Philosophy of International Law

First published Thu May 12, 2022

The English phrase “international law” was first coined by the utilitarian philosopher, Jeremy Bentham (Janis 1984). But philosophical engagement with international legal themes stretches back to writings on natural law in ancient Greece and Rome. Philosophers in this tradition—such as Plato, Aristotle, Cicero, and the Stoics—advanced the idea of a universal normative order over and above the laws and customs found in particular societies that is discoverable through the exercise of ordinary human, or “natural”, reason (Nussbaum 2019: 18–96). In the Middle Ages, Christian beliefs framed the idea of normative universalism which, at times, was cynically deployed to justify the wrongs of Christian rulers but, at its best, provided the basis for subjecting their conduct to moral censure, as the criticisms of the Conquistadores in some of the Spanish Scholastics illustrate (Pagden 2003; Pagden & Lawrence 1991).

In the modern era, the Dutch natural lawyer Hugo Grotius is credited with laying the foundations for the rise of international law as a genuine system of positive law, rather than simply a source of universal moral or “natural law” principles. By insisting that his system of law would be justifiable even if it were assumed that God does not exist, i.e., the “etiamsi daremus” argument in the Prolegomena to his De Jure Belli ac Pacis (1625: para. XI), Grotius paved the way for a more genuinely universalist conception of international law, independent of Christian beliefs and thus more ideologically inclusive (Nussbaum 2019: 97–140). Subsequently, important contributions were made by other major philosophers, including Pufendorf, Kant, Hegel, Bentham. Although the two leading legal philosophers of the twentieth century—Hans Kelsen and H.L.A. Hart—devoted attention to international law, and extensively so in the case of the former (Bernstorff 2010), international law was neglected by the Anglophone legal and political philosophers who followed them, and important works by international law scholars with potential significance to philosophical debate—e.g., Brierly (1928) or Lauterpacht (1933)—seldom resonated outside the field of international law. By the end of the last century, however, there was a surge in philosophical engagement with international law. This change is reflected in the publication of The Law of Peoples, the last book written by John Rawls (1999), and also in the more philosophically inclined works of prominent international lawyers, such as Thomas Franck (1995).

The focus of this entry is on developments that have occurred since World War II. In the aftermath of World War II, an unprecedentedly sophisticated international architecture of legal norms and institutions, to a large extent associated with the United Nations system, was established. With the end of the Cold War, and the spread of globalization, this architecture reached new heights of ambition, claiming authority over a diverse range of governmental matters that were formerly treated as falling within the exclusive province of state authority. The scope of international law expanded to cover new subject-matter, such as the relationship between the individual and the State, migration, or the environment. Many now perceive the “international rule-based order” to be imperilled by the rise of authoritarian powers, on the one hand, and of populist forces in the Western world, on the other; both are said to be hostile to international law, especially to certain aspects of it like human rights (Alston 2017; Ginsburg 2020; Neuman 2020; Wuerth 2017). For others, the expansion of international law poses a challenge to the liberal foundations of domestic sovereignty. This entry is inevitably selective, focusing on some general conceptual and normative questions, but discussions of the discrete domains of international law can be found elsewhere in the Stanford Encyclopedia (see e.g., the entry on human rights).

1. Conceptual and Normative Argument on International Law

Recent philosophy of international law has pursued a great variety of questions. For present purposes, they can be broadly grouped into two categories, although the boundaries between them are not sharp. First, there are conceptual questions, such as whether international law is genuinely an instance of “law” and, if it is, how it is related to the municipal legal orders associated with individual states; there are also conceptual questions relating to key ideas employed in international legal discourse, whether these be general ideas such as “sovereignty”, “the state”, or “legitimacy”, or ideas associated with specific international legal sources or doctrines, such as “customary international law”, “jus cogens”, and “human rights”. Such questions are discussed mainly in sections 2 and 3 of this entry.

Second, there are normative questions about the proper goals that international law—or its domains, such as international human rights law, international environmental law, and international criminal law—should advance and the means by which it may properly do so and, relatedly, how the legitimacy of international law is to be assessed. A recurring issue is the extent to which ethical-political standards fashioned to assess domestic law—such as democracy, the rule of law, and even legitimacy itself—apply to international law (an important theme in the work of Buchanan, e.g., Buchanan 2013). Due to the long period of philosophical neglect of international law, we are still at an early stage in forming an adequate picture of the political morality appropriate to its distinctive nature and role. These questions are mostly discussed in sections 4, 5, and 6 of this entry.

2. International Law as Law

The two features of international law most commonly invoked by those who call into question its legal character are the absence of a centralized system of enforcement and the role of state consent in the formation of rules of international law. Some legal philosophers, while recognizing that international law possesses some features characteristic of law, dispute its status as a genuine and fully-fledged legal order (e.g., Hart 1961 [2012]). We consider these different strands of arguments on the legal nature of international law in turn.

2.1 Lack of Centralized Enforcement Mechanisms

At the domestic level, law is enforced through both executive power (police, tax authorities, regulatory bodies, etc) and judicial power. International law does not benefit from a comprehensive system of executive and judicial enforcement that is comparable to what developed domestic legal systems can offer. The UN, as the principal international organization, does perform a unique role particularly in the area of collective peace and security; and its most powerful organ, the Security Council, is empowered to adopt decisions under Chapter VII of the UN Charter that are binding on all member states of the UN and can involve the use of military force. The Security Council has used its enforcement powers since the end of the Cold War, most notably during the First Gulf War in 1990–1991 when it authorized its member States to use force to liberate Kuwait following Iraq’s aggression and invasion. But there are many examples of grave breaches of international law that are not met with any enforcement action by the Security Council. As for judicial enforcement, international law lacks a centralized dispute settlement mechanism that operates independently of the consent of states. It is true, however, that the role of the International Court of Justice and the proliferation of other international courts and tribunals—with jurisdiction over areas such as human rights, trade, investment, international crimes—mean that, in practice, international law does benefit today from a far greater measure of enforcement through courts and tribunals than ever in the past.

Some legal philosophers have responded to the problem of limited enforcement by fashioning a theory of international law on the basis of the hypothesis—admitted to be a “fantasy”—that an international court with compulsory jurisdiction exists and that there are reliable international institutional mechanisms for giving effect to its decisions (Dworkin 2013; section 4.4 below). Some have also given a normative interpretation of the relation between law and enforceability that makes in principle, rather than actual, enforceability a touchstone of legality. Thus, according to Liam Murphy, when it comes to law

we would regard it as obviously appropriate for provision to be made within the normative order itself for effective enforcement. Properly regulated third-party enforcement is always in principle appropriate. (Murphy 2017: 221).

