History of the Ontology of Art
Questions central to the ontology of art include the following: what sort(s) of things are works of art? Do all works of art belong to any one basic ontological category? Do all or only some works have multiple instances? Do works have (material) parts or constituents, and if so, what is their relation to the work as a whole? How are particular works of art individuated? Are they created or discovered? Can they be destroyed?
Explicit and extensive treatments of these topics written prior to the 19th century have yet to be found. This does not mean, however, that there is nothing relevant to these ontological questions in early writings on beauty, the arts, and related matters. For example, Aristotle’s claims about the functions and elements of tragedy (see Gerald Else 1957) can be mined for ideas about the nature of literary works more generally. And what can be made of the hint, in Metaphysics Eta, 6, that the unity of The Iliad is a matter of a set of words made “one” by being connected together?
Rather than attempting to make conjectures about such difficult exegetical topics, this entry focuses primarily on contributions made by authors who explicitly address themselves at length to some of the aforementioned questions pertaining to the ontology of works of art, either in general or with reference to such major art forms as music, literature, painting, architecture, and sculpture.
One further note about the scope of this entry is in order. Instructive surveys of the subfield of aesthetics known as the ontology of art are fairly plentiful; see Nicholas Wolterstorff (1992), Gregory Currie (1998, 2010), Joseph Margolis (1998), Stephen Davies (2003a), Amie Thomasson (2004, 2006b), Guy Rohrbaugh (2005), Theodore Gracyk (2009), Robert Stecker (2010), and Carl Matheson and Ben Caplan (2011). Surveys of the history of the field have not, however, been forthcoming, and the comments on this topic that crop up in the literature are sketchy and sometimes quite misleading. One shortcoming has been a marked tendency to focus on contributions from the last two decades of the 20th century, the one salient exception being due attention paid to works by Roman Ingarden (e.g, 1931, 1962, and see the entry on Ingarden). The present entry has been designed with this shortcoming in mind. A schematic mapping of questions and positions is provided and reference is made to neglected, earlier contributions to the ontology of art.
- 1. Do works of art exist?
- 2. Monism and its rivals
- 3. What sorts of entities are works of art?
- 4. Mapping ontological theses
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1. Do works of art exist?
Although artists, critics, and art lovers are likely to think it absurd to deny that a work of art is as real as anything else one might encounter, many philosophers and art theorists have raised questions about the very existence or “mode of being” of works of art.
One prevalent response to the question of art’s existence is a straightforward realism to the effect that works of art figure amongst those entities which, once they have been brought into existence, do not depend on anyone’s (actual or possible) beliefs or responses. A strikingly realist statement is Samuel Alexander’s (1925, 22) claim that the sculptor discovers a sculptural figure in the block of marble, at least if we assume that something can only be discovered if it already exists. A more prominent example of a philosopher who defends realism about works of art is Monroe C. Beardsley (1958), who seems to have espoused the disjunctive thesis that a work of art is either a particular physical object or a kind of physical object (see the entry on Beardsley’s aesthetics).
1.2 Modes of being and existence
Some philosophers postulate a plurality of modes of being, and some of these philosophers have attributed modes of being other than existence to works of art. An example is C. E. M. Joad, who included a fairly lengthy discussion of issues related to the ontology of art in his popular Guide to Philosophy of 1936.
Joad denied that a work such as Shakespeare’s Hamlet could be correctly identified with any existing concrete particular, such as a script, or with a collection of events, such as those involved in a staging of the play. Nor should the title ‘Hamlet’ be taken as referring to ideas in the author’s mind, to some spectator’s experience of the work, or to some collection of experiences occasioned by performances of the play. Joad’s alternative was to say that the work of art is a subsistent object, neither mental nor material, which, like other universals, is a constituent of the universe possessing a special kind of being in its own right. According to Joad, then, at least some works are subsistent universals, and this is the sort of entity to which the titles of such works of art refer.
In his Mellon lectures presented at the National Gallery in Washington in 1955 (published in 1957), Étienne Gilson classified works of art as Aristotelian substances (for background, see the entries on substance and Aristotle’s metaphysics). Gilson also claimed that a work has aesthetic and artistic modes of existence in addition to a substantial one. A work exists artistically qua product of the artist’s activity, whereas it exists aesthetically when it is the object of someone’s aesthetic (or contemplative) experience. A similar plurality of modes of existence of works of art had been postulated by Étienne Souriau (1943, 1947), who posited thing-like [chosale], aesthetic, and transcendent modes of existence.
1.3 The Imagination and fictionalism
In attributing artistic and aesthetic modes of existence to works, Gilson adverted to a physical object’s relation to the experiences and actions of cognizing subjects. Similarly, a long series of philosophers have taken subjective relations and experiences to be crucial to answering the question of the existence of works of art. It has often been proposed, for example, that works are at least in part a product of the imagination, and this not merely in the sense that some artist must imagine what sort of thing he or she wants to make or do if a work of art is to be brought into existence. Instead, the thought is that even the existence or reality of a completed work of art continues to depend on the make-believe or imaginative activity of the artist or some other subject, such as the observer or reader who appreciates the work as a work of art.
That the imagination plays a crucial role in aesthetic responses to both art and nature was an important theme in 18th-century aesthetics (see the entries on French, British, and German aesthetics in the 18th century). Joseph Addison’s (1712) description of the “pleasures of the imagination” was influential, yet not as influential perhaps as Immanuel Kant’s idea that the activation of the power or faculty of the imagination was essential to aesthetic judgments (for more detail, see the entry on Kant’s aesthetics).
In the 19th and 20th centuries, various thinkers contended that the imagination plays a crucial role in both the creation and the reception of works of art. Prominent examples of philosophers who emphasized the importance of Einbildungskraft or Phantasie in this regard include Friedrich Theodor Vischer (1857, 1898), Robert Zimmermann (1865), Hermann Lotze (1884), Eduard von Hartmann (1888), Karl Köstlin (1869, 1889), Konrad von Lange (1895, 1901, 1912, 1935), Christian von Ehrenfels (1896–1899, 318), and Johannes Volkelt (1905–1915).
Von Hartmann (1888, vol. 2, 11) rejects what he called “naïve realistic” assumptions about the objects of aesthetic or artistic judgements. Arguing for a “transcendental realism,” he contends that beauty is not a material object, but a subjective appearance, like the sweetness of sugar. Von Hartmann observes that people confidently say such things as “this book is Homer’s Iliad,” “this score is Beethoven’s Ninth Symphony,” and “this painting is Raphael’s Sistine Madonna.” Although it is often acknowledged that the first two examples are philosophically untenable, it ought to be admitted, von Hartmann contends, that the third sort of statement is also inaccurate. The painted surface in itself is not beautiful even though in some circumstances it has the capacity to contribute to a subjective appearance of beauty, which von Hartmann characterizes as Schein or Phantasie. If the work of art is the bearer or locus of beauty and other aesthetic properties, it cannot be the material object in itself. Yet Hartmann also contests what he called “subjective idealism,” and in his discussion of artistic creation emphasizes the artist’s engagement with the material constraints of artistic media. The “phantasy work” that an artist elaborates prior to the creation of an “external work of art” is never neutral with regard to media or instrumentation (1888, vol. 2, 180).
Konrad von Lange held that imaginative play and an attitude he called ‘conscious self-deception’ [die bewusste Selbsttäuschung] are necessary to both the creation and appreciation of art. He did not explicitly draw the conclusion that works of art are therefore fictions, but he did describe our commerce with them as a kind of lucid illusion in which we playfully entertain thoughts of states of affairs that we know not to exist. The artistic artifact, he proposed, is like the toy or other object that is recruited to the ends of a child’s imaginative play. A sophisticated and highly influential contemporary exponent of this kind of approach to art and, more specifically, to the philosophical analysis of depiction and fictional content, is Kendall L. Walton (1990).
