The Definition of Art

First published Tue Oct 23, 2007; substantive revision Tue Aug 14, 2018

The definition of art is controversial in contemporary philosophy. Whether art can be defined has also been a matter of controversy. The philosophical usefulness of a definition of art has also been debated.

Contemporary definitions can be classified with respect to the dimensions of art they emphasize. One distinctively modern, conventionalist, sort of definition focuses on art’s institutional features, emphasizing the way art changes over time, modern works that appear to break radically with all traditional art, the relational properties of artworks that depend on works’ relations to art history, art genres, etc. – more broadly, on the undeniable heterogeneity of the class of artworks. The more traditional, less conventionalist sort of definition defended in contemporary philosophy makes use of a broader, more traditional concept of aesthetic properties that includes more than art-relational ones, and puts more emphasis on art’s pan-cultural and trans-historical characteristics – in sum, on commonalities across the class of artworks. Hybrid definitions aim to do justice to both the traditional aesthetic dimension as well as to the institutional and art-historical dimensions of art, while privileging neither.

1. Constraints on Definitions of Art

Any definition of art has to square with the following uncontroversial facts: (i) entities (artifacts or performances) intentionally endowed by their makers with a significant degree of aesthetic interest, often greatly surpassing that of most everyday objects, first appeared hundreds of thousands of years ago and exist in virtually every known human culture (Davies 2012); (ii) such entities are partially comprehensible to cultural outsiders – they are neither opaque nor completely transparent; (iii) such entities sometimes have non-aesthetic – ceremonial or religious or propagandistic – functions, and sometimes do not; (iv) such entities might conceivably be produced by non-human species, terrestrial or otherwise; and it seems at least in principle possible that they be extraspecifically recognizable as such; (v) traditionally, artworks are intentionally endowed by their makers with properties, often sensory, having a significant degree of aesthetic interest, usually surpassing that of most everyday objects; (vi) art’s normative dimension – the high value placed on making and consuming art – appears to be essential to it, and artworks can have considerable moral and political as well as aesthetic power; (vii) the arts are always changing, just as the rest of culture is: as artists experiment creatively, new genres, art-forms, and styles develop; standards of taste and sensibilities evolve; understandings of aesthetic properties, aesthetic experience, and the nature of art evolve; (viii) there are institutions in some but not all cultures which involve a focus on artifacts and performances that have a high degree of aesthetic interest but lack any practical, ceremonial, or religious use; (ix) entities seemingly lacking aesthetic interest, and entities having a high degree of aesthetic interest, are not infrequently grouped together as artworks by such institutions; (x) lots of things besides artworks – for example, natural entities (sunsets, landscapes, flowers, shadows), human beings, and abstract entities (theories, proofs, mathematical entities) – have interesting aesthetic properties.

Of these facts, those having to do with art’s contingent cultural and historical features are emphasized by some definitions of art. Other definitions of art give priority to explaining those facts that reflect art’s universality and continuity with other aesthetic phenomena. Still other definitions attempt to explain both art’s contingent characteristics and its more abiding ones while giving priority to neither.

Two general constraints on definitions are particularly relevant to definitions of art. First, given that accepting that something is inexplicable is generally a philosophical last resort, and granting the importance of extensional adequacy, list-like or enumerative definitions are if possible to be avoided. Enumerative definitions, lacking principles that explain why what is on the list is on the list, don’t, notoriously, apply to definienda that evolve, and provide no clue to the next or general case (Tarski’s definition of truth, for example, is standardly criticized as unenlightening because it rests on a list-like definition of primitive denotation; see Field 1972; Devitt 2001; Davidson 2005). Corollary: when everything else is equal (and it is controversial whether and when that condition is satisfied in the case of definitions of art), non-disjunctive definitions are preferable to disjunctive ones. Second, given that most classes outside of mathematics are vague, and that the existence of borderline cases is characteristic of vague classes, definitions that take the class of artworks to have borderline cases are preferable to definitions that don’t (Davies 1991 and 2006; Stecker 2005).

Whether any definition of art does account for these facts and satisfy these constraints, or could account for these facts and satisfy these constraints, are key questions for aesthetics and the philosophy of art.

2. Definitions From the History of Philosophy

Classical definitions, at least as they are portrayed in contemporary discussions of the definition of art, take artworks to be characterized by a single type of property. The standard candidates are representational properties, expressive properties, and formal properties. So there are representational or mimetic definitions, expressive definitions, and formalist definitions, which hold that artworks are characterized by their possession of, respectively, representational, expressive, and formal properties. It is not difficult to find fault with these simple definitions. For example, possessing representational, expressive, and formal properties cannot be sufficient conditions, since, obviously, instructional manuals are representations, but not typically artworks, human faces and gestures have expressive properties without being works of art, and both natural objects and artifacts produced solely for homely utilitarian purposes have formal properties but are not artworks.

The ease of these dismissals, though, serves as a reminder of the fact that classical definitions of art are significantly less philosophically self-contained or freestanding than are most contemporary definitions of art. Each classical definition stands in close and complicated relationships to its system’s other complexly interwoven parts – epistemology, ontology, value theory, philosophy of mind, etc. Relatedly, great philosophers characteristically analyze the key theoretical components of their definitions of art in distinctive and subtle ways. For these reasons, understanding such definitions in isolation from the systems or corpuses of which they are parts is difficult, and brief summaries are invariably somewhat misleading. Nevertheless, some representative examples of historically influential definitions of art offered by major figures in the history of philosophy should be mentioned.

2.1 Some examples

Plato holds in the Republic and elsewhere that the arts are representational, or mimetic (sometimes translated “imitative”). Artworks are ontologically dependent on, imitations of, and therefore inferior to, ordinary physical objects. Physical objects in turn are ontologically dependent on, and imitations of, and hence inferior to, what is most real, the non-physical unchanging Forms. Grasped perceptually, artworks present only an appearance of an appearance of the Forms, which are grasped by reason alone. Consequently, artistic experience cannot yield knowledge. Nor do the makers of artworks work from knowledge. Because artworks engage an unstable, lower part of the soul, art should be subservient to moral realities, which, along with truth, are more metaphysically fundamental and, properly understood, more humanly important than, beauty. The arts are not, for Plato, the primary sphere in which beauty operates. The Platonic conception of beauty is extremely wide and metaphysical: there is a Form of Beauty, which can only be known non-perceptually, but it is more closely related to the erotic than to the arts. (See Janaway 1998, the entry on Plato’s aesthetics, and the entry on Plato on Rhetoric and Poetry.)

