Photo of young Anderson
John Anderson c. 1926
University of Sydney Archives

John Anderson

First published Mon Oct 22, 2012; substantive revision Wed Nov 29, 2017

John Anderson (1893–1962) was a Scottish philosopher who worked primarily in Australia. In 1927 he was appointed to the Challis Chair of Philosophy at the University of Sydney and occupied this position until his retirement in 1958. In relative isolation he developed a distinctive realist philosophy which was inspirational for generations of students at Sydney. While developing this position, he carried most of the teaching load in philosophy at the university, wrote the articles for which he is primarily known, and as contributor and editor kept the Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy going. Shortly after his arrival in Sydney he acted as theoretical advisor to the Communist Party of Australia, but moved away from the party through the 1930s and finally adopted a strongly anti-communist stance. He remained active throughout his career, however, in a series of public controversies concerning censorship, university reform, academic freedom and opposition to religious instruction in education. Depending upon one’s perspective, these activities diverted him from serious philosophical work or were the natural expression of his philosophical outlook. On either view his intellectual impact at Sydney was overwhelming. Philosophers such as David Malet Armstrong, John Passmore, John Leslie Mackie, Eugene Kamenka, Jim Baker and David Stove all acknowledged Anderson’s formative influence. From his early teaching at Edinburgh, Anderson influenced the social and political thought of Rush Rhees, and so also indirectly that of Alasdair Macintyre who came to recognise and value common themes in his own sociological and historical view of ethics. Outside the academy, Anderson’s criticisms of conventional morality and his account of positive ethical goods promoting a stance of commitment, endeavour, risk and critical opposition to merely customary expectations was a powerful tonic for a small but influential group of anti-careerist intellectuals, lawyers, journalists and artists collectively known as the “Sydney Push”.

1. Life and Work

John Anderson was born in 1893 in the weaving and coal-mining village of Stonehouse, Lanarkshire (about 20km from Glasgow). His father was schoolmaster in the village and politically active in the Independent Labour Party. In 1911 Anderson began his university studies at the University of Glasgow, enrolling in two successive honours degrees: mathematics/natural philosophy (including laboratory training) and logic/moral philosophy (including political economy). His undergraduate studies extended throughout the years of the World War, culminating in 1917 with his Masters thesis on the philosophy of William James. Declared medically unfit for service, his experience of the war was dominated by the Red Clydeside industrial and rental disputes, characterised by workers’ resistance to state and industry attempts to re-organise work practices and personnel in the interests of a supposed common national interest. The disputes ultimately led to state suppression at the conclusion of the war when British troops and artillery were deployed to Glasgow.

Anderson’s philosophical direction was powerfully influenced by the Australian-born philosopher, Samuel Alexander, who delivered the Gifford Lectures at Glasgow in 1918. In the previous year Anderson had been awarded for an essay supporting Henry Jones’ practical idealist view of the state as a moral agent. Following Alexander’s lectures (later published as Space, Time and Deity) Anderson accepted the case for the complete rejection of this form of idealism in favour of a new and systematic realist programme.

In 1919 Anderson married fellow philosophy student Jenny Baillie, was appointed assistant lecturer at University College of South Wales (where he also provided Workers’ Education Classes) and was subsequently appointed assistant lecturer in logic at the University of Glasgow. In 1920 he was appointed lecturer at the University of Edinburgh and so became the main exponent of realism in Norman Kemp Smith’s Department of Logic and Metaphysics. In the same year, his brother William accepted the Chair of Mental and Moral Philosophy at Auckland University College, New Zealand.

By 1926 Anderson had become dispirited by the rejection for publication of a textbook on logic that he had been working on since 1922. He had also become politically isolated in the department because of his support for the General Strike in Britain. Such factors may have moved him to accept the Challis Chair of Philosophy at the University of Sydney, although as with his brother, the movement of Scottish philosophers to Commonwealth universities was not unusual. In 1927 he moved with Jennie and their young son Alexander (“Sandy”) to Sydney.

Anderson’s first serious professional engagement was in a critical discussion of F. C. S. Schiller’s logic, “Propositions and Judgments” and “The Truth of Propositions” (1926). The first outlines of a distinctive realist position were made in “Empiricism” and “The Knower and the Known” (1927). After his arrival at Sydney, Anderson was intent upon developing this position and was dismissive of the fragmentary nature of most international philosophy in the wake of the “linguistic turn”. The important philosophical work in Anderson’s view was to establish and preserve a school of realist philosophy as the repository of a tradition of critical inquiry that would remain alert to the dangers of corrupting external forces and expectations.

Shortly after his arrival at Sydney, Anderson became a “theoretical advisor” to the Australian Communist Party and so began a long history of antagonising conservative political and cultural representatives in the city. He was repeatedly accused of disloyalty and communist sympathies by returned servicemen organisations, the churches and the conservative political parties. The University Senate ultimately debated censure although a motion to declare him unfit to occupy the Chair of Philosophy was defeated.

In 1930 James Joyce’s Ulysses was banned in Australia and the Freethought Society was formed with Anderson as President. Anderson’s political influence at Sydney primarily took the form of a libertarian pluralism, particularly concerned with issues of state and religious censorship and interference in education. By the 1940s and 1950s his political position was strongly anti-communist. Yet he remained unpopular with conservative politicians and clerics and was criticised for “corrupting the city’s youth” as late as 1961.

In 1935 Anderson became the editor of The Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy. He had previously contributed significantly to the journal with his articles “Determinism and Ethics” (1928), “The Non-Existence of Consciousness”, “‘Universals’ and Occurrences” (1929), “The Place of Hegel in the History of Philosophy”, “Utilitarianism” (1932), “Realism and Some of its Critics” (1933), and “Mind as Feeling” (1934). He retained editorial responsibility for the journal until 1947 when it passed to John Passmore with the new name The Australasian Journal of Philosophy.

In 1958 Anderson retired and in 1962 died at his home in Sydney’s northern suburbs. The Challis Chair of Philosophy was occupied for the next 30 years by Anderson’s students, J. L. Mackie (1959–1963) and D. M. Armstrong (1964–1991). Both philosophers were critical of Anderson’s philosophy and were more engaged with contemporary philosophical debates, but both also acknowledged Anderson’s formative influence on their work.

In 1972 members of the Department of Philosophy at the University of Sydney were caught in a bitter dispute concerning subject matter, educational practices and the nature of philosophical study itself, and by the start of 1974 the department had split into two separate units. D. M. Armstrong led the minority Department of Traditional and Modern Philosophy away from what he perceived to be the politically radical but philosophically barren Department of General Philosophy. Political disruptions throughout the academic world in the early 1970s were not uncommon, but the particular intransigence and secessionist tendencies which characterised both sides of the conflict at Sydney may well have been at least in part a legacy of Anderson’s teaching and practice. The department eventually reunited some thirty years later.

2. Outline of Anderson’s Philosophy

The emphasis of Anderson’s realism is upon independence, directed particularly at the notion of constitutive relations (which he takes to be the central error of idealism), but also employed in qualifying reductivist and instrumentalist forms of scientific explanation. His position is that although whatever exists has relations and is conditioned, it is nonetheless a specific existing thing with qualities of its own. It is the aim of critical inquiry in any given field to identify relevant qualities and characteristics and to state the issue in the form of objective and communicable truth. Whatever our interests draw our attention to, the truth of the matter is independent of our consideration. Whatever innovative and imaginative uses we make of particular things, those uses are available to us because of existing properties in the things themselves. For Anderson, two aspects of philosophical speculation have been linked throughout the history of the subject, and his own thought can be considered as a single system with these complementary aspects: the logical and the ethical.

First, there is a single way of being, that of ordinary things behaving in ordinary ways in space and time. All theories of higher and lower realities can only be stated in terms of the common reality we all know and share. Anderson applied this thesis across the board: there are not different kinds or degrees of truth, only something’s being the case or not; universals and values do not exist above the world of space and time in a transcendent sphere of operation; powers are not entities distinct from the processes they explain; the mental realm cannot be conceived as operating in a sphere separate from or other than space and time. There is no absolute or logical distinction between universals and particulars – universals exist within the ordinary world, but never apart from the particulars they describe; that is, there is no ontological level above or below that of the state of affairs or the fact of a predicated subject. As the study of the formal features of facts, logic provides an account of what is objectively real: logic entails a general ontology.

Second, Anderson emphasised both the objective and subjective difficulties inherent in the endeavour to see things as they are, and the necessary discipline acquired in ongoing traditions of critical inquiry. Confronting the reality of our existence entails recognising and not turning away from the ubiquity of conflict, tension and strife in all spheres. For Anderson ethical goods exist in the world in such activities as intellectual inquiry, artistic production and scientific investigation. Ethical investigation is primarily concerned with identifying those human activities which are driven by internal standards of correctness and value and not by concern for external rewards or utilities. But these activities exist perilously in a world seriously inclined towards stasis and corruption. There is an almost theological depth to Anderson’s pessimism in this regard.

