First published Wed Jun 29, 2022

Many biologists and commentators from the humanities and social sciences have questioned whether the gene is still a useful category in biology. Too many times have the entities and processes associated with the term turned out to be more diverse and more complex than initially assumed, and it seemed that new terms were needed to accommodate new insights. And yet, the term “gene” has proved to be persistent. It remains central not only in public discourse about biology and in educational contexts, but also for researchers at the cutting edge of the life sciences in framing their results and interpretations.

To understand this seemingly paradoxical situation, it is worthwhile to reflect on the nature of scientific concepts. Most, if not all scientific concepts are historically constituted, i.e., they are neither given once, with a unique and stable meaning attached to them and either remain in discourse unchanged or disappear entirely, nor are they merely subject of historical development in the sense of progressing towards some final, stable meaning. Instead, concepts are “in flux”; they change their meaning in the course of ongoing investigation (Elkana 1970). Additionally, when the investigative projects associated with a concept diversify, concepts may at any point in history exhibit several related but still different meanings in various local contexts. In each context, the concept might be more or less well defined, but overall, or at the boundaries between different fields of research, concepts will be perceived as rather vague (Löwy 1992). Furthermore, scientific concepts do not stand isolated; they belong to conceptual systems, discourses, and practices (Foucault 1971; Kuhn 1962; Lynch 1993). Indeed, what it means for a concept to change its meaning is that the context of use for a given concept or its relations to other concepts change. All of the above applies to the gene concept, which has been described as a “concept in flux” (Falk 1986), a fuzzy, vague, or boundary concept (Rheinberger 2000), and a “concept in tension” (Falk 2000), and studied as part of various discourses (Jacob 1970 [1973]; Keller 2000) or in the context of broader cultural spheres and practices (Müller-Wille & Rheinberger 2012).

The first part of this entry provides a historical overview, which serves as a background to understand philosophical accounts of scientific change with respect to genetics addressed in the second part. Section 2.1 will discuss models of theory reduction in genetics. Sections 2.2 and 2.3 will address discussions of change and diversification in the meaning and reference of the term “gene”. Because of its central role in most areas of biology, the gene concept also has a central role in debates in philosophy of biology (see entries on philosophy of biology and feminist philosophy of biology). This entry focusses on the gene concept in studies of heredity and development. Additional philosophical problems concerning the concept of genetic information, causation, and determinism are covered in entries on biological information, genetics, molecular genetics, molecular biology, the distinction between innate and acquired characteristics, and the human genome project (see also Griffiths & Stotz 2013). For conceptual questions pertaining to genes as central units of evolution, the reader is referred to the entries on evolution, ecological genetics, population genetics, genetic drift, units and levels of selection, and replication and reproduction (see also Sterelny & Griffiths 1999).

1. A History of the Gene Within the History of Genetics

1.1 From Mendel’s methods to Mendelism

The question of biological heredity emerged in the nineteenth century in diverse fields of practice and gave rise to various theories, which often aimed to provide a unified view of heredity, development, and evolution (Müller-Wille & Rheinberger 2012: Chs. 2–5). Gregor Mendel (1822–1884) did not aim at a unifying theory, nor did he set out to discover laws governing heredity. Historians have argued, instead, that he was concerned with specific questions regarding the role of hybridization in evolution (Olby 1979; cf. Müller-Wille 2018). Other hybridists had crossed plants of different species and varieties, studied their offspring, and asked whether new species could emerge in this process. Issues regarding the classification of hybrids emerged: how did hybrids resulting from crosses between pure species differ from offspring of parent organisms that were hybrids themselves; and how could their characteristics be interpreted with respect to those of their parents when it came to determining their type? Mendel (1866 [2016]) aimed to address such questions in his experiments with garden peas and in this respect was indeed indebted to his predecessors. Nonetheless, he introduced several changes in the experimental system employed by the hybridists that allowed him to arrive at more specific results regarding the distribution of types in several generations of offspring (Müller-Wille & Orel 2007). First, he concentrated on varieties that differed only in one or a few characteristics. This enabled him to move from classifying the offspring according to type to a focus on the distribution of traits that characterized the types. Second, he made sure that he obtained offspring in numbers that allowed for a statistical treatment of the distribution of characters. In this way, he was able to observe regularities in the appearance of types in the third generation (plants resulting from crosses between hybrids) that previous hybridists where not able to detect. Finally, he developed a notation system where letters represented types of germ cells, which he used to record his results and compare them with theoretical predictions. These innovations enabled Mendel to arrive at a set of regularities regarding

  1. the uniform appearance of a “dominant” character in the first generation,
  2. the segregation of the dominant and alternative, “recessive” characters in a ratio 3:1 in the second generation, representing one pure dominant, two hybrids, showing the dominant character, and one pure recessive, and
  3. the independent inheritance of separate character pairs.

Mendel’s refined methodology was the basis for important conceptual innovations. Next to the shift from “forms” or “types” found in several generations in hybridization experiments to the distribution of characters, Mendel could move from the characterization of the contribution of gametes (also addressed as “factors”) to the “elements” by which the gametes differed (Müller-Wille & Orel 2007). Nonetheless, Mendel did not think of the regularities as laws of heredity. Indeed, whether they were valid for organisms other than the garden pea he considered subject to empirical investigation. Furthermore, Mendel thought of his results as illuminating the behavior of characters in hybrids, i.e., he did not generalize his results to heredity per se, as it would occur in the reproduction of all characters, also in pure varieties (Rheinberger & Müller-Wille 2018: Ch. 3).

In 1900, several botanists independently arrived at similar results in their hybridization experiments and at the same time took notice of Mendel’s original work and stated its significance in their respective publications (Olby 1966: Ch. 6). This brought the Mendelian approach and way of reasoning to the attention of those who worked with experimental crosses in contexts of either theoretical questions regarding heredity and evolution or applied problems of horticulture and scientific breeding (Bowler 1989a: Ch. 6). Much had changed in biology since Mendel’s days: first, the idea that the hereditary material is passed on independently of somatic development, codified in August Weismann’s (1834–1914) germ-line theory, was well established; second, several researchers had developed a cytological interpretation of hereditary phenomena; third, in the late nineteenth century various ideas on how to identify units transmitted through germ cells had emerged. Furthermore, on a broader social and economic scale, processes of industrialization and rationalization of food production, vaccines, and other applications had led to an increased demand for standardized biological materials (Müller-Wille & Rheinberger 2012: Ch. 6). In this context, the entities and regularities identified by hybridization experiments were now taken to be the basis of heredity in general.

The early “Mendelians” employed and expanded Mendel’s experimental system, notation, and terminology (Shan 2020). They codified Mendel’s regularities as “laws” of heredity, while at the same time investigating exceptions to uniformity or dominance (e.g., “blending” characters), to the ratios of segregation (e.g., due to “composite” characters, which came to be seen as influenced by several factors), and to independent assortment in crosses involving several characters (e.g., because characters appeared to be “coupled”). Mendel’s experiments, perceived as exemplars for the study of variation and heredity, named “genetics” by William Bateson (1861–1926; 1907), played an important role for the formation of both the field and its central concept, the gene. Bateson emphasized the idea that discrete “unit-characters” could be identified in organisms, which occurred in alternative forms or “allelomorphs”. In crosses these characters segregated in Mendelian ratios. This indicated and was explained by assuming the “purity of gametes”, i.e., the fact that reproductive cells can transmit only one form of a character. When two gametes that were alike with respect to one character united, the resulting zygote was “homozygous” for this character, otherwise it was “heterozygous”. While these observations were initially discussed mainly in terms of characters and types of gametes or the gametes’ ability to transmit characters, Bateson came to think of the dominant allelomorph as being determined by some “factor” present in the gamete, while the recessive character resulted when the factor was absent in both gametes (Darden 1991: Ch. 6; Schwartz 2002). “Factor” thus came to be used by many Mendelians similarly to Mendel’s “elements”. The term referred to whatever made two gametes different regarding the inheritance of characters, but it was not connected to any specific theory regarding the physical nature of the hereditary material.

