspectives, Julie Brumberg-Chaumont and Claude Rosental (eds.), (Studies in Universal Logic), Cham: Birkhäuser, 91–120. doi:10.1007/978-3-030-58446-7_6
- Brungs, Alexander, Vilem Mudroch, and Peter Schulthess (eds.), 2017, Die Philosophie des Mittelalters, Band 4: 13. Jahrhundert, (Grundriss der Geschichte der Philosophie), Basel: Schwabe.
- Brungs, Alexander, Georgi Kapriev, and Vilem Mudroch (eds.), 2019, Die Philosophie des Mittelalters, Band 1: Byzanz, Judentum, (Grundriss der Geschichte der Philosophie), Basel: Schwabe Verlag.
- Bulthuis, Nathaniel E., 2021, “Propositions”, in Cross and Paasch 2021: 5–18.
- Bydén, Börje and Katerina Ierodiakonou, 2012, “Greek Philosophy”, in The Oxford Handbook of Medieval Philosophy, John Marenbon (ed.), Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press, 29–57.
- Calma, Dragos (ed.), 2016, Neoplatonism in the Middle Ages, 2 volumes, (Studia Artistarum 42), Turnhout: Brepols.
- Casagrande, Carla and Gianfranco Fioravanti (eds.), 2016, La filosofia in Italia al tempo di Dante, (Le vie della civiltà), Bologna: Società editrice il Mulino.
- Cesalli, Laurent, Ruedi Imbach, Alain de Libera, and Thomas Ricklin (eds.), 2021, Die Philosophie des Mittelalters, Band 3: 12. Jahrhundert, (Grundriss der Geschichte der Philosophie), Basel: Schwabe Verlag.
- Coleman, Janet, 1981, Medieval Readers and Writers, 1350–1400, (English Literature in History), London: Hutchinson.
- Copenhaver, Brian P. and Charles B. Schmitt, 1992, Renaissance Philosophy, (History of Western Philosophy 3), Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press.
- Courtenay, William J., 1987, Schools & Scholars in Fourteenth-Century England, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
- Cross, Richard, 2014, The Medieval Christian Philosophers: An Introduction, London/New York: I.B. Tauris.
- Cross, Richard and J. T. Paasch (eds.), 2021, The Routledge Companion to Medieval Philosophy, (Routledge Philosophy Companions), New York/Abingdon: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9781315709604
- Dales, Richard, 1990, Medieval Discussions of the Eternity of the World, Leiden: Brill (Brill’s Studies in Intellectual History 18
- Davidson, Herbert, 1987, Proofs for Eternity, Creation, and the Existence of God in Medieval Islamic and Jewish, New York: Oxford University Press.
- De Libera, Alain, Jean-Baptiste Brenet, and Irène Rosier-Catach (eds.), 2019, Dante et l’averroïsme, (Collection Docet Omnia 5), Paris: Collège de France & Les Belles Lettres.
- De Rijk, Lambertus Marie, 1985, La philosophie au Moyen Age, Leiden: Brill.
- Dhanani, Alnoor, 2017, “Al-Mawāqif fī ʿilm al-kalām by ʿAḍūd al-Dīn al-Ījī (d. 1355), and Its Commentaries”, in El-Rouayheb and Schmidtke 2017: 375–396.
- Dronke, Peter (ed.), 1988, A History of Twelfth-Century Western Philosophy, Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511597916
- Dutilh Novaes, Catarina and Stephen Read (eds.), 2016, The Cambridge Companion to Medieval Logic, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781107449862
- Dvořák, Petr and Jacob Schmutz, 2019, “Introduction: Special Issue on Baroque Scholasticism”, American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly, 93(2): 187–189. doi:10.5840/acpq2019932178
- El-Rouayheb, Khaled, 2015, Islamic Intellectual History in the Seventeenth Century: Scholarly Currents in the Ottoman Empire and the Maghreb, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2015
- –––, 2016, “Arabic Logic after Avicenna”, in Dutilh Novaes and Read 2016: 67–93. doi:10.1017/CBO9781107449862.004
- –––, 2019, The Development of Arabic Logic (1200–1800), (Medieval and Early Modern Philosophy 2), Basel: Schwabe Verlag Basel.