Another solution draws attention to the existence of decentralized modes of enforcement, e.g., “outcasting”, which operate not through centralized institutions, but by denying law-breakers the benefits of membership and cooperation (Hathaway & Shapiro 2011; Kelsen 1952 [2012: 20–25]; Goodman & Jinks, 2013). Finally, and more radically, some reject the thesis that enforcement mechanisms, centralized or not, are necessary for full-fledged legal status. It is a mainstream view in contemporary legal philosophy, shared by philosophers as diverse as H.L.A. Hart, John Finnis, and Joseph Raz, that the concept of law does not involve the idea of coercion as a necessary element (Hart 1961 [2012: 199–200]; Finnis 2011; Raz 1999: 159; and in relation to international law, O’Connell 2008: 62–8. For a different view, see Schauer 2015).

This mainstream view rejects the command theory of law (e.g., John Austin), which construes law as orders of a sovereign backed by the threat of sanctions; the view that the function of law is to identify delicts (conduct characterized as illegal) which are the condition of a sanction (a coercive act against the law-breaker) (e.g., Kelsen); as well as predictive theories of law (e.g., Oliver Wendell Holmes) which reduce law to predictions about the application of sanctions (Hart 1961 [2012]). Instead, the primary function of law is to provide a structure for generating norms that guide human behaviour, with or without the existence of effective sanctions, as in Joseph Raz’s hypothetical “society of angels” (Raz 1999: 159). On this view, enforcement mechanisms operate as a mere contingent back-up plan for cases where law fails in its primary function.

As a matter of historical fact, municipal legal systems have extensively relied on centralized enforcement mechanisms to encourage compliance, but this does not amount to a conceptual constraint on the existence of law. It is also worth noting Hart’s observation that in the international domain—where it is difficult for violence and wrong-doing to remain hidden from public view—there may be less of a practical need for sanctions to secure compliance (Hart 1961 [2012: 218]).

On this view, what matters for the existence of international law is a sufficient level of compliance to underwrite its operation as a practically effective system of normative ordering. Though some query whether international legal norms genuinely exert compliance pull of their own accord, as opposed to on the basis of independent (e.g., self-interested) reasons that favour adopting the pattern of behaviour prescribed by law (Goldsmith & Posner 2005), in the famous words of Louis Henkin, it is arguably still the case that

almost all nations observe almost all principles of international law and almost all of their obligations almost all the time. (Henkin 1979: 47)

2.2 The Role of Consent in the Formation of Rules of International Law

The most authoritative statement of the sources of international law is found in Article 38 of the Statute of the International Court of Justice (ICJ 1945). Neither of the two main sources of international law there identified—customary international law and treaties—has an obvious counterpart in domestic law. Arguments about the legal character of international law turn, to a significant degree, on how we understand these two methods of law creation to function.

Legal philosophers writing about international law have often proceeded on the basis that both treaty and custom ultimately depend on state consent. Ronald Dworkin, for example, believed that the idea that a state is subject to international law only insofar as it has consented to be bound by it reflects what “seems to be now generally accepted by practitioners and scholars of international law” (Dworkin 2013: 5). The consent-based account of international law does indeed enjoy wide support among international lawyers too. In one 1996 case, the International Court of Justice described consent, alongside sovereignty, as “the very basis of international law” (ICJ 1996: para. 21).

But is the consent-based account correct in a descriptive sense? Does it, in other words, accurately reflect the way in which rules of international law are generated? When one considers how international law “works”, in theory as well as in practice, this account begins to unravel. This was noted by H.L.A. Hart in 1961 when he wrote of

the suspicion that the general theory that all international obligation is self-imposed has been inspired by too much abstract dogma and too little respect for the facts. (Hart 1961 [2012: 226])

State consent does evidently play an important role in the formation of treaties. Treaties do not bind states that are not parties to them and have not consented to be so bound (Vienna Convention on the Law of Treaties, Article 34 [VCLT 1969]). But among treaties too, there are important caveats. The right to withdraw unilaterally from a treaty, which would grant states the full force of consent, does not, for example, apply to all treaties. The UN Charter is generally understood not to be open to unilateral withdrawal: member states of the UN can be expelled from the organization, but they cannot leave it voluntarily. Consent to it is thus irrevocable. States may be said to have consented to all of the rules that descend from UN membership when they first joined the UN, but the UN Charter is not a static body of legal obligations; it also governs processes through which rules of international law come into existence, and are interpreted and developed—processes which will take their course after the State’s initial consent to be bound by the Charter.

The consent-based account runs into even greater difficulties when it comes to custom. There is, first, the notion of jus cogens, i.e., rules of customary international law (such as the prohibition on torture, genocide and apartheid) which have acquired peremptory status and from which no state is permitted to derogate. Dworkin maintained that jus cogens too comes “under the umbrella of consent” in contemporary international legal doctrine (Dworkin 2013: 6), but there is nothing in the definition of jus cogens in the Vienna Convention that suggests this.[1]

Nor, contrary to many accounts, is customary international law, or custom, based on consent. Custom is defined in the Statute of the International Court of Justice as “general practice accepted as law” (Statute of the International Court of Justice, Article 38(1)). This definition is normally understood to comprise two elements: an objective one, i.e., the practice of States; and a subjective one, i.e., opinio juris, the acceptance of rules as custom. Many of the conceptual errors that afflict discussions of custom, with inevitable repercussions for theoretical arguments about international law, concern its subjective dimension. Two errors are common. The first one is to think of opinio juris as requiring state consent to a rule of customary international law. Acceptance and consent are, however, different concepts. The International Court of Justice regularly establishes the existence of rules of customary international law without specific evidence of consent from the states concerned (Talmon 2015). The second one is to describe the subjective element as necessarily involving a belief that a particular practice is already law.

There are at least two good descriptive reasons to be sceptical about both the belief- and the consent-based theories of customary international law. First, they cannot explain why newly independent states are bound by rules of custom in respect of which they never had an opportunity to give consent or time to form beliefs (Hart 1961 [2012: 226]). Secondly, neither the consent-based nor the belief-based account of customary international law can adequately explain change in customary rules. Under the consent-based theory, the replacement of a rule of custom with a contrary one would be explained as a consequence of states withdrawing their consent from, and acting in breach of, the prior rule. Under the belief-based approach, a change in custom would be explained by error or insincerity on the part of states, either acting on the erroneous belief that a particular rule was one of customary international law or lying about their belief.

These descriptive questions have a bearing on conceptual argument about the legal character of international law. If the main engines of rule-creation function only on the basis of consent, or depend on the belief and subjective mindset of those that those rules are meant to constrain, the legal character of international law would be, at best, severely diminished; or, at worst, lost entirely because international law would be robbed of the claim to legitimate authority inherent to law, a claim that its norms are binding simply as legal rather than as voluntarily or otherwise subjectively assumed.

These questions also have an impact on argument about the legitimacy international law, which is discussed below, because as observed by John Tasioulas, such accounts “tarnish[es] the legitimacy of customary international law” (Tasioulas 2014: 331; Tasioulas 2016), and undermine both the moral and systemic credentials of international law.