Kant has a definition of art, and of fine art; the latter, which Kant calls the art of genius, is “a kind of representation that is purposive in itself and, though without an end, nevertheless promotes the cultivation of the mental powers for sociable communication” (Kant, Critique of the Power of Judgment, Guyer translation, section 44, 46).) When fully unpacked, the definition has representational, formalist and expressivist elements, and focuses as much on the creative activity of the artistic genius (who, according to Kant, possesses an “innate mental aptitude through which nature gives the rule to art”) as on the artworks produced by that activity. Kant’s aesthetic theory is, for architectonic reasons, not focused on art. Art for Kant falls under the broader topic of aesthetic judgment, which covers judgments of the beautiful, judgments of the sublime, and teleological judgments of natural organisms and of nature itself. So Kant’s definition of art is a relatively small part of his theory of aesthetic judgment. And Kant’s theory of aesthetic judgment is itself situated in a hugely ambitious theoretical structure that, famously, aims, to account for, and work out the interconnections between, scientific knowledge, morality, and religious faith. (See the entry on Kant’s Aesthetics and Teleology and the general entry on Immanuel Kant.)

Hegel’s account of art incorporates his view of beauty; he defines beauty as the sensuous/perceptual appearance or expression of absolute truth. The best artworks convey, by sensory/perceptual means, the deepest metaphysical truth. The deepest metaphysical truth, according to Hegel, is that the universe is the concrete realization of what is conceptual or rational. That is, what is conceptual or rational is real, and is the imminent force that animates and propels the self-consciously developing universe. The universe is the concrete realization of what is conceptual or rational, and the rational or conceptual is superior to the sensory. So, as the mind and its products alone are capable of truth, artistic beauty is metaphysically superior to natural beauty (Hegel, Lectures, [1886, 4]). A central and defining feature of beautiful works of art is that, through the medium of sensation, each one presents the most fundamental values of its civilization.[1] Art, therefore, as a cultural expression, operates in the same sphere as religion and philosophy, and expresses the same content as they. But art “reveals to consciousness the deepest interests of humanity” in a different manner than do religion and philosophy, because art alone, of the three, works by sensuous means. So, given the superiority of the conceptual to the non-conceptual, and the fact that art’s medium for expressing/presenting culture’s deepest values is the sensual or perceptual, art’s medium is limited and inferior in comparison with the medium that religion uses to express the same content, viz., mental imagery. Art and religion in turn are, in this respect, inferior to philosophy, which employs a conceptual medium to present its content. Art initially predominates, in each civilization, as the supreme mode of cultural expression, followed, successively, by religion and philosophy. Similarly, because the broadly “logical” relations between art, religion and philosophy determine the actual structure of art, religion, and philosophy, and because cultural ideas about what is intrinsically valuable develop from sensuous to non-sensuous conceptions, history is divided into periods that reflect the teleological development from the sensuous to the conceptual. Art in general, too, develops in accord with the historical growth of non-sensuous or conceptual conceptions from sensuous conceptions, and each individual art-form develops historically in the same way (Hegel, Lectures; Wicks 1993, see also the entries on Hegel and on Hegel’s Aesthetics).

For treatments of other influential definitions of art, inseparable from the complex philosophical systems or corpuses in which they occur, see, for example, the entries on 18th Century German Aesthetics, Arthur Schopenhauer, Friedrich Nietzsche, and Dewey’s Aesthetics.

3. Skepticism about Definitions of Art

Skeptical doubts about the possibility and value of a definition of art have figured importantly in the discussion in aesthetics since the 1950s, and though their influence has subsided somewhat, uneasiness about the definitional project persists. (See section 4, below, and also Kivy 1997, Brand 2000, and Walton 2007).

3.1 Skepticisms inspired by views of concepts, history, Marxism, feminism

A common family of arguments, inspired by Wittgenstein’s famous remarks about games (Wittgenstein 1953), has it that the phenomena of art are, by their nature, too diverse to admit of the unification that a satisfactory definition strives for, or that a definition of art, were there to be such a thing, would exert a stifling influence on artistic creativity. One expression of this impulse is Weitz’s Open Concept Argument: any concept is open if a case can be imagined which would call for some sort of decision on our part to extend the use of the concept to cover it, or to close the concept and invent a new one to deal with the new case; all open concepts are indefinable; and there are cases calling for a decision about whether to extend or close the concept of art. Hence art is indefinable (Weitz 1956). Against this it is claimed that change does not, in general, rule out the preservation of identity over time, that decisions about concept-expansion may be principled rather than capricious, and that nothing bars a definition of art from incorporating a novelty requirement.

A second sort of argument, less common today than in the heyday of a certain form of extreme Wittgensteinianism, urges that the concepts that make up the stuff of most definitions of art (expressiveness, form) are embedded in general philosophical theories which incorporate traditional metaphysics and epistemology. But since traditional metaphysics and epistemology are prime instances of language gone on conceptually confused holiday, definitions of art share in the conceptual confusions of traditional philosophy (Tilghman 1984).

A third sort of argument, more historically inflected than the first, takes off from an influential study by the historian of philosophy Paul Kristeller, in which he argued that the modern system of the five major arts [painting, sculpture, architecture, poetry, and music] which underlies all modern aesthetics … is of comparatively recent origin and did not assume definite shape before the eighteenth century, although it had many ingredients which go back to classical, mediaeval, and Renaissance thought. (Kristeller, 1951) Since that list of five arts is somewhat arbitrary, and since even those five do not share a single common nature, but rather are united, at best, only by several overlapping features, and since the number of art forms has increased since the eighteenth century, Kristeller’s work may be taken to suggest that our concept of art differs from that of the eighteenth century. As a matter of historical fact, there simply is no stable definiendum for a definition of art to capture.