Anderson’s views in normative philosophy are outlined in writings in ethical inquiry, narrowly construed, aesthetics, political thought and educational philosophy. Ethics is the study of the real qualities of human activities, not of what is right or obligatory, these latter questions being relegated to the study of customary norms and expectations arising from particular practices and ways of life. Similarly, aesthetics is the study of the qualities of beautiful things, and is neither a study of feelings, expressions or judgments, nor a source of directives for artists. A work of art succeeds to the extent that it objectively portrays its theme, accounts for what is the case (for example, anger considered as the “theme” of The Iliad). Literary criticism consists in assessing whether the artist has succeeded, objectively, in capturing or portraying the chosen theme. In his social and political thought, Anderson holds that society is a complex of competing and cooperating movements neither united by inclusive social purpose, nor reducible to its individual members.

Underlying both logical and ethical aspects of Anderson’s thought is the identification of systematic confusions and errors in philosophical thought. One persistent confusion is the misidentification of relations as qualities. Most commonly, being in some relation is thought to constitute the “nature” of some special status entity. But whereas a term together with a quality is a complete unit just as it stands, a term and a relation is simply incomplete without a second term. Anderson applied this thesis widely: there are no such things whose nature it is to be known or perceived (“ideas”); there is no such thing whose nature it is to know (“consciousness”); there are no such things whose nature it is to be pursued or whose nature it is to direct action (“values” conceived as standing over and above the goods and values of this life). Relations are often more evident to us than the underlying qualities of the things related and so relational explanations suggest themselves to us quite naturally. On the other hand, significant intellectual effort is required in any given field to understand the illusory nature of such explanations and the manner in which they obstruct the identification and assertion of real issues.

According to Anderson, one central confusion infecting modern philosophy since Descartes has been its obsession with epistemological questions, the attempt to provide unshakeable foundations for our knowledge of the external world. There is no gap between mind and world that needs to be bridged because mentality belongs to the spatio-temporal world along with everything else. This is not to say that misunderstanding is impossible, just that understanding is possible. It is possible to know various conditions and characters of things in the first place only because things have these characters independently of our inquiries. And since as knowers we occupy the single world of space and time we come under the same conditions and so come into relations with those things that we are investigating. All knowledge depends upon empirical investigation and so is fallible: it is not built upon any more immediate or reliable entities such as sense data or self-evident ideas. Epistemological and ontological bedrock is the complex situation of being there and so, a particular’s being of a certain kind. Knowing minds are themselves complex spatio-temporal things, societies of emotions and feelings without a unifying consciousness to which these might belong nor some ultimate self which could conceivably take a stand somehow outside and beyond the world of space and time. Modern philosophy’s epistemological obsession can be regarded as an illogical attempt to look behind the proposition, to gain a sideways view of how our propositions hook up to the real world.

3. Difficulties in Understanding Anderson’s Work

Gilbert Ryle listed Anderson among the “seniors” who had preceded his own generation: philosophers such as Russell, Moore, Wittgenstein, Bradley, Stout, McTaggert, Alexander, Laird, and Kemp Smith. For Ryle, Anderson’s generation represented “the old gang”, many the products of “those dominating Scots teachers” who had established philosophy as an academic discipline in English-speaking universities around the world. Anderson was an exact contemporary of Wittgenstein and Heidegger, yet only seven years older than Ryle himself. But Ryle seems to have a point in suggesting a generational gap that separated him from that earlier generation’s “pieties, lores, sagacities, equipments – yes, and fetishes too” (Ryle 1976: 383). Ryle was describing the generation of philosophers who were adult prior to or during the Great War. He only became acquainted with Anderson in the 1950s and was struck by the manner in which Anderson had continued a form of philosophy into modern times that had given way elsewhere to philosophies more concerned with linguistic usage. Despite this recognition of interpretive challenges, for many of Anderson’s followers Ryle at that time radically misunderstood Anderson’s work (Ryle 1950), reading it from the perspective of the “linguistic turn”.

For current readers there are indeed several obstacles to approaching Anderson’s work. His published works, primarily articles for the Australasian Journal of Philosophy and Psychology and in local journals and newspapers, are difficult without the context of Anderson’s broader teaching. They are generally regarded as subsidiary to the lectures and syllabus of an Andersonian apprenticeship. It seems that they were written for the benefit of the students who already had the value of his personal contact. Without this contact, we must rely on the publication of several series of lecture notes from Anderson’s papers by Sydney University Press (see Bibliography). Anderson’s isolation from his intellectual peers and his seeming reluctance to engage in international debate also deprives contemporary students of the opportunity to locate his work within more familiar territory.

One point of access to Anderson’s work for contemporary students, of course, lies in the work of his students such as D. M. Armstrong, John Passmore, and J. L. Mackie. But there is a danger even here that their specialisations may distort our view of Anderson’s work as a whole. Anderson, as Passmore noted, was a generalist (Passmore, Introduction to Anderson’s posthumous work, Studies in Empirical Philosophy, hereafter EMP). Unlike the next generation, he expected all spheres of philosophical inquiry to open up to his investigation and his philosophy extended to all spheres: logic, metaphysics, ethics, political thought, aesthetics, education.

Anderson describes his position variously as empiricist, realist, naturalist, physicalist, positivist and pluralist, conceiving each of these as different aspects of the one truly empirical philosophy. But his use of these terms is problematic for the uninitiated. Anderson’s empiricism has no time for representational views of truth, nor for the traditional empiricist entities of sense data or ideas. Empiricism for Anderson is an ontological doctrine asserting a single way of being to which we as investigators belong. While undoubtedly committed to empirical investigation and the fallible nature of all propositional claims, Anderson’s empiricism is only secondarily an epistemological viewpoint relating to how we come to know things within this spatio-temporal world. Anderson’s realism rejects the traditional realist-nominalist options concerning the existence of universals. Universals are brought down to (spatio-temporal) earth, but there are no such things as pure universals nor pure particulars outside their roles within complex states of affairs. Mentality is a product of physico-chemical processes in the brain but this does not preclude our inquiry into the nature of mind as a field of conflicted tendencies, feelings and emotions. Whatever the special sciences tell us about their particular subject matters, philosophy retains its authority in questions of logic, that is to say, concerning the conditions of possibility of discourse. Indeed, modern science is badly infected by instrumentalist and technological views of its investigations and needs to become more truly philosophical and critical, more concerned with establishing what is the case within specific fields, and less with being practical and useful in relation to perceived societal needs (EMP, 290). Positivism then is for Anderson a commitment to what is objectively and positively the case, and not a program of instrumental or operational truth, nor a means of distinguishing meaningful from meaningless utterances. Anderson’s call for a “science of ethics” is not an assimilation of ethical inquiry to the standards of the special sciences. It is a plea for an objective investigation of the ethical, focussed on the existing ethical qualities of human activities, rather than on the pieties of traditional moral philosophy: the questions of right, obligation, duty and so forth.

Ryle was only the first of many to be accused of misreading Anderson. Criticisms of Anderson’s position from within mainstream English-language philosophy have always seemed to his followers to miss their mark. They have generally failed to recognise the ontological, non-representational, non-semantic basis for his empiricism. Robert Brandom’s recent criticism and rejection of the “theoretical, explanatory and strategic commitments” motivating Anglo-American philosophy in the 20th century lists these as: empiricism, naturalism, representationalism, semantic atomism, formalism about logic, instrumentalism about practical norms (Brandom 2000). It is extraordinary that not one of these criticised features would touch the philosophy of John Anderson as they stand (at least as Brandom outlines them). Brandom regards the notion of “facts” and “states of affairs” as emblematic of atomistic, representationalist thought. Anderson would have replied imperiously as he did to Gilbert Ryle’s “representationist” criticisms: “That is nothing to me”.

Many of the problems contemporary readers encounter in Anderson’s work result from his relative international isolation. But for many of his students it was precisely Anderson’s secessionist traditional stance that was the key to the great value of an Andersonian education. He may have failed in his project, but he kept alive at Sydney enduring values of traditional philosophical inquiry at a time when mainstream philosophy was either obsessed with linguistic usage on the one hand or in deference to the natural sciences on the other. Many of Anderson’s students expected his philosophy to re-emerge stronger following the inevitable decline of linguistic philosophy and the renewed interest in metaphysical questions which followed this decline. But if his work played any role in this renewal it was only indirectly through the work of his student D. M. Armstrong. Contemporary philosophers interested in metaphysical questions do not refer to Anderson’s work and are frankly baffled by Armstrong’s enthusiasm for his teacher’s work. Anderson exists today almost exclusively in the footnotes of his more engaged and accomplished students.