2.4 International Law as “Primitive Law”: H.L.A. Hart’s Critique

The most famous post-war critique of international law’s legal character is Chapter X of H.L.A. Hart’s The Concept of Law. Hart was not an outright sceptic about the legal character of international law, saying we should “neither dismiss the doubt we may feel… nor shall we simply confirm them” (Hart 1961 [2012: 214]). However, he did think international law was impaired in its law-like character by the fact that

the rules for states resemble that simple form of social structure, consisting only of primary rules of obligation, which, when we find it among societies of individuals, we are accustomed to contrast to a developed legal system. (Hart 1961 [2012: 214])

The resemblance is “in form though not at all in content” (Hart 1961 [2012: 232]), given the discrepancy between the content of obligations typically imposed by domestic legal systems and those imposed by international law.

The main problem with international law, according to Hart, is that it lacks secondary rules. This means it is not law in a modern developed sense, but in a simple or primitive one. In Hart’s well-known conception, a legal system is a union of two sets of rules: primary rules which impose obligations, and secondary rules which are rules about rules, relating to the way in which those primary rules are identified, changed and adjudicated upon.[2] Hart argues that international law possesses primary rules which are for the most part observed in practice. International law however lacks that distinctive secondary rule which Hart calls the the rule of recognition, that is a rule that does not depend for its existence on other rules and provides the ultimate foundation on which the legal system depends.

These defects, Hart says, make international law not law in the modern sense, but law only in a primitive or incomplete sense. Hart’s characterization of international law as primitive law is a poor fit with his own view of primitive law as law suitable for

a small community closely knit by ties of kinship, common sentiment, and belief, and placed in a stable environment. (Hart 1961 [2012: 92])

The context in which international law operates is quite different: the total number of States (fewer than 200) would fit the notion of small community, but the small community of States has none of the social ties that characterize the communities in which primitive law operates.

A typical retort among international lawyers to Hart’s critique is that these are just matters of definition. But this answer misses the distinction between terminological and conceptual disagreement. Hart’s conceptual critique of international law raises crucial questions about its legal character. As Hart himself understood, a failure to conceptualize the social phenomenon that we normally describe as international law does matter, for it hinders both “theoretical enquiries … [and] moral deliberation” (Hart 1961 [2012: 214]). We need to understand what it is that we are talking about if we want to advance moral and political arguments about international law.

More fundamentally, Hart’s conclusion that international law lacks a rule of recognition needs to be tested against the evolving realities since 1961 when The Concept of Law was first published. Hart was not particularly prescriptive about the form of the rule of recognition:

[i]t may, as in the early law of many societies, be no more than that an authoritative list or text of the rules is to be found in a written document or carved on some public monument. (Hart 1961 [2012: 94])

But Hart was dismissive of the possibility that consent or pacta sunt servanda could perform such a function: to say “international law is what states have consented to” or “international law obligations must be performed” cannot amount to a rule of recognition.

A promising candidate for the role of secondary rule is the Vienna Convention on the Law of Treaties, which is generally understood to reflect customary international law. As a treaty about treaties, the Convention has come to perform a systemic function by regulating the adoption, entry into force, amendment and interpretation of treaties. By providing rules for treaty-making, the Vienna Convention operates for treaties much like the Uniform Commercial Code in the US or the Code Civil in France do for contracts. It is, in other words, a set of primary and secondary rules that enables certain promises to have legal effect.

A basic norm to explain the legal character of the Vienna Convention may be Article 38 of the Statute of the International Court of Justice, a treaty to which all member states of the UN must also be a party. But Article 38 is a treaty provision which, on first inspection, does no more than identify the applicable law in disputes brought before the Court. Applicable law clauses are far from infrequent in treaties that provide for judicial settlement of disputes, and their existence supports the non-systemic and episodic nature of international law. So in what way can Article 38 be said to be to embody the rule of recognition? Unlike other applicable law clauses, Article 38 has come to perform a systemic function, and is regularly relied upon by domestic as well as international courts. It is foundational at least in an explanatory sense, i.e., as a rule about how “primary rules may be conclusively ascertained, introduced, eliminated, varied” (Hart 1961 [2012: 94]).

Lastly, in the search for a rule of recognition, some have pointed out that features like the inability of states freely to leave the UN, to take one example, have given a constitutional character to international law. This is not only an exaggeration, but also a distortion of international law—a conceptual over-correction of not treating international law as properly law. Features such as the non-denunciability of the UN Charter do however tell us something important about the nature of international law: they may evidence a distinctive constitutive force from which international law derives full legal character.

The above responses to Hart’s ambivalence about the legal status of international law has granted his premise that a full-fledged legal system requires a rule of recognition. Even on this basis, critics like Jeremy Waldron have rejected his “very poor” arguments for a qualified scepticism about the legal character of international law (Waldron 2014: 213). However, Hart’s leading critic, Ronald Dworkin, contested this premise itself. According to Dworkin, the determination of law is not ultimately grounded in a social rule—a rule of recognition—widely accepted by officials and others as the right standard for identifying law. Instead, legal requirements emerge through a process of “constructive interpretation” that requires the interpreter to discern the set of underlying moral-political principles that best fit and justify the relevant legal materials, e.g., in the case of international law, the raw data of treaties, state practice, opinio juris, international declarations, etc. (Dworkin 1986). Unlike Hart, Dworkin’s view of international law is part of his theoretical ambitions to establish that genuine law is morally binding on its subjects (see section 4 on Legitimacy).

3. States and Sovereignty

The criteria for determining the existence of statehood are well-established in customary international law (Crawford 1979 [2006: 38]). They are: a defined territory, a permanent population, an effective government, the capacity to enter into relations with other States, and independence. Each of these criteria is related to an equally fundamental aspect of international law and inter-state relations: sovereignty. The relationship between sovereignty and statehood is crucial in both legal philosophy and international legal practice. Although some consider sovereignty to be coextensive with independence, James Crawford’s seminal work on statehood maintains that whereas independence is a prerequisite for statehood, sovereignty “has another more satisfactory meaning as an incident or consequence of statehood” (Crawford 1979 [2006: 89]). This section will explore the various aspects of this “more satisfactory meaning.”

Sovereignty can be viewed as the ultimate authority that derives from, and attaches to, statehood. On the international plane, though international organizations exercise some functions normally associated with States, it is traditionally only States that have been described as sovereign. This may now be changing as some argue that the European Union, for example, possesses a kind of sovereignty, with its member States now being sovereign in a different, “late” or post-national, sense (MacCormick 1993 [2006: 4, 16]; Walker 2003, 9). On the domestic plane, the position is more complicated given that a larger number of subjects—from monarchs to parliaments, from individuals to peoples—have, at various points and in different ways, been considered sovereign (Verdirame 2016).

3.1 Absolute Sovereignty

Identifying the matters over which sovereign states have, or should have, ultimate authority is a difficult task in both an explanatory and normative sense. An enduring view is that the sovereignty of the State is absolute; a sovereign state is the final arbiter in all domestic matters, with limitations to such absolute sovereignty permissible only where the state has consented to them. Under this view, the subject matter of state sovereignty covers all legal and political matters that relate to a state’s territory and people. Hobbes is the early modern thinker most commonly associated with this all-encompassing conception of sovereignty. This interpretation of the few brief passages on international relations in the Leviathan is questioned by some scholars (Malcolm 2002), but it remains the foundation for theories of absolute sovereignty in international political thought.