There were also alternatives to the Mendelian view of heredity. The biometric approach, going back to the work of Francis Galton (1822–1911) and further developed by W.F.R. Weldon (1860–1906) and Karl Pearson (1857–1936), used advanced statistical tools to investigate heredity in terms of correlations between characters in successive generations in limited populations (Porter 1986: Ch. 9). Weldon and Pearson adhered to an orthodox interpretation of Charles Darwin’s (1809–1882) view that evolution proceeded by natural selection acting on gradual variation. Mendelians, instead, focused on discontinuous variation (Bowler 1992; Gayon 1998). Wilhelm Johannsen (1857–1927) had conducted experiments with “pure lines”, in which he selected the plus or minus variants of quantitative characters such as seed size in the offspring of self-fertilized beans (Johannsen 1903). Based on his results, Johannsen distinguished between fluctuating variation, which was due to contingent influences of the environment, and variation between types, which remained stable unless changed in a discontinuous manner through mutation (Roll-Hansen 2009). Around that time, Hugo de Vries (1848–1935; 1901–1903) suggested the concept of mutation to account for the spontaneous emergence of new stable types. Even though many did not follow de Vries’ idea of large-scale changes affecting several characters at once, giving rise to a new species instantaneously, most Mendelians came to think that the character variation they observed occurred spontaneously through changes in factors as units of the hereditary material (Bowler 1992: Ch. 8).

Initially, some Mendelians doubted the purity of gametes and concluded that the maternal and paternal gametes “contaminated” each other regarding the factors by which they differed, thus allowing for continuous variation. However, various researchers were able to resolve the question by showing how several factors affected the same quantitatively characterized character in cumulative manner (Carlson 1966: Chs. 4–5; Darden 1991: Chs. 6–7). Around 1910, models of “multi-factorial inheritance” explained modes of inheritance of continuously varying characters based on discontinuous genetic variation. These and other developments led to a convergence of biometric approaches and Mendelism and the emergence of mathematical population genetics in the 1920s and 30s, a field that laid the foundations for genetic models of the effects of selection and other processes of evolution (Allen 1978: Ch. V, Part II; Bowler 1989b: Ch. 11; Provine 1971; entries on population genetics and ecological genetics).

1.2 Classical and physiological genetics

Much of population genetics relied on an abstract concept of the gene as a unit inferred through character differences, represented in a symbolism, and used in the mathematical reconstruction or prediction of patterns of variation in theoretical, experimental, or natural breeding populations. In the early years of genetics, there was no agreement regarding the possibility of identifying units of the hereditary material and characterizing their nature and function. Considerations in this direction did not differ much from the speculative theories of the nineteenth century and were indeed mainly informed by them. In 1909 Johannsen coined the term “gene”, derived from de Vries’s term “pangene”, to disentangle the concept of the hereditary unit from any specific theory:

It is meant to express merely the simple idea that “something” in the gametes can condition or take part in the determination of a property of a developing organism. (Johannsen 1909: 124, author’s translation)

With respect to his selection experiments mentioned above, Johannsen had furthermore introduced the distinctions between phenotype and genotype. The former concept initially captured the range of fluctuating variation in a quantitative character centering on an average value that characterized a pure line. Later, however, the term was used with respect to an individual’s characteristics for both quantitative and qualitative differences in type. The genotype was the genetically relevant constitution of the germ cells or zygote, in other words, the sum of the genes, where genes could only be identified as bearing differences between genotypes resulting in phenotypic differences. The phenotype was the result of the interaction of the genotype with the environment in ontogenesis (Meunier 2016a; entry on the genotype/phenotype distinction). The phenotype of the parents, let alone of more distant ancestors, thus had no effect on the offspring. The genotype was what passed from parents to offspring. Johannsen defined heredity “as the presence of identical genes in ancestors and descendants” (Johannsen 1911: 159).

Paradoxically, the rejection of speculations about the nature and functioning of hereditary units advocated by Johannsen opened the possibility for its investigation as an epistemic object. By separating genes and characters more clearly and treating them as correlated in terms of differences rather than in terms of growth or production implied in “Anlage” and similar earlier concepts, characters could take on the epistemic function of an “index” or “marker” informative of the genetic composition of gametes and zygotes (Meunier 2016b; Schwartz 2000). The gene began to take shape as a material entity when this inferential strategy was combined with observations from microscopic studies of reproductive cells that enabled inferences on the role of chromosomes in heredity.

In 1910–1911, Thomas Hunt Morgan (1856–1945) observed several mutants in his stocks of Drosophila melanogaster. When he analyzed these mutants through Mendelian crosses, he found that they were partially linked regarding their inheritance, i.e., the characters were inherited together in more than the 50% of cases that would be expected if genes were randomly distributed, but in less than 100% of the cases, which would have suggested that both characters depend on the same gene. Indeed, Morgan found that his characters could be recombined, despite the fact that they were all sex-linked, i.e., the genes were associated with whatever determined sex in the fruit fly. As every gene was present in two instances (later called “alleles”), the linkage groups could be assumed to exist in pairs and recombination thus suggested exchange between corresponding linkage groups, or “crossing over” of genes. This again suggested that linked genes appeared in linear order, with the frequency of crossing over between two genes being an indicator of their proximity. Other characters were found that also formed such linkage groups but were not sex-linked. Based on these assumptions, Morgan and his students were able to construct maps of four linkage groups in Drosophila that represented the linear order and relative distance as inferred from recombination frequencies (Carlson 1966: Ch. 6–7).

While this account of genes was derived from genetic evidence, i.e., Mendelian crosses, the results could be mechanistically explained with reference to chromosomes. Chromosomes had been suggested as containing hereditary material before, but evidence was not forthcoming until the early twentieth century. Cytologists had been able to observe the behavior of chromosomes the formation of gametes and draw analogies to the segregation and independent assortment of Mendelian units. They demonstrated the role of chromosomes in the determination of sex and made observations which suggested an exchange of materials between homologous chromosomes (Brush 1978; Carlson 1966: Ch. 6; Crow & Crow 2002). On this basis, the Morgan group’s account identified linkage groups with chromosomes (Morgan et al. 1915; Vorms 2014). By the 1930s, cytological observations had reached a resolution that enabled researchers to correlate genetic linkage map loci with physical landmarks in the chromosomes, leading to cytological maps, which further facilitated the study of chromosomes in heredity (Falk 2004; Gannett & Griesemer 2004).

In this tradition, often referred to as “classical genetics”, genes were hypothetical material units of the genetic material, located in the chromosomes. But unlike the material carriers of heredity assumed in the nineteenth century, they did not give rise to characters in a straightforward manner. Many-many relations between genes and characters became obvious early on. All characters were influenced by many genes (polygenic) and most genes affected many characters (pleiotropic). The only kind of causal statement that was justified was that a difference in a gene resulted in one or more differences on the phenotypic level (Schwartz 2000).

Some questioned the chromosome theory of heredity and the notion of separable corpuscular genes. For instance, in the light of the “position effect”, where genes had different effects depending on their location in the chromosome, Richard Goldschmidt (1878–1958; 1938) suggested a holistic view of chromosomal agency (Allen 1974; Carlson 1966: Chs. 13–15). Furthermore, whether justified or not, many embryologists interpreted genetics as a form of preformationism, the view that organisms or their parts were in some way already given or at least pre-determined in the fertilized egg or its nucleus, such that development would be the mere articulation of the given structures. This interpretation was at odds with the view held by most embryologists, that the organism is the result of a process referred to as epigenesis, in which nucleus, cytoplasm and environment interact to transform material and structures (see the entry on theories of biological development).

On their part, geneticists became increasingly interested in the chemical nature of genes and their roles in metabolism and development. Several researchers had emphasized analogies between gene action and enzyme mediated chemical reactions (Ravin 1977). Using their terminology, Hermann Muller (1890–1967) and others observed that the gene had two characteristics that needed to be elucidated. First, it was autocatalytic, i.e., it was capable of reproducing itself for cell division and heredity to happen; second, it was heterocatalytic, i.e., it was able to facilitate the production of other chemical materials to perform its function (Muller 1922, 1947). What was peculiar regarding the first aspect was that genes were still capable of autocatalysis when they underwent mutational change, and they faithfully reproduced the alteration. Hence, for Muller, mutation was the key to the material nature of the gene. In the late 1920s, he and others were able to establish the mutagenic agency of radiation (Muller 1927; see Campos 2015: Chs. 5–6). The fact that genes could be “hit” and changed through X-rays supported the idea that they were individual entities that could be physically and chemically characterized.

To address the immediate chemical function of genes in the cell, i.e., their heterocatalytic properties, it was necessary to conceive of the phenotype itself in chemical terms. In 1908 Archibald Garrod (1857–1936; 1909) had found that some medical conditions that could be associated with “errors in metabolism” were inherited in a Mendelian fashion. Subsequently, physiological geneticists studied the relation of genes and catalytic activities. Conclusive evidence was achieved when George Beadle (1903–1989) and Edward Tatum (1909–1975) used the bread mold Neurospora crassa to search for mutants that affected known nutritional pathways by growing the fungi on selective media that provided or lacked certain substances. This approach established the field of biochemical genetics and stabilized the one gene—one enzyme hypothesis, i.e., the view that every gene was involved in the production of a specific enzyme, which had a specific effect on cellular metabolism (Kay 1993: Ch. 7; Kohler 1994: Ch. 7).