4. A Systematic Realism

In Anderson’s view the realist movement initiated by Russell and Moore had ended in failure because it had attempted to overcome Hegelian philosophy by a return to pre-idealist certainties (EMP, 89). As a result, realism had been left without a school from which to challenge the newly emerging schools of idealism and pragmatism (STP, 161). Hegel’s all-encompassing system of thought was an example for a new and systematic realism to emulate.

In brief, Hegel’s attempt to formulate his sequence of outlooks relies upon a realist view of the proposition which is incompatible with his whole theory of outlooks or categories and their varying adequacy to reality as a whole. Hegel “unwittingly is proceeding in terms of the proposition” but is caught up with the illusory attempt to establish an overarching truth (“that whereby a true proposition can be true”), instead of the task of establishing true propositions (JAA, Lectures on William James, 1935). The same criticism of Hegel seems to be made by Brandom in the service of his very different expressionist project (Brandom 2000). But for Anderson, Hegel’s doctrine of outlooks “rests on an inability to grasp the independence of truths” (EMP, 81). On the other hand, we need only reject Hegel’s doctrine of expressions to find that we are left with actual states of affairs rather than abstract being.

Neither Cartesian rationalism nor English empiricism could replace Hegel’s philosophy with any philosophical position of comparable range. Hegel was right to emphasise system, but not as totality (a pretended solution to real problems), but in the form of a single logic. He was also right to see this logic as historical, but wrong to attempt to replace a “logic of things developing” with the notion of a “developing logic” (EMP, 80). Anderson summarises the position as follows. The only way to answer Hegel would be to drop the modern fixation with epistemological questions altogether and return to a Greek consideration of things. In addition to Greek directness, a true replacement for Hegelian idealism would incorporate three major components: a positive theory of the mind as feeling and as non-unitary, as much a part of spatial and temporal reality as any non-mental things and events; a true empiricism which recognised relations and generals as being as real (and as knowable) as the particulars related; and a conception of space and time as conditions of existence rather than of human knowledge as in Kant’s transcendental idealism. Anderson proposed to replace Hegel’s totality by developing a systematic realism which would incorporate the work of John Burnet on Greek philosophy, of Sigmund Freud on mind, of William James’ radical empiricism and of Samuel Alexander’s reworking of Kant’s transcendental aesthetic (EMP, 80). Anderson does not mention here another possible source for his direct realism, namely, Scottish common sense philosophy, but he does consider this in his Lectures on Thomas Reid of 1935 (LMP).

Richard Rorty has suggested that English language philosophy in the early 20th century emerged from the dominance of Hegelian idealism by deferring to the natural sciences, partly because the alternative association with modernist literature seemed to threaten “a kind of privatised aestheticism which contained disturbing strains of irrationalism” (Rorty 1985, p. 748). Superficially, Anderson’s work suggests an attempt of some kind to assimilate philosophy to the sciences. But he was a true modernist in relation to literary culture: his articles and addresses include critical works on such figures as, in particular, James Joyce, but also Lawrence, Shaw, Wells, Grahame, Belloc, Wilde, Hardy, Ibsen, Meredith, Dostoevsky and Melville, as well as on the genre of detective fiction. Literature for Anderson had a special character as the embodiment or repository of culture (JAA, Lectures on the Educational Theories of Spencer and Dewey, 1949). At Sydney in the 1930s he championed both the works of James Joyce (recently banned) and the importance of Freudian psychoanalysis to our understanding of mentality as conflicted and passionate, and to cultural inquiry more generally (cf., Damousi 2005). He thought the pre-modernist “literary philosophers” of romanticism and idealism had shown “greater tenacity” than those philosophers who professed scientific exactitude (EMP, 80). But they had also tended to promote forms of moralising and theologising which were opposed to precision and independence of thought and which were “detrimental to culture in general” (EMP, 87). Anderson thought his interpretation of traditional Aristotelian logic had an important role to play in the new world of literary culture as much as in the natural sciences.

One major achievement of Hegel for Anderson was the encouragement he gave to the study of Greek philosophers. Anderson’s lectures explored the historical background to his propositional view of reality in the issues raised by the pre-Socratics and later in Plato’s Dialogues. Like other modernist philosophers and novelists (and Hegel himself), Anderson found in Heraclitus an inspirational alternative to what he came to regard as the sentimental and intellectually stifling idealism of his teachers.

This world, which is the same for all, no one of gods or man has made; but it was ever, is now, and ever shall be an ever-living Fire, with measures of it kindling and measures going out. (Heraclitus Fragment 20. trans. John Burnet, Early Greek Philosophy 4th Ed., 1930, p.134.)

Anderson acknowledged that Heraclitus’ emphasis on the element Fire might be read as a typically Ionian response to the question “what is the world made of”, but the more important theme is his treatment of fire purely as process, as transaction and exchange, as the paradigm element of strife and harmony. In embryo Anderson found in Heraclitus so many of his own principles: the close link between logic and ethics (ethics as the field in which conflict comes primarily to the fore); the single way of being, of “what is common” (the search for a general logic, a theory of the commensurability of things in terms of a theory of process); the recognition of complexity, conflict and strife underlying existing things; the anti-sentimentality and pessimism which refuses to find solace in unity; the hidden harmony of forces in balance preferable to the open harmony of illusory unity; the unremitting attack on subjectivist illusions of desiring or imagining things as we would like them to be (unchanging and secure) rather than seeing them for what they are.

For Anderson’s Heraclitus, “seeing things as they are” is seeing them as complex, active and changing; a perspective opposed to the optimistic, rationalist illusion of the simple, fixed and static. It is to see things as moving, historical, in process, and yet as in balance. Heraclitean “strife” is harmony: the things of everyday experience are positive and concrete because they are contingent and historical. Anderson described this “fundamental strain” in all fields of inquiry as that “between objectivism and subjectivism”, between “critical thinking” recognising complexity and tension everywhere, and “rationalist illusion” seeking the fixed and simple. (JAA, Lectures on Criticism 1955, number 11.) Rationalism here shared with more primitive mythological thinking the quest for stability, security and moral uplift. Both have looked for solutions at a higher level than the problems being addressed.

Anderson’s teaching and writings constantly refer to the history of philosophy, but Anderson was not a scholarly historian. He thought that persistent philosophical issues and positions were evident throughout history (eleaticism, for example, was a highly instructive and critical stage recurring throughout the history of the subject – for example in Green’s criticisms of Hume’s particulars). The history of philosophy helped to emphasise the value of his own position. On the other hand, his lectures and writings are laden with references to philosophers, scientists, novelists, psychoanalysts and revolutionaries. Nothing seems alien to even the most abstruse topic of discussion in his work. And his lectures were “great starters of hares” (Partridge’s reflections on Anderson’s teaching, in EAI). John Passmore acknowledges the inspiration of Anderson’s lectures in his own works on Hume, philosophical reasoning, Ralph Cudworth, perfectibility and his history of one hundred years of philosophy.

5. Specific Fields

5.1 Logic

Anderson wrote a Textbook on Logic in the early 1920s (JAA, Textbook on Logic, released 2010) and its fate tells us much about his philosophical ambitions. According to his biographer, Anderson submitted the manuscript not to narrowly academic publishers but to A. R. Orage, the editor of The New Age (Kennedy 1995 p. 64), described by the historian of Scottish philosophy, George Davie, as serving a readership “of libertarian and often leftist autodidacts” (Davie 1977 p. 57). Under Orage the journal was nonetheless a highly influential avant garde modernist vehicle for literary and political criticism. Anderson conceived his logic to have wider cultural aims than merely codifying forms of reasoning and when Orage rejected the work due to its supposed eccentricity Anderson was deeply disappointed.

Logic for Anderson is concerned with statements, and not with questions, commands, prescriptions, exhortations or other forms of expression. Logic is concerned fundamentally with statements that raise an “objective issue” and these other forms of speech do so only indirectly. (JAA, Lectures on Scientific Method, c.1950.) Discourse implies a common logic of assertion, implication and definition (EMP, 6). Apparent differences in logical form are due simply to different modes of expression. Any statement, if it is saying anything at all, can be shown by transformation into logical form to be asserting some matter of fact: a description of a certain thing as being of a certain kind, a claim that something is the case. Anderson’s students were set a range of statements to be transformed into one of the four Aristotelian propositional forms, traditionally designated as the A, E, I and O forms. In any field, until questions or issues are posed in one of these four propositional forms they will inevitably be confused and potentially misleading bases for inquiry.