- El-Rouayheb, Khaled and Sabine Schmidtke (eds.), 2017, The Oxford Handbook of Islamic Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/oxfordhb/9780199917389.001.0001
- Erismann, Christophe, 2017, “Logic in Byzantium”, in Kaldellis and Siniossoglou 2017: 362–380. doi:10.1017/9781107300859.022
- Evans, Gillian (Vol. 1) and Philip Rosemann (Vols 2–3) (eds), 2002–2014, Medieval Commentaries on the ‘Sentences’ of Peter Lombard, Leiden/Boston: Brill. doi:10.1163/9789047400707 doi:10.1163/9789004283046 doi:10.1163/ej.9789004118614.i-551
- Flasch, Kurt, 1986 , Das philosophische Denken im Mittelalter: von Augustin bis Machiavelli, Stuttgart: P. Reclam. Second edition 2000.
- Frank, Richard M., 1978, Beings and Their Attributes: The Teaching of the Basrian School of the Mu‘tazila in the Classical Period, (Studies in Islamic Philosophy and Science), Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
- Frank, Daniel H. and Oliver Leaman (eds.), 1997, History of Jewish Philosophy, (Routledge History of World Philosophies 2), London/New York: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9780203983102
- ––, (eds.), 2003, The Cambridge Companion to Medieval Jewish Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
- Freudenthal, Gad (ed.), 2012, Science in Medieval Jewish Cultures, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511976575
- Gabbay, Dov M. and John Woods (eds), 2008, Handbook of the History of Logic, Volume II: Mediaeval and Renaissance Logic, Amsterdam/Boston: North Holland.
- Giraud, Cédric (ed.), 2020, A Companion to Twelfth-Century Schools, (Brill’s Companions to the Christian Tradition 88), Leiden/Boston: Brill. doi:10.1163/9789004410138
- Griffel, Frank, 2009, Al-Ghazālī’s Philosophical Theology, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780195331622.001.0001
- –––, 2021, The Formation of Post-Classical Philosophy in Islam, New York: Oxford University Press.
- Gutas, Dimitri, 1998, Greek Thought, Arabic Culture: The Graeco-Arabic Translation Movement in Baghdad and Early ʻAbbāsid Society (2nd–4th/8th–10th Centuries), London/New York: Routledge.
- –––, 2018, “Avicenna and After: The Development of Paraphilosophy. A History of Science Approach”, in Islamic Philosophy from the 12th to the 14th Century, Abdelkader Al Ghouz (ed.), (Mamluk Studies 20), Göttingen: V&R unipress, 19–72. doi:10.14220/9783737009003.19
- Gutas, Dimitri and Niketas Siniossoglou, 2017, “Philosophy and ‘Byzantine Philosophy’”, in Kaldellis and Siniossoglou 2017: 271–295. doi:10.1017/9781107300859.017
- Hankins, James (ed.), 2007, The Cambridge Companion to Renaissance Philosophy, Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CCOL052184648X
- Hasse, Dag Nikolaus, 2000, Avicenna’s “De Anima” in the Latin West: The Formation of a Peripatetic Philosophy of the Soul 1160–1300, (Warburg Institute Studies and Texts 1), London: The Warburg Institute.
- Imbach, Ruedi, 1996, Dante, la philosophie et les laïcs: Initiations à la philosophie médiévale I, (Vestigia 21), Fribourg, Suisse: Éditions universitaires.
- Imbach, Ruedi and Catherine König-Pralong, 2013, Le défi laïque, Paris: Vrin.
- Johnston, Spencer C., 2021, “Modal Logic”, in Cross and Paasch 2021: 43–56.
- Kaldellis, Anthony and Niketas Siniossoglou (eds.), 2017, The Cambridge Intellectual History of Byzantium, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/978110730085
- Kapriev, Georgi, 2005, Philosophie in Byzanz, Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann
- Kenny, Anthony, 2005, Medieval Philosophy, (New History of Western Philosophy 2), Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Knuuttila, Simo, 1993, Modalities in Medieval Philosophy, (Topics in Medieval Philosophy), London/New York: Routledge.
- König-Pralong, Catherine, 2012, “Métaphysique, théologie et politique des savoirs chez Christine de Pizan”, Freiburger Zeitschrift für Philosophie und Theologie, 59: 464–479. Also in Imbach and König-Pralong 2013: 193–210.