A fourth sort of argument suggests that a definition of art stating individually necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for a thing to be an artwork, is likely to be discoverable only if cognitive science makes it plausible to think that humans categorize things in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions. But, the argument continues, cognitive science actually supports the view that the structure of concepts mirrors the way humans categorize things – which is with respect to their similarity to prototypes (or exemplars), and not in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions. So the quest for a definition of art that states individually necessary and jointly sufficient conditions is misguided and not likely to succeed (Dean 2003). Against this it has been urged that psychological theories of concepts like the prototype theory and its relatives can provide at best an account of how people in fact classify things, but not an account of correct classifications of extra-psychological phenomena, and that, even if relevant, prototype theory and other psychological theories of concepts are at present too controversial to draw substantive philosophical morals from (Rey 1983; Adajian 2005).

A fifth argument against defining art, with a normative tinge that is psychologistic rather than sociopolitical, takes the fact that there is no philosophical consensus about the definition of art as reason to hold that no unitary concept of art exists. Concepts of art, like all concepts, after all, should be used for the purpose(s) they best serve. But not all concepts of art serve all purposes equally well. So not all art concepts should be used for the same purposes. Art should be defined only if there is a unitary concept of art that serves all of art’s various purposes – historical, conventional, aesthetic, appreciative, communicative, and so on. So, since there is no purpose-independent use of the concept of art, art should not be defined (Mag Uidhir and Magnus 2011; cf. Meskin 2008). In response, it is noted that some account of what makes various concepts of art concepts of art is still required; this leaves open the possibility of some degree of unity beneath the apparent multiplicity. The fact (if it is one) that different concepts of art are used for different purposes does not itself imply that they are not connected in ordered, to-some-degree systematic ways. The relation between (say) the historical concept of art and the appreciative concept of art is not an accidental, unsystematic relation, like that between river banks and savings banks, but is something like the relation between Socrates’ healthiness and the healthiness of Socrates’ diet. That is, it is not evident that there exist a mere arbitrary heap or disjunction of art concepts, constituting an unsystematic patchwork. Perhaps there is a single concept of art with different facets that interlock in an ordered way, or else a multiplicity of concepts that constitute a unity because one is at the core, and the others depend asymmetrically on it. (The last is an instance of core-dependent homonymy; see the entry on Aristotle, section on Essentialism and Homonymy.) Multiplicity alone doesn’t entail pluralism.

A sixth, broadly Marxian sort of objection rejects the project of defining art as an unwitting (and confused) expression of a harmful ideology. On this view, the search for a definition of art presupposes, wrongly, that the concept of the aesthetic is a creditable one. But since the concept of the aesthetic necessarily involves the equally bankrupt concept of disinterestedness, its use advances the illusion that what is most real about things can and should be grasped or contemplated without attending to the social and economic conditions of their production. Definitions of art, consequently, spuriously confer ontological dignity and respectability on social phenomena that probably in fact call more properly for rigorous social criticism and change. Their real function is ideological, not philosophical (Eagleton 1990).

Seventh, the members of a complex of skeptically-flavored arguments, from feminist philosophy of art, begin with premises to the effect that art and art-related concepts and practices have been systematically skewed by sex or gender. Such premises are supported by a variety of considerations. (a) The artworks the Western artistic canon recognizes as great are dominated by male-centered perspectives and stereotypes, and almost all the artists the canon recognizes as great are men – unsurprisingly, given economic, social, and institutional impediments that prevented women from making art at all. Moreover, the concept of genius developed historically in such a way as to exclude women artists (Battersby, 1989, Korsmeyer 2004). (b) The fine arts’ focus on purely aesthetic, non-utilitarian value resulted in the marginalization as mere “crafts” of items of considerable aesthetic interest made and used by women for domestic practical purposes. Moreover, because all aesthetic judgments are situated and particular, there can be no such thing as disinterested taste. If there is no such thing as disinterested taste, then it is hard to see how there could be universal standards of aesthetic excellence. The non-existence of universal standards of aesthetic excellence undermines the idea of an artistic canon (and with it the project of defining art). Art as historically constituted, and art-related practices and concepts, then, reflect views and practices that presuppose and perpetuate the subordination of women. The data that definitions of art are supposed to explain are biased, corrupt and incomplete. As a consequence, present definitions of art, incorporating or presupposing as they do a framework that incorporates a history of systematically biased, hierarchical, fragmentary, and mistaken understandings of art and art-related phenomena and concepts, may be so androcentric as to be untenable. Some theorists have suggested that different genders have systematically unique artistic styles, methods, or modes of appreciating and valuing art. If so, then a separate canon and gynocentric definitions of art are indicated (Battersby 1989, Frueh 1991). In any case, in the face of these facts, the project of defining art in anything like the traditional way is to be regarded with suspicion (Brand, 2000).

An eighth argument sort of skeptical argument concludes that, insofar as almost all contemporary definitions foreground the nature of artworks, rather than the individual arts to which (most? all?) artworks belong, they are philosophically unproductive (Lopes, 2014).[2] The grounds for this conclusion concern disagreements among standard definitions as to the artistic status of entities whose status is for theoretical reasons unclear – e.g., things like ordinary bottleracks (Duchamp’s Bottlerack) and silence (John Cage’s 4′33″). If these hard cases are artworks, what makes them so, given their apparent lack of any of the traditional properties of artworks? Are, they, at best, marginal cases? On the other hand, if they are not artworks, then why have generations of experts – art historians, critics, and collectors – classified them as such? And to whom else should one look to determine the true nature of art? (There are, it is claimed, few or no empirical studies of art full stop, though empirical studies of the individual arts abound.) Such disputes inevitably end in stalemate. Stalemate results because (a) standard artwork-focused definitions of art endorse different criteria of theory choice, and (b) on the basis of their preferred criteria, appeal to incompatible intuitions about the status of such theoretically-vexed cases. In consequence, disagreements between standard definitions of art that foreground artworks are unresolvable. To avoid this stalemate, an alternative definitional strategy that foregrounds the arts rather than individual artworks, is indicated. (See section 4.5.)

3.2 Some descendants of skepticism

Philosophers influenced by the moderate Wittgensteinian strictures discussed above have offered family resemblance accounts of art, which, as they purport to be non-definitions, may be usefully considered at this point. Two species of family resemblance views will be considered: the resemblance-to-a-paradigm version, and the cluster version.