Jean-Paul Sartre (1938, 1940) has often been credited with the idea that works of art are illusory (in the sense of systematically being the object of some sort of error about their mode of existence), but it is not obvious that this is the best interpretation of his remarks on the topic. Sartre declares that Beethoven’s Seventh Symphony “is outside of the real, outside of existence” (1940, 371, my trans.). He also says that we do not really hear the symphony at all, but only hear the composition in our imaginations. Such statements can be read as being meant to debunk a widespread illusory belief in the existence of musical works; they also hold open the possibility of imagining works without believing in their existence, in which case the putative illusion is not necessary. One of the possible targets of Sartre’s remarks is a kind of idealist doctrine discussed below. For an informative discussion of Sartre’s views on the subject, see Peter V. Lamarque (2010, chapter 10); and for additional background, see the entry on existentialist aesthetics.
On this topic Sartre was preceded and possibly influenced by Ingarden and Nicolai Hartmann, who was professor of theoretical philosophy in Berlin at the time of Sartre’s stint at the Institut français in Berlin from 1933–1934. In a paper presented at the International Congress of Philosophy held at Harvard in 1926 and published in 1927, Hartmann contrasted psychological and ontological approaches in aesthetics and argued for the priority of the latter. In this paper he outlined positions that he was to develop at length in a series of works, including his (1933) and an unfinished treatise on aesthetics, written in 1945 and published posthumously in 1953.
Hartmann’s central thesis on the ontology of art is that works are fictions that depend upon the perceptual and imaginative activities of artists and their audiences. In Hartmann’s view, the work of art has at least two parts or strata: the first layer, which he sometimes refers to as the “foreground,” is perceptible—Hartmann’s examples include a piece of stone, colors on a surface, and audible sounds. The perception of such items is the basis of the aesthetic experience of the higher “background” stratum, which also requires imaginings occasioned by this perceptual experience. The artistic and aesthetic qualities of the work arise from the relation between these ‘heterogeneous’ levels. As a result of this dependence upon the imagination, the work lacks independent or autonomous being, or what Hartmann calls ‘Ansichsein’. A work is an observer-relative appearance or Erscheinung, experienced as such. An appearance experienced as appearance is not to be confused, however, with illusion or Schein because it involves self-reflexive awareness that something is being imagined as opposed to believed. In this regard Hartmann evokes the familiar analogy to children’s imaginative play, while commenting that for the adult such play “remains fiction” (1953, 53).
Hartmann’s concept of artistic appearance does not embrace only the depictive or symbolic contents of representational works of art, as Hartmann also applies his levels analysis to the aesthetic properties of non-figurative works, including architectural ones. A building qua material object obviously figures amongst the real entities of the world, but to experience the material building as a work of art is to engage in the imaginative apprehension of fictional qualities. Hartmann appears to be claiming in this regard that such terms as ‘grandiose’, ‘pompous’ or ‘majestic’, are, when used as labels to name the aesthetic qualities of a building, in some sense imaginative and hence fictional.
Kindred approaches to the question of the work’s existence have been developed by a number of different figures, an early instance being the American philosopher Stephen C. Pepper, who describes how the imagination contributes to a process in which “an aesthetic work of art is created out of a physical work of art” (1937a, 231; 1955). Pepper, who was a professor of philosophy at the University of California at Berkeley, was on the same panel as Hartmann at the 1926 Congress mentioned above. It is not clear, however, whether Pepper embraced Hartmann’s conclusion that works of art are in some sense fictions. Pepper argued for a relativist conception whereby ontological issues depend ultimately on such overarching rival frameworks as organicism, mechanism, and pragmatism or “contextualism.” Pepper explicitly denied that any one of these frameworks was the one true theory.
Another philosopher whose early contributions merit attention in this vein is Joseph Margolis (1958, 1959, 1961). Margolis describes a work of art as being comprised of a physical system (for example, a lump of clay) and an aesthetic design. To behold something as a work of art, it is necessary to combine a sensory perception of the physical item with an imaginative experience of the aesthetic design. The design “supervenes” upon the physical system. Margolis suggests that whereas contradictory assertions about a physical object cannot both be true, the principle of noncontradiction does not apply to the description of works of art.
Margolis (1958) explicitly endorses one implication of his hypothesis regarding the way of being or Seinsweise of the work of art. In the absence of the right sort of attention, the work ceases to exist, even though the physical system remains intact. Yet the same work can return to existence when the same sort of imaginative attention is directed upon the physical system that constitutes the supervenience base of the artwork, thereby “reviving” the correlative aesthetic design.
Several philosophers (e.g., Eleanor Rowland 1913, 117, Hilde Hein 1959, Andrew Harrison 1967–68, Currie 1989, 57) have raised questions about the wisdom of allowing that the existence of a work is intermittent. An early example is Johannes Volkelt (1905, 11), who asserts that the statue of Zeus in Otricoli was a work of art throughout the many centuries during which it lay buried and unobserved. As Wolterstorff later put it, “Have not Beethoven’s quartets, Rembrandt’s prints, and Yeats’s poems existed at least ever since their composition?” (1980, 43). As will become apparent below, a desire to find some alternative to the hypothesis of intermittent existence has influenced some of the proposals about the category of enduring or perduring entities to which artworks should be said to belong. For example, Andrew Paul Ushenko characterized works as powers so as to avoid the intermittence problem (1953, 47), and similar intuitions motivated Pepper’s (1965) “double-dispositional” account, according to which a work’s continuous existence depends on the “passive disposition” of a physical object as well as the “dynamic disposition” of the observer.
It would be quite misleading to give the impression that all of those philosophers who thought minds and their activities have something to do with the existence of works of art also thought that this means that works were somehow less real than, say, natural physical entities and events. Idealists invert this hierarchy.
This is explicit in Benedetto Croce (1913, 1965, 9–10) when he asserts that works of art cannot be physical entities because works of art are “supremely real” whereas the physical world is “unreal.”
Another early example of an idealist ontology of art is provided by Waldemar Conrad (1908–09). Conrad stressed Edmund Husserl’s contrast between “natural” and “phenomenological” attitudes and their objects (for background, see the entries on Husserl and phenomenology). Conrad asserts that only the latter attitude can reveal the “ideal Object” that is the genuine or intended [gemeinte] work of art. In his example, which could well have served as the counterpoint for Sartre’s discussion of Beethoven’s Seventh Symphony, the genuine work is the symphony itself as opposed to the various spatiotemporal events, such as more or less competent orchestral performances, or someone’s whistling the melody or reading the score, that might help to direct attention to some of the work’s essential features (1908–09, 77–78). Conrad does not present a detailed defense of his assumptions about the ontology of ideal objects, but clearly shared Husserl’s aversion to “psychologism” (for background, see the entry on psychologism).
Croce’s (1902, 1913, 1948) claims about works (and ideas) as “expressions” of experience generated a lot of controversy and did much to put ontological issues on the agenda of aesthetics and the philosophy of art (for background, see the entry on Croce’s aesthetics). British proponents of Croce-inspired aesthetics included Lascelles Abercrombie (1922), who promoted the idea that the work is an experience, and P. Leon (1931), who rhapsodized about the aesthetic object as an experienced quale. Drawing upon a broad Platonic and Romantic background, George W. Beiswanger (1939) developed the view that the “material” work is merely a means to the aesthetic object, which he characterized as “experienced experiencing,” an idea inspired, apparently, by John Dewey’s remark that “the actual work of art is what the product does with and in experience” (1934, 3).
By far the most influential Croce-inspired aesthetician was Robin George Collingwood (1925, 1938), whose several translations of Croce’s work helped make the Italian philosopher’s views more accessible to readers bereft of Italian (for background and references, see Alan Donagan 1972). As Collingwood’s philosophy of art is the subject of a separate entry as well as various commentaries (e.g., Ian Winchester 2004, David Davies 2008), we can be brief here. For some purposes talk of a “Croce-Collingwood” theory of art is good enough, but of course differences come to the fore when one reads these authors with an eye to detail. It seems fair to say that for Collingwood, the work of art is not a physical object or finished artifact, but the conscious imaginative activity through which creative expression takes place. That works are the activity of the imagination does not make them any less real in Collingwood’s opinion.