A   All As are B   (AaB)
E   No As are B   (AeB)
I   Some As are B   (AiB)
O   Some As are not B   (AoB)

So, from typical examination papers in Andersonian logic:

  1. “Many hands make light work”
      → A – All shared activities are lightened
  2. “You can’t make an omelette without breaking eggs”
      → E – No omelettes are things made without breaking eggs
  3. “It is by no means unusual to find adulteration in manufactured products”
      → I – Some manufactured products are adultered
  4. “His valour is greater than his discretion”
      → O – Some valourous activities of his are not discreet

In Anderson’s view of traditional logic, the universal proposition “All As are B” asserts the simple fact that all As are B; a thing’s being of a certain sort is the irreducible minimum of a fact or state of affairs; there is no assertion of some “general connection” over and above that fact. Nor does the universal proposition assert that some class relation holds between A and B – the assertion of a class relation is just a way of saying that certain propositions are true. Nor is it about some totality A: it asserts simply of each and every A that it is B. And although it does not directly assert the existence of A, it certainly presupposes it. It is indeed the great virtue for Anderson of his version of traditional logic that it fully brings out the existential presuppositions of the proposition. In addition, Anderson thinks that what are often taken to be supreme logical truths (for example, identity statements) are not truths at all, for they say nothing. There is no analytic truth: if a proposition says anything at all, it can be false. Anderson rejects the view that mathematical truths are so only within a calculus, that is, derivable from a given set of chosen postulates.

Anderson rejects Mill’s view that universal statements are generalisations from experience. Universal propositions cannot be derived by generalisation from particular experiences, because there simply are no such immediate experiences. Such truths are derived from other universal propositions and tested in experience. In discussing the functions of subjects, predicates and the copula in propositions and the logical relations between propositions, logic is already discussing universals, individuals, identity, space-time and causality. And, contra Mill’s inductivism, because we have direct experience of generality and of relations, a single instance is sufficient to establish the universal proposition (say, that all glass is brittle). Further investigation may challenge such assertions since all our beliefs are fallible but wholesale doubt is simply not an option. The logical gap between particulars and universals that inductive reasoning proposes is a gap that no amount of human reasoning could hope to span. Hume was right in this, but instead of embracing skepticism he should have concluded as did William James that generality and relations are as much a part of our experience as are particulars.

The validity of the syllogism is fundamental and Anderson rejects the absolute independence from syllogistic reasoning of other forms of reasoning such as the relational, hypothetical and disjunctive. The syllogism demonstrates clearly that the subject in one proposition can function as the predicate in another. The difference between subject and predicate is purely one of function: the function of the subject term is to locate, that of the predicate to describe. There are not two classes of entities involved here; that is, there are no pure locations/particulars/substances, just as there are no pure descriptions/universals. There is no logical gap that needs to be spanned between subject and predicate terms: any term can play the role of particular or general, subject or predicate.

For Anderson logic is the science of the most general features of reality. Logic is not simply a useful calculus following on from an initial choice of primitives, and Anderson’s logic is not simply one version of predicate calculus among others. His view is that logic describes the general structure of facts and the relations between them. It provides the conditions of possibility for all discourse, but it is not about forms of language nor about special status entities such as universals. It is about the most general features of facts. Underlying this propositional view of reality is the thesis that things within space and time are irreducibly complex. Every situation has both particular and general aspects represented by the subject and predicate functions within the proposition. Every predicate can be the subject of a further proposition. The simplest unit is a being there and so, a state of affairs in which a particular is characterised in some specific way, but neither the particular nor the universal could exist independently. We never arrive at absolutely simple elements in any field. The quest for such simples urged by Russell, Moore and the early Wittgenstein indicated a residual rationalist element in their thinking. On the other hand, against the idealist opponents of these early realists, Anderson of course insisted that no entities could be constituted, wholly or in part, by their relations (EMP, 43).

Mackie described Anderson as the last of the Aristotelian logicians and observed some awkward consequences for his conception of logic: the problem of false propositions; the absence of a way of dealing with singular propositions; an inability to deal with multiple quantification; the difficulty in expressing relational propositions in subject-predicate and syllogistic form. For Mackie, any logic dealing with false propositions, relations of contradiction and contrariety, entertained arguments, falsifications and reductions ad absurdum must be something more than an account of propositions as what is there (Mackie 1985).

Anderson distinguished idealism’s substance-attribute logic that had been condemned by Russell from his own subject-predicate logic. Nonetheless, his Aristotelian logic of everyday experience did seem to sit uneasily with the broader search for logics that could more adequately capture forms of reasoning across a wide variety of domains. Ontological logics like Anderson’s came to seem “naively realistic and Aristotelian”, and “hard to hang on to” in the history of twentieth century philosophy (Rorty 1986). It is not just that 20th century philosophy’s “counter-intuitive redescription and relativisation to choice of primitives” (Rorty 1986) ignored Anderson’s insistence that logic is not a calculus. Technical developments in the logic of modal, tense and relational terms proceeded without reference to Anderson’s form of onto-logic.

5.2 Metaphysics

Nonetheless, a traditional form of metaphysics did make a resurgence in the last quarter of the century in the work of Anderson’s student, D. M. Armstrong. Armstrong accepts against Anderson that the nature of space and time is a matter for scientific investigation, as is the identification of real properties – Anderson’s view of three-dimensional space and one-dimensional time as “ontological bed-rock”, for example, simply cannot be sustained (Armstrong, introduction to STC). But he finds real interest in Anderson’s conception of the categories, as elaborated in the lectures on Samuel Alexander, recently published as Space, Time and the Categories: Lectures on Metaphysics (STC – published from typescript lectures in Armstrong’s possession and originally presented in 1949–50). In his introduction to these lectures, Armstrong writes:

The categories of being dive so deep that though quantum physics and other physics may have interesting things to say to philosophy – in particular whether causation is in fact deterministic – the issues are not susceptible of being resolved at the level of experimental science, yet seem to be real issues. Science may be able to cast light on whether causation is irreducibly statistical or not, but how can it decide what causation is in itself? Is it just a universal or statistical regularity? Or is it something deeper in the nature of things? What of the properties and quantities in which science inevitably traffics? Are they just concepts in our minds, or somethings in the objects that our concepts merely reflect? (STC, x)

In these lectures Anderson systematically derived the number of categories and their ordering from the nature of the proposition and its subject-predicate structure. The result was a scheme of 13 categories, laid out in Hegel-like “succession” organized in three groups with the categories of Universality and Quantity acting as “link categories” in the two transitions between the groups.

Anderson List of Categories
(Reproduced from Space, Time and the Categories, with the permission of Sydney University Press.)

Armstrong concludes:

[W]ith this scheme, John Anderson joins a very distinguished line of philosophers who have presented us with a set of categories. We have first Plato (the doctrine of Highest Kinds in his dialogue The Sophist), then Aristotle, Kant, Hegel, and Samuel Alexander. (STC, xiii)

Despite his appreciation of Hegel, Anderson thought that Kant had laid “the foundations for a logic of things as historical” and here “Hegel can be regarded only as reactionary” (EMP, 83). Kant had shown that the objects of science are just the objects of observation, that “matter” is something we perceive and not something lying behind our perceptions. Kant’s answer to Hume was that things perceived are connected with one another; they pass through and affect one another in various ways because they are related in space and time. We are aware of such relations in being aware of anything at all. But Anderson insists against Kant that relations are known on the same level as the related. Kant was still subject to the assumptions of representationalism, and thought of the objects of science as mere phenomena. Kant viewed space and time as forms of intuition under which we must experience the world. He viewed the categories such as causality and substance as forms of understanding under which we must understand the world. Things-in-themselves are not given to us in experience, and so remain beyond our cognitive grasp. In this way Kant set up an untenable division in reality between phenomena and things-in-themselves, and along with this division the idea that our thoughts, practices and forms of inquiry in some way create or constitute the reality we inhabit, act upon and investigate. Anderson, following Samuel Alexander, proposed a realist alternative such that space and time would be considered not as forms of intuition, but as forms of being, the categories not as forms of understanding but as categories of being, categories under which all being must fall. On such a proposal we can recognise the objects of science as things-in-themselves.

Anderson claimed to have avoided the pitfalls of traditional metaphysical questions concerning the reality of universals through his account of the proposition (cf., “‘Universals’ and Occurrences”, EMP). H. O. Mounce has suggested that Anderson’s realism may not be able to avoid the issue. In particular, his account of universals is in danger of collapsing into nominalism on the question of whether the directly perceived relation (say, of causality) is on separate occasions one and the same (for Mounce, anything less than complete identity would be a retreat to nominalism – Mounce 1989). Mounce suggests that Anderson may not be able to hold off a Humean challenge here. He would be drawn back to a familiar realist-nominalist debate on the nature of universals, which may explain why Armstrong’s philosophy takes seriously Plato’s question of the one and the many as the starting point for metaphysical reflection (Armstrong 1997). From a Quinean perspective, however, Armstrong’s metaphysics, despite its improved scientific credentials, remains attentive to old school pseudo-questions (Quine 1953). (Michael Devitt explicitly associates Armstrong with Quine’s parody of the traditional scottish metaphysician “McX” in Devitt 2010.)