On the resemblance-to-a-paradigm version, something is, or is identifiable as, an artwork if it resembles, in the right way, certain paradigm artworks, which possess most although not necessarily all of art’s typical features. (The “is identifiable” qualification is intended to make the family resemblance view something more epistemological than a definition, although it is unclear that this really avoids a commitment to constitutive claims about art’s nature.) Against this view: since things do not resemble each other simpliciter, but only in at least one respect or other, the account is either far too inclusive, since everything resembles everything else in some respect or other, or, if the variety of resemblance is specified, tantamount to a definition, since resemblance in that respect will be either a necessary or sufficient condition for being an artwork. The family resemblance view raises questions, moreover, about the membership and unity of the class of paradigm artworks. If the account lacks an explanation of why some items and not others go on the list of paradigm works, it seems explanatorily deficient. But if it includes a principle that governs membership on the list, or if expertise is required to constitute the list, then the principle, or whatever properties the experts’ judgments track, seem to be doing the philosophical work.

The cluster version of the family resemblance view has been defended by a number of philosophers (Bond 1975, Dissanayake 1990, Dutton 2006, Gaut 2000). The view typically provides a list of properties, no one of which is a necessary condition for being a work of art, but which are jointly sufficient for being a work of art, and which is such that at least one proper subset thereof is sufficient for being a work of art. Lists offered vary, but overlap considerably. Here is one, due to Gaut: (1) possessing positive aesthetic properties; (2) being expressive of emotion; (3) being intellectually challenging; (4) being formally complex and coherent; (5) having the capacity to convey complex meanings; (6) exhibiting an individual point of view; (7) being original; (8) being an artifact or performance which is the product of a high degree of skill; (9) belonging to an established artistic form; (10) being the product of an intention to make a work of art (Gaut 2000). The cluster account has been criticized on several grounds. First, given its logical structure, it is in fact equivalent to a long, complicated, but finite, disjunction, which makes it difficult to see why it isn’t a definition (Davies 2006). Second, if the list of properties is incomplete, as some cluster theorists hold, then some justification or principle would be needed for extending it. Third, the inclusion of the ninth property on the list, belonging to an established art form, seems to regenerate (or duck), rather than answer, the definitional question. Finally, it is worth noting that, although cluster theorists stress what they take to be the motley heterogeneity of the class of artworks, they tend with surprising regularity to tacitly give the aesthetic a special, perhaps unifying, status among the properties they put forward as merely disjunctive. One cluster theorist, for example, gives a list very similar to the one discussed above (it includes representational properties, expressiveness, creativity, exhibiting a high degree of skill, belonging to an established artform), but omits aesthetic properties on the grounds that it is the combination of the other items on the list which, combined in the experience of the work of art, are precisely the aesthetic qualities of the work (Dutton 2006). Gaut, whose list is cited above, includes aesthetic properties as a separate item on the list, but construes them very narrowly; the difference between these ways of formulating the cluster view appears to be mainly nominal. And an earlier cluster theorist defines artworks as all and only those things that belong to any instantiation of an artform, offers a list of seven properties all of which together are intended to capture the core of what it is to be an artform, though none is either necessary or sufficient, and then claims that having aesthetic value (of the same sort as mountains, sunsets, mathematical theorems) is “what art is for” (Bond 1975).

4. Contemporary Definitions

Definitions of art attempt to make sense of two different sorts of facts: art has important historically contingent cultural features, as well as trans-historical, pan-cultural characteristics that point in the direction of a relatively stable aesthetic core. (Theorists who regard art as an invention of eighteenth-century Europe will, of course, regard this way of putting the matter as tendentious, on the grounds that entities produced outside that culturally distinctive institution do not fall under the extension of “art” and hence are irrelevant to the art-defining project (Shiner 2001). Whether the concept of art is precise enough to justify this much confidence about what falls under its extension claim is unclear.) Conventionalist definitions take art’s contingent cultural features to be explanatorily fundamental, and aim to capture the phenomena – revolutionary modern art, the traditional close connection of art with the aesthetic, the possibility of autonomous art traditions, etc. – in social/historical terms. Classically-flavored or traditional definitions (also sometimes called “functionalist”) definitions reverse this explanatory order. Such classically-flavored definitions take traditional concepts like the aesthetic (or allied concepts like the formal, or the expressive) as basic, and aim to account for the phenomena by making those concepts harder – for example, by endorsing a concept of the aesthetic rich enough to include non-perceptual properties, or by attempting an integration of those concepts (e.g., Eldridge, section 4.4 below) .

4.1 Conventionalist Definitions: Institutional and Historical

Conventionalist definitions deny that art has essential connection to aesthetic properties, or to formal properties, or to expressive properties, or to any type of property taken by traditional definitions to be essential to art. Conventionalist definitions have been strongly influenced by the emergence, in the twentieth century, of artworks that seem to differ radically from all previous artworks. Avant-garde works like Marcel Duchamp’s “ready-mades” – ordinary unaltered objects like snow-shovels (In Advance of the Broken Arm) and bottle-racks – conceptual works like Robert Barry’s All the things I know but of which I am not at the moment thinking – 1:36 PM; June 15, 1969, and John Cage’s 4′33″, have seemed to many philosophers to lack or even, somehow, repudiate, the traditional properties of art: intended aesthetic interest, artifactuality, even perceivability. Conventionalist definitions have also been strongly influenced by the work of a number of historically-minded philosophers, who have documented the rise and development of modern ideas of the fine arts, the individual arts, the work of art, and the aesthetic (Kristeller, Shiner, Carroll, Goehr, Kivy).

Conventionalist definitions come in two varieties, institutional and historical. Institutionalist conventionalism, or institutionalism, a synchronic view, typically hold that to be a work of art is to be an artifact of a kind created, by an artist, to be presented to an artworld public (Dickie 1984). Historical conventionalism, a diachronic view, holds that artworks necessarily stand in an art-historical relation to some set of earlier artworks.

4.2 Institutional Definitions

The groundwork for institutional definitions was laid by Arthur Danto, better known to non-philosophers as the long-time influential art critic for the Nation. Danto coined the term “artworld”, by which he meant “an atmosphere of art theory.” Danto’s definition has been glossed as follows: something is a work of art if and only if (i) it has a subject (ii) about which it projects some attitude or point of view (has a style) (iii) by means of rhetorical ellipsis (usually metaphorical) which ellipsis engages audience participation in filling in what is missing, and (iv) where the work in question and the interpretations thereof require an art historical context (Danto, Carroll). Clause (iv) is what makes the definition institutionalist. The view has been criticized for entailing that art criticism written in a highly rhetorical style is art, lacking but requiring an independent account of what makes a context art historical, and for not applying to music.