1.3 Molecular genetics: From DNA to protein

As much as these achievements of genetic analysis pushed the gene in the biochemical or molecular domain, they were not able to elucidate the chemical nature of the gene and its immediate action. This required other experimental systems, which began to take shape in the 1930s to 1950s (Morange 2020, Part One). For instance, Max Delbrück (1906–1981) and others turned to T-phages (viruses that infect the bacterium e.coli) because they assumed that viruses were essentially “naked genes”. While these researchers were able to show that genetic phenomena (mutation, exchange of genetic material) were present in viruses and bacteria as well and to achieve higher resolution of analysis, this work remained as formal as Drosophila genetics. It was only through integrating new technologies from physics and chemistry into the new experimental systems that microbial genetics led to molecular genetics. Results from biochemical work in biomedical microbiology and from work involving radioactive isotopes to label biological molecules provided evidence that DNA might be the genetic material.

Several researchers turned their efforts to elucidating the structure of DNA (Judson 1979: Ch. 2; Morange 2020: Ch.11; Olby 1974: Section V). Among them were James Watson (born 1928) and Francis Crick (1916–2004). They used data from DNA X-ray crystallography produced by Maurice Wilkins (1916–2004), Rosalind Franklin (1920–1958), and co-workers, and adopted the style of reasoning and use of ball-and-stick models of molecules pioneered by Linus Pauling (1901–1994). DNA was already known to consist of a sugar-phosphate structure and the four bases cytosine (C), guanine (G), adenine (A) or thymine (T). Based on additional evidence, Watson and Crick eventually came to consider a double helix model with the bases on the inside and a pairing of A with T and G with C, which was published in April 1953. Shortly thereafter they published another paper which spelled out the consequences for genetics (Watson & Crick 1953a,b). The model suggested a mechanism of DNA replication according to which the two chains of the DNA separate and each acquires a novel complementary strand on the basis of base pair complementarity. Hence it explained the previously postulated autocatalytic properties of genes. Seymour Benzer (1921–2007), working with phage was able to push the resolution of genetic analysis to a level below the gene, by mapping mutation loci within genes (Holmes 2006). His work supported the DNA model as it showed that not only genes, but also their components were arranged in a linear sequence and suggested that single bases could be the locus of mutation. Benzer concluded that the understanding of the classical gene as unit of mutation, recombination and function needed to be revised (Benzer 1957). He suggested the novel terms “muton”, “recon” and “cistron,” where only the latter gained some currency to refer to genes as units of function.

The acceptance of DNA as genetic material and of its structure brought the search for the material basis of genes to an end. Subsequently, the focus shifted on the question of how genes realized their heterocatalytic capacities. At this point, the question was reframed in terms of protein synthesis (Judson 1979: Ch. 6; Morange 2020: Ch. 12). Proteins consist of one or several polypeptide chains, which are composed of amino acids. In the early 1950s, Frederick Sanger (1918–2013) had determined the amino acid sequence for polypeptides of insulin (Chadarevian 1996). On this basis, Crick re-defined the problem by observing that

[t]he actual chemical step by which any two amino acids […] are joined together is probably always the same […].

Therefore, the aspect of protein synthesis in need of explanation was

that only a single standard set of twenty amino acids can be incorporated, and that for any particular protein the amino acids must be joined up in the right order.

In other words, it was

the problem of “sequentialization”. (Crick 1958: 144)

In response to this problem Crick formulated the sequence hypothesis, which assumed

that the specificity of a piece of nucleic acid [i.e., a stretch of DNA or RNA] is expressed solely by the sequence of its bases, and that this sequence is a (simple) code for the amino acid sequence of a particular protein. (1958: 152)

The three-dimensional conformation of the protein was then seen as emerging spontaneously as a function of its sequence. Additionally, Crick formulated what he called the “central dogma”, regarding the directionality of the relation of DNA’s sequence of bases and proteins’ sequence of amino acids:

[The central dogma] states that once “information” has passed into protein it cannot get out again. In more detail, the transfer of information from nucleic acid to nucleic acid, or from nucleic acid to protein may be possible, but transfer from protein to protein, or from protein to nucleic acid is impossible. (1958: 153)

The language of “information” and “code” had entered genetics only recently and from several sources. One was Erwin Schrödinger’s (1887–1961) What is life? (1944), where he spoke of a “code-script”; another was the broader cold war techno-cultural context of cryptography, computer science, and cybernetics (Kay 2000; Keller 2000). In this context, before the early 1960s, most authors treated the problem of the role of DNA in protein synthesis in a theoretical manner, relying on mathematical and cryptographic considerations, and using computers to solve the combinatorial puzzle. Although some theoretical insights and much of the language developed at this time was important for later developments, these attempts by geneticists were ultimately unsuccessful (Sarkar 1996; Stegmann 2021).

Biochemists at the time were equally convinced that genes played an important role in protein synthesis (Judson 1979: Ch. 6 and 8; Morange 2020: Ch. 12; Rheinberger 1997). New evidence emerged from the medical genetics and biochemistry of sickle cell anemia, indicating the relation of gene mutations and amino acid alterations, from in vitro systems of protein synthesis based on e.coli cell extracts, leading to the characterization of ribosomes and transfer RNA (tRNA), as well as from work establishing the existence and role of messenger RNA (mRNA) and its complementarity to DNA. The image that resulted from this diverse evidence was that mRNA transferred information from nuclear DNA to the cytoplasm, where ribosomes, as largely unchanged structures, facilitated the assembly of amino acid chains based on the sequence of mRNA. In 1961, Crick and co-workers showed experimentally that three bases code for one amino acid, that coding triplets do not overlap and that they are read from a fixed starting point. In the same year, Marshall Nirenberg (1927–2010) and Heinrich Matthaei (born 1929) published results from an experiment in which synthetic RNA consisting only of uracil bases (RNA contains uracil, instead of thymine) was introduced in a cell free protein synthesis system, resulting in the production of a monotonous protein consisting of the amino acid Phenylalanine. Thus, it was shown that the RNA triplet UUU coded for this amino acid. This result opened the possibility to solve the genetic code experimentally and several labs participated in this project, leading to a complete table of correlated codons (coding triplets) and amino acids by 1967.

1.4 Molecular biology: DNA technology, development, and evolution

Molecular technologies and concepts inevitably had a transforming influence on other fields. Indeed, it might be argued, that while molecular genetics constituted a discipline centered on a limited number of questions regarding the molecular basis of heredity, molecular biology is best understood as a set of techniques and approaches that came to be applied in various disciplines (Burian 1993).

In the classical period of molecular genetics, many central mechanisms pertaining to DNA replication, gene regulation, and protein synthesis were described. While DNA served as a template in its own replication, it was not self-replicating or autocatalytic; many enzymes and other molecules were required in this process, such as DNA polymerase and DNA ligase. Furthermore, around 1970, several enzymes specific for bacteria or viruses were described such as reverse transcriptase, which enabled viruses to translate RNA into DNA, and restriction enzymes, which cleaved DNA as part of a bacterial defense system. Next to explaining important cellular processes, taken together, these enzymes could be used as a toolkit to manipulate DNA in vitro, in bacterial systems and eventually also in eukaryotic cells. In 1972, Paul Berg (born 1926) and colleagues published a study demonstrating the possibility to construct DNA molecules from fragments originating from different organisms by using these enzymes as tools (Jackson et al. 1972). These molecular tools not only led to recombinant DNA technology and genetic engineering, but also facilitated the further molecular characterization of genes by isolating and amplifying them in bacteria (molecular cloning) (Morange 2020: Ch. 16).