A forceful objection to all theories that invite us to think of works of art as experiences—those of the artist and/or those of the audience—is that this is a conflation of an experience and the object of the experience. It is one thing to acknowledge that a work is the product or even the expression of a human experience and that it is designed to occasion certain kinds of experiences; it is something else entirely to assert that the work is itself an experience and nothing more. Such an account neglects the physical dimensions of art, beginning with the artist’s encounter with materials and media. It is also objected that the attempted reduction of artworks to experiences would convert a public, culturally situated entity into something private. Early worries of this sort were articulated in relation to Croce’s aesthetics by Alexander (1925) and Louis Arnauld Reid (1926). More recently, these objections have been raised against Roger Scruton’s (1997) ontology of musical works by Jerrold Levinson (2000), who explicitly links Scruton’s account to the legacy of Collingwood and idealism.
Given a sufficiently austere ontology, titles such as Das Lied von der Erde and Hamlet have no real referents. Those who defend such an ontology are rarely eager to trumpet the implications for the arts, perhaps because doing so would be a poor recommendation for the austerity. A few thinkers writing about aesthetics have, however, conjectured that we would be better off without committing ourselves to the existence of works. For example, Richard Rudner (1950) distinguished between questions about the object of our aesthetic responses and questions about the referents of the names of works. The answer to the latter question is that such names are non-designative or syncategorematic. The former question, Rudner concludes, is not scientific and should be set aside.
Roland Barthes (1971) notoriously asserted that the concept of the work of art is part of a repressive ideology that should be replaced by a liberating conception of textuality. ‘Textuality’ referred in his mind to a highly indeterminate and exciting sphere of semantic and erotic possibilities; ‘work’ [une œuvre] was, on the contrary, an ideological drag involving wrong-headed thinking about fixed meanings, ownership, and repression.
In a somewhat similar spirit but without Barthes’s poststructuralist idiom, Stephen David Ross (1977) contends that there is no work of art simpliciter, but any number of discriminable achievements or loci of artistic value.
Anders Pettersson (1981, 1984, 1990, 2009, 2012) contends that talk of a text or literary work can be eliminated. He acknowledges that the concept of a literary work forms part of ordinary language and is useful in theoretically undemanding contexts, but he also argues that it is a self-contradictory construct that creates many pseudo-problems for literary theory. We can say what we need to say about literature in a theoretically adequate way without making any ontological commitments to texts or works and without introducing any new entities by referring to such phenomena as physical copies of texts, texts in the sense of sequences of signs, or meaning in its different varieties.
A more recent proponent of an eliminativist strategy is Ross P. Cameron (2008), who contends that we need not make works of art part of our fundamental metaphysics. Even so, we can still hold our common sense statements about them to be true. For criticisms of the idea that this eliminativist position is compatible with common sense or well-entrenched practices, see Robert Stecker (2009) and Stefano Predelli (2009).
2. Monism and its rivals
In this context ‘monism’ is simply a label for the idea that all works of art fall within one ontological category, such as universals. A prevalent argument against this sort of thesis rests on the distinction between performance and non-performance works: a musical work can be performed by various persons and on various occasions; a painting cannot. Having described such distinctions amongst works of art, Wolterstorff concludes tersely that “Works of art are not all alike in their ontological status” (1975, 230). According to Stephen Davies (1993), we need not look beyond the art of music to find grounds for rejecting ontological monism. More recently, Robert Howell (2002a, 2002b) has argued that if the term ‘work of art’ covers artistic improvisations, the various utterances referred to as ‘oral literature’, and such items as paintings and scored musical compositions, then no single adequate ontological category is to be found. With reference to artists’ stipulative authority over the “features and boundaries” of their works, Sherri Irvin declares that “Any claim to the effect that all works belong to the same ontological category will thus come out false or uninformative” (2008, 1). Yet as will become clear below, monism still has its proponents.
2.1 Multiple vs. singular artistic items
Many debates over monism and rivals to that position have hinged on the question of reproduction and multiple instances, the thought being that in the case of at least some works, adequate technologies of reproduction yield more than one instance of an artistic artifact, and therefore of the work. For example, it would be highly implausible to contend that Henri Cartier-Bresson’s famous photographic work, “Behind the Gare Saint-Lazare, Paris” (1932), consists in the negative used to make prints, or in the first or any other single print of this picture. Multiply instantiated works form one major category, then, while singular or non-reproducible ones form another.
It has been complained, however, that this distinction ought not to be taken as decisive for an ontology of art since it rests upon a contingent thesis about what is technologically possible.
The question of how technological change can influence our basic conception of works of art was raised by Walter Benjamin in a famous essay, a first version of which appeared in French in 1936 (translated literally, the title is ‘The Work of Art in the Age of its Mechanical Reproducibility’). Benjamin is generally interpreted as claiming that the advent of techniques of mechanical reproduction has undermined the quasi-religious “aura” that previously surrounded the individual work of art. Benjamin appears to have viewed such technological change as part of a liberating or progressive historical process. Whether Benjamin held that no work of art really was or could be an “authentic” concrete particular is hard to determine, however, as the history of art’s political functions is the primary focus of his somewhat obscure essay. Benjamin does declare early on (in both the first and revised versions of his essay) that “In principle, the work of art has always been reproducible. Objects made by humans could always be copied by humans” (2008, 20).
Other philosophers have argued that technological possibility should not be thought decisive with regard to the soundness of a monist ontology of art: the important philosophical question is what is nomologically or metaphysically possible. A relatively early example is C. I. Lewis’s oft-overlooked (1946) discussion of the ontology of the work of art.
Drawing upon work by Pepper, D. W. Prall (1929, 1936), and George Santayana (1923), Lewis held that an aesthetic appreciation of art is based on the contemplation of an “aesthetic object” presented by the work. Lewis recruited Santayana’s (1923) concept of essences (or some approximation thereof) in order to characterize these aesthetic objects. An aesthetic essence is described as “a certain composition of sense or qualia” (1946, 188) and as a “qualitatively identical content” (1946, 18). When we appreciate a painting, Lewis contends, what we contemplate is what this canvas could have in common with some reproduction of it, namely, “that qualitative and abstract essence which is here incorporated, and is theoretically repeatable in some other physical object” (1946, 477). Lewis claims that an aesthetic object always depends upon some physical object, but he maintains that these dependency relations differ in degree, since a poem depends on a particular inscription less than a work of visual art depends on a particular visible object. Yet the work is not just a type of visual appearance abstracted from a physical object, or in Lewis’s terms, an artistic vehicle. Instead, for Lewis, the aesthetic essence constitutive of the identity of the work of art, as opposed to the physical object, “lies in the context associated with this physical entity which presents it” (1946, 474, Lewis’s italics). If someone fails to bring this associated context, or brings some other context, into the interpretation of the vehicle, “the esthetic object presented fails to be apprehended in its actual esthetic character—is either misapprehended or not apprehended at all” (1946, 474).
Note that Lewis considers every aesthetic essence to be “theoretically repeatable.” Similar claims to the effect that all works of art are multiple, at least in principle and qua objects of appreciation, were subsequently made by Ushenko (1953, 21–25), Peter Strawson (1959, 231, n. 1; 1974, 183), Jeanne Wacker (1960), Anthony Savile (1971), Eddie Zemach (1966, 1986), and Currie (1989).
Many other writers have, on the contrary, stressed the singularity of at least some works of art and/or some of their constituents. Croce’s influential (1903) diatribe against the “science” of genres stands at the top of a list that includes George Boas (1937), Henri Focillon (1934, 56), Souriau (1947, 70), Stuart Hampshire (1952), Ingarden (1962), Nelson Goodman (1968), Richard Wollheim (1968), Wolterstorff (1975, 1980), Catherine Lord (1977), Mark Sagoff (1978), Levinson (1987, 1996), Anthony O’Hear (1995), Irvin (2008), and Michael Weh (2010).
The diversity of arguments and positions on this broad particularist theme should be noted. For example, Ingarden reacts negatively to the prospect of a multiplicity of perfect replicas of the cathedral of Notre Dame de Paris: seeing such things side by side, he comments, would cause “the strongest displeasure, precisely because it belongs to the nature of the work of art to be an individual, in the sense of something qualitatively unique” (1989, 274; 1962, 278). O’Hear defends a “singularity thesis” to the effect that “works of distinction” are necessarily individual and unique, whereas Weh argues that artistic intentions constrained by the historical circumstances determine whether and when a work is reproducible or multiple. Wolterstorff’s line on this topic is that in the case of many paintings, the artist does not settle on a set of properties that establish criteria for correctness of instances or “occurrences” of the work (1980, 72).