The problem with theories about absolute sovereignty is that they can only, at best, support a narrow consent-based idea of international law which, as the discussion of the sources of international law in the earlier section has shown, does not reflect the reality of how rules of international law are created, interpreted and applied. Some classical international law thinkers writing in the natural law tradition, like Alberico Gentili (Wagner 2017), argued that it was possible to reconcile absolute sovereignty with a fuller idea of international law by postulating that only voluntary (i.e., positive), but not involuntary (i.e., natural law), rules imposed by international law on states impinge on the concept of absolute sovereignty. In other words, one can be absolutely sovereign and still subject to natural law.

With the exception of this particular natural law tradition, proponents of the absolute conception of sovereignty have generally been viewed as “deniers of the “Law of Nations”” (Hinsley 1986: 184). The criticism is that there can be no international law unless it is accepted that, on some matters at least, states must be irrevocably subject to an authority other than their own; the possibility of subjection to an external authority must be viewed as a necessary requirement for even minimal international law.

The absolute conception of sovereignty also cannot be reconciled with the UN Charter, which recognizes the principle of “sovereign equality” in Article 2—the same provision where other cornerstones for the post-war order, such as the peaceful settlement of disputes and the prohibition on the use of force, are laid. As a matter of positive international law in force today, states are not fully sovereign—i.e., they are not the final arbiters—on matters pertaining to the use of force. In particular, they are not free to develop a set of rules governing the use of force that contravenes the prohibition in the UN Charter, nor do they have any legal means of escaping such rules by withdrawing their consent. The same can be said of other fundamental principles and rules, such as self-determination and human rights.

Yet international law still describes states as sovereign. The principle of sovereignty equality constructs a world order where states are endowed with ultimate authority over some matters, yet inescapably subject to the authority of international law in others. (For a defence of the idea of sovereignty as a vital mechanism for ensuring the authority of international law in an ineradicably pluralistic world in which states disagree on what constitutes a just and legitimate internal public order, see Roth 2011).

That said, it is important not to confuse sovereignty in this sense of ultimate authority with the idea of economic or political power. For example, to say that the States that emerged from the collapse of the European empires after World War II acquired sovereignty on an equal basis as their former colonies is to say that they were endowed with the ultimate authority to decide matters—such as the regulation of social and economic activities in their territory—which had hitherto been the domain of the colonial powers. Whether these newly independent States also acquired the socio-economic or political clout to take on, for example, big multinational corporations operating in their territory, or whether they became more powerful politically than the former colonial powers, is another matter. To use a different example, by leaving the European Union, the United Kingdom regained sovereignty over matters which (unlike colonies of course) it had freely agreed to transfer to the European Union during the time of its membership, but whether this increase in sovereignty means an increase in power or influence is a different matter. Authority can be bestowed upon those that have no power, and power can be wielded by those with no authority.

3.2 Self-Determination

There is another fundamental concept that must be factored in to explain the role of sovereignty in modern international law: self-determination. Self-determination is prominently mentioned in Article 1(2) of the UN Charter as one of the purposes of the UN. Under international law, self-determination is a right of all peoples, defined in identical terms in the Charter and the UN International Covenants on Civil and Political Rights (1966) and Economic, Social, and Cultural Rights (1966), as the right to “freely determine their political status and freely pursue their economic, social and cultural development.”

Self-determination is considered to have both an external and internal dimension (Crawford 1979; Alston 2017). The external dimension, namely the right of a people to be free from colonial subjugation or foreign occupation and control, was historically most transformative at the time of decolonization (Crawford 1979). The internal dimension concerns the rights of people to pursue democratic governance domestically (Franck 1992) and has become increasingly relevant in discussions about the role of international law in promoting democracy.

Self-determination complicates the meaning of sovereignty in international law. It is conceptually cognate to moral and political ideas of popular sovereignty and self-government, which are, in turn, related to the values of self-respect and autonomy. By embracing this notion, international law gave recognition to the moral and political value of self-government, accepting that people prefer to be ruled by their own bad rulers rather than foreigners, including those foreigners with some claim to greater competence.

Self-determination adds a new dimension to argument about sovereignty in international law also because it is no longer only states that advance a claim to ultimate authority—in some sense, and to some degree, people can too. This means that international law is no longer immune from tensions between the state and the people that have featured prominently in many political struggles. In cases of secession (Crawford 1979; Buchanan 2008) in particular, the claim of the extant state to ultimate authority can be challenged by a population now empowered to articulate a competing claim under the banner of an internationally recognized legal principle (the legal merits of such competing claims will, of course, vary).

If sovereignty is thought of as a quality that both states and peoples possess, the analogy between sovereignty and human autonomy, advanced by Timothy Endicott, makes more sense. Moreover, understood as both complete power within a political community and complete independence needed for the purposes of a good state, sovereignty is compatible with the legitimate authority of international law and ameliorates the worry about abuses (Endicott 2010). Such power and freedom must be subject to law but, just as with individual autonomy, it is wrong to think that these qualities must be forgone as a price for such subjection.

3.4 International Organizations and Sovereignty

The phenomenon of international organization adds further conceptual, moral and political challenges to the idea of sovereignty. The key question is one that Rousseau first posed in the Emile:

How far should the rights of an international federation be stretched without destroying the rights of national sovereignty? (1762 [1979: 466])

The context is different in the sense that, instead of the single international federation envisaged by Rousseau, international law has developed through a multitude of universal and regional international organizations.

But questions about the boundaries between the domestic and the international legal sphere, and their respective institutions, are even more important nowadays as international organizations exercise functions that once were within the exclusive domain of states. These questions lie at the heart of the most recent debates about international law, populism (Müller 2016; Alston 2017) and the rise of authoritarian international law (Ginsburg 2020). Some question the dualism or pluralism on which these arguments are premised, and prefer to think of domestic and international law as forming part of the same legal order. Kelsen was the most famous proponent of these “monist” conceptions (Bernstorff 2010; for another attempt to show the compatibility of state sovereignty with the authority of international law with the notion of changing sovereignty regimes and constitutional pluralism, see Jean Cohen 2010).

An important set of normative questions concerns the relationship between international organizations and political and individual liberty. Some argue that while the transfer of sovereign functions to international organizations can be justified for a number of moral and political reasons, it cannot extend to the point where it jeopardizes human rights or hollows out self-government—these limits are necessary to preserve the liberal character of the international order (Verdirame 2013).

Many contemporary writers focus on the European Union, which has been described as “supranational”, rather than international, in light of the direct primacy that EU law enjoys within domestic legal spheres (Neyer & Wiener 2011a; van Middelaar 2013). Whether supranationalism is a way of ascribing sovereignty to the European Union or a way of reconceiving the legal order in a post-sovereignist and cosmopolitan sense is an open debate (Eriksen 2011). For others, the process of European integration poses a challenge to the modern liberal constitutional sense of sovereignty as understood to include the “overall competency and responsibility for the common welfare of the people united into a polity….”, and the shift of the regulatory power over the economy away from the State risks paving the way for “a fragmentation of the care for the common good” (Böckenförde 1997).