Molecular technologies changed the way research was done in molecular biology. In vitro systems that helped among other things to solve the genetic code, were complemented by new methods of in vivo manipulation and detection (Rheinberger 2009). This in turn led to the discovery of new cellular mechanisms involved in the transcription and translation of genes. For instance, it had been observed in virus-based model systems that in some cases mRNA corresponded to non-contiguous fragments of the DNA from which it was transcribed. Further studies revealed that in these cases parts of the initial transcript were removed to form the mature mRNA that was eventually translated and the segments that were removed could separate coding regions. Much to the surprise of biologists, this was the case for all genes in eukaryotic cells, while the mechanism was absent in prokaryotes (Abir-Am 2020; Morange 2020: Ch. 17). “Split genes” and the mechanism of RNA splicing led to an important reconception of genes. As Walter Gilbert (born 1932) wrote:

The notion of the cistron, the genetic unit of function that one thought corresponded to a polypeptide chain, now must be replaced by that of a transcription unit containing regions which will be lost from the mature messenger which I suggest we call introns (for intragenic regions)—alternating with regions which will be expressed—exons. (W. Gilbert 1978: 501)

Gilbert’s terminology was widely accepted and it became clear that exons could be spliced together in alternative ways, thus multiplying the number of proteins that could be derived from a stretch of DNA. During the 1970s and 80s, further mechanisms of RNA processing were discovered in various organisms. For instance, mRNA could be generated by splicing together exons from several transcripts, from either the same or adjacent loci or even from different chromosomes (“trans-splicing”). Furthermore, RNA could be edited by changing several or single nucleotides, which could have large effects on the proteins translated from the mRNA. Mobile elements in the genome (transposons), already characterized by Barbara McClintock (1902–1992) in Maize in the early 1950s by classical genetic means, were also studied in bacteria and molecularly characterized around 1980 (Comfort 2001). It was not always immediately clear how general these and other mechanisms were (and it is still investigated). Nonetheless, it transpired that the notion that one gene, understood as an unequivocally localized stretch of DNA, corresponded to one polypeptide, had to be abandoned (Fogle 2000; Portin 2002).

Another important development concerned gene regulation. Studying the ability of bacteria to adapt to varying food sources, François Jacob (1920–2013) and Jacques Monod (1910–1976) developed the operon model, according to which a protein called “repressor” is permanently produced, which binds to a DNA region called “operator” in the vicinity of the genes required for lactose metabolism, thereby inhibiting the production of the respective enzymes and other proteins. If lactose was present, it (or a derivate) interacts with the repressor such that the genes are activated, and lactose could be digested by the bacteria. This model introduced an important distinction regarding genes. Those genes that coded for β-galactosidase or lactose permease or other proteins constituting cellular functions were called “structural genes”. The genes that produced the repressor and other proteins controlling the expression of genes were called “regulatory genes” (Jacob & Monod 1961).

This kind of mechanism was immediately interpreted as providing answers to the question how different genes become activated at different times and in different tissues during metazoan development (differential gene expression). Between the 1950s and the 1980s the concept of specific developmental genes emerged (Morange 2001: Ch. 7). Developmental biologists identified a limited number of genes that were essential in establishing the organization of the very early embryo and functioned by controlling the expression of various other genes. Molecular cloning led to the molecular characterization of developmental genes and the discovery of their evolutionary conservation (Weber 2004, see also the entry on developmental biology).

Evolutionary biology as well became molecularized (Suárez-Díaz 2018). One important contribution was the theory of the molecular clock, which stated that the rate of evolutionary change in a protein remained constant such that the time of divergence of lineages could be estimated from data on amino acid sequences (Morgan 1998). This lent support to and was explained by the neutral theory of molecular evolution suggested, which was controversially discussed between molecular and traditional biologists in the 1960s (Dietrich 1998; entries on ecological genetics and genetic drift). In general, molecular biology opened a new perspective on evolutionary mechanisms, for instance, the notion that evolution builds upon events of duplication of genes, chromosomes, or whole genomes. On this view the duplicated elements could acquire new functions or alter the dosage of gene products (Morange 2020, Ch. 23).

1.5 Genomics and post-genomics

In the late 1970s, Sanger developed methods for sequencing DNA. The 1980s then saw the automation of these methods (García-Sancho 2012). This made whole genome sequencing of humans and other organisms feasible, and the Human Genome Project (HGP) commenced work in 1990 (Bostanci 2004; entry on the human genome project). New parallel, or “next generation”, sequencing methods that emerged around 2005 made sequencing faster and cheaper. Accordingly, the number of species and human samples sequenced increased continually. Since the early days of protein sequencing, sequence data was stored in digital databases, with GenBank being among the most important sequence repositories (Strasser 2019). Genomics, the science of analyzing and comparing genomes was thus strongly aligned with bioinformatics. Sequence comparison once more transformed evolutionary genetics and enabled new comparative approaches; now the DNA sequence itself could be used to reconstruct phylogenetic trees, and patterns of duplication events could be tracked in more detail (Suárez-Díaz 2010). Microbial systematics and ecology, in particular, changed significantly when metagenomic approaches, i.e., the sequencing of whole microbial communities, revealed not only the diversity of microbial life, but also the amount of lateral gene transfer between organisms, including eukaryotes (O’Malley 2014). But the availability of large data sets on human genomes also fostered novel interest in human diversity and history, enhanced medical genetics and the use of genetic data in forensics, and led to the emergence of direct-to-consumer genetic testing (Atkinson et al. 2009; Gibbon et al. 2018).

One of the unexpected results of the HGP was that the human genome contained only about 23,000 protein-coding genes as defined based on the concept of an open reading frame (ORF), that is, a stretch of DNA that begins with a start and ends with stop codon that initiate and terminate translation. Other, apparently less complex organisms, had as many or even more genes (thus defined) in their genomes (G-value paradox). This fact again suggested the significance of splicing variants and other mechanisms increasing the number of proteins derived from a given genome, of regulatory elements in the genome, and of non-coding RNA (see entry on genomics and postgenomics). In 2003 the Encyclopedia of DNA Elements (ENCODE) project was initiated, aiming at identifying all functional elements in the human genome including those transcribed to non-protein-coding RNA, and sites for protein binding or epigenetic modification (Brzović & Šustar 2020). The results of the consortium’s work made the already known deviations from the classic model of the molecular, protein-coding gene appear as the rule rather than the exception. To a large extent ENCODE researchers found overlap of transcripts, products derived from widely separated pieces of DNA sequence and widely dispersed regulatory sequences for a given gene. The findings also confirm that most of the genome is transcribed and emphasize the importance and pervasiveness of functional non-coding RNA transcripts (Morange 2020: Ch. 25; O’Malley et al. 2010; Veigl 2021).

These developments belong to what is commonly referred to as “post-genomics” (Richardson & Stevens 2015). Next to DNA, so-called “omics” research studies the transcriptome, the proteome, the interactome, and other levels of cellular processes and is strongly driven by new technological developments. DNA and protein microarrays (biochips) have been instrumental in this respect, and the investigation of RNA transcripts has been even further enhanced by next generation RNA sequencing (Rheinberger & Müller-Wille 2018: Ch. 9). Such high-throughput technologies result in massive amounts of diverse types of data. Bio-ontologies, and database infrastructures and curation, accordingly, became a central aspect of molecular biological research (Leonelli 2016).

While relevant mechanisms were first characterized in the 1960s and 70s, omics-approaches have furthered the study of cellular epigenetics, referring to molecular mechanisms including DNA methylation, changes in chromatin structure, and non-coding RNA related regulation (Buklijas 2018; Morange 2020: Ch. 26; Nicoglou & Merlin 2017). These mechanisms can result in patterns of differential gene expression that remain stable across mitotic cell division, thus contributing to the explanation of development. Epigenetic modifications have also been shown to be conserved in meiosis, facilitating the inheritance of phenotypic variation across generations, independently of changes in DNA sequence, a fact with consequences for evolutionary biology (Jablonka & Raz 2009).

The availability of data sets also enabled new, technology-driven styles of biological research (Morange 2020: Ch. 28; Rheinberger & Müller-Wille 2018: Ch. 9; entry on philosophy of systems and synthetic biology). Systems biology emerged as a highly interdisciplinary field, which is characterized by mathematical and computational approaches to the topology and dynamics of interaction networks involving genes and gene products. In a complementary manner, synthetic biology focuses on engineering metabolic pathways and regulatory networks for biotechnological applications such as drug or biofuel production, but also to increase the understanding of molecular systems (Kastenhofer 2013). The CRISPR-Cas system, originally elucidated as a bacterial immune defense mechanism, was developed into a new tool for genome editing, which, due to its precision, also enhanced genetic engineering approaches in multicellular organisms (Morange 2020: Ch. 24).

It becomes clear that biological research remains dynamic and that every development sheds new light on questions of heredity and the functioning of DNA. With the developments presented in this part in mind, we shall now turn to some of the philosophical debates they have engendered.