In a paper published posthumously in 2001, Frank Sibley evokes the longstanding controversy surrounding the reproducibility of works of art and contends that in this regard a “two-way pull” is a pervasive feature of the practices and discourses of art. Sibley concludes that only a stipulation could rectify the tension between reproducibility and singularity in our conception of the work of art. We return to this topic below.
2.2 Artistic vehicles vs. works of art
One source of confusion in this area is divergent assumptions about both the extension and intension of the expression ‘work of art’ and its cognates: what is it, exactly, that can or cannot be classified in a single, basic ontological category? Whereas Virgil Aldrich (1963) proclaims the term ‘work of art’ useful because of its ambivalence, others (e.g., Boas 1937) have found the pervasive ambiguity in the discourse about artworks (starting with a process/product conflation) troublesome and in need of clarification.
I. A. Richards famously wrote that people “naturally talk about poems (and pictures, etc.) in a way which makes it impossible for anybody to discover what it is we are talking about” (1924, 176). Evoking the “vague” and “diverse” usage of the term, Francis Sparshott (1963) worried that the question about what sort of thing a work of art is might have no precise answer. Richard Shusterman concurs, and passes the question of the identity of the work of art along to the “piecemeal efforts of practicing art critics” (1980, 543). Thomasson (2005) argues that given that the relevant sortals yield only vague and incomplete identity and persistence conditions, some questions in the ontology of art admit of no precise answers. A good example would be the question of just how faulty a performance of a difficult composition can be and still count as a performance of the work. Thomasson’s skepticism, however, is a limited one: some art-ontological questions do have determinate answers about which sufficiently well-informed practitioners in the world of art could not be wrong.
Pepper, who struggled with art-ontological issues for several decades, ended up proclaiming in his (1952) that ‘work of art’ is best understood as a “portmanteau” expression on which are hung significantly different conceptual garments. In his early writings on the ontology of art (e.g., 1937b, 231; 1946), Pepper had distinguished between the work of art and “the aesthetic work.” In response to published objections and queries (Nathan Berall 1951, James L. Jarrett 1952, Robert Hoffman 1962), he later drew a distinction between what he proposed to call ‘the control object’ (that he had previously referred to as the ‘physical work of art’ or ‘the vehicle’) and the object of critical evaluation (previously, ‘the aesthetic work of art’).
Various terms for a distinction in this vicinity had already been employed. Hermann Siebek (1875, 7) and von Hartmann (1888, vol. 2, 35, 208) both used the term ‘Vehikel’ to refer to the material or perceptible bases of aesthetic objects and works of art. Volkelt (1905, 11) used the term ‘Ausserdinge’ to refer to the non-psychological items that make up what he called the “pre-aesthetic basis of the work of art.” H. S. Goodhart-Rendel (1934) distinguished between the material of art, the artistic vehicle, and the work of art. His idea is that the vehicle is whatever is used to “externalize” the work or to “disclose it to the world” (1934, 4). In the case of music, the sound is the vehicle; sound is not the artist’s material, however, because some musicians can compose in their heads, and on Goodhart-Rendel’s usage, only those media that are necessary to working in an art form are to be taken as materials. All that is strictly necessary to musical composition is an idea or thought of a sequence of sounds.
The term ‘vehicle’ was taken up again by Harold Osborne, who defined it as what “enables the same organization of material to enter the experience of different persons at different times” (1953, 96). A particular arrangement of pigments upon a canvas or some other surface could be the vehicle of a work, but the work itself is distinct from its material component. The work is not the vehicle alone, but “an enduring possibility, often enshrined or recorded in a material medium, of a specific set of sensory impressions” (1953, 100).
For those who dislike the medical and other connotations of the term ‘vehicle’, there are other options. Ruby Meager uses the term ‘manifestation’, commenting that “a poem is like a universal in being capable of multiple manifestations of which no single one can count as the poem itself” (1958–59, 52). Many writers have preferred the term ‘instances’. Currie, for example, defines ‘instance’ as “all those concrete things that we come into contact with when we experience a work of art” (1989, 5).
Why distinguish between the work of art and its vehicle, manifestation, or control object? Various reasons have motivated such distinctions. One line of thought is that a work is “constituted” by a material object or vehicle, where the constitution relation is not a matter of identity (for background, see the entry on material constitution). Roger Pouivet (2000, 2010) has brought such arguments to bear on a number of issues in the ontology of art.
John Dilworth (2005a) distinguishes between the concrete artifact or event and the artwork. In his view the relation between them is representational. The artifact or event represents the work, which in turn represents other content, namely, the subject matter of the work.
In an analogy that some philosophers (e.g., Arthur C. Danto 1993, 199–200) have taken quite seriously, the vehicle is to the work as the body is to the person; for Johan Georg Sulzer (1792, vol. 4, 727), the work of art has both body (the artistic material or Stoff), and soul or Geist (the representation or Darstellung). A less heavily freighted way of motivating the distinction in aesthetics is to say, along with Pepper and others, that reference to the vehicle or artistic structure alone does not suffice to identify the object of critical evaluation, or what artistic and aesthetic appreciation is really about.
The next section evokes a commonly told story about the basis of a work-object distinction, indicating some ways in which this story is misleading.
2.2.1 Indiscernibility and the story of Pierre Menard
In his widely cited 1964 paper, “The Artworld,” Danto cleverly evoked ways in which perceptually indistinguishable painted canvases could be the vehicles of strikingly different works of art bearing different titles and contrasting artistic and aesthetic qualities. It follows, Danto reasons, that the painted canvas alone is not the work of art.
In a reply to questions raised by Sparshott (1976), Danto claimed to have been “loosely following a famous model in the philosophy of perception” when he began to explore the implications of indiscernibles for issues in aesthetics (1976, 80). Yet at the outset of the second chapter of his 1981 book, The Transfiguration of the Commonplace, Danto commented: “the possibility was first recognized, I believe, in connection with literary works, by Borges, who has the glory of having discovered it in his masterpiece, Pierre Menard, Symbolist Poet” [sic].
It is certainly the case that many philosophers have found inspiration in Jorge Luis Borges’s 1939 story, “Pierre Menard, autor del Quijote,” an English translation of which first appeared in 1962. This short story is not easy to summarize, but one relevant part of it concerns a French symbolist who sets out to create a novel by rewriting—without simply copying—the text of Cervantes’s masterpiece. The narrator of the story makes observations about ways in which Menard’s work would be different from Cervantes’s even if Menard somehow managed to produce something “verbally identical” to what Cervantes had written.
In English-language philosophical publications, the earliest reference to the tale and to its implications for the ontology of art appears in Savile’s (1971) essay on Goodman’s Languages of Art (for background, see the entry on Goodman’s aesthetics). Subsequent references to the story’s philosophical implications include Walton (1973), Wollheim (1978), Goodman (1978), David K. Lewis (1978), Levinson (1980a), Ben Tilghman (1982), Susan Wilsmore (1987), Currie (1989), Jean-Marie Schaefer (1989), Michael Wreen (1990), David Davies (1991, 2010), Christopher Janaway (1992), Lamarque (1998, 2010), Jacques Morizot (1999), and the papers in Petr Kot’átko and Karel Cisar (2004).
Savile presented what he referred to as the “Borges-paradox” in order to contest some of Goodman’s claims about the individuation of works of art. More specifically, Goodman had distinguished between “autographic” and “allographic” works, where the former, unlike the latter, are susceptible to forgery. Moving quickly, the thought is that while it is possible to make a more or less successful forgery of a particular painting, it is impossible to make a deceptive copy of a work of literature because any verbally identical instance of the text is a good copy of the work, or in Goodman’s terms, an instance produced in conformity with a system of notation (for discussion of Goodman’s distinction, see Levinson 1980b, Pillow 2003, and the entry on Goodman’s aesthetics).