The most prominent and influential institutionalism is that of George Dickie. Dickie’s institutionalism has evolved over time. According to an early version, a work of art is an artifact upon which some person(s) acting on behalf of the artworld has conferred the status of candidate for appreciation (Dickie 1974). Dickie’s more recent version consists of an interlocking set of five definitions: (1) An artist is a person who participates with understanding in the making of a work of art. (2) A work of art is an artifact of a kind created to be presented to an artworld public. (3) A public is a set of persons the members of which are prepared in some degree to understand an object which is presented to them. (4) The artworld is the totality of all artworld systems. (5) An artworld system is a framework for the presentation of a work of art by an artist to an artworld public (Dickie 1984). Both versions have been widely criticized. Philosophers have objected that art created outside any institution seems possible, although the definition rules it out, and that the artworld, like any institution, seems capable of error. It has also been urged that the definition’s obvious circularity is vicious, and that, given the inter-definition of the key concepts (artwork, artworld system, artist, artworld public) it lacks any informative way of distinguishing art institutions systems from other, structurally similar, social institutions (D. Davies 2004, pp. 248–249, notes that both the artworld and the “commerceworld” seem to fall under that definition). Early on, Dickie claimed that anyone who sees herself as a member of the artworld is a member of the artworld: if this is true, then unless there are constraints on the kinds of things the artworld can put forward as artworks or candidate artworks, any entity can be an artwork (though not all are), which appears overly expansive. Finally, Matravers has helpfully distinguished strong and weak institutionalism. Strong institutionalism holds that there is some reason that is always the reason the art institution has for saying that something is a work of art. Weak institutionalism holds that, for every work of art, there is some reason or other that the institution has for saying that it is a work of art (Matravers 2000). Weak institutionalism, in particular, raises questions about art’s unity: if absolutely nothing unifies the reasons that the artworld gives for conferring art-hood on things, then the unity of the class of artworks is vanishingly small. Conventionalist views, with their emphasis on art’s heterogeneity, swallow this implication. From the perspective of traditional definitions, doings so underplays art’s substantial if incomplete unity, while leaving it a puzzle why art would be worth caring about.

Some recent versions of institutionalism depart from Dickie’s by accepting the burden, which Dickie rejected, of providing a substantive, non-circular account of what it is to be an art institution or an artworld. One, due to David Davies, does so by building in Nelson Goodman’s account of aesthetic symbolic functions. Another, due to Abell, combines Searle’s account of social institutions with Gaut’s characterization of art-making properties, and builds an account of artistic value on that coupling.

Davies’ neo-institutionalism holds that making an artwork requires articulating an artistic statement, which requires specifying artistic properties, which in turn requires the manipulation of an artistic vehicle. Goodman’s “symptoms of the aesthetic” are utilized to clarify the conditions under which a practice of making is a practice of artistic making: on Goodman’s view, a symbol functions aesthetically when it is syntactically dense, semantically dense, relatively replete, and characterized by multiple and complex reference (D. Davies 2004; Goodman 1968; see the entry on Goodman’s aesthetics). Manipulating an artistic vehicle is in turn possible only if the artist consciously operates with reference to shared understandings embodied in the practices of a community of receivers. So art’s nature is institutional in the broad sense (or, perhaps better, socio-cultural). By way of criticism, Davies’ neo-institutionalism may be questioned on the grounds that, since all pictorial symbols are syntactically dense, semantically dense, relatively replete, and often exemplify the properties they represent, it seems to entail that every colored picture, including those in any catalog of industrial products, is an artwork (Abell 2012).

Abell’s institutional definition adapts Searle’s view of social kinds: what it is for some social kind, F, to be F is for it to be collectively believed to be F (Abell 2012; Searle 1995, 2010; and see the entry on social institutions). On Abell’s view, more specifically, an institution’s type is determined by the valued function(s) that it was collectively believed at its inception to promote. The valued functions collective belief in which make an institution an art institution are those spelled out by Gaut in his cluster account (see section 3.1, above). That is, something is an art institution if and only if it is an institution whose existence is due to its being perceived to perform certain functions, which functions form a significant subset of the following: promoting positive aesthetic qualities; promoting the expression of emotion; facilitating the posing of intellectual challenges, and the rest of Gaut’s list. Plugging in Gaut’s list yields the final definition: something is an artwork if and only if it is the product of an art institution (as just defined) and it directly effects the effectiveness with which that institution performs the perceived functions to which its existence is due. One worry is whether Searle’s account of institutions is up to the task required of it. Some institutional social kinds have this trait: something can fail to be a token of that kind even if there is collective agreement that it counts as a token of that kind. Suppose someone gives a big cocktail party, to which everyone in Paris invited, and things get so out of hand that the casualty rate is greater than the Battle of Austerlitz. Even if everyone thinks the event was a cocktail party, it is possible (contrary to Searle) that they are mistaken: it may have been a war or battle. It’s not clear that art isn’t like this. If so, then the fact that an institution is collectively believed to be an art institution needn’t suffice to make it so (Khalidi 2013; see also the entry on social institutions).[3] A second worry: if its failure to specify which subsets of the ten cluster properties suffice to make something an artwork significantly flaws Gaut’s cluster account, then failure to specify which subsets of Gaut’s ten properties suffice to make something an art institution significantly flaws Abellian institutionalism.

4.3 Historical Definitions

Historical definitions hold that what characterizes artworks is standing in some specified art-historical relation to some specified earlier artworks, and disavow any commitment to a trans-historical concept of art, or the “artish.” Historical definitions come in several varieties. All of them are, or resemble, inductive definitions: they claim that certain entities belong unconditionally to the class of artworks, while others do so because they stand in the appropriate relations thereto. According to the best known version, Levinson’s intentional-historical definition, an artwork is a thing that has been seriously intended for regard in any way preexisting or prior artworks are or were correctly regarded (Levinson 1990). A second version, historical narrativism, comes in several varieties. On one, a sufficient but not necessary condition for the identification of a candidate as a work of art is the construction of a true historical narrative according to which the candidate was created by an artist in an artistic context with a recognized and live artistic motivation, and as a result of being so created, it resembles at least one acknowledged artwork (Carroll 1993). On another, more ambitious and overtly nominalistic version of historical narrativism, something is an artwork if and only if (1) there are internal historical relations between it and already established artworks; (2) these relations are correctly identified in a narrative; and (3) that narrative is accepted by the relevant experts. The experts do not detect that certain entities are artworks; rather, the fact that the experts assert that certain properties are significant in particular cases is constitutive of art (Stock 2003).