2. Philosophical Accounts of Scientific Change in Genetics

2.1 Theory change and reductionism in genetics

The developments in genetics sketched in Part 1 prompted the question how philosophical models of scientific change could be applied to the case of biology from the late nineteenth century to the present, as they had been developed mainly based on cases from modern physics and chemistry and preceding traditions in natural philosophy. Were the major transitions in hereditary thought to be described as scientific revolutions (see entries on scientific revolutions and the incommensurability of scientific theories)? It seems that models of change emphasizing discontinuity and incommensurability among successive paradigms, such as Thomas Kuhn’s (1962), do not fit well with what can be observed in the history of genetics: Much terminology and many practices seem to remain intact despite constant theoretical novelty, and the developments do not appear to be perceived as discontinuous in a strong sense by the protagonists. Continuous models of change, developed earlier by logical empiricists and centered on the notion of reduction as a relation between earlier and later theories, were thus discussed as possible alternatives with respect to the history of genetics.

“Reductionism” in genetics can, on the one hand, refer to philosophical positions regarding theory reduction or reductive explanation. On the other hand, attitudes in biology and philosophy that are characterized by a preference for molecular over organismic accounts of biological phenomena or an emphasis on genes in explanations have been labeled “reductionist” (see entry on reductionism in biology). The latter, broader meaning overlaps with notions of “genetic determinism” and, more generally, “gene-centrism”. This section focuses on the former, technical meanings of “reduction”. The debate on reduction got contemporary philosophy of biology started around 1970 and is still on-going today (Vidal & Teira 2020; Winther 2009). Theory reduction is most prominently articulated by Ernest Nagel (1961). Put very simply, on Nagel’s account, one theory reduces to another if the former can be logically derived from the latter, or, in terms of a nomological-deductive model of explanation, if the reducing theory explains the reduced theory. Since, on this view, the relation between theories is one between sets of statements, including, most importantly, laws or law-like generalizations, successful reduction also requires “bridge principles” or coordinating definitions, which indicate how the vocabularies (terms or predicates) of the two theories relate (see entry on scientific reduction).

Kenneth Schaffner (1967, 1969) further develops Nagel’s account by pointing out that the candidate reduced theory typically needs to be corrected before it can be reduced. He then applies his model to the case of genetics. On Schaffner’s view, molecular genetics reduced or is in the process of reducing classical genetics (see §1.2 and §1.3 for an account of classical and molecular genetics). On his account, the genes of classical genetics can be identified with DNA sequences. Furthermore, concepts that capture law-like generalizations about phenomena in classical genetics (e.g., dominance) can be explained through generalizations on the molecular level. Schaffner’s account is met with criticism by David Hull (1972, 1974). Hull’s most influential objection rests on a multiple realizability argument. He argues that the types of phenomena identified in classical genetics (such as dominance) can be instantiated by a variety of different molecular constellations. Furthermore, Hull points out that any molecular entity or mechanism can be involved in various types of situations as described in classical genetics. Accordingly, Hull diagnoses many-many relations between molecular phenomena and phenomena identified through cytological and phenotypic analysis.

Alexander Rosenberg (1978; 1985: Ch. 4) argues that Mendelian properties supervene on molecular properties, i.e., that for any difference in Mendelian properties there is a difference in molecular properties. Thus, even if theory reduction is not available, the facts of Mendelian genetics can be ontologically reduced to facts of molecular genetics. Others describe this situation by observing that while token-token reduction is possible, type-type reduction is not to be had (Kimbrough 1979). Closer to a Kuhnian notion of incommensurability is Michael Ruse’s (1971) reconstruction, according to which the Mendelian gene and the molecular gene are incompatible concepts. One reason is that the former was treated as a unit of function, recombination, and mutation, while the latter is not. Furthermore, molecular genetics explains everything that is explained by Mendelian genetics and more; it has more explanatory power and is more accurate. Hence, according to Ruse, molecular genetics does not reduce, but replaces Mendelian genetics. Others defend the thesis that Mendelian genetics in its original version is reduced by molecular genetics (e.g., Goosens 1978).

Another, influential set of challenges to theory reduction in genetics is posed by Philip Kitcher (1984). The main problem, and indeed one that is fundamental to any account of theory reduction that identifies theories with sets of laws, is that there are no laws in classical genetics. Even seemingly straightforward examples such as what came to be called “Mendel’s laws”, as Kitcher shows, are neither laws, nor do they play an important explanatory role in classical genetics. Kitcher further argues that the basic predicates of classical genetics, such as “x is a gene” cannot be unequivocally connected to the vocabulary of molecular genetics through bridge principles, as it would be required for successful theory reduction. Finally, even if these two issues were solved, an account based on the principles of molecular genetics would not explain the phenomena of classical genetics any better than the cytological explanations already in place. Others argue against this disunified picture of Mendelian and molecular genetics that the two fields depend on each other in their practices. This interdependence, however, also precludes an eliminative reduction (i.e., replacement) (Vance 1996).

Several authors suggest that the debates on in-principle reducibility are far removed from explanatory practice in molecular genetics. Wimsatt (1974) highlights theories of inter-level relations and how they facilitate mechanistic explanations (see the entry on mechanisms in science). Pointing towards a sematic view of theory, which holds that theories are families of related models, Waters (1990, 1994) maintains that molecular genetics provides explanations for phenomena described by Mendelian theory. The basis for this is that both fields rely on the principle that only phenotypic differences in a population, rather than the presence of traits is explained by genes (or rather by genetic differences). While these authors still speak of theoretical reduction, theory has changed its status. Rather than one theory containing laws being reduced by another theory through logical deduction, theory is conceived in terms of explanatory models which mediate the conceptual and practical relations between Mendelian and molecular genetics.

Subsequently, the emphasis of philosophical debates shifts more towards explanatory reduction (Hüttemann & Love 2011; Kaiser 2015; Rosenberg 2006; Sarkar 1998). The question becomes less one of the relations between Mendelian genetics and molecular genetics, but rather whether organismic phenomena from heredity to development to evolution can or should be explained in molecular terms (see §1.4).

This section was concerned with the relation of the theories in which gene concepts are embedded from the perspective of scientific change. The next section will address scientific change on the level of the gene concept itself, where the focus is on the question to what extent such concepts remain constant regarding reference and meaning when theories and practices change.

2.2 Conceptual change and the gene concept

About the time when philosophers of science turned to biology, a new theory of meaning was widely discussed—the causal theory of reference (Kripke 1972; Putnam 1975; see entries on reference and natural kinds). Proponents of this view turned against earlier theories of reference, which they took to hold that the reference of a token (an instance of a term’s use) is fixed by a description of the referent the speaker has in mind and that represents the term’s meaning. Instead, according to the new theory, a natural kind term, and especially a scientific term, is connected to a kind of entity when it is used for the first time to refer to an instance as belonging to a certain natural kind by an ostensive gesture or an equivalent. Speakers might then use a scientific term to refer to a natural kind, even if they are not able to identify a member of the kind in question or have false beliefs about this kind of entity. They rely on the fact that there are experts in their broader linguistic community who can identify members of the kind in question in the way it was initially introduced, and who stand in a suitable causal relation with the event of the original naming of the kind through a series of communicative links. The initial identification of a kind might have been based on recognizing some salient shared properties (“nominal essence” in Locke’s terms; Locke on real essences). However, if the introduction of the term has indeed successfully identified a natural kind, then, eventually, the “real essence” of the kind will be identified, presumably in form of the physical microstructure, which explains the initially recognized properties. The latter still play a role in characterizing a stereotype for non-expert speakers, but based on the underlying causal properties experts can determine kind membership unequivocally in every case (Putnam 1975).

Based on such a view, the dependence of the reference of theoretical terms in science on a description or on its relation to a currently accepted theory can be avoided. This is what made causal theories of reference attractive to philosophers of biology, who saw continuity in the use of the term “gene” despite significant theoretical shifts in genetics during the twentieth century. This view suggests the following narrative regarding the events presented in Part 1: Mendel had identified a natural kind when he identified gametic elements involved in the inheritance of characters. Early Mendelians used a variety of terms but referred to the same entity when performing hybridization experiments. Later the units were named “genes” but the communicative chain connecting earlier and later uses of the terms referring to entities belonging to the natural kind remained intact. And even if the meaning of the concept changed, i.e., various properties shared by the members of the kind were suggested or dropped from the list of necessary and sufficient criteria, eventually, a molecular characterization of genes was achieved, which explained the most stable observed properties (or their variation under varying conditions) and was since available for expert geneticists to determine whether something was a gene or not. Much of the debate sketched in the following can be described as discussing to what extent this narrative is adequate.