For his more empirically-minded students, Anderson’s logic seemed to rely upon an unwelcome element of a priorism. Any weakening of our confidence in Anderson’s identification of logic and ontology, for example, would critically undermine significant components of the position. First, it would no longer be clear that things spoken of together must exist in the same way – the notion of a single level of being would become a matter for investigation (what kinds of differences exist) rather than determined by general principle (Mackie 1985). Regarding his social thought, the importance of individuals’ behaviour in explaining the nature and operation of social movements and institutions would require investigation, rather than a pronouncement based purely on general grounds. Again, Anderson’s rejection of the rationalist view that there must be simple or ultimate units upon which complex things can be built would not lead without further argument to the view that there cannot be such simple parts or totalities (Mackie 1985).

According to Anderson, David Hume’s skepticism was a direct result of his inability to work out a logic, to create a coherent account of existence. But his mentor at Edinburgh, Norman Kemp Smith, had long argued that Hume’s importance was in demonstrating the factual limits of all logic. If Hume had failed to work out a logic to Anderson’s satisfaction this was because in his view philosophers should resist the temptation of this kind of “systematic working out” altogether (Davie 1977). Hume’s reservations about a “systematic working out” have emerged in another form with the “linguistic return” proposed by Huw Price, who became the first appointment to the Challis Chair of Philosophy within a united department at Sydney since the split of 1974. Price describes the project as a “linguistic retooling of metaphysics” (Price 2011, p. 18) and the attempt specifically to avoid Mackie’s “placement” issue which arises from an obsession with the representational aspect of language (although Mackie himself regarded this with Anderson as an ontological issue – see section 5.4 below). On Price’s view plurality exists in the world of an entirely familiar kind: a plurality of ways of talking and ways of behaviour which don’t need to be mirrored in an ontology of any kind.

It has been observed that Anderson’s most prominent students accepted in fact very little of his system. It is still the case that their most fundamental philosophical commitments can be traced to the boldness of Anderson’s position. And Armstrong suggests that the philosopher at some point can only outline his or her most basic commitments. In Armstrong’s case Stephen Mumford summarises the position: no God, no non-spatial minds, no abstract entities beyond space-time, no Platonic forms or realm of universals; an austere ontology without transcendent universals, realm of numbers, transcendent standards of value, timeless propositions, non-existent objects, possibilia, possible worlds, abstract classes. (Mumford 2007 p. 5.) Armstrong diverges from Anderson in his emphasis upon scientific naturalism, in the position that the world is to be completely described in terms of a completed physics. What properties exist will ultimately be determined solely by science, and the results will inevitably seem counter-intuitive within the perspective of Aristotelian common sense. But for Armstrong this scientific view can be reconciled with a form of metaphysical realism derived from Anderson’s teaching which takes universals to exist immanently rather than in a transcendent realm; which takes the world to contain nothing but particulars having properties and being related to each other; which takes the world to be nothing but a single spatio-temporal system; which regards reality as a world of states of affairs conceived as particulars bearing properties; which insists that states of affairs are the smallest units of existence since neither particulars nor universals are capable of independent existence.

5.3 Epistemology

The Greeks, according to Anderson,

are far clearer on many questions than modern philosophers … they avoid many modern errors, and especially … they are not, like the moderns, obsessed with ‘the problem of knowledge’ – they do not set out to discover (i.e., to know!) how, or how much, we can know, before they are prepared to know anything. This ‘criticism of the instrument’ amounts to scientific defeatism, and the instrumental view of mind has both prevented a knowledge of minds themselves, and hampered the direct inquiry into logical and other scientific problems. (EMP, 82)

Anderson’s Hegelian diagnoses of the obsessions of modern philosophy and Cartesianism with epistemology are likely to elicit recognition and appreciation from many contemporary readers. Cartesianism in modern philosophy represented for Anderson an anti-classicist movement: an antipathy towards history and tradition. Modern philosophy searched within abstract rationality as the ground of human knowledge, rather than in concrete and many-sided culture. The whole modern era was characterised by this lack of concreteness (EMP, 195).

Hegel in this regard stands out as a lonely classical figure within the history of modern philosophy. (EMP, 201) Philosophy since Descartes has become infected by practicalism and progressivism and logic has been reduced to the status of an instrument, a generalised method for acquiring new knowledge. Along with this instrumental view of logic came contempt for the syllogism, replaced by Bacon with “inductive reasoning” and by Descartes with rational intuition.

Empiricism for Anderson is primarily the denial of any higher form of being, any other reality by which experienced reality can be found wanting, or dependent, or in a position of striving to emulate, and so forth. So also, the importance of modern realism lies not in its account of knowledge, but its development of a theory of independence, the rejection of any conception of relative existence and the development of a logic of situations (JAA, Philosophy II Distinction Lectures, 1937).

There is no criterion of “truth”, “nothing by believing which we believe something else” (EMP, 55). Truth is simply what is conveyed by the copula, the “is” of the proposition. It cannot reside in correspondence between a believed proposition and something else we call reality, nor in relations between propositions in terms of coherence. Propositions are not forms of words: we convey our beliefs by words, but what we are putting forward for acceptance is not the form of words but the state of affairs itself. Representionalist and correspondence theories of truth are “attempts to get behind the proposition – to maintain (in words!) that we mean more than we can say.” (EMP, 5). We must abandon the notion of “thought” as something contrasted with or identified with things. Our thoughts are just our dealings with things – Anderson shared with Norman Kemp Smith a quasi-calvinist conception of knowledge as a striving and grappling with problems rather than mirroring an external reality. Anderson dismisses most contemporary philosophies as “varieties of representationalism” (EMP, 87). The proposition is not “about” anything in the sense of representing an external reality. Or rather, if it is “about” something, it is about the subject of the proposition itself.

One of Anderson’s most audacious articles was the 1934 “Mind as Feeling” which attempts to work out exactly how mentality should be conceived as belonging to the spatio-temporal realm. Anderson believed that once we admit the spatial nature of mind or of anything mental, “Cartesianism goes” (JAA, Lectures on Reid, 1935.) The mental realm consists as much of situations as the natural and social world, so our knowledge of mind is on the same footing as the non-mental. He repudiates the Cartesian subject-object model which sees philosophy’s task as the study of the medium for knowledge understood as the relation whereby one entity reproduces within itself the essence or intrinsic characteristics of some other entity. There is no such medium for there are not different entities within space and time requiring such mediation. There is no “knower” conceived as a point of consciousness that has stepped outside history, outside of space and time. In our striving and grappling with illusions so as to come to terms with ourselves and the things around us we never step outside the movement of things, nor see behind the proposition; never reach outside the realm of propositional claim and counter-claim.

What is this thing that strives? Anderson adopts a Nietschean, pre-Socratic view of mentality as a social structure of instincts and passions competing and cooperating. It is the emotions or feelings themselves that strive. The passion of curiosity, for example, is the actual agent of inquiry. There is no entity of conscious willing that directs our attention on the world. “Part of the deception, of course, part of the ‘analytic’ myth, is of an egoistic character (‘what do I find when I set my analysis machine rumbling?’), and this is opposed to the fact that language and inquiry are inherent in social life, are at all stages part of communication.” (EMP, 181.)

That critical inquiry itself rests on the existence of specific ways of carrying on and proceeds from within some definite way of life, provides one important link with the ethical aspect of Anderson’s thought. Such ways of life which lift individuals out of their humdrum existence and base material concerns are what Anderson regards as the embodiment of ethical goodness. For Anderson if the good exists we must find it as a natural quality in this world, just as we come to know and identify other natural qualities. However, the good is not merely something we discover, but “that by which we discover things” (EMP, 266). Anderson was aware that his view of the good as a natural quality would not convince everyone, and that he could do little to convert the doubters. But he claimed that there will be those who recognise the truth of his position, seeing this view of the good as “something with which they have long been in a certain way acquainted” (EMP, 267).

5.4 Ethics

“We do not, in fact, step out of the movement of things, ask ‘What am I to do?’ and, having obtained an answer, step in again. All our actions, all our questionings and answerings, are part of the movement of things.” (EMP, 241).