Savile presents the Pierre Menard case as a counterexample to Goodman’s thesis that the identity conditions of allographic works are determined by a notational scheme.
Two numerically distinct tokens of the same “verbally identical” text-type could be generated by different literary authors—Menard and Cervantes—working in significantly different artistic contexts. These could, then, be the texts of two artistically different works. Ergo, the work is not the text. Turning from literature to music, Savile asks us to imagine a case where Stockhausen independently composes “an ode notationally and semantically identical” with a composition by Stamitz. Savile proposes that “We should certainly not say that they had composed the same work, for the way in which it would be appropriate to hear them would be quite different” (1971, 23; cf. Levinson 1980a).
The Borgesian narrator also floats the idea that one work could have two artistically different texts, which could be taken as reinforcing a Borges-inspired assault on a text-to-work biconditional (Paisley Livingston 2005a). Generalizing, we end up with a broad distinction between works of art and their “objects” or vehicles.
There has unsurprisingly been some skepticism about both the distinction between vehicle and work, and the idea that cogent reasoning in favor of such a distinction is really to be found in the Borges story. Tilghman (1982), Currie (1989, 134 n. 19) and Lamarque (2010), for example, raise questions about the intelligibility and coherence of that part of the Borges story that concerns Pierre Menard’s unusual intentions and putative achievement with regard to the writing of “his” Quixote. What are we supposed to imagine about Menard’s ambition in setting out to “rewrite” but not copy the text of the novel by Cervantes? Is this a psychologically coherent project? What is more, is there any good reason to think of his text as a new work? For denials, see Goodman (1978) and Goodman and Catherine Z. Elgin (1988), who contend that Menard’s text, if brought to completion, would only be a “replica” of Cervantes’s.
With regard to the text-work distinction and the more general arguments given in support of it, various doubts have been raised. Wollheim (1993) challenges the evidentiary value of thought experiments in a context where the concept in question—in this case, the one evoked by the expression ‘work of art’—has no determinate conditions for its application, but only some broad assumptions that can easily be “transgressed” by the apparent results of a thought experiment. Tilghman had complained a decade earlier that Danto did not specify any criteria of work constitution. Tilghman (1982) added that the ontological question of constitution is in any case not crucial to questions about criticism and appreciation.
It can also be reasonably doubted whether the Borges story truly merits the “glory” of discovery to which Danto alludes. Lamarque (1998, 2010) finds evidence of the key contextualist insight, or at least closely related points, in passages from both Shakespeare and Kant.
Another earlier and little-known source was the Danish physician and neurologist, Carl Georg Lange (1834–1900), who is best known for his independent discovery of the so-called James-Lange ‘peripheric’ theory of emotion in 1885. Lange’s book of 1899, Bidrag til Nydelsernes fysiologi som grundlag for en rationel æstetik, the title of which can be translated quite literally as ‘Contribution to the Physiology of the Pleasures as Foundation for a Rational Aesthetics’, begins with a lengthy survey of the author’s ideas about the nature of the various sources of enjoyment or pleasure, and then moves on to apply these ideas to the arts and beauty.
Lange argues that the various sorts of enjoyments or pleasures [the Danish ‘nydelser’ is ambiguous between the two] given to us by works of art have a few basic sources, including variety [Afvekslingen] and the arousal of sympathy. He also stresses the art appreciator’s admiration of the artist’s manifest overcoming of artistic difficulties in the creation of the work. The awareness that very few people, or perhaps even only a unique individual [den Enkelte], could have brought about an innovative artistic achievement is a distinct source of artistic enjoyment. Lange wants to argue that this type of artistic enjoyment depends upon the appreciator’s awareness of aspects of the art object’s origins. One can only admire a work, in the special sense of artistic admiration or ‘Beundring’ conceived of by Lange, to the extent that one can understand and evaluate the artistic difficulties the artist has overcome. Although Lange here repeats a claim made in earlier aesthetic treatises (e.g. Véron 1878, 63), he takes the argument one step further. He turns to an imaginary indiscernibility example in an effort to make a point about the relevant aspects “in a work” [i et Værk] that can give rise to the special kind of enjoyment he has in mind:
There are examples where people, and this includes even the experts, disagree over which of two paintings is the original and which is a copy. In such a situation one should think that the artistic pleasures these two paintings occasion must be more or less the same, and indeed they are, up to the moment when the doubt is removed. Once this happens the difference is very large, as history shows. Nothing prevents us in any case from imagining a copy that so perfectly reproduces the original that there is no way to distinguish them from each other. Yet there is all the difference in the world between the enjoyments they occasion. The enjoyment value of the copy, and with it, its economic value, is negligible compared to that of the original, and this notwithstanding the fact that they resemble each other like two drops of water (1899, 125–126, my trans.).
Lange holds, in other words, that one object of aesthetic admiration and enjoyment is the relational event of artist A in context C creating something sufficiently novel to provide an audience with a certain type of pleasure. Lange explicitly insists that the kind of value he has in mind is “in” the work, but not an intrinsic feature of the (tokens of) the visually identical image type.
As will become apparent below, the debate between monisms and their rivals in the ontology of art continues. A mapping of salient theses is proposed in section 4.
3. What sorts of entities are works of art?
Philosophers who have asked themselves what sorts of things works of art are have had recourse to a bewildering array of received and newly postulated ontological categories. The following survey is not exhaustive, but identifies some of the most prominent proposals.
3.1 Platonism and the paradox of creation
Platonism about at least some works of art—understood broadly as the thesis that a work is some kind of abstract entity having no spatiotemporal location—has its advocates, such as Peter Kivy (1983, 1987) and Julian Dodd (2000, 2007, 2010). Noteworthy recent critiques of Platonist assumptions in the ontology of art include Stephen Davies (1993, 2003b, 2008), Predelli (1995), Saam Trivedi (2002), Andrew Kania (2008a, 2008b), and David Davies (2009).
Rudner raised an objection that would find multiple echoes in the literature: if a work such as Beethoven’s Fifth Symphony is an abstract entity, this would have “as a counter-intuitive consequence a denial that Beethoven created the Fifth Symphony” (1950, 385).
Here we encounter a paradox, or incompatible conjunction of thoughts each of which has some intuitive appeal when examined separately. As Kania (2008a, 22) and Cameron (2008, 295) put it in the context of discussions of the ontology of musical works, the inconsistent triad of propositions may be specified as follows:
(A) Works of art are created.
(B) Works of art are abstract objects.
(C) Abstract objects cannot be created.
Many philosophers (e.g., Wolterstorff 1980, Kivy 1987, Currie 1989) have denied (A). For others, such as Haig Khatchadourian (1960) and Renée Cox (1985), works of art should be recognized as items that come into existence and can be destroyed. Given this premise, which is defended at length by Charles Nussbaum (2003), the trio may be interpreted as a reductio of (B). Another strategy is to restore coherence by attenuating (C). Margaret MacDonald (1952–1953) proposes that works are abstract types that are genuinely created by the artist or author. Similarly, Thomasson argues that at least some works of art (i.e., musical and literary works) are a kind of “abstract artifact” meriting recognition as genuine creations (1999, 2005, 2006a, 2006b, 2010). Barry Smith (2008) also argues for what he calls ‘quasi-abstract patterns’, which like numbers are nonphysical and nonpsychological, but which are tied, through the actions of agents, to a time and historical context. Anthony Ralls (1972) characterizes works as created universals concretely embodied through the intentional activities of artists. Peter Alward (2004) contends that the paradox is generated by inappropriate assumptions about types, and that genuine artistic creation is compatible with a continuant/stage model of works and performances.
Many philosophers in search of conceptual resources that might be useful in responding to the questions about what sorts of entities works of art are have had recourse to some version of Charles Sanders Peirce’s type-token distinction (1931–1955, IV, para. 537). One idea has been that as a special sort of abstraction, types have features that can help solve the paradox of creation and other vexed issues in the ontology of art. As becomes apparent below, however, the conclusions on this score have been quite diverse.