These normative concerns become more acute in the case of a fully fledged world government. Kant, in Perpetual Peace, reached a famously sobering conclusion on the prospect of international organizations developing into such a world government:

The idea of the right of nations presupposes the separation of many neighbouring states independent of one another; and though such a condition is of itself a condition of war (unless a federative union of them prevents the outbreak of hostilities), this is nevertheless better, in accordance with the idea of reason, than the fusion of them by one power overgrowing the rest and passing into a universal monarchy, since as the range of government expands laws progressively lose their vigour, and a soulless despotism, after it has destroyed the seed of good, finally deteriorates into anarchy. (Kant 1795 [1996: 336])

One of the leading contemporary political and legal philosophers, Joseph Raz, shares Kant’s scepticism about world government, but argues that there may be a better alternative to world government than a world of sovereign states. That alternative is one of relatively sovereign states, which are however subject to binding regulations issued by international organizations (Raz 2019).

The balancing act between cosmopolitan international law (i.e., law that binds all states) and domestic sovereignty is famously explored in John Rawls’ Law of Peoples (Rawls 1999; see also Wenar 2008 [2021]). Rawls himself does not use the concept “sovereignty”, or “state”, in relation to the societies that are members of his “Society of Peoples”, but that is because he associates “sovereignty” with an absolutist conception, and regards “states” as claiming such sovereignty. In contrast, his theory upholds a more restricted notion of sovereignty for “well-ordered peoples”. Such peoples enjoy both legitimacy with respect to their own citizens and full international standing in the Society of Peoples, which includes immunity from intervention.

4. Legitimacy

4.1 Senses of Legitimacy

There are multiple ways of assessing the various dimensions of international law, such as its individual norms or bodies of norms (e.g., international human rights law, humanitarian law etc.) and its associated institutions and enforcement mechanisms (e.g., the International Court of Justice, Security Council resolutions, etc). Some of these assessments relate to how international law and institutions bear on a given state’s interests or policy preferences; others are in terms of efficiency or impact on economic growth; some are more overtly moral forms of assessment, invoking demands of peace, the rule of law, justice, environmental protection, and so on. Of course, a key debate in international relations concerns the extent to which moral values find a foothold in an international domain that is “anarchic” in the sense of lacking a sovereign political authority or reliable enforcement mechanisms.

One prominent moral-political rubric for assessing international law is the contested idea of “legitimacy”. Sometimes “legitimacy” is used as a catch-all term encompassing any kind of assessment of law, but this usage is too broad. A starting-point in achieving greater specificity is the distinction between de facto (or descriptive) and de jure (or normative) interpretations of legitimacy. Sometimes talk of the “legitimacy” of international law is a matter of describing the degree to which it is accepted, or complied with, by its putative subjects, primarily states. On this de facto interpretation, an international legal norm will enjoy legitimacy to the extent that it exerts a high level of “compliance pull” among international actors. A substantive study of de facto legitimacy investigates the features that tend to enhance support for, and compliance with, international law (Franck 1995).

By contrast, de jure senses of “legitimacy” refer to the capacity of international law to generate reasons for action of various kinds. These might be reasons, whether prudential or moral, to establish international laws and institutions, to preserve and develop them once they exist, or not to interfere with their operations (Buchanan 2013). But de jure legitimacy is often taken to mean something more ambitious: the existence of a “right to rule”. On this view, some domain or institution of international law enjoys de jure legitimacy to the extent that its putative subjects have a pro tanto or defeasible moral obligation to comply with its directives, one that is content-independent, i.e., not dependent for its binding force on the specific content of any particular law (Raz 2006; Green 2004 [2012]). This sense of de jure legitimacy, as the right to rule, corresponds to the kind legitimate authority that states are often interpreted as asserting in relation to their members.

Just as it is controversial whether international law is truly law, some have also raised doubts as to whether international law should be assessed in terms of the “right to rule” asserted by states. A lot of international law takes the form of treaties that bind only states that are parties to them. It might seem that the idea of a promise or contract, rather than that of legitimate rule, is the right template for assessing the normative force of such treaties. Moreover, the other main source of international law, customary international law, being the product of the convergent practice and attitudes of disparate state actors, does not assert a right to rule in the way that a unitary ruler, whether an individual or group, such as a legislative body, does. Yet others have claimed that, insofar as we can impute a claim to rule to international law, it is not as strong as that made by states, but amounts instead to a claim of the existence of a moral reason for maintaining and conforming to international law, not in a content-independent moral obligation (Buchanan 2013).

But assuming that a right to rule is an assertion plausibly imputable to international law and institutions, how can we determine whether it is ever justified? The question is rendered all the more acute by the fact that in recent decades international law has increasingly asserted a more expansive right to rule, one that encroaches into areas previously regarded as belonging to the domain of state authority, including such matters as the basic rights of its own citizens, economic and environmental policy, and the provision of vital goods such as education and health care.

4.2 Consent Theory

One prominent approach traces the legitimacy of international law to the actual consent (explicit or implicit) of its subjects. States are bound by treaties insofar as they consent to them; meanwhile, states are bound by customary international law insofar as they have explicitly (opinio juris) consented to its norms in the process of their formation, or else implicitly done so (e.g., by failing persistently to object to them). One problem with the consent theory is that international law includes norms that purport to bind states independently of whether they consented to them, such as norms that came into being before the state came into existence, or norms that have achieved the status of jus cogens norms (Dworkin 2013). In response, the steadfast defender of the consent view might reply, “So much the worse for the legitimacy of these norms”.

Even if we were to accept this hard-line response, a deeper challenge remains: why, if international law can help us achieve vital goals—such as the avoidance of war, prevention of human rights abuses or the mitigation of climate change—on condition that all states generally comply with it, should its authority over them be subject to their consent? The question is all the more pointed once it is recognized that the governments of many states do not themselves enjoy the consent of their own subjects or even perpetrate grave injustices against them. Considerations such as these have led many to conclude that, contrary to received views, actual consent is not in general a necessary condition for international law’s legitimacy but is, at best, an idea that plays an important but limited role in explaining the bindingness of treaties. Nor, it has been argued, is actual consent generally a sufficient condition for legitimacy, since state consent to treaties that require the commission of human rights abuses would not be even presumptively binding (Buchanan 2010; Tasioulas 2010; Murphy 2017).