Positive ethical inquiry for Anderson is concerned with the identification of good as a natural quality and he finds that this most naturally pertains to certain actually existing practices and ways of living in the world of common experience. Traditionally the good has been identified abstractly as an end to be achieved or aimed for, either as a transcendent reality to which we can only aspire (but which in some unexplained way is supposed to guide our moral actions) or as an end external to our actions in the real world and by which those actions may be evaluated; for example, some optimal quantum of happiness or welfare for the greatest number of people involved. In either case, a relational explanation is mistakenly offered in place of identifying a real quality. This has been the problem with virtually all moral thought since the Greeks, although Anderson thought that G. E. Moore had made important advances in our thinking on these matters. Anderson proposes that the good exists in forms of enterprise, productive activities capable of developing in a special way by means of “communication” – individuals are caught up in these goods and in the process transcend their more immediate and mundane goals and demands. Any theory of social life must take account of activities with no formulated end: customs, regular forms of behaviour, and practices which precede the formulation of ends (JAA, Philosophical Implications of Marxism, 1945).

Values have objective reality, but not in a transcendent realm divorced from this world of facts or states of affairs. Anderson agrees that “the way things are” includes moral facts: “it is impossible to discuss social processes except in terms of ways of living or forms of enterprise, and that is moral characterisation” (EMP, 330). But he cannot accept that moral characterisation entails moral prescription because this would commit us to a morality of commands, and to programmes for action and reform designed to achieve a merely external good. The importance of ethical inquiry is in giving an account of productive activities which entail the operation of a certain mentality or spirit. Within such activities there is no question of external ends or rewards to be achieved. Goodness exists in free, spontaneous participation in such movements and activities (although not of course in the metaphysical sense of undetermined free will – such practices, social movements and ways of life are not things we as individuals “opt into” at will; they in a sense adopt us). Acting because we feel obliged so to act is on this view an indication of the absence of goodness. Although the notion of “virtue” does not much appeal to him, Anderson’s emphasis upon the transformative role of practices and ways of life upon the ethical outlook of the individual does seem to accord with many of the major preoccupations of virtue ethicists. Alasdair Macintyre recognises the value to contemporary Aristotelian virtue ethics of Anderson’s Heraclitean appreciation of conflict and the importance he attributes to critical traditions (Macintyre 1981).

Ethics is especially concerned to bring out the facts of conflict, the opposition of different strains in things in general, but in human and mental life most particularly. The category of causality is central to the ethical sphere – false views of causality represent the attempt to escape conflict, to gain a standpoint above that of strife and interlocking tensions (JAA, Lectures on Criticism, 1954). Positive ethics exhibits the good life as constantly struggling with difficulties and other types of life driven by external or instrumental considerations (JAA, Lectures on Greek Theories of Education, 1954). The good exists in struggle and so cannot be made secure (JAA, Philosophy I Lectures, 1943). In all spheres of life the good can only make its stand. Attempts at reconciliation and compromise often obscure the issues and may well prove detrimental to the good. The resulting Heraclitean harmony is best served by this stance of independence and intransigence.

Sociological inquiry is appropriate for the bulk of traditional moral terms. Forms of social organisation develop regular habits of action which come to be seen as obligatory: rights, duties and so forth are easily understood by those involved in the same way of life. Bourgeois society is based on commodification and contractual relations. The market destroys folk life and with it one important source by which culture can be refreshed (JAA, Lectures on Marx, 1950). Marxism has made important advances in this area but Anderson notes the “simple-mindedness” of most Marxists on moral questions – altruism seems to be the peak of their thinking about morality (Cf., remarks on Kautsky, EMP, 321) and little consideration is given to the importance of a plurality of ways of living.

Participation in disinterested activities represents the ethical value of “devotion to a cause”. Anderson even offers a sociological interpretation of sin as a person’s sense of inadequacy to social movements, one’s inability to keep the flag flying, to devote oneself thoroughly to these kinds of activity. Sin appears then as a kind of backsliding and subjectivism: the individual setting him or herself up as the standard. Anderson was opposed to all forms of religious instruction and interference in educational practice, but he occasionally shocked his students with a quasi-theological appreciation of the existence of evil in the world. Passmore commented that forms of religion that emphasise that our life is not of our making and that it goes on independently of our plans, are far more preferable in Anderson’s view to any form of secular sentimental humanism (Passmore, Introduction to EMP).

J. L. Mackie regarded Anderson’s positive conception of goods as being “hopeless as an account of moral talk and reasoning” (Mackie 1985). However, despite being one of the current standard bearers for anti-realism in ethics the manner in which Mackie posed the question of the subjectivity of values owes much to Anderson’s ontological standpoint. Mackie seemed at pains to explain that his subjectivist view of ethical terms complied with Anderson’s main concern. Subjectivism in ethics is for Mackie the doctrine that objective facts in this field do not include any descriptive assignment of goodness or rightness of actions. It is “precisely because we want to distinguish what is simply and absolutely the case that we say values/obligations are relative.” (Mackie 1985). Mackie suggested that linguistic philosophy had made the realist-antirealist opposition a philosophical pseudo-question, and that with renewed interest in ontological issues this opposition returned in a pressing form in the “placement” issue regarding various “queer” entities in the world.

Rush Rhees was a student of Anderson’s at Edinburgh and, of course, later of Ludwig Wittgenstein’s. Like Mackie, he was critical of Anderson’s ethical theory, but from the other pole in that he was more inclined towards Anderson’s positive view of ethics. He regarded Anderson’s notion of a “way of life” as at some level the same as Wittgenstein’s (Rhees 1969). But he came to think that Anderson paid too little attention to the ways in which moral questions are posed for individuals, that Anderson too readily portrayed individual concerns as base, egocentric, low concerns in contrast with the uplifting concerns resulting from participation in social movements. Anderson, Rhees concluded, had no appreciation for the urgency with which moral questions presented themselves to individuals (Rhees 1999, p. xiii), nor their distinctive character compared to more practical questions of how to go on. However, Rhees always emphasised the Andersonian lesson that values are rooted in different traditions and movements. We have to resist the temptation to locate values in a realm which transcends these contexts. It is futile to argue that the moral individual is located in a realm outside history, outside the particularities of space and time. Only in these contexts do the individual’s convictions, problems, struggles and difficulties have their sense. Resources for criticism of moral codes exist within movements, and criticism develops only within ways of living. Notions of the “common good” generally conceal special interests (Rhees 1989, p. 53).

5.5 Social and Political Thought

Anderson’s moral and political thought was strongly influenced by the writings of the French socialist Georges Sorel (and before him the libertarian socialist Pierre-Joseph Proudhon). Although Anderson abandoned communism and socialism as movements whose time had passed, the influence of these thinkers for whom socialism was a moral movement remained with him (Cole 2009). In all fields of human activity, there is a conflict between what Sorel described as the “ethic of the producer”, characterised by spontaneous and cooperative endeavour, and the ethic of the consumer, characterised by an instrumental morality of reward and punishment, obligation and expectation, an ethic most perfectly suited in sociological terms to the marketplace (and in purely psychological terms to the compulsive obligations of the neurotic personality). More accurately, for Anderson, the ethic of the consumer is an ethic without a theme. In history there are classical periods of cultural achievement in contrast with periods in which we struggle to find a theme at all; that is, periods in which nothing really happens, nothing develops from within. Anderson also admired Vico’s cyclical view of history and by the 1940s had not only resigned himself to the collapse of heroic 19th century socialism, but discerned in the era of post-war optimism and state planning the early stages of one of Vico’s periods of barbarism (EMP, 290). More positively, for Anderson the rejection of all totalising views, the thesis that “no formula covers all things”, has the practical consequence of supporting and encouraging “a life of responsibility and adventure” for those prepared to face the situation (EMP, 86).

Anderson intended to combat the influence of idealism in our thinking on political issues evident since Plato’s Republic. The modernist, realist project he meant to develop in opposition to the political outlook of British Idealism would draw upon the major theorists of conflict, struggle and cyclic historical movement: Heraclitus, Vico and Sorel. In place of a simple contrast between individual and state Anderson insisted upon the complex interplay of movements, institutions and traditions. In place of an unargued tendency towards ever greater social harmony he insisted on the inevitability of conflict and constant adjustment, the persistent danger of regress, and the consequent need for clear lines of critical engagement. Order is a Heraclitean state of balance between complex interacting forces rather than a normative standard by which to measure existing social and political formations. Conflict is not an indication of social dysfunction which needs to be overcome or rationalised away, but a necessary feature of any social institution. Any notion of an ideal state without such features can have no bearing on our present real life situation.