3.2 Type-token distinctions
Although Wollheim has at times wrongly been credited with this move (e.g., Hick 2011, 188, n. 15), the earliest explicit reference to the type-token distinction in the literature on the ontology of art is to be found in Rudner (1950). Subsequent philosophers who discussed applications of type-token distinctions in the philosophy of art include Charles Stevenson (1957, 1958), Meager (1958–59) Margolis (1958, 1959, 1961), W. D. L. Scobie (1960), Wacker (1960), Khatchadourian (1960), Ruth Saw (1961), Donald F. Henze (1957, 1961), Jay E. Bacharach (1971), Nigel Harrison (1975), and R. A. Sharpe (1979, 1995, 2001).
Rudner brought up the type-token distinction in the context of a critique of Lewis’s (1946) idea that a work of art is a contextualized abstract entity. Rudner conjectured that what Lewis had in mind in talking about the relationship between an abstract entity and its renditions or instances was the type-token relation. This conjecture might not have been far off, especially given that Lewis was one of the first American philosophers to read his way through the Peircean Nachlass, which he found stored in cartons in the first office he was assigned at Harvard.
Stevenson (1957) reached for a type/token distinction in an attempt to disambiguate the intuitively appealing idea that a poem is a written or spoken sequence of words. ‘Word’, Stevenson notes, is ambiguous between the particular instance or token and the type of word. While he finds it tempting to rule that the poem is the type (of word sequence), Stevenson considers this to be incompatible with ordinary discourse about literature, as when we use the title of a work to refer to a particular token, saying “Please hand me Paradise Lost.” Stevenson considers it best to allow that the work is either a type or a token, leaving the task of disambiguation to context-sensitive usage. He explicitly rejects René Wellek and Austin Warren’s (1942) Ingarden-inspired thesis that a work is an abstract item, namely a stratified system of norms. In order to accommodate the idea that meaning is also essential to the kind of thing a poem is, Stevenson uses the term ‘megatype’ to pick out classes of word sequences having the same meaning, so that a poem is identifiable as a megatype. Megatypes, he would appear to believe, are ultimately reducible to “a special kind of physical object or event” (1958, 41 n. 2), but it is not clear how this analysis will proceed: is the conjunction of a meaningful text type and the text types of all of its past, present, and future faithful translations a physical object or event?
In an extended criticism of particularist accounts of the individuation and evaluation of works, Meager characterizes a work as either a spatiotemporal object or performance that manifests a pattern of elements that is the product of a person’s (or group of persons’) activity, where the activity was not a matter of copying or servile imitation, and where the object or performance is evaluated non-instrumentally. The concept of a work of art, she comments, “operates in a rather special way as a universal defined by a spatio-temporal particular, which may itself therefore be regarded as a type-universal” (1958–59, 59). According to Meager, the identity of the individual artist is not a factor of work individuation: should two different persons independently author poems that happen to consist in the same sequence of words, they have independently authored the same work, even if their motives, intentions, and contexts are strikingly different.
Turning now to Wollheim’s influential application of a type-token distinction (1968, 1980), what is most noteworthy about his articulation of the idea that at least some works of art are best categorized as types is the reason he gives for saying that types are different from other “generic entities,” and in particular, universals. The relation between a type and its tokens is, according to Wollheim, “more intimate” than the relation between a universal (e.g., a property) and its instances. Whereas the property being white is not itself white, all and only those properties that a token has by virtue of its being a token of a given type are “transmitted” to that type as well: as no bit of cloth that is not rectangular can be a correctly formed token of the type The Union Jack, it follows that the property of being rectangular also belongs to the type The Union Jack. This idea is endorsed by Oswald Hanfling (1992, 80–82), Linda Wetzel (2009), and others.
This contention about the “intimate” relation between types, tokens, and their instantiations of properties leaves one to wonder how Wollheim conceived of both universals and types. Unlike Peirce, he does not hold that the existence of a type depends on that of at least one token; Wollheim seems inclined to accept types as a species of autonomously existing abstract object. Yet if any item that instantiates the property rectangular must be spatial, and if every token of The Union Jack instantiates that property, then it follows from Wollheim’s claim that The Union Jack is, qua type, rectangular. It would appear to follow from this that the type must be a concrete, spatially located entity, since anything that can be a particular instantiation of a spatial property must be located in space. Yet one of the main reasons for going in for the theory of types in the first place was Peirce’s basic observation that while token word inscriptions of ‘the’ have their times and places, the word the, qua type, has no location. Is it sound to postulate the existence of an autonomous abstraction having spatial or temporal features?
Reicher (1998) acknowledges that if works are types, they cannot literally have spatiotemporal properties. With the aim of providing a more accurate restatement of ordinary talk about the perceptible qualities of works, she distinguishes between two different modes of predication. In an example of a first mode of predication, someone says ‘the table is rectangular’. This is contrasted to a different mode whereby we say, for example, ‘this work of art is determined as [ist bestimmt als] rectangular’. If a work of art has been determined as rectangular, then every realization of the work is rectangular. We can perceive a work’s realizations, as these are concrete objects or actions, but strictly speaking, we apprehend [erfassen] but do not perceive the type itself. (For background on this approach, see the entry on nonexistent objects.)
Wolsterstorff complains that Wollheim’s thesis about the sharing of properties among types and their tokens gives us “no illumination” with respect to the pattern of such sharing (1975, 239). Shifting to the terminology of ‘kinds’ and ‘examples’, Wolterstorff focuses on properties that are necessary to “properly formed” examples of a kind, where the kind in question is a “norm-kind” that can (but need not) have both improperly and properly formed instances. For example, some seriously flawed attempts to play a difficult piece by Chopin are nonetheless performances of that work, even though they lack qualities that a proper or a good instance of the work would have. This proposal seems made to order for the many cases where significantly different artistic and aesthetic properties figure within the occurrences or performances of one and the same work (on this theme, see also Walton 1977).
Wolterstorff accepts the thesis that works of art neither come into nor go out of existence (1980, 88–89). A kind, K, exists if and only if the correlated property, k, exists. With regard to the existence of properties, Wolterstorff’s initial view (1970) was that for any property, being-f, this property exists just in case either something is-f or something is not-f. Criticisms (John Perry 1974) involving Russell’s paradox of unexemplified properties led him to qualify this “general predicate entailment principle.”
Wolterstorff holds that the sequences of sounds and words of which musical and literary works are made up exist everlastingly. What the artist does in creating a work, then, is to make it the case that a “preexistent kind becomes a work—specifically, a work of his” (1980, 89). Wolterstorff’s idea, then, is that a composer can select but not create a sound pattern or type of sound-occurrence. Although the latter is an entity that already exists, it is not a musical work unless some composer has determined and perhaps recorded its correctness conditions qua work. Wolterstorff remarks that the composing of a musical work is similar to the inventing of a game (1980, 63).
3.4 Artifacts and actions
That the arts are a matter of the rational production and judgement of artifacts was widely accepted by medieval thinkers (for background, see Eco 1988, 164–165). For example, in the discussion of iconoclasm in the Opus Caroli regis contra synodum (ca. 794), Theodulf of Orléans characterized pictures as manufacta (Noble 2009, 227, 347). As Aquinas puts it in Summa Theologica (I-II, 57, 4c), “ars est recta ratio factibilium” [art is the right reason of things to be made, or more bluntly, art is knowing how to make things]. In keeping with this tradition, Kant (1790) identified a work or opus as the product of a doing [Tun] (facere), to which he contrasted the effects of nature, such as a beehive. Only what is the product of the exercise of a capacity to choose [eine Willkür] is art (Kritik der Urteilskraft, paragraph 43). (For commentary on Kant’s definitions of art and fine art, see Paul Guyer 1997.)
Bernard Bolzano’s neglected (1849) essay on the nature and classification of works of art similarly begins with an emphasis on the necessity of the artist’s intentional activity to the creation of a work, yet Bolzano goes on to allow that some works of art are created solely by means of the artist’s thoughts. Such works consist entirely of the artist’s voluntary subjective presentations or intentional entertaining of propositions (for background, see Blaukopf 1996, Reicher 2006). Bolzano adds that the free and intentional production of such inner representations often plays a crucial role in the creation of those works of art, such as statues and songs, that are perceptible to an audience.