Kitcher takes causal theories of reference as his starting point to discuss conceptual change in the case of the gene concept (1982). He introduces the notion of reference potential of a term type, which on his account comprises several ways in which the reference of a token is fixed. On the one hand, there are several modes of reference and they are correlated with the intention of the speakers. Sometimes a speaker might value clarity and hence provide a description that fixes the reference of a term in the sense of descriptivist theories of reference. Indeed, researchers or teachers often provide definitions of the term “gene”. The description might turn out to be wrong, however, and hence the term might fail to refer, but at least the speaker made it transparent in which sense the term is used. In other situations, a speaker might want to conform to the established use of a term in a community. In this case the reference is fixed in the way suggested by causal theories of reference; in using the term the speaker relies on the existence of experts in the broader language community, who know how the term is applied correctly (i.e., how a member of the natural kind is identified). These experts are causally connected to the initial event of the term’s introduction. This is the way most people use the term “gene”. Finally, speakers might refer to an entity in a situation where they are in direct causal interaction with it. This might be the case when researchers refer to genes in research articles reporting experiments involving genes.

On the other hand, and this is what expands the reference potential of a concept, there are various descriptions available, which speakers might use to fix the reference of the term “gene”. Furthermore, there are several causal trajectories by which various groups of experts are connected to situations where the term was introduced by something akin to ostension. Finally, there are always new situations in which researchers refer by ostension in direct interaction with genes, possibly based on new kinds of experiments. Conceptual change for Kitcher is thus constituted by changes in the reference potential of a concept, in this case, in the ways tokens of the term “gene” refer to genes (if they refer at all).

When applying theories of reference, philosophers typically commit to realism of some form. This means that they assume that there are natural kinds and that a concept, when it refers successfully, picks out some natural kind. When dealing with complex matters such as the phenomena of heredity, there are certainly several natural kinds to be identified. Hence, according to Kitcher, not only the reference potential of a concept changes, but also the reference of the concept itself. Earlier as well as later uses of the term “gene” might have referred successfully, but the extensions of the term in earlier and later instances might nonetheless have been different. Mendelians might have picked out the natural kind of, say, chromosomal elements that are potential difference makers with respect to heritable phenotypic variation when using the term. This kind comprises protein-coding DNA sequences and some non-coding regions. Molecular geneticists might have picked out another natural kind, say, template for functional molecules, which did not include some of the elements referred to as genes by Mendelians, but protein-coding DNA sequences as well as sequences coding for functional RNA. While this opens the door to a form of pluralism regarding genes as natural kinds, Kitcher connects his account to a notion of progress. He maintains that the reference potential of the gene concept improved. Descriptions that failed to fix reference were rejected and causal trajectories going back to the ostensive introduction of a term that turned out to have failed to pick out a natural kind or picked a natural kind no longer held to be significant are cut. In Kitcher’s view molecular genetics refined the concept of the gene. The notions of failure of reference and improvement of the reference potential are of course dependent on the status of molecular biological knowledge at a given time, which provides the baseline for the evaluation of concepts (Weber 2005: Ch. 7; for developments since Kitcher’s writing, see §1.5).

Richard Burian (1985), like Kitcher, is concerned with the facts that theoretical terms can pick out natural kinds even when a theory turns out to be mistaken and that researchers who disagree in their theories can use a concept that refers to the same natural kind. Burian illustrates these points with the case of Bateson, who held theoretical views that are now seen as false (e.g., regarding the presence/absence hypothesis, see §1.1), but who is still taken to have referred successfully to genes on most occasions where he used the term or synonyms. Furthermore, Bateson was able to discuss the chromosome theory held by the Morgan group (see §1.2), despite rejecting it. This only makes sense if it is assumed that despite disagreement, both parties used the term “gene” to refer to the same natural kind. Burian aims at a hybrid account combining extensionalist views based on causal theories of reference and intensionalist views relying on the notion of theoretical descriptions. Theoretical differences among accounts put forward by various groups simultaneously or across time can thus be bridged by a gene concept exhibiting “referential openness” achieved by indefinite, rather schematic descriptions that are not committed to the material nature of genes but nonetheless characterize them through their causal effects and in that sense operationalize the concept. While such concepts facilitate continuity in scientific change, any given research project will operate with a specification of the description that provides criteria to individuate genes and that relies on a mix of functional and structural characterizations. How genes are identified depends among other things on how and on what level the phenotype is determined (e.g., as qualitative or quantitative, molecular or morphological). Such specific gene concepts then account for the discontinuities observed in the history of genetics (Burian 1985; [1995] 2005). In the light of the complex cellular processes in which DNA is involved, both Kitcher and Burian suggest that molecular biologists ultimately study the genetic material rather than genes, but importantly, they are still interested in functional units; a gene then becomes “anything a competent biologist chooses to call a gene” (Kitcher 1992: 131). Genomics or post-genomics can be understood as enhancing this shift (see §1.5; Dupré 2004; Stotz et al. 2006; entry on genomics and postgenomics).

Marcel Weber (2005: Ch. 7) begins his discussion of reference and conceptual change in genetics by drawing on Kitcher’s account of changing modes of reference and reference potentials, following Burian in emphasizing the important role of meaning in terms of descriptions or theoretical beliefs. Weber then presents a more fine-grained series of conceptual changes, driven by the introduction of new investigative techniques or new experimental organisms (esp. bacteria and phage), and observes that the reference potential (including theoretical beliefs) as well as the extension of the term “gene” changed continuously. Weber describes a situation where a broad extension based on the causal effects observed in Mendelian crossing experiments is narrowed down when additional criteria are introduced in classical, chromosome-based genetics, broadened again to include bacteria and viruses, and narrowed down again to sequences of DNA that determine the sequence of proteins (see §§1.1–1.3). Furthermore, in different contexts researchers could interpret the molecular characterization differently, for instance, including or excluding regulatory sequences.

Because of this diachronic and synchronic variation in gene concepts, Weber speaks of “floating reference”, highlighting permanent change in the reference potential and shifts in reference. This fact, according to Weber, is explained by metaphysical considerations regarding the nature of biological objects. Evolution produces variation; this is true also for genetic material. As a result, genetic material exhibits kinds in the sense of classes of objects that share some causal disposition, but it can nonetheless be divided in various ways. Hence different historical and contemporary gene concepts identify different kinds depending on the methods and interests of researchers. Apart from the different ways to identify causally relevant classes of objects, any such class contains objects none of which is exactly like the other. The gene concept is thus comparable to the species concept (Weber 2014; see entry on species).

Furthermore, Weber moves from general characterizations of concepts to an empirical study of reference to particular genes in Drosophila in the context of investigative practices in genetics, such as the molecular cloning of genes in the context of developmental biology (see §1.4). Even though reference and description of classical and various versions of molecular gene concepts differ, it turns out that the classical concept is utilized in identifying genes (e.g., those involved in the organization of the fly embryo), which are then made subject to molecular characterization (Weber 2005: Ch 7; see also Waters 1994). Thus, despite a lack of complete co-extension of the classical and the molecular gene concepts, partial referential continuity plays a significant role in mediating investigative practices.

The importance of investigative practices highlighted by Weber is also emphasized by Ingo Brigandt (2010). He suggests that the content of theoretical concepts consists of three elements: a concept’s reference; its inferential role, which he construes similarly to Kitcher’s reference potential; and its epistemic goal, which he specifies as the theoretical, explanatory, and investigative aims that are facilitated using a given concept. Brigandt argues that change of or variation in the inferential role of a concept is rational when the inferences or explanations supported by the revised concept support a given epistemic goal better than an earlier or an alternative version. The epistemic goals associated with a concept can change as well, typically, according to Brigandt, in a gradual manner. From this perspective, Brigandt reconstructs a continuous shift in the goals pursued by researchers using the gene concept, from classical genetics, which pursued the epistemic goal of predicting patterns of inheritance to molecular genetics’ focus on the goal of explaining how genes bring about their molecular products, through various intermediate goals, such as understanding the influence of genes on cell metabolism (see §§1.2–1.3). Furthermore, the account addresses the variety of gene concepts emerging in the last 30 years (see §1.5). While the epistemic goal connected to the gene concept in contemporary molecular genetics remains similar to that associated with the classical molecular gene, i.e., to elucidate how DNA contributes to functional RNA and protein, reference and inferential role are specific to various research contexts. More recent discussions of conceptual change in biology have not focused on genes, but on related concepts such as dominance (Shan 2020) or lineage (Neto 2020).