- Kukkonen, Taneli, 2014, “Creation and Causation” in Pasnau 2014, 232–246
- Lagerlund, Henrik, 2008, “The Assimilation of Aristotelian and Arabic Logic up to the Later Thirteenth Century”, in Gabbay and Woods 2008: 281–346.
- Lagerlund, Henrik and Benjamin Hill (eds.), 2017, Routledge Companion to Sixteenth Century Philosophy, New York/London: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9781315770512
- Luscombe, David, 1997, Medieval Thought, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press.
- Manekin, Charles H., 1996, “Medieval Translations into and from Latin and Hebrew”, in Medieval Latin Studies: An Introduction and Bibliographical Guide, F.A.C. Mantello and A. G. Rigg (eds), Washington, DC: Catholic University Press, 713–717.
- –––, 2009, “Propositions and Propositional Inference”, in Nadler and Rudavsky 2009: 165–187. doi:10.1017/CHOL9780521843232.008
- –––, 2012, “Logic in Medieval Jewish Culture”, in Freudenthal 2012: 113–135. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511976575.009
- Marenbon, John, 1988, Early Medieval Philosophy (480–1150): An Introduction, second edition, London ; New York: Routledge.
- –––, 2005, Le temps, l’éternité et la prescience de Boèce à Thomas d’Aquin, Paris: Vrin
- –––, 2011, “When Was Medieval Philosophy?” Inaugural lecture as Honorary Professor of Medieval Philosophy, Faculty of Philosophy, University of Cambridge. [Marenbon 2011 available online]
- –––, 2012b, “Introduction”, in Oxford Handbook of Medieval Philosophy, John Marenbon (ed.), Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press, 3–14.
- Morton, Jonathan and Marco Nievergelt (eds.), 2020, The ‘Roman de La Rose’ and Thirteenth-Century Thought, (Cambridge Studies in Medieval Literature 111), Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/9781108348799
- Nadler, Steven M. and Tamar Rudavsky (eds.), 2009, The Cambridge History of Jewish Philosophy: From Antiquity through the Seventeenth Century, Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CHOL9780521843232
- Novotný, Daniel D., 2009, “In Defense of Baroque Scholasticism”, Studia Neoaristotelica, 6(2): 209–233. doi:10.5840/studneoar2009623
- Paasch, J. T., 2021, “Logic Games”, in Cross and Paasch 2021: 57–76.
- Pasnau, Robert, 2011, Metaphysical Themes, 1274–1671, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199567911.001.0001
- ––– (ed.), 2014, The Cambridge History of Medieval Philosophy, second edition, 2 volumes, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CHO9781107446953
- Perler, Dominik, 2011 , Transformationen der Gefühle: philosophische Emotionstheorien 1270–1670, Frankfurt am Main: S. Fischer. Translated as Feelings Transformed: Philosophical Theories of the Emotions, 1270–1670, Tony Crawford (trans.), New York: Oxford University Press.
- Podskalsky, Gerhard, 1988, Griechische Theologie in der Zeit der Türkenherrschaft (1453–1821). Die Orthodoxie im Spannungsfeld der nachreformatorischen Konfessionen des Westens, Munich: C.H. Beck.
- Rudavsky, Tamar (ed.), 1985, Divine Omniscience and Omnipotence in Medieval Philosophy: Islamic, Jewish, and Christian Perspectives, (Synthese Historical Library 25), Dordrecht/Boston: D. Reidel.
- –––, 2000, Time Matters: Time, Creation, and Cosmology in Medieval Jewish Philosophy, (SUNY Series in Jewish Philosophy), Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
- Rudolph, Ulrich (ed.), 2012, Philosophie in der islamischen Welt, I: 8.-10. Jahrhundert (Grundriss der Geschichte der Philosophie), Basel: Schwabe.
- ––– (ed.), 2021, Philosophie in der islamischen Welt, II.1: 11. und 12. Jahrhundert, Zentrale und östliche Gebiete (Grundriss der Geschichte der Philosophie), Basel: Schwabe.
- Schmidtke, Sabine, 2017, “Ibn Anī Jumhūr al-Aḥsāʾī (d. after 1491) and his Kitāb mujlī mir’āt al-munjī”, in El-Rouayheb and Schmidtke 2017: 397–414.