Philosophers who have more recently classified works of art as artifacts include Marcia Eaton (1969), Gary Iseminger (1973), Denis Dutton (1979), Risto Hilpinen (1992, 1993), Thomasson (1999), and Levinson (2007) (for background, see the entry on artifacts).
3.4.1 Indicated structures and objects
Levinson advocates a “contextualism” in aesthetics (2005), which is not to be confounded, however, with the approach defended by Pepper (1937a, 1968, 1970) under the same label.
In his (1980a, 1990) Levinson sets forth and defends an account of “paradigm musical works,” i.e., fully notated “classical” compositions within Western culture. His proposal is motivated by the attempt to meet what he takes to be three salient requirements on an adequate ontology of works of this sort: creatability, fine individuation, and the inclusion of performance means.
The first requirement specifies that “Musical works must be such that they do not exist prior to the composer’s compositional activity, but are brought into existence by that activity” (1980, 68). Like Wolterstorff, Levinson allows that all possible sounds, and patterns and sequences thereof, preexist anyone’s compositional activities. The creatability requirement must be compatible with this assumption. The claim is not, then, that composers can bring musical structures into existence; what they can do, however is “indicate” a structural type along with a “performance means” or manner of generating instances or tokens of sound sequences of that type. A musical work is, then, a relational entity of the sort “sound structure and performance-means as indicated by artist X at time t.” This sort of abstract item, Levinson writes, “does not preexist the activity of composition and is thus capable of being created” (1980a, 79; cf. John Andrew Fisher 1991). Entities of this sort, it seems, only come into existence through an actual event of indication performed by a person (or persons) in some context. Terms figuring alongside ‘indicate’ in Levinson’s descriptions of what the artist does with the abstract object include ‘discover’, ‘choose’, and ‘demonstrate’ (1990).
Levinson’s fine individuation requirement springs from the intuition that if two composers were to indicate the same sound-structure, they would not thereby generate the same musical work. The contrary intuition had been forwarded by Wolterstorff (1975, 248) and criticized in Walton (1977) and Savile (1971). Levinson entertains the possibility that the identity of the composer is not necessarily essential to the individuation of works; perhaps it is at least logically possible for a work to be composed by a person other than the one who actually did so. Levinson explores the thesis that something like sameness of musical-historical context is a constraint sufficient to satisfy the requirement of “fine-grained individuation.”
Levinson proposes, then, that some musical works may be classified as “initiated types,” that is, types that are brought into being by an intentional action of indication performed upon a pure structure. With regard to works of visual art, Levinson (1996) defends the idea that at least some such works are physical objects as intended by the artist for a certain regard or treatment. The work is the relational entity comprised of the object or structure and the artist’s action in a context.
Currie objects that Levinson’s ontological category, ‘structure-as-indicated-by-artist at time t’ is “metaphysically obscure” (1989, 58). Fleming discovered penicillin, but do we want to add that in so doing he also created the entity penicillin-as-discovered-by-Fleming? Levinson is explicitly committed to the idea that when the artist indicates or discovers the abstract structure, “something further comes into existence,” namely, an “initiated type” (1990, 262). Currie’s point is that if this is allowed, various unwanted ontological commitments follow. A related criticism raised by Dodd (2000), Predelli (2001), and Alward (2004) is that indicating is not really a matter of creating, and if this is correct, it follows that Levinson’s proposal does not satisfy the first of his three requirements on an adequate ontology.
Currie also raises the objection that Levinson’s account does not individuate works adequately; this objection has been further pursued by David Davies (2004). And Lamarque (2010) contends that there is an indeterminacy as to which tokens are of a given indicated type.
In response to James Anderson’s (1985) suggestion that Levinson’s proposal could be amplified with reference to Wolterstorff’s ideas about norm-kinds, Levinson (1990) expresses reservations about the latter, but adds that the notion that the artist makes certain features normative for a work helps explain in what ‘indicating’ a structure consists.
3.4.2 Action types and performances
Various philosophers have explored the basic idea that works should be classified as actions or performances as opposed to the products or objects that may result from such activities. Croce, Collingwood, and Dewey are early and highly influential examples. In a review of Dewey’s aesthetics, Croce makes a list of familiar ideas to be found in Dewey’s work. One of these ideas, which he says was formulated much earlier in Italy, is that “there are not artistic ‘things’, but only an artistic doing, an artistic producing” (1948, 205). Jeffrey Maitland (1975) similarly suggests that the work of art is a “doing”, but also declares that a work is a “performative presence.” Denis Dutton writes that “As performances, works of art represent the ways in which artists solve problems, overcome obstacles, make do with available materials.” (1979, 305). He adds in the same context that “the work of art has a human origin, and must be understood as such”.
Sparshott (1980, 1982) conceives of a work as a performance, and more specifically, as an action when it is conceived in a certain way, namely, as the establishment of a design. Work identity is determined by both the nature of this design and the type of action that yielded it: same design and origin, same work. Sparshott’s evocation of a unity of outcome and agency is complicated, however, by the fact that he thinks in terms of reconstructed or idealized, nonfactual artistic intentions, as opposed to the actual intentions and actions of the artist or artists responsible for the production of a “system of qualities.”
Currie (1989) proposes that all artworks belong to the category of action types. Works are types of events, then, and events are said by Currie to be a “natural ontological category.” Although Currie says he wants to stay neutral on issues pertaining to the nature and individuation of events, he at least provisionally works with Jaegwon Kim’s (1976) conception of events as property exemplifications by an object or substance (or ordered n-tuple of objects/substances) at a time. As types, works could not themselves literally be events, and Currie’s event-types are individuated in ways that abstract from the “constitutive substance” figuring within Kim’s basically Aristotelian perspective on events.
More specifically, Currie’s proposal is that a work is an action type of the form:
An agent, A, discovers a structure, s, via a heuristic path, H, at a time, t.
Currie allows that the artist does not create the work of art. Nor does the artist discover it. The artist can discover a preexisting abstract artistic structure, but the work is an action type that the artist “performs” in so doing.
Currie explains that the heuristic path is the “way in which the artist arrived at the final product.” Neither a particular agent nor a specific time is essential to the action type that is the work of art: someone else could discover the same structure at a different time yet instantiate the same work. Currie conjectures, for example, that if “Picasso’s twin on ‘Twin Earth’ produces a canvas indistinguishable from Picasso’s Guernica, and if he does so in the same way, then Guernica and Twin Guernica are instances of the same work” (1989, 9). Currie also introduces a similar conjecture involving Beethoven, twin Beethoven, and twin tokens of the Hammerklavier sonata.
Wolterstorff (1992) and Levinson (1992) complain that a counterintuitive implication of Currie’s proposal is that one cannot read a literary work. Levinson (1992) takes up the question of work individuation and asks whether Beethoven and twin Beethoven really make the same works, even though they act within qualitatively identical cultures and come up with tokens of the same artistic structure via qualitatively identical paths. Do such examples carry any weight in an ontology of art?
Questions have been raised (e.g., by Levinson 1992 and David Davies 2004) about Currie’s Lakatos-inspired notion of the artist’s heuristic path, beginning with the obvious query as to what is and is not included in the “way” the artist discovers the structure. Currie allows that the path can include facts unknown to the artist if they are deemed relevant to the appreciation of his or her achievement. For example, even if Virginia Woolf did not know of Marcel Proust’s work when she wrote Jacob’s Room, she could “in principle” have known about it, and so Proust’s prior inventions are relevant to our understanding of Woolf’s achievement. Currie acknowledges that his notion of a heuristic path is vague, and he entertains the possibility that describing the heuristic of a work “starts to look like writing the history of the universe” (1989, 72). Yet he optimistically predicts that there “will be wide agreement about how the idea is to be applied in particular cases” (1989, 73). More specifically, he indicates that “case studies” in the analysis of such heuristics can be found in Michael Baxandall’s (1985).