Anderson’s political thought is distinctive for his rejection of the state as the fundamental object of political investigation and reflection. This aspect of his thought aligns rather strongly with modern Nietschean and anti-humanist political thought. For Anderson the social is not reducible to agreements among atomic individuals. In his anti-individualist statements, however, he seems to echo an idealist view of social movements portrayed, for example, by Bernard Bosanquet who similarly decried the “repellant isolation” of atomist individualism. Culture and human achievement depend upon the capacity of human beings to engage in activities that take them outside themselves. Apart from these struggles with nature or within broad social movements, a person collapses into non-entity. (Bosanquet 1899, pp. xxxiii ff.)

Anderson’s rejection of good as an end to be achieved applied to his ultimate rejection of socialism as a progressive movement and of Marxism in particular. “The doctrine of history as struggle is at once the liberal and the scientific part of Marxism; the doctrine of socialism as something to be established (‘classless society’) is its servile part” (EMP, 339). Socialism for Anderson was not a goal to be achieved but a movement to be joined. The amelioration of social conditions of the workers would be achieved by the workers themselves in the process of asserting the value and validity of their way of life within the wider socio-political sphere. But once alleviation became the primary goal of the workers’ movement and representatives, that movement was finished as a progressive and liberating force. It could be bought off by employers and the state. Socialism understood as a force lobbying for state action and funding to redress market inequities had become mired in “servility” as a matter of historical fact.

5.6 Education

In the 1950s, Anderson retreated from broad political theory which had been a feature of his lectures and writings of the 1940s, and attended more to local and institutional questions. This new emphasis emerged in his lectures on education and on criticism. Central to Anderson’s view of education is the rejection of any utilitarian or instrumental view of education, the view of education as a means to some other purpose. Education needs to be understood as an activity with positive characteristics of its own. Education is critical, devoted to developing and discarding hypotheses, to seeing through pretensions of all kinds. It means for the individual “finding a way of life” and it affects the whole life of the educated individual. Critical intellectual life survives as a social tradition, a “movement” to which individuals are attracted and in which they are caught up.

Anderson’s classicism promotes the history of European culture from the early Greeks as a tradition of critical thought that can refresh and fortify contemporary education against the predations of practicalism and servility in the modern world. Education is concerned with training in taste and judgement. The educated individual is not shackled by the assumptions of his society or group. (JAA, Lectures on the Educational Theories of Spencer and Dewey, 1949). But to play its part, education must resist outside standards (such as those set by the attitudes and capacities of commercial society, or by the vocational needs of business) as to what is to be allowed and valued in institutions of education. Rhees suggested that Anderson was primarily concerned with a “grammar school education”, one not suited to the “masses” (Rhees 1969 p. 168). In particular, for Anderson, vocational and moralistic standards have to be resisted. True learning is not easy and cannot be made easy – it advances only through overcoming resistances. The inquiring life has to stand up for itself. It is just as real, just as practical, just as positive a part of society as other activities (J. L. Mackie, in EAI).

Any activity or institution of learning can proceed only along the lines of certain traditions with custodians and in terms of common activities. (JAA, Lectures on Greek Theories of Education, 1954). For education is simply one struggling tendency in society itself among others – even within institutions supposedly devoted to educational aims, true educational values have to be fought for.

Anderson’s lectures on education are of interest because they include the most extensive account of his appreciation for the classicism of Matthew Arnold, but more particularly of his attitude towards the philosophy of John Dewey. Besides his early acknowledgement of the importance of William James (at least the more metaphysical writings on radical empiricism) and his critical articles on F. C. S. Schiller, the consideration of Dewey’s educational theory is the most important reflection on American pragmatism in Anderson’s work. The question of the relation of theory to practice was one that exercised Anderson repeatedly. His position was that the connection was a close one, but not in the direction that he assumed pragmatism urged. Theory was not dependent upon practice for the validity of its findings. Rather inquiry proceeded from particular kinds of practice. Certain forms of life made possible an objective view of things. Moreover, theory was not subsidiary to practice in an instrumental sense because it was itself a distinct form of practice with its own requirements and standards. Anderson reflected upon this question both in the lectures on education but also in his lectures on Marxism and most particularly on Marx’s Theses on Feuerbach where he was concerned to dispute Sidney Hook’s pragmatist reading of the theses (JAA, Philosophical Implications of Marxism). Both the fact of his consideration of the enigmatic Theses and his substantial conclusions on the relation of theory to practice would have resonated with the Althusserian Marxists in the Department of General Philosophy in the 1970s.

6. Influence Beyond the University: the Sydney Push

Anderson’s influence extended beyond the confines of the academy. One of Anderson’s students, a young man from the Pacific island of Tonga, Futa Helu, later claimed that John Anderson’s realism had revolutionised his thinking, particularly with reference to the notion of “tapu” or the sacred, as the cover-up for the special demands of the ruling class in Tonga. Returning to Tonga in the early 1960s, he founded the Atenisi (Athens) Institute as an independent high school based on the ideals of Greek philosophy. He added “Atenisi University” in 1975, where the philosophical thought of Heraclitus as interpreted by Anderson became the backbone of philosophy courses. Following Anderson’s example of public engagement, Helu is credited as one of the intellectual architects of the democracy movement in Tonga. (Keith Campbell, personal communication).

Anderson’s influence on the self-styled “Sydney Push” is more widely known. The latter was a diffuse sub-culture of anarchist libertarians who met around Sydney’s inner city in the 1950s and 1960s. Members were imbued with a spirit of anti-careerism, and a major influence in their meetings, talks and drinking sessions was the philosophy of John Anderson who had lectured many of them on the value of risk, endeavour, withdrawal from consumerist society and the overriding value of criticism to the health of a society. Through his influence on many of these figures, Anderson affected the tone of intellectual debate and discussion in Sydney and beyond. If the key figures of the movement are relatively unknown, there were more famous figures who moved through this environment and were on their own accounts deeply affected by its intellectual stimulus: such figures as Germaine Greer, Robert Hughes and Clive James.

More centrally involved with the life of the Push over an extended period and more particularly with the direct teachings of John Anderson was the anarchist activist and philosopher George Molnar. He attended Anderson’s lectures in the 1950s and was active in debates on metaphysical questions in the 1960s associated with Armstrong and C. B. Martin. Students recall Armstrong and Molnar in the university quadrangle around 1970 arguing about dispositions and powers with an intensity no doubt propelled by their political disagreements at the time. Molnar conducted courses on anarchism and education theory in the early 1970s but in 1976 resigned his position at the university, a move consistent with the anti-careerist ethos of the Push and of the radical politics of the time. Perhaps he also found his philosophical interests on the wrong side of an irreconcilable split within the department. Some thirty years later, he returned to academic life to take up a part-time position as John Anderson Research Fellow at the University of Sydney, but died unexpectedly in 2002. His book Powers: a study in metaphysics was published posthumously in 2007 by Oxford University Press at the urging of his old adversary D. M. Armstrong.

7. Conclusion

While sharing some of the deflationary ambitions of linguistic, scientific and pragmatist philosophies with respect to traditional metaphysics and rationalism, Anderson’s philosophy was a singular expression of twentieth century philosophy emerging from the world of 19th century idealism. Not only are the terms Anderson employs systematically misleading to contemporary readers; his work belongs to a world of higher philosophical ambition, a world in which philosophy could aspire to a central role in cultural affairs, unlike the “rickety philosophical apparatus” and the whole “intellectual mess” that he saw in mid-century philosophy (EMP, 187–88).

The current lack of philosophical interest in Anderson seems to derive as much from external factors related to his place in Australian intellectual life as from the intrinsic qualities of his work. This is due in part to his posthumous role in the culture wars prompted by his strongly anti-communist stance in the 1950s. Any consideration of his work soon becomes entangled in unwelcome and extraneous debates. Moreover, compounding “a certain Presbyterian intransigence” in his personality (EAI, 22), Anderson’s conception of philosophy as something of a master discipline legislating legitimate forms of inquiry in the sciences, psychology, social studies, literature, linguistics, and the humanities made him an unpopular figure in the academy (cf. Partridge’s and Kamenka’s accounts of their studies with Anderson in EAI).

David Armstrong describes Anderson as “a failed great philosopher – he played for higher stakes than the rest of us” (personal communication). A certain ambivalence creeps into such assessments of his importance. On the other hand, while there are those who regard Anderson as almost heroically holding out against false philosophical fashions, there are many who regard his dominance at Sydney as wholly negative: his indifference to developments in technical logic since the 19th century, to developments in theoretical physics and to philosophical interest in linguistic usage and the nature of scientific inquiry. Did Anderson sustain traditional philosophical values and standards of inquiry in the face of fragmentary and unsound philosophical trends, or did he cut Sydney students off from the life blood of international philosophical and scientific exposure? The philosophical prominence of many of his students strongly suggests the former, but even his most loyal followers recognise in his educational practice a tendency to promote uncritical conformity.