The similarity of these views to institutionalism is obvious, and the criticisms offered parallel those urged against institutionalism. First, historical definitions appear to require, but lack, any informative characterization of art traditions (art functions, artistic contexts, etc.) and hence any way of informatively distinguishing them (and likewise art functions, or artistic predecessors) from non-art traditions (non-art functions, non-artistic predecessors). Correlatively, non-Western art, or alien, autonomous art of any kind appears to pose a problem for historical views: any autonomous art tradition or artworks – terrestrial, extra-terrestrial, or merely possible – causally isolated from our art tradition, is either ruled out by the definition, which seems to be a reductio, or included, which concedes the existence of a supra-historical concept of art. So, too, there could be entities that for adventitious reasons are not correctly identified in historical narratives, although in actual fact they stand in relations to established artworks that make them correctly describable in narratives of the appropriate sort. Historical definitions entail that such entities aren’t artworks, but it seems at least as plausible to say that they are artworks that are not identified as such. Second, historical definitions also require, but do not provide a satisfactory, informative account of the basis case – the first artworks, or ur-artworks, in the case of the intentional-historical definitions, or the first or central art-forms, in the case of historical functionalism. Third, nominalistic historical definitions seem to face a version of the Euthyphro dilemma. For either such definitions include substantive characterizations of what it is to be an expert, or they don’t. If, on one hand, they include no characterization of what it is to be an expert, and hence no explanation as to why the list of experts contains the people it does, then they imply that what makes things artworks is inexplicable. On the other hand, suppose such definitions provide a substantive account of what it is to be an expert, so that to be an expert is to possess some ability lacked by non-experts (taste, say) in virtue of the possession of which they are able to discern historical connections between established artworks and candidate artworks. Then the definition’s claim to be interestingly historical is questionable, because it makes art status a function of whatever ability it is that permits experts to discern the art-making properties.

Defenders of historical definitions have replies. First, as regards autonomous art traditions, it can be held that anything we would recognize as an art tradition or an artistic practice would display aesthetic concerns, because aesthetic concerns have been central from the start, and persisted centrally for thousands of years, in the Western art tradition. Hence it is an historical, not a conceptual truth that anything we recognize as an art practice will centrally involve the aesthetic; it is just that aesthetic concerns that have always dominated our art tradition (Levinson 2002). The idea here is that if the reason that anything we’d take to be a Φ-tradition would have Ψ-concerns is that our Φ-tradition has focused on Ψ-concerns since its inception, then it is not essential to Φ-traditions that they have Ψ-concerns, and Φ is a purely historical concept. But this principle entails, implausibly, that every concept is purely historical. Suppose that we discovered a new civilization whose inhabitants could predict how the physical world works with great precision, on the basis of a substantial body of empirically acquired knowledge that they had accumulated over centuries. The reason we would credit them with having a scientific tradition might well be that our own scientific tradition has since its inception focused on explaining things. It does not seem to follow that science is a purely historical concept with no essential connection to explanatory aims. (Other theorists hold that it is historically necessary that art begins with the aesthetic, but deny that art’s nature is to be defined in terms of its historical unfolding (Davies 1997).) Second, as to the first artworks, or the central art-forms or functions, some theorists hold that an account of them can only take the form of an enumeration. Stecker takes this approach: he says that the account of what makes something a central art form at a given time is, at its core, institutional, and that the central artforms can only be listed (Stecker 1997 and 2005). Whether relocating the list at a different, albeit deeper, level in the definition renders the definition sufficiently informative is an open question. Third, as to the Euthyphro-style dilemma, it might be held that the categorial distinction between artworks and “mere real things” (Danto 1981) explains the distinction between experts and non-experts. Experts are able, it is said, to create new categories of art. When created, new categories bring with them new universes of discourse. New universes of discourse in turn make reasons available that otherwise would not be available. Hence, on this view, it is both the case that the experts’ say-so alone suffices to make mere real things into artworks, and also true that experts’ conferrals of art-status have reasons (McFee 2011).

4.4 Traditional (mainly aesthetic) definitions

Traditional definitions take some function(s) or intended function(s) to be definitive of artworks. Here only aesthetic definitions, which connect art essentially with the aesthetic – aesthetic judgments, experience, or properties – will be considered. Different aesthetic definitions incorporate different views of aesthetic properties and judgments. See the entry on aesthetic judgment.

As noted above, some philosophers lean heavily on a distinction between aesthetic properties and artistic properties, taking the former to be perceptually striking qualities that can be directly perceived in works, without knowledge of their origin and purpose, and the latter to be relational properties that works possess in virtue of their relations to art history, art genres, etc. It is also, of course, possible to hold a less restrictive view of aesthetic properties, on which aesthetic properties need not be perceptual; on this broader view, it is unnecessary to deny what it seems pointless to deny, that abstracta like mathematical entities and scientific laws possess aesthetic properties.)

Monroe Beardsley’s definition holds that an artwork: “either an arrangement of conditions intended to be capable of affording an experience with marked aesthetic character or (incidentally) an arrangement belonging to a class or type of arrangements that is typically intended to have this capacity” (Beardsley 1982, 299). (For more on Beardsley, see the entry on Beardsley’s aesthetics.) Beardsley’s conception of aesthetic experience is Deweyan: aesthetic experiences are experiences that are complete, unified, intense experiences of the way things appear to us, and are, moreover, experiences which are controlled by the things experienced (see the entry on Dewey’s aesthetics). Zangwill’s aesthetic definition of art says that something is a work of art if and only if someone had an insight that certain aesthetic properties would be determined by certain nonaesthetic properties, and for this reason the thing was intentionally endowed with the aesthetic properties in virtue of the nonaesthetic properties as envisaged in the insight (Zangwill 1995a,b). Aesthetic properties for Zangwill are those judgments that are the subject of “verdictive aesthetic judgments” (judgements of beauty and ugliness) and “substantive aesthetic judgements” (e.g., of daintiness, elegance, delicacy, etc.). The latter are ways of being beautiful or ugly; aesthetic in virtue of a special close relation to verdictive judgments, which are subjectively universal. Other aesthetic definitions build in different accounts of the aesthetic. Eldridge’s aesthetic definition holds that the satisfying appropriateness to one another of a thing’s form and content is the aesthetic quality possession of which is necessary and sufficient for a thing’s being art (Eldridge 1985). Or one might define aesthetic properties as those having an evaluative component, whose perception involves the perception of certain formal base properties, such as shape and color (De Clercq 2002), and construct an aesthetic definition incorporating that view.