One familiar move is to resort to a hypothetical version of consent theory, appealing not to the actual consent of states, but to international standards that states have good reason to accept. Such a view is propounded by Rawls in The Law of Peoples, which envisions legitimate international law as grounded in principles (“the Law of Peoples”) that would be endorsed in social contracts at two levels: first, among liberal peoples as regulating foreign relations among themselves; second, among liberal peoples together with a sub-category of non-liberal peoples—decent hierarchical peoples. Rawls’ account, however, is problematic in a number of ways. First, it presupposes that decent hierarchical principles enjoy legitimacy with respect to their own populations despite not adhering to basic liberal rights, such as freedom of speech and non-discrimination on the grounds of sex or religion. Second, and relatedly, the doctrine of human rights embodied in the Law of Peoples is very minimalist, excluding not only the aforementioned rights, but also socio-economic rights such as the rights to health, work, and an adequate standard of living. Finally, despite its minimalism, Rawls’ Law of Peoples is ultimately grounded in the perspective of liberal societies—the only members of the Society of Peoples that are “fully reasonable”. But given that “reasonableness” is defined by stipulation as stemming from ideas implicit in liberal democratic culture, rather than by reference to an objectively true criterion, the whole approach is vulnerable to accusations of parochialism. (For another attempt to mobilize Rawlsian approach to international legal legitimacy, with a focus on the great pluralism that characterizes the international order, see Roth 2011: ch.2–4).

4.3 The Service Conception

Difficulties with consent-based, or voluntarist, theories have led to the exploration of alternative bases for the legitimacy of international law, especially in relation to those obligations not traceable to a treaty. The two following approaches are not only non-voluntarist, but they also make reference to objective standards of reason. One approach is inspired by Joseph Raz’s influential “service conception of authority”, which advances a Normal Justification Condition (NJC) on legitimate authority. According to the NJC:

A has legitimate authority over B if the latter would better conform with reasons that apply to him if he intends to be guided by A’s directives than if he does not. (Raz 2006: 1014; Tasioulas 2010, 2013)

The NJC purports to specify a generally applicable sufficient condition of legitimate authority. An important feature of it is that it does not present the legitimacy of international law in an all-or-nothing manner, and this is so in two ways (Tasioulas 2010). First, it may be that some areas of international law (e.g., the law on the use of force) enjoy legitimacy, whereas others (e.g., international trade law) do not. Second, it may be that some states are bound by a given area of international law, such as human rights law, whereas others are not. This is because the former, but not the latter, would better comply with reasons that apply to them by being bound by that international legal regime, whereas others would not. This second possibility enables the Razian theory to accommodate the possibility of a justified exceptionalism in relation to the legitimate authority of international law. This is one potential template for defending familiar claims that the United States, for example, is not bound by norms on the use of force that properly bind other states because it should be free to use its immense capabilities to further the cause of justice around the globe in ways that other states cannot. But a similar argument for exceptionalism might be pressed in the case of weaker or poorer states in relation to international obligations—for example, pertaining to free trade or environmental protection—that are unduly burdensome for them.

Leaving aside the possibility of exceptionalism, the Razian theory faces the challenge of how to integrate a proper respect for state sovereignty. To what extent, for example, does a due regard for sovereignty entail that there are certain matters that fall within the jurisdiction of states and regarding which international law cannot invalidate or override their decisions? The question is broadly analogous to that which arises in the domestic context: to what extent is the authority of the state limited by a due respect for the autonomy of its citizens, such that the state should not seek to impose obligations with respect to certain matters, e.g., selection of occupation or spouse, even if its directives would lead to greater compliance by citizens with reasons applicable to them? Of course, the state is an institution, one lacking the basic moral status of individual human beings, but the question arises because of the value of collective identity and self-determination that is protected by sovereignty. In this connection, Raz has controversially proposed a mutually exclusive relationship between state sovereignty and a sound international human rights law (Raz 2010). Over and above state sovereignty as a constraint on the legitimacy of international law, there is a more general question of how such authority is constrained by a proper principle of subsidiarity that favours the resolution of political questions at the most local level possible (Føllesdal 1998; Finnis 2016). Finally, a special challenge arises regarding international law’s claim to legitimate authority in the absence of its creation through democratic means, especially in relation to states that are themselves democracies (see section 4.5).

Questions arise, however, about the extent to which any domain of international law can achieve legitimacy in these terms, especially given the absence of reliable enforcement mechanisms at the global level. This is because, on the NJC, one way in which legitimacy can be acquired is through the capacity of legal institutions effectively to impose solutions to various societal problems—such as co-ordination problems regarding environmental protection—through its capacity to enforce the standards it lays down. This reveals the familiar substantive dependence of de jure legitimacy on de facto legitimacy: the fact that the subjects of law are likely to comply with it enhances its legitimacy. Some have questioned whether international law can claim any legitimacy given the absence of reliable enforcement mechanisms (Posner 2009). This is a problem that is especially acute in the area of international human rights law, since the usual expedient of a tit-for-tat response to another state’s defection from the law seems out of place here. It will hardly be an incentive for state X to comply with international human rights law if state Y threatens non-compliance in relation to its own citizens.

But even in the case of international human rights law, various responses have been offered. One line of response calls into question the need for the “enforcement” of international law to be global in character. The seminal work of Beth Simmons on the effectiveness of human rights treaties has shown that, insofar as membership of such treaty regimes tends to enhance human rights compliance, the mechanisms through which this is achieved are primarily those of domestic politics rather than a “white knight” foreign state or international agents (Simmons 2009). More generally, as we saw above (§2.1), states in general tend to conform with their international legal obligations (Henkin 1979: 47). Another line of response appeals not to the effectiveness of international law, but its supposed epistemic superiority, deriving from its pooling of cross-cultural knowledge in identifying solutions to common problems, such as the content of human rights (Buchanan 2008). However, it is doubtful that a bare claim to epistemic superiority can justify a claim to practical, as opposed to theoretical, authority, i.e., a claim about what we have reason to do, as opposed to what we have reason to believe (Tasioulas 2013).

4.4 The Principle of Salience

An alternative way of dealing with the legitimacy of international law, given the absence of reliable enforcement mechanisms, is offered by Ronald Dworkin (2013). For Dworkin, legitimacy concerns not only a moral obligation of obedience, but one that is reliably enforceable through the courts. Given the absence of any international court with compulsory jurisdiction and reliable enforcement mechanisms, it could be argued that on this interpretation of legitimacy the question of international law’s legitimacy simply does not arise. As we noted previously (2.1), Dworkin avoids this sceptical conclusion by proceeding on the “fantasy” that such a court exists, that cases can be readily brought before it, and that there are effective sanctions to enforce its rulings. Dworkin claims we can discern the binding requirements of international law by asking:

What tests or arguments should that hypothetical court adopt to determine the rights and obligations of states (and other international actors and organizations) that it would be appropriate for it to enforce coercively? (Dworkin 2013: 14)

Two more general obligations are then appealed to by Dworkin in answering this question.

The first is a general obligation incumbent upon all states to undertake steps that enhance their own political legitimacy, as well as of the international legal order in which states operate. Such steps include

  1. upholding human rights at home and abroad;
  2. guaranteeing the assistance of the international community against invasion and other external threats to a state’s independence;
  3. encouraging international cooperation; and
  4. enabling people to have some role in their own government (Dworkin 2013: 18).