The next section focuses on the simultaneous use of various gene concepts in contemporary biology rather than the succession of gene concepts.

2.3 The plurality of gene concepts in contemporary biology

2.3.1 The instrumental and the molecular gene

The gene concept that structured the work of early Mendelism and chromosomal genetics is referred to as “instrumental gene” (Falk 1986; Griffiths & Stotz 2006). Geneticists routinely identified genes based on phenotypic differences in hybridization experiments or the analysis of pedigrees (see §1.2). Differences between, first germ cells, and, later, more specifically, between chromosomes, had to be assumed to explain patterns of phenotypic correlation between sexually reproducing organisms and their offspring. These units of difference in the genetic material could also, and more importantly, be used to predict phenotypes. For these purposes, it was not necessary to know what exactly their physical location or material composition was. In this sense, the concept was instrumental. In a similar way, Lenny Moss (2003: Ch. 1) characterizes the gene-P as a gene defined by its phenotypic effect and used for prediction (the “P” can thus stand for “phenotype” or “prediction”, but Moss also points out that the concept is associated with instrumental preformationism).

Once the tools of molecular genetics were in place, for each case the genetic difference correlated with the phenotypic difference could be located in the DNA and hence the genes of classical genetics could be molecularized (Waters 1994). The instrumental gene (as a unit that correlates with a phenotypic difference, segregates in a Mendelian manner, and is subject to recombination events) can remain indeterminate regarding DNA-sequence and need not correspond to a gene that has an identifiable product. In many cases one of the genetic variants consists in the absence or lack of a function of a gene product and there are many ways in which a change in DNA can result in the lack of a resource (Moss 2003: Ch. 1). The instrumental gene can correspond to elements of various size, including whole chromosome aberrations, and they might be located in coding regions as much as in regulatory elements or even insulator regions that only function to separate other functional elements, as long as a difference in  the sequence is correlated with a phenotypic effect (Griffiths & Stotz 2006).

The concept of the gene analyzed in terms of instrumental genes, or genes-P, is still widely used in many contexts such as evolutionary biology, agricultural breeding, or medicine (even though it might play out differently in the identification of genetic traits and in evolutionary theory, respectively; see Gifford 2000; S. Gilbert 2000). The instrumental gene thus exists along-side other gene concepts which emphasize the material basis and immediate biochemical roles of genes.

Molecular genetics gave rise to what has been called the “classical molecular gene” concept (Neumann-Held 1999, see §§1.3–1.4). The classical molecular gene was characterized both structurally and functionally in the following way: A gene exhibits a certain structure known as an “open reading frame” (ORF), that is, a sequence of codons between and including a start and a stop codon, which initiate and terminate translation respectively (i.e., they exhibit their function in the transcribed RNA, but can be identified in the corresponding DNA). Also, transcription and translation initiation and determination signals, such as transcription factor binding sites and other regulatory elements typically associated with protein-coding genes were often seen as part of the molecular gene (forming a “transcription unit”). The function of such a molecularly described gene was to give rise (via mRNA) to a polypeptide chain as the basis of a functional protein through the processes of transcription and translation. The gene fulfilled this function by acting as a template. Complications such as splicing or overlapping genes were initially not seen as compromising the structural-functional unity of the material gene. Non-coding, functional RNA could also be assimilated to the concept, if it was possible to identify a stretch of DNA based on linear correspondence between the product and its gene (Griffiths & Stotz 2006).

In the molecular realm, yet another gene concept, gene-D, can be identified, which is characterized in contrast to the gene-P and captures a situation in which researchers identify genes as developmental resources (Moss 2003: Ch. 1). Genes-D are typically classical molecular genes, but here the emphasis is on function rather than structure and especially on function beyond the initial role as template. As pointed out by Weber (2005: Ch. 7), researchers’ attention is often initially guided towards a part of DNA sequence conceptualized as gene-P, that is, as associated with phenotypic variation. Once the relevant gene is cloned and the regulatory networks in which it is involved as well as the activities of its product are investigated, it frequently becomes clear that it is expressed in many tissues, in different contexts and at different times (see §1.4). Furthermore, the locus in question often functions as template for a large variety of products. Hence, while the gene-P is indeterminate with respect to sequence, the gene-D is indeterminate with respect to phenotype. Addressing a gene as gene-D means to investigate its various roles in the process of epigenesis. The fact that the absence of one or several of these products leads to phenotypic change does not imply that the resource is more important in the development of the structure exhibiting the phenotype than the large number of other genes involved and their respective products. Instead, the phenotype shows how the developmental process responds to the absence of a resource. The fallacious notion of genes for a certain trait (e.g., blue eyes) containing developmental information (e.g., for making blue eyes) results when biologists (or commentators) conflate the separate notions that genes-D contain template information and that genes-P contain predictive information (Moss 2003: Ch. 1 and 2). While “gene for” talk is misleading in the context of development (Kampourakis 2017), the notion has been defended in the context of evolution (Kaplan & Pigliucci 2001).

The classical molecular gene concept was closely related to the notions of genetic information and the genetic code (see §1.3 and entry on biological information). While some philosophers have described these terms as potentially misleading metaphors (Sarkar 1996), many see these concepts either as used in a literal sense and hence justified (Godfrey-Smith 2000), or as metaphorical, but productive (Levy 2011). The details of an adequate explication are much debated (e.g., Stegmann 2005), but on the level of molecular phenotypes (mainly proteins) the information concept is seen as relatively uncontroversial. More debated is the question if information, or the notion of causal specificity that it implies, is a unique property of DNA or if it applies to other cellular and extra-cellular components as well (Baxter 2019; Bourrat 2020; Griffiths & Stotz 2013: Ch. 4–6; Griffiths et al. 2015; Waters 2007; Weber 2017; Woodward 2010). On the level of whole organism phenotypes, genetic information has been explicated in terms of teleosemantic theories borrowed from philosophy of mind and emphasizing the selected function of genes (Maynard Smith 2000; Sterelny et al. 1996). The parity thesis, stating that non-genetic factors can carry information in the same sense has been suggested on this level as well (Griffiths 2001). Other philosophers have discussed the question of whether selected function would not be better located on the level of the developing organism as the receiver of information (Jablonka 2002) or if a notion of genetic representation can be reformulated in terms of transmission in an intergenerational information producer and consumer system (Shea 2013; cf. Kõiv 2020; Planer 2016).

From a broader perspective, it has been argued that information talk in genetics results in the persistence of genetic determinism (Oyama [1985] 2000). The latter notion expresses the idea that an organism will exhibit a trait if it carries certain alleles, where the role of the environment is reduced to permitting this potential to unfold (see entries on heritability and the distinction between innate and acquired characteristics). The question is if the influence of genes and environment can be separated, especially when considering the often non-additive character of genotype-environment interactions (Gray 1992; Griffiths 2006; Kitcher 2001). These issues are most controversial and have received most attention regarding the question to what extent human behaviors or cognitive capabilities can be described as genetically determined (Esposito 2017; Keller 2010; Longino 2013; Schaffner 2016; Tabery 2014; Turkheimer 2019). Interestingly, the new science of molecular epigenetics is often framed in a deterministic language as well (see §1.5; Meloni 2016; Richardson 2017; Waggoner & Uller 2015).

2.3.2 The molecular and the post-genomic gene

Molecular biology is not interested merely in the physical characterization of molecules; it aims to assign biological roles to molecules, that is, functions in highly specialized, directively organized systems (Waters 2000). However, it becomes increasingly questionable if molecules identified as developmental resources or functional parts of cellular mechanisms can be identified in a coherent manner as genes or gene products. The classical molecular gene concept has been undermined by the accumulation of insights about the complexities of regulation and post-transcriptional processing of RNA (see §§1.4–1.5; Fogle 2000; Portin 2002). A more flexible gene concept has since emerged, which analysts have dubbed the “post-genomic gene” (Griffiths & Stotz 2006). In an influential article, researchers associated with the ENCODE project suggested the following definition:

The gene is a union of genomic sequences encoding a coherent set of potentially overlapping functional products. (Gerstein et al. 2007: 677)

In this view, several molecular products are the starting point from which elements in the genome are identified giving rise to this set of products (regulatory regions not included).