Views which combine features of institutional and aesthetic definitions also exist. Iseminger, for example, builds a definition on an account of appreciation, on which to appreciate a thing’s being F is to find experiencing its being F to be valuable in itself, and an account of aesthetic communication (which it is the function of the artworld to promote) (Iseminger 2004).

Aesthetic definitions have been criticized for being both too narrow and too broad. They are held to be too narrow because they are unable to cover influential modern works like Duchamp’s ready-mades and conceptual works like Robert Barry’s All the things I know but of which I am not at the moment thinking – 1:36 PM; June 15, 1969, which appear to lack aesthetic properties. (Duchamp famously asserted that his urinal, Fountain, was selected for its lack of aesthetic features.) Aesthetic definitions are held to be too broad because beautifully designed automobiles, neatly manicured lawns, and products of commercial design are often created with the intention of being objects of aesthetic appreciation, but are not artworks. Moreover, aesthetic views have been held to have trouble making sense of bad art (see Dickie 2001; Davies 2006, p. 37). Finally, more radical doubts about aesthetic definitions center on the intelligibility and usefulness of the aesthetic. Beardsley’s view, for example, has been criticized by Dickie, who has also offered influential criticisms of the idea of an aesthetic attitude (Dickie 1965, Cohen 1973, Kivy 1975).

To these criticisms several responses have been offered. First, the less restrictive conception of aesthetic properties mentioned above, on which they may be based on non-perceptual formal properties, can be deployed. On this view, conceptual works would have aesthetic features, much the same way that mathematical entities are often claimed to (Shelley 2003, Carroll 2004). Second, a distinction may be drawn between time-sensitive properties, whose standard observation conditions include an essential reference to the temporal location of the observer, and non-time-sensitive properties, which do not. Higher-order aesthetic properties like drama, humor, and irony, which account for a significant part of the appeal of Duchamp’s and Cage’s works, on this view, would derive from time-sensitive properties (Zemach 1997). Third, it might be held that it is the creative act of presenting something that is in the relevant sense unfamiliar, into a new context, the artworld, which has aesthetic properties. Or, fourth, it might be held that (Zangwill’s “second-order” strategy) works like ready-mades lack aesthetic functions, but are parasitic upon, because meant to be considered in the context of, works that do have aesthetic functions, and therefore constitute marginal borderline cases of art that do not merit the theoretical primacy they are often given. Finally, it can be flatly denied that the ready-mades were works of art (Beardsley 1982).

As to the over-inclusiveness of aesthetic definitions, a distinction might be drawn between primary and secondary functions. Or it may be maintained that some cars, lawns, and products of industrial design are on the art/non-art borderline, and so don’t constitute clear and decisive counter-examples. Or, if the claim that aesthetic theories fail to account for bad art depends on holding that some works have absolutely no aesthetic value whatsoever, as opposed to some non-zero amount, however infinitesimal, it may be wondered what justifies that assumption.

4.5 Hybrid (Disjunctive) Definitions

Hybrid definitions characteristically disjoin at least one institutional component with at least one aesthetic component, aiming thereby to accommodate both more traditional art and avant-garde art that appears to lack any significant aesthetic dimension. (Such definitions could also be classified as institutional, on the grounds that they make provenance sufficient for being a work of art.) Hence they inherit a feature of conventionalist definitions: in appealing to art institutions, artworlds, arts, art functions, and so on, they either include substantive accounts of what it is to be an artinstitution/world/genre/-form/function, or are uninformatively circular.

One such disjunctive definition, Longworth and Scarantino’s, adapts Gaut’s list of ten clustering properties, where that list (see 3.5 above) includes institutional properties (e.g., belonging to an established art form) and traditional ones (e.g., possessing positive aesthetic properties); see also Longworth and Scarantino 2010. The core idea is that art is defined by a disjunction of minimally sufficient and disjunctively necessary conditions; to say that a disjunct is a minimally sufficient constitutive condition for art-hood, is to say that every proper subset of it is insufficient for art-hood. An account of what it is for a concept to have disjunctive defining conditions is also supplied. The definition of art itself is as follows: ∃ZY (Art iff (ZY)), where (a) Z and Y, formed from properties on Gaut’s cluster list, are either non-empty conjunctions or non-empty disjunctions of conjunctions or individual properties; (b) there is some indeterminacy over exactly which disjuncts are sufficient; (c) Z does not entail Y and Y does not entail Z; (d) Z does not entail Art and Y does not entail Art. Instantiation of either Z or Y suffices for art-hood; something can be art only if at least one of Z, Y is instantiated; and the third condition is included to prevent the definition from collapsing into a classical one. The account of what it is for concept C to have disjunctive defining conditions is as follows: C iff (ZY), where (i) Z and Y are non-empty conjunctions or non-empty disjunctions of conjunctions or individual properties; (ii) Z does not entail Y and Y does not entail Z; (iii) Z does not entail C and Y does not entail C. A worry concerns condition (iii): as written, it seems to render the account of disjunctive defining conditions self-contradictory. For if Z and Y are each minimally sufficient for C, it is impossible that Z does not entail C and that Y does not entail C. If so, then nothing can satisfy the conditions said to be necessary and sufficient for a concept to have disjunctive defining conditions.

A second disjunctive hybrid definition, with an historical cast, Robert Stecker’s historical functionalism, holds that an item is an artwork at time t, where t is not earlier than the time at which the item is made, if and only if it is in one of the central art forms at t and is made with the intention of fulfilling a function art has at t or it is an artifact that achieves excellence in achieving such a function (Stecker 2005). A question for Stecker’s view is whether or not it provides an adequate account of what it is for a function to be an art function, and whether, consequently, it can accommodate anti-aesthetic or non-aesthetic art. The grounds given for thinking that it can are that, while art’s original functions were aesthetic, those functions, and the intentions with which art is made, can change in unforeseeable ways. Moreover, aesthetic properties are not always preeminent in art’s predecessor concepts (Stecker 2000). A worry is that if the operative assumption is that if x belongs to a predecessor tradition of T then x belongs to T, the possibility is not ruled out that if, for example, the tradition of magic is a predecessor tradition of the scientific tradition, then entities that belong to the magic tradition but lacking any of the standard hallmarks of science are scientific entities.