- Schmitt, Charles B. and Quentin Skinner (eds.), 1988, The Cambridge History of Renaissance Philosophy, Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CHOL9780521251044
- Schmutz, Jacob, 2012, “Medieval Philosophy after the Middle Ages”, in Marenbon 2012: 245–266.
- Siniossoglou, Niketas, 2011, Radical Platonism in Byzantium: Illumination and Utopia in Gemistos Plethon, (Cambridge Classical Studies), Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press.
- Sirat, Colette, 1985, A History of Jewish Philosophy in the Middle Ages, Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press & Paris: Editions de la Maison des Sciences de l’Homme.
- Sirat, Colette, Sara Klein-Braslavy, and Olga Weijers (eds), 2003, Les méthodes de travail de Gersonide et le maniement du savoir chez les scolastiques, Paris: Vrin.
- Sorabji, Richard, 1983, Time, Creation and the Continuum, London: Duckworth.
- Stroumsa, Sarah, 2019, Andalus and Sefarad: On Philosophy and Its History in Islamic Spain, (Jews, Christians, and Muslims from the Ancient to the Modern World), Princeton/Oxford: Princeton University Press.
- Tatakis, Basil, 1949 , La philosophie byzantine, Paris: Presses universitaires de France. Translated as Byzantine Philosophy, Nicholas J. Moutafakis (trans.), Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing, 2003.
- Taylor, Richard C. and Luis Xavier López Farjeat (eds.), 2016, The Routledge Companion to Islamic Philosophy, (Routledge Philosophy Companions), New York: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9781315708928
- Thom, Paul, 2019, Robert Kilwardby’s Science of Logic: A Thirteenth-Century Intensional Logic, Leiden/Boston: Brill. doi:10.1163/9789004408777
- Tirosh-Samuelson, Hava, 1997, “The Ultimate End of Human Life in Postexpulsion Philosophic Literature”, in Crisis and Creativity in the Sephardic World, 1391–1648, Benjamin R. Gampel (ed.), New York: Columbia University Press, 223–254.
- Trizio, Michele, 2007, “Byzantine Philosophy as a Contemporary Historiographical Project”, Recherches de Théologie et Philosophie Médiévales, 74(1): 247–294. doi:10.2143/RTPM.74.1.2022841
- Uckelman, Sara L., 2021, “Kinds of Argument”, in Cross and Paasch 2021: 31–42.
- Van Ess, Josef, 1991–95, Theologie und Gesellschaft im 2. und 3. Jahrhundert Hidschra: Eine Geschichte des religiösen Denkens im frühen Islam, 6 vols., Berlin: De Gruyter.
- Vasalou, Sophia, 2008, Moral Agents and Their Deserts: The Character of Mu’tazilite Ethics, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
- Zonta, Mauro, 2006, Hebrew Scholasticism in the Fifteenth Century: A History and Source Book, Dordrecht: Springer Netherlands. doi:10.1007/1-4020-3716-3
- –––, 2012, “Medieval Hebrew Translations of Philosophical and Scientific Texts: A Chronological Table”, in Freudenthal 2012: 17–73. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511976575.005
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
- Islamic Philosophy Online (Philosophia Islamica)
[Very rich collection of digitized texts, mostly in Arabic]
- Mediaeval Logic and Philosophy (pvspade.com)
[Paul Spade’s website. Translations, books and articles, inactive 2007]
- Medieval Philosophy Digital Resources (SIEPM),
created by Jean-Luc Solère
[Rich collection of digitized books and electronic editions]
- Migne’s Patrologia Latina
[Texts of Latin philosophy and theology up to 1200]
- Migne’s Patrologia Graeca
[Texts of Greek philosophy and theology]
- Peter King’s website
[Digitized texts of Boethius, Anselm, Abelard and many others, as well as articles etc.]
- Scholasticon (msh-lse.fr)
- Aristotle’s On the Eternity of the World
[Translation by Robert T. Miller]
- Spade, Paul, “Medieval Philosophy”, Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Summer 2022 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/sum2022/entries/medieval-philosophy/>. [This was the previous entry on this topic in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy – see the version history.]