The post-genomic gene thus not only adds to the plurality of gene concepts, but it is also inherently pluralistic. Many new cellular processes have been discovered and found to be ubiquitous, such as frameshifting, antisense DNA transcription, alternative and trans-splicing, RNA editing, as well as an abundance of regulatory elements in DNA, and of DNA regions transcribed to non-coding, but functional RNA. This has created a situation in which no single or simple set of criteria can be formulated for when a sequence of DNA counts as a gene. While the classical molecular gene seemed to reestablish a one-one relation of genes and phenotypes on the molecular level (one gene – one polypeptide), the processes just mentioned can result in a situation where one gene identified through an ORF gives rise to various gene products (molecular phenotypes). One can thus speak of “molecular pleiotropy” (Burian 2004). Additionally, a given product might be synthesized from various genes (ORFs). Accordingly, a given stretch of DNA can belong to several genes identified more broadly as set of template resources for a product. Furthermore, the nature of these processes implies that the molecular phenotype is not determined by the DNA sequence but depends on a distributed and context-dependent interaction of many cellular and, ultimately, extracellular factors. Hence one can also speak of “molecular epigenesis” in this respect (Burian 2004).

Again, however, it seems that just as the molecular gene concept has not replaced the instrumental gene concept, the new, post-genomic concept has not replaced the molecular gene concept. Indeed, empirical research shows that groups that identify with different subfields of biology prefer different gene concepts (Stotz et al. 2004). Referring to genes as more or less straightforward representations of gene products in DNA sequence plays an important role in many contexts, and for coordinating research and integrating results from various fields. Gene annotation, for instance, which is necessary to make genome sequences in databases accessible in a useful way, depends on identifying genes in a canonical manner (Baetu 2012a; see §1.5). The persisting classical molecular gene concept can be referred to as the “consensus” or “nominal gene” (Burian 2004; Fogle 2000; Griffiths & Stotz 2006). The post-genomic gene concept, instead, has been proposed to capture situations where researchers focus on the complexities of regulation, transcription, and translation, and conceptualize genes as template resources used in various ways in cellular processes (Griffiths & Stotz 2006). Even in cases of complex transcription, however, the identification of genes tends to be guided by the consensus gene concept. As opposed to the instrumental and the nominal molecular gene, the post-genomic gene does not entail a prescription as to how to identify a gene. In some sense, the focus shifts more to function (the product), but at the same time this new concept de-emphasizes the gene as a unit and facilitates the study of the whole genome as a set of complexly structured DNA molecules (Barnes & Dupré 2008; Falk 2010).

Because of its focus on structure and the resulting usefulness for annotation practices in bioinformatics, the nominal gene remains the unit of analysis in comparative genomics (see §1.5). In these contexts, claims about similarity in terms of nominal molecular genes are often translated into claims of similarity more broadly construed, based on the assumption that homologous genes yield homologous products and hence are involved in homologous functions. Such claims are, however, often not warranted given the complexity of gene expression (Piotrowska 2009). On the other hand, much of genomic research seems not to be committed to any specific gene concept. Statistical techniques of bioinformatic sequence comparison function as discovery tools that detect relations between genome sequences, transcripts, and proteins or between sequences on any level among various species (Perini 2011). They can suggest candidate genes, indicate events of post-transcriptional processing, or point to processes of genome evolution (see §§1.4–1.5). Researchers in genomics (involving sequence annotation tasks), seem to respond to the complexities of regulation and post-transcriptional processing by operating with an extended structural characterization (“syntax-based”, in the parlance of bioinformatics-driven research) of genes and other genome elements, rather than emphasizing the ad hoc identification of genes from the perspective of products captured by the post-genomic gene concept (Baetu 2011, 2012a). A sequence thus characterized can still give rise to a variety of products, but their processing depends on splicing signals and similar sequence features that can be identified on a structural level. In this view, genes appear “as modular sets of instructions for the genome expression machinery of the cell” (Baetu 2011: 718).

In terms of development, the genome has been described not only as a resource, but also as reactive to the cellular context rather than as directing cellular processes (S. Gilbert 2003; Griffiths & Stotz 2013: Ch. 4; Keller 2014). The genome is always embedded in a cellular environment (also virus genomes become reactive in the context of their host’s cells), and cellular processes mediate between the organismal or extra-organismal environment and the genome. The post-genomic gene concept is thus open to integrate molecular epigenetic processes that turn environmental cues into regulatory signals. Molecular epigenetics has also been discussed as a pathway of inheritance, alternative to DNA transmission and more responsive to environmental changes (Jablonka & Raz 2009; entry on inheritance systems). Emerging knowledge of these processes re-shapes explanations in heredity, development, and evolution and hence shifts the explanatory status of gene concepts (Baedke 2018; Griesemer 2011; Griffiths & Stotz 2013, Ch. 5; Le Goff et al. 2021; Stotz & Griffiths 2016). Furthermore, next to the complexity of the regulation and genesis of molecular products, also the interaction of products as studied in systems biology displays a complexity that makes it difficult to ascribe functional roles to genes (see entry on philosophy of systems and synthetic biology; see §1.5). If genes are deleted from the genome experimentally (“gene knock-out”), this often does not have the expected effect on developmental processes, because the encoded molecules are part of large interaction networks that can exhibit a high degree of robustness and redundancy (Mitchell 2009: Ch. 4; Morange 2001: Ch. 5). The stochasticity of gene expression and molecular interactions emerges as another aspect complicating the role of genes and gene products in cellular processes (Casali & Merlin 2020; Kupiec 2014; Morange 2011; Nicholson 2019).

In the light of these developments, one might say that the post-genomic gene was disassociated from the notion of a “genetic program”, which was criticized as embodying a preformationist view of development (Keller 2000; Moss 1992; Robert 2004; entry on theories of biological development). Some have argued, however, that the concept is still important for reasoning about regulatory mechanisms, highlighting roles and organizational features of genomic elements without excluding others (Baetu 2012b; Calcott 2020). Nonetheless, it appears that post-genomic explanations are rather articulated in terms of signaling, regulatory, or interaction networks than programs (Calcott 2014; Huneman 2019; Planer 2014). Even though genes do not constitute a blueprint of the organism (Pigliucci 2010), DNA and its functional elements provide a form of stability necessary for epigenetic processes to yield robust outcomes (De Tiège et al. 2015; Meunier & Reynaud 2017; Vecchi 2020).

Suggestions have been made to use the term “gene” to refer to the whole process that yields the functional product (the “process molecular gene” concept, Neumann-Held 1999). But apart from the fact that it is difficult to delineate the boundaries of such a process, this seems to be too distant from the ways researchers use the term. Biologists and philosophers have suggested alternative terminologies for DNA sequences that are meant to replace or complement the problematic term gene, for instance, regarding genome evolution (Brosius & Gould 1992), regulation (Scherrer & Jost 2007), and from an integrative systems perspective (Keller & Harel 2007). While some of these interventions seem to suggest that the gene concept has become redundant, biologists have emphasized its explanatory value when seen in the right context, in particular, as a cellular component (Hall 2001). It might be the case that this component of cells has received undue attention to the expense of others, but it must also be noted that genes (or DNA) are often in focus because they can be most easily intervened on, while these interventions can then also be informative about other components of cellular processes (Gannett 1999; Waters 2008). Similarly, in the practical contexts of synthetic biology, genes can often successfully be constructed, conceptually and materially, as causal agents (Oftedal & Parkkinen 2013). More generally, it has been suggested that the gene concept is useful exactly because of its overall vagueness, because it can be adjusted to specific epistemic needs within newly emerging fields and at the same time facilitate connections between disparate areas of research (Rheinberger & Müller-Wille 2018).

3. Conclusion

It became clear that discussions in philosophy of biology are driven by developments in biology. At the same time, it appears that there is no end to scientific innovation in biology. New technologies open new windows into biological domains, make new phenomena accessible, or shed a different light on known entities and processes. These developments and the ensuing theoretical shifts and conceptual transformations will require a type of conceptual reflection and clarification for which philosophy of science has developed an indispensable set of tools (Pradeu et al. forthcoming).


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The author would like to thank Jan Baedke, Dominic Berry, Soraya de Chadarevian, Elizabeth Hughes, Staffan Müller-Wille, Ulrich Stegmann, and the reviewers for their suggestions and comments. The entry was written at the University of Kassel under funding by the Deutsche Forschungsgemeinschaft (DFG – German Research Foundation) – project nr. 362545428, and finalized while being visiting postdoctoral fellow in the MPRG “Practices of Validation in the Biomedical Sciences” at the Max Planck Institute for the History of Science, Berlin, and postdoc researcher at the University of Lübeck in the Cluster of Excellence “Precision Medicine in Chronic Inflammation” (EXC 2167), DFG project nr. 390884018.

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