But this obligation of mitigation suffers from considerable indeterminacy, given the existence of reasonable disagreement about the best way to improve the legitimacy of the existing international legal order. As a remedy, Dworkin invokes a second basic obligation on states, the principle of salience:

If a significant number of states, encompassing a significant population, has developed an agreed code of practice, either by treaty or by other form of coordination, then other states have at least a prima facie duty to subscribe to that practice as well, with the important proviso that this duty holds only if a more general practice to that effect, expanded in that way, would improve the legitimacy of the subscribing state and the international order as a whole. (Dworkin 2013: 19)

The result is that a state will be “prima facie” bound to comply with an emerging consensus, of the kind described, if doing so will enhance its legitimacy, and it will enhance its legitimacy if compliance would help ameliorate some of the four problems of the state system identified above. Applying this principle, Dworkin believes that the basic elements of the UN system, including the UN Charter, the Geneva Conventions, the conventions on genocide, and the Rome Statute of the International Criminal Court, have acquired salience of this kind, such that all states now have an obligation to obey them as law, irrespective of whether they have consented to them (Dworkin 2013: 20).

Dworkin’s resort to fantasy, however, raises questions. Critics of a Razian persuasion will claim that an appeal to a fantasy court is necessitated only by Dworkin’s adoption of an unduly restrictive conception of legitimacy centred on the judicial enforcement of law. But the essence of legitimate authority is the existence of a content-independent obligation of obedience, not the subsidiary question of whether it is properly enforceable, let alone enforceable through the courts. Another difficulty is that it seems problematic to derive obligations to obey international law here and now on the basis of a fantasy scenario that bears little relation to any existing, or reasonably foreseeable, reality. For example, why should the fact that there is plausibly an obligation to obey the International Criminal Court in a hypothetical world in which it operates impartially and effectively tell us anything much about states’ obligations in the current world in which its impartiality and effectiveness are matters of heated controversy? At a more methodological level, many will baulk at Dworkin’s tendency to run together the question of the existence of international law with that of its legitimacy, since they would reject his thesis that law is of its nature presumptively legitimate (Tasioulas 2021). For some other treatments of the legitimacy of international law, see Besson, Christiano, and Pettit in Besson and Tasioulas (2010); also regarding particular institutions, such as courts Føllesdal 1998)).

4.5 Democracy

Some believe there is an intimate link between democracy and political legitimacy, at least in the domestic context. They regard the democratic enactment of law, or at least the subjection of any source of law to democratic control, as a necessary condition of its legitimacy, if not also a sufficient one. But even many of those who do not treat democracy as a universally necessary or sufficient condition for legitimacy—such as advocates of the service conception or the salience principle—accept that democratic law-making processes augment the legitimacy of the laws they produce. Of course, the proper characterization of democracy is itself a contested matter—ranging from simple majoritarianism, on the one hand, to sophisticated deliberative conceptions of democracy, on the other. For present purposes, however, we can take democracy to involve the idea of participatory self-government, in which those subject to laws participate as free and equals in deliberation and decision-making leading to the enactment of laws.

Various difficult questions arise as to the relationship between international law and democracy, such as whether non-democratic states should have full sovereign status or whether international law should encourage the spread of democracy around the globe, perhaps by recognizing and upholding a human right to democracy (Franck 1992 and 1995: ch.4; Dworkin 2013). However, two other questions are particularly salient under the rubric of legitimacy: (1) should the process of international law-making be democratic?, and (2) can international legal norms enjoy legitimacy in the case of democratic states that have not consented to be bound by them?

Regarding the first question, it is obvious that existing systems for the generation of international law (e.g., custom and treaties) are not meaningfully “democratic”. International law is created by states, many of which are not themselves democratic, and the process by which they create such law cannot itself be described as democratic. However, many writers have advocated introducing democratic features into international law-making. One example is Ronald Dworkin, who canvassed the idea of establishing a world legislative body through a Global Legislative Convention. The body would operate by means of a four-majorities system. Proposed laws would need to receive votes representing states with a majority of the UN General Assembly’s members’ total populations, a majority of votes in the General Assembly, a majority of votes in the Security Council, and a majority of votes among the Council’s permanent members (Dworkin 2013: 28). One potential concern about this proposal is that it operates via majorities among states (weighted to some extent by their populations), rather than among all individual persons throughout the globe. This worry may be mitigated somewhat if we suppose that the states participating in this process must themselves be sufficiently representative of their populations.

Others, however, defend more ambitious schemes that involve the direct representation of the global population. For example, Thomas Franck proposed towards the transformation of the UN General Assembly into a bicameral forum, with one chamber for states and another being directly elected (Franck 1995: Part V; for other such proposals of global democratic institutions, including a global direct “virtual” democratic assembly, see Held 1995; Falk & Strauss 2000). Democratic reforms of this sort attract scepticism not only on the basis that states are unlikely to cede power to a global democratic populace, but also because genuine democracy requires forms of entitlement, deliberation and solidarity (e.g., equal rights of participation, a robust civil society (e.g., mass political parties to mediate between individuals and officials, concern for a common good, etc) that cannot be realistically replicated at the global level). In this sceptical vein, Thomas Christiano has written that global democracy

is highly unlikely to succeed given the weakness of global civil society and it is highly unlikely to be legitimate given the unevenness of stakes and given the high chance of permanent minorities. (Christiano 2010: 137)

He prefers, instead, the idea of a fair association of democratic states operating on the basis of a constrained principle of consent. (For a discussion of international legitimacy from a neo-republican perspective that incorporates democratic elements, see Pettit 2010).

The second question, identified above, is whether democratic states, in particular, have an obligation to obey international legal norms they have not consented to or incorporated into their domestic law through democratic procedures. Recent international law, especially through expansive conceptions of customary international law and jus cogens, has significantly increased the number of norms which bind states, even in the absence of their consent. This has created a backlash, especially among “neo-conservative” commentators who deny that any such laws can bind a constitutional democracy, at least in the absence of its consent expressed by means of internal democratic processes (Rabkin 2005; Kyl, Feith, & Fonte 2013). But this sort of concern extends beyond neo-conservative defenders of American exceptionalism; for example, Martha Nussbaum, a leading liberal political philosopher, has argued that domestic democratic endorsement is a condition of international law’s legitimacy (Nussbaum 2018 [Other Internet Resources]).

Given that existing international law-making processes are not even weakly democratic, and that there is no realistic prospect that they will become so anytime in the foreseeable future, why should they be regarded as binding on democratic states in the absence of their consent or democratic incorporation into their own legal systems? The problem of integrating international and democratic governance is one of the most serious challenges facing us today, and it is echoed in similar challenges confronting regional governmental blocs, such as the European Union, that assert authority over their constituent democratic member states.