A third hybrid definition, also disjunctive, is the cladistic definition defended by Stephen Davies. who holds that something is art (a) if it shows excellence of skill and achievement in realizing significant aesthetic goals, and either doing so is its primary, identifying function or doing so makes a vital contribution to the realization of its primary, identifying function, or (b) if it falls under an art genre or art form established and publicly recognized within an art tradition, or (c) if it is intended by its maker/presenter to be art and its maker/presenter does what is necessary and appropriate to realizing that intention (Davies, 2015). (In biology, a clade is a segment in the tree of life: a group of organisms and the common ancestor they share.) Artworlds are to be characterized in terms of their origins: they begin with prehistoric art ancestors, and grow into artworlds. Hence all artworks occupy a line of descent from their prehistoric art ancestors; that line of descent comprises an art tradition that grows into an artworld. So the definition is bottom-up and resolutely anthropocentric. A worry: the view seems to entail that art traditions can undergo any changes whatsoever and remain art traditions, since, no matter how distant, every occupant of the right line of descent is part of the art tradition. This seems to amount to saying that as long as they remain traditions at all, art traditions cannot die. Whether art is immortal in this sense seems open to question. A second worry is that the requirement that every art tradition and artworld stand in some line of descent from prehistoric humanoids makes it in principle impossible for any nonhuman species to make art, as long as that species fails to occupy the right location in the tree of life. While the epistemological challenges that identifying artworks made by nonhumans might pose could be very considerable, this consequence of the cladistic definition’s emphasis on lineage rather than traits raises a concern about excessively insularity.

A fourth hybrid definition is the “buck-passing” view of Lopes, which attempts an escape from the stalemate between artwork-focused definitions over avant-garde anti-aesthetic cases by adopting a strategy that shifts the focus of the definition of art away from artworks. The strategy is to recenter philosophical efforts on different problems, which require attention anyway: (a) the problem of giving an account of each individual art, and (b) the problem of defining what it is to be an art, the latter by giving an account of the larger class of normative/appreciative kinds to which the arts (and some non-arts) belong. For, given definitions of the individual arts, and a definition of what it is to be an art, if every artwork belongs to at least one art (if it belongs to no existing art, then it pioneers a new art), then a definition of artwork falls out: x is a work of art if and only if x is a work of K, where K is an art (Lopes 2014). When fully spelled out, the definition is disjunctive: x is a work of art if and only if x is a work belonging to art1 or x is a work belonging to art2 or x is a work belonging to art3 …. Most of the explanatory work is done by the theories of the individual arts, since, given the assumption that every artwork belongs to at least one art, possession of theories of the individual arts would be necessary and sufficient for settling the artistic or non-artistic status of any hard case, once it is determined what art a given work belongs to. As to what makes a practice an art, Lopes’ preferred answer seems to be institutionalism of a Dickiean variety: an art is an institution in which artists (persons who participate with understanding in the making of artworks) make artworks to be presented to an artworld public. (Lopes 2014, Dickie 1984) Thus, on this view, it is arbitrary which activities are artworld systems: there is no deeper answer to the question of what makes music an art than that it has the right institutional structure.[4] So it is arbitrary which activities are arts. Two worries. First, the key claim that every work of art belonging to no extant art pioneers a new art may be defended on the grounds that any reason to say that a work belonging to no extant artform is an artwork is a reason to say that it pioneers a new artform. In response, it is noted that the question of whether or not a thing belongs to an art arises only when, and because, there is a prior reason for thinking that the thing is an artwork. So it seems that what it is to be an artwork is prior, in some sense, to what it is to be an art. Second, on the buck-passing theory’s institutional theory of the arts, which activities are arts is arbitrary. This raises a version of the question that was raised about the cladistic definition’s ability to account for the existence of art outside our (Hominin) tradition. Suppose the connection between a practice’s traits and its status as an art are wholly contingent. Then the fact that a practice in another culture that although not part of our tradition had most of the traits of one of our own arts would be no reason to think that practice was an art, and no reason to think that the objects belonging to it were artworks. It is not clear that we are really so in the dark when it comes to determining whether practices in alien cultures or traditions are arts.

5. Conclusion

Conventionalist definitions account well for modern art, but have difficulty accounting for art’s universality – especially the fact that there can be art disconnected from “our” (Western) institutions and traditions, and our species. They also struggle to account for the fact that the same aesthetic terms are routinely applied to artworks, natural objects, humans, and abstracta. Aesthetic definitions do better accounting for art’s traditional, universal features, but less well, at least according to their critics, with revolutionary modern art; their further defense requires an account of the aesthetic which can be extended in a principled way to conceptual and other radical art. (An aesthetic definition and a conventionalist one could simply be conjoined. But that would merely raise, without answering, the fundamental question of the unity or disunity of the class of artworks.) Which defect is the more serious one depends on which explananda are the more important. Arguments at this level are hard to come by, because positions are hard to motivate in ways that do not depend on prior conventionalist and functionalist sympathies. If list-like definitions are flawed because uninformative, then so are conventionalist definitions, whether institutional or historical. Of course, if the class of artworks, or of the arts, is a mere chaotic heap, lacking any genuine unity, then enumerative definitions cannot be faulted for being uninformative: they do all the explaining that it is possible to do, because they capture all the unity that there is to capture. In that case the worry articulated by one prominent aesthetician, who wrote earlier of the “bloated, unwieldy” concept of art which institutional definitions aim to capture, needs to be taken seriously, even if it turns out to be ungrounded: “It is not at all clear that these words – ‘What is art?’ – express anything like a single question, to which competing answers are given, or whether philosophers proposing answers are even engaged in the same debate…. The sheer variety of proposed definitions should give us pause. One cannot help wondering whether there is any sense in which they are attempts to … clarify the same cultural practices, or address the same issue” (Walton 2007).


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