In the end the issue concerns the value and depth of a tradition of philosophical inquiry and apprenticeship, weighed against the opportunity costs of pursuing such a tradition to the exclusion of all others. This question was posed rather urgently a decade after Anderson’s death when the department of philosophy at Sydney split into two distinct units, immediately on political grounds, but inevitably also over the nature of philosophical inquiry and study itself. Although the department was eventually re-united as a single professional and productive unit, its members have very little interest in revisiting a troubled history. And this applies most particularly to the highly distinctive work and legacy of Professor John Anderson, the dominant force in philosophy at Sydney for much of the twentieth century.


Works by Anderson

Published in his lifetime

[EAP] Education and Politics, Sydney: Angus and Robertson, 1931.
[EMP] Studies in Empirical Philosophy, Sydney: Angus and Robertson, 1962.

Selections published after his death

[AAR] Art and Reality: John Anderson on Literature and Aesthetics, Janet Anderson, Graham Cullum and Kim Lycos (eds.), Sydney: Hale and Iremonger, 1982.
[EAI] Education and Inquiry, D. Z. Phillips (ed.), Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1980.
[JAA] The John Anderson Archive, online archive of Anderson’s unpublished lectures and other works available at the University of Sydney Library.
[LGP] Lectures on Greek Philosophy 1928, with an Introduction by Graham Cullum, Sydney: Sydney University Press, 2008.
[LMP] Lectures on Modern Philosophy 1932–35: Hume, Reid, James, Sydney: Sydney University Press, 2008.
[STC] Space, Time and the Categories: Lectures on Metaphysics 1949–50, with an Introduction by D. M. Armstrong, Sydney: Sydney University Press, 2007.
[PFL] A Perilous and Fighting Life: the Political Writings of John Anderson, Mark Weblin (ed.), Sydney: Pluto Press, 2003.
[LPT] Lectures on Political Theory 1941–45, Sydney: Sydney University Press, 2007.
[STP] Space-Time and the Proposition: the 1944 Lectures on Samuel Alexander’s Space Time and Deity, Mark Weblin (ed.), Sydney: Sydney University Press, 2005.

Secondary Literature

  • Armstrong, D. M., 1977, “On Metaphysics”, Quadrant, 21 (7): 64–69.
  • –––, 1997, Universals and Scientific Realism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2001, “Interview”, Matters of the Mind: Poems, Essays and Interviews in Honour of Leonie Kramer, Lee Jobling and Catherine Runcie (eds.), Sydney: University of Sydney Press, 322–32.
  • Baker, A. J., 1979, The Social Thought and Political Life of Professor John Anderson, Sydney: Angus and Robertson.
  • –––, 1986, Australian Realism: the Systematic Philosophy of John Anderson, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Barcun, A., 2002, Radical Students: the Old left at Sydney University, Melbourne: Melbourne University Press.
  • Birchall, B., 1983, “The Problem of Form”, International Studies in Philosophy, 15: 15–40.
  • Bosanquet, Bernard, 1899, The Philosophical Theory of the State, London: Macmillan.
  • Boucher, David, 1990, “Practical Hegelianism: Henry Jones’s Lecture Tour of Australia”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 51(3): 423–52.
  • Brandom, Robert, 2000, Articulating Reasons: an introduction to inferentialism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Cole, Creagh McLean, 2009, “John Anderson’s Political Thought Revisited”, Australian Journal of Political Science, 44(2): 229–44.
  • –––, 2010, “The Ethic of the Producers: Sorel, Anderson and Macintyre”, History of Political Thought, 31(1): 155–76.
  • Damousi, Joy, 2005, Freud in the Antipodes: A Cultural History of Psychoanalysis in Australia, Sydney: University of New South Wales Press.
  • Davie, George, 1961, The Democratic intellect: Scotland and Her Universities in the Nineteenth Century, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
  • –––, 1977, “John Anderson in Scotland”, Quadrant, 21(7): 55–57.
  • Devitt, Michael, 2010, “‘Ostrich Nominalism’ or ‘Mirage Realism’”, in Putting Metaphysics First: Essays on Metaphysics and Epistemology, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Eddy, Harry, 1944, “Ethics and Politics”, Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy, 22: 70–92.
  • Franklin, James, 2003, Corrupting the Youth: a History of Philosophy in Australia, Sydney: Macleay Press.
  • Gasking, D. A. T., 1949, “Anderson and the Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 27(1): 1–26.
  • Hibberd, Fiona, 2009, “John Anderson’s Development of (Situational) Realism and its Bearing on Psychology Today”, History of the Human Sciences, 22(4): 63–92.
  • Hylton, Peter, 1990, Russell, Idealism and the Emergence of Analytic Philosophy, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Kennedy, Brian, 1995, A Passion to Oppose: John Anderson, Philosopher, Melbourne: Melbourne University Press.
  • Macintyre, Alasdair, 1981, After Virtue: a Study in Moral Theory. London: Duckworth.
  • –––, 1988, Whose Justice; Which Rationality, London: Duckworth.
  • Mackie, J. L., 1946, “A Refutation of Morals”, Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy, 24(1–2): 77–90.
  • –––, 1951, “Logic and Professor Anderson”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 29(2): 109–113.
  • –––, 1985, “The Philosophy of John Anderson”, Logic and Knowledge: Selected Papers (Volume I), Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp. 1–20.
  • Mounce, H. O., 1989, “Anderson on Generality”, Wittgenstein: Attention to Particulars. Essays in Honour of Rush Rhees (1905–89), D. Z. Phillips and Peter Winch (eds.), London: Macmillan.
  • Mumford, Stephen, 2007, David Armstrong, Durham: Acumen.
  • Passmore, John, 1943, “Logical Positivism” (Parts I and II), Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy, 21(2–3): 65–92; 22(3): 129–53.
  • –––, 1948, “Logical Positivism” (Part III), Australasian Journal Philosophy, 26(1): 1–19.
  • –––, 1962, “John Anderson and Twentieth Century Philosophy”, Introduction to John Anderson’s posthumous work, Studies in Empirical Philosophy, Sydney: Angus and Robertson, pp. ix-xxiv.
  • –––, 1963, “Philosophy”, in The Pattern of Australian Culture, A. L. McLeod (ed.), New York: Cornell University Press.
  • –––, 1997, Memoirs of a Semi-Detached Australian, Melbourne: Melbourne University Press.
  • Price, Huw, 2011, Naturalism Without Mirrors, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Quine, W. V. O., 1953, From a Logical Point of View, Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Redding, Paul, 2007, Analytic Philosophy and the Return of Hegelian Thought, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Reinhardt, Lloyd, 1980, “Olympian Pessimist”, Quadrant, 24(4): 48–52.
  • Rhees, Rush, 1969, Without Answers, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
  • –––, 1999, Moral Questions, London: Macmillan.
  • Rorty, Richard, 1986, “From Language to Play”, Proceedings of the American Philosophical Association, 59(5): 747–53.
  • Ryle, Gilbert, 1950, “Logic and Professor Anderson”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 28(3): 137–53.
  • –––, 1976, “Fifty Years of Philosophy and Philosophers”, Philosophy, 51(198): 381–89.
  • Schiller, F. C. S., 1926, “Judgments and Propositions”, Mind (New Series), 35(139): 337–43.
  • –––, 1927, “The Two Logics”, Mind (New Series), 36(141): 64–68.
  • Stavropoulos, Pam, 1992, “Conservative Radical”, Australian Journal of Anthropology, 3: 67–79.
  • Stewart, A. W., 2009, “A Debate about Anderson’s Logic”, History and Philosophy of Logic, 30(2): 157–69.
  • Weblin, Mark, 2003, “Introduction”, in M. Weblin (ed.), A Perilous and Fighting Life: Political Writings of John Anderson, London: Pluto Press.
  • –––, 2007, “John Anderson”, Dictionary of Twentieth Century British Philosophers, London: Bloomsbury Academic.
  • –––, 2007, “John Anderson on Reid and Scottish Philosophy”, Monist, 90: 310.
  • –––, 2010, “John Anderson and Idealism”, Biographical Encyclopedia of British Idealism, London: Bloomsbury Academic.
  • –––, 2014, “John Anderson Arrives: 1930s”, History of Philosophy in Australia and New Zealand, Graham Oppy and Nick Trakakis (eds.), Dordrecht: Springer, pp. 55–87.

Other Internet Resources

  • The John Anderson Archive, the online archive of Anderson’s lectures and articles at the University of Sydney Library (compiled 2006–2010).


Many thanks to the close reading and very helpful suggestions of an anonymous referee.

Copyright © 2017 by
Creagh McLean Cole <>

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