In his proposal for an alternative to contextualist ontologies of art, David Davies (2004, 2005) proposes that works of art are best classified, not as indicated structures or as action types, but as action tokens. A work of art, then, is a ‘doing’ or generative performance. Davies further analyzes the latter as a sequence of “motivated manipulations of a vehicular medium through which a particular focus of appreciation is specified” (2005a, 75). With regard to the bedeviled question of which factors in the historical context of a work’s creation do and do not determine the identity of the work (a question that is taken to be distinct from the question as to which factors are in some broad sense relevant to the work’s understanding and appreciation), Davies identifies what he calls the artist’s “primary motivation,” which governs activities that specify an artistic vehicle that articulates a given artistic content. It is these art-content-articulating manipulations of artistic vehicles that qualify as elements in the performance that is identified with the work. For example, whether an artist’s intentional ingestion of a drug during the making of the “focus of appreciation” or product of the generative performance is to be counted as part of the work depends, then, on whether this action is part of a manipulation of an artistic vehicle effectively designed to articulate some aspect of the work’s content.
Dilworth (2005b) objects that Davies’s basic contention to the effect that works are action tokens is incompatible with his claim that works, conceived of as a particular generative performance, have a kind of “modal flexibility,” which means that the same work could have had different properties (e.g., it could have been created a few minutes earlier or later). Other critics (Kania 2005, Stecker 2005) believe Davies provides insufficient grounds for the adoption of a highly revisionary ontological doctrine that gives the lie to countless ordinary statements about works of art, such as “the Mona Lisa can be seen at Le Louvre.” This criticism echoes Mary McCarthy’s remark in response to Harold Rosenberg’s proposal that action paintings are not pictures but “events”: “You cannot hang an event on a wall, only a picture” (Rosenberg 1962, 5).
Davies (or the proponent of any other ontological account that diverges from ordinary language) may respond that the goal is not to mirror all everyday utterances, but to articulate an accurate ontological doctrine. Davies in fact contends that his proposal is meant to obey a “pragmatic constraint” to the effect that “Artworks must be conceived ontologically in such as way as to accord with those features of our critical and appreciative practice upheld on rational reflection” (2004, 23). Yet if it is acknowledged that art-world practices are contradictory, changing, and theory-infested, the question (Livingston 2005b) is on what grounds a philosopher’s “rational reflection” can single out those practices that can provide a non-circular basis for an ontological thesis. Stecker (2009) argues that Davies’s pragmatic constraint is too broad to single out the performance theory or any of the other rival ontological proposals. The pragmatic, referential core of our talk about musical works requires them to be audible, repeatable, and performable, and this is compatible with contextualism and other rivals to Davies’s proposal, but not with Davies’s proposal itself.
3.5 Historical individuals
Guy Rohrbaugh (2003) argues that even in the case of ‘repeatable’ works such as photographs, the category of types does not adequately capture at least three fundamental features of works of art: temporality (they come into existence and can cease to exist), temporal flexibility (some of their qualities can change over time), and modal flexibility (a work could have had properties other than those it actually has). Rohrbaugh denies that a work or its vehicle has all of its intrinsic features essentially. It is widely accepted that some (but not too many) of the artistic features of a painting or a photograph could have been slightly different. According to Rohrbaugh, type theories, including those that include features of the structure’s historical provenance amongst the conditions on being a token of a given artwork type, cannot accommodate this sort of modal flexibility. Rohrbaugh proposes instead that works of art should be conceived of as “historical individuals” that persist through time in an ontologically dependent fashion.
4. Mapping ontological theses
In light of the array of positions surveyed above, we may revisit Sibley’s claim about a ‘two-way pull’ at the heart of our practices and conceptions related to works of art. Doing so will shed some light on at least one central aspect of the debate between monists and their rivals in the ontology of art.
We start with a broad distinction between the work and its vehicle, where the term ‘vehicle’ names different sorts of items that might be considered constituents or parts of a work of art, such as the particular poplar board on which Da Vinci worked for some ten years in making the Mona Lisa, the specific gestures made by a performance artist, or a readily reproducible inscription produced by a poet.
If such a work/vehicle distinction is accepted (and as was noted above, this is the case for some but not all philosophers), the question of whether all or only some works admit of multiple instances can be distinguished from the question of whether all artistic vehicles can be reproduced in a manner that satisfies some standard of qualitative artistic or aesthetic identity. Such a standard would be met just in case the artistic item in question can be reproduced in such a way that the relevant artistic or aesthetic properties are manifested. Our two questions, then, are:
(Q1) Are all artistic vehicles multiple?
(Q2) Are all works of art multiple?
Salient answers to these questions are:
(A1) Some vehicles are singular, some are multiple (e.g., they are abstracta that can have multiple occurrences), and the works of which they are parts or constituents are respectively singular and multiple;
(A2) All vehicles are multiple, and so are the works of which they are parts or constituents.
Versions of (A2) are defended by prominent advocates of ontological monism. One might think that the critics of ontological monism all espouse (A1), but this is not correct, since some of these philosophers do not accept a vehicle/work distinction to begin with, and there are other grounds for rejecting monism. Also (A1) is compatible with several different theses.
What are some of these options? At least some of the disputes between proponents of monism and its rivals in the ontology of art have pivoted on equivocation regarding the kind of possibility envisaged in discussions of multiplicity and singularity. It is one thing to argue that it is impossible to make a perfect replica of an ancient building either because our current technology will not allow it, or, more boldly, because it is physically impossible given the laws of nature (and so “nomologically” impossible). When Ushenko, Strawson, Currie and other writers have evoked the ‘possibility’ of a machine that gives us perfect replicas of things like the vehicle of the Guernica, they are quite obviously abstracting away from the limitations of our current technology. Currie says explicitly that his twin Guernica conjecture ranges over “physically impossible” worlds (1989, 111). C. I. Lewis’s evocation of iterable “aesthetic essences” is similarly a matter of a metaphysical or logical possibility, not a technological one. In sharp contrast, when Focillon (1934, 56) asserted that certain kinds of reproductions were “impossible,” he clearly had in mind what could and could not be done given the technical and other constraints of an actual historical period. A similar assumption becomes explicit in Gérard Genette’s discussion of this topic when he claims that the iterability of artistic items depends upon institutional contingencies (1994, 101–102; Livingston 2012).
Indicating what is meant by ‘possible’ and ‘impossible’ in this context is crucial to a more precise identification of the available theses. Here is a sample:
(T1) It is technologically possible to make multiple instances of some but not all artistic vehicles, yet it is logically or metaphysically impossible for there to be multiple instances of any work, because a work is a particular object, action, or event;
(T2) It is technologically possible to make multiple instances of some but not all artistic vehicles, and it is logically or metaphysically possible for there to be multiple instances of some but not all works, as some works are abstractions or types;
(T3) It is nomologically possible to make multiple instances of any artistic vehicle, but it is logically or metaphysically impossible for there to be multiple instances of any work, because a work is a particular object, action, or event;
(T4) It is metaphysically possible to make multiple instances of any artistic vehicle, and it is (in some sense) possible for there to be multiple instances of some but not all works, because some works are abstract types;
(T5) It is metaphysically possible to make multiple instances of any artistic vehicle, and it is metaphysically possible for there to be multiple instances of all works, because all works are abstract types.
It turns out, then, that at least some of the apparent disagreements in the literature hinge on disparate assumptions about what sorts of possibilities are relevant or decisive in discussions of the nature of works of art. If we go on to ask what grounds philosophers have had for deeming a given kind of possibility relevant or even decisive, a prevalent answer is that such decisions should be constrained by our interest in aesthetic or artistic appreciation. Currie, for example, in his defense of a version of (A2)/(T5), contrasts an “historical” interest in seeing something like Napoleon’s boots or the actual canvas of Guernica to the “aesthetic interest” that could, in the case of the work of art, be equally well served by the scrutiny of a perfect replica of the picture (1989, 102, 105). Yet as was noted above, Ingarden explicitly evokes an aesthetic response in his articulation of the idea that the work is an individual, even if it is possible to create multiple reproductions of the building constitutive of the cathedral of Notre Dame de Paris. A plausible diagnostic (Livingston 2013) is that at least some of the diversity of opinion in ontology reappears when we turn to conceptions of aesthetic and artistic value and appreciation.
In light of this variety of theses and sources of divergent assumptions and conclusions, it would appear that Sibley’s talk of a “two-way pull” was something of an oversimplification.
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