One line of response begins by arguing that democracy is not the ultimate touchstone of legitimacy, whether of international or domestic law, and that, for example, consent theory, the service conception of legitimate authority, or the principle of salience can justify the international legal order’s legitimacy even in relation to democratic states. This line of thought leaves unaddressed specific worries regarding how intrusive international law can be with respect to the decision-making of democratic states without compromising or forfeiting its claim to legitimacy or causing undue damage to domestic democratic governance. For a sophisticated attempt to articulate ways of arriving at an acceptable balance between the goods of international law and constitutional democracy, see Buchanan and Powell 2008. A notable element of their account is the defence of “principle M”, i.e.,

where the acceptance of international law by a constitutional democracy can be reasonably expected to result in constitutional changes—significant alterations in constitutional structures or significant diminutions in political self-determination—then, as with other constitutional changes (such as consensual secession, accession to a federation, or devolution from a centralized state), there is a strong presumption that public constitutional deliberation and popular choice are required. (Buchanan & Powell 2008: 347)

5. International Rule of Law

5.1 The Rule of Law—Thick and Thin

One of the key determinants of the legitimacy of a legal order is the extent of its compliance with the widely acclaimed, but deeply contested, value commonly designated as “the rule of law”. An initial problem is that the phrase “the rule of law” is used to mean many different things. It is important to avoid confusing the rule of law with the idea of rule by law. The latter refers to the idea of governance through the means, and under the constraint of, positive law. But the fact that a mode of governance assumes a recognizably legal form does not necessarily reveal anything about its value. When the expression “rule of law” is used to mean rule by law, there is no meaningful difference between, for example, a call to respect the rule of law in international relations and a simple call to respect international law.

If, however, we think of the rule of law as an evaluative notion, different and important issues arise. One of them is whether the rule of law properly extends to the evaluation of international law and, if so, under which interpretation and with what concrete implications. This debate partly reflects background disagreements about the rule of law more generally. Another downstream question is to what extent, and in what form, the ethical-political ideal of the rule of law, has been, or should be, specified as a set of legal requirements within international law itself, analogously to the manner in which international human rights law crystallizes a background morality of human rights (Arajavi 2021). In this section, the focus will be on the prior, more foundational issue.

Legal philosophers disagree about the proper characterization of the rule of law, their differing views occupying varying points along a spectrum from “thin”, or formal-procedural, to increasingly “thick”, or substantive, accounts (Waldron 2016; Tasioulas 2020a). “Thick” accounts of the rule of law identify it with something approaching all the requirements, formal-procedural and substantive, good law should satisfy; or all the requirements that make for legitimate law (Beyleveld & Brownsword 2007); or all the demands of political justice (rights) that bear on law (Dworkin 2011); or else some favoured comprehensive catalogue of legally-relevant desiderata, such as compliance with democracy and human rights (Bingham 2010; Annan 2004). The thicker one’s favoured account of the rule of law, the more demanding a standard it sets for the international legal order. This has led some advocates of thick accounts to conclude that the rule of law does not apply to international law, since it imposes demands that cannot feasibly be made of international, rather than domestic, law.

One such advocate of a thick account is James Crawford, a former Judge on the International Court of Justice. Crawford identifies five requirements imposed by the rule of law:

first, that no one is outside the law, still less above it; second, that it is by some means or in some sense democratic, at least in the sense of being accountable to others; third, that its instituted authorities—notably the Security Council—are in principle subject to legal constraint; fourth, that there is something like a constitution of international society; and fifth, that society is not irremediably unjust. (Crawford 2014: 343)

As Crawford shows, existing international law in general struggles to meet each of these desiderata; at best, perhaps only certain “enclaves” of international law do so (Crawford 2014: 367).

One might conclude from his analysis that full compliance with the rule of law is an unrealistic demand to place on the international legal order, ignoring, as it does, salient disanalogies between the domestic and international spheres, such as the absence of a centralized legislative authority, courts with compulsory jurisdiction, and effective enforcement mechanisms, as well as forms of international solidarity needed to make democratic governance feasible. Crawford himself draws the conclusion that there can only be a rule of law in international law in the thin, formal, sense (Crawford 2014: 375), not the full, substantive, sense incorporating all five of his requirements. (For more optimistic proponents of “thick” conceptions of the international rule of law, one that incorporates respect for human rights, see McCorquodale 2016 and Pavel 2021).

Others, who are proponents of the thin view of the rule of law, will respond to Crawford’s conclusion by saying that the “thin” view of the rule of law is the correct one in general. For these philosophers, “thick” accounts of the rule of law err in lumping together a series of requirements on law that either have no underlying coherence or which simply replicate other standards for its evaluation, thereby obscuring the distinctive form of assessment imported by a thinner account of the rule of law as one moral-political demand upon law among others (Tasioulas 2020a).

5.2 Thin Theories of the International Rule of Law

International law may fare better on “thin” accounts of the rule of law, as these are limited to a familiar set of formal-procedural desiderata that are not intended to be exhaustive of the desiderata applicable to the assessment of law (Franck 1995; Chesterman 2008). These desiderata include the following: that legal norms be expressed in general, prospective, and clear terms, that they are relatively stable over time and do not issue in conflicting demands or demands that cannot be feasibly complied with, that officials (judges, bureaucrats, police etc) charged with applying them do so consistently and in accordance with their meaning, and so on (Raz 1979: 214–8; Fuller, 1964: 33–41). These formal-procedural requirements are usually thought to require certain institutional arrangements for their effective realization, such as an independent judiciary and access to professional legal advice.

While proponents of the thin theory admit that compliance with the rule of law, so understood, is compatible with extreme injustice, it nonetheless has inherent value, an important way of respecting those subject to laws as rational agents who are given the opportunity to take legal norms into account in their practical deliberation prior to reaching a decision (Fuller 1964: 162; Raz 1979: 221; Finnis 2011: 273). In this way, it acts as a significant, but not comprehensive, limitation on certain forms of arbitrary official power. Moreover, some requirements of the rule of law, such as the prohibition of retrospective punishment, seem to capture basic demands of justice. Finally, the rule of law has various kinds of instrumental value, such as helping achieve social goods including economic efficiency (by fostering a predictable environment for economic decision-making) and democratic governance (by ensuring, for example, that laws enacted democratically are effectively applied according to their terms).

But even on a thin interpretation of the rule of law, there are problems about its applicability to international law. Jeremy Waldron has highlighted two major disanalogies between domestic and international law that bear on the applicability of the rule of law ideal in the case of the latter (Waldron 2011). The first is that, unlike ordinary citizens in domestic legal systems who are contrasted with officials, states in the international legal order are both the subjects of international law and its officials (its creators, e.g., via treaty-making and processes of customary international law, and its enforcers, e.g., via countermeasures). The second disanalogy is that, unlike individual human beings, states do not have inherent moral value; in particular, their freedom seems to be valuable only insofar as it serves the interests of individual human beings. One practical upshot of both of these disanalogies is that we cannot readily proceed on the assumption, which is justified in the domestic case in relation to the conduct of individuals, that state conduct should be free of official interference unless clearly circumscribed by law. One response to Waldron’s first disanalogy is to say that it is a matter of degree; even in a domestic legal order, compliance with the rule of law will depend upon the attitudes and habits of ordinary citizens in sustaining a rule of law respecting culture. Meanwhile, one response to the second disanalogy is to argue that although state autonomy is not inherently valuable, it acquires value derivatively, as a means of protecting the autonomy of individuals and groups within states (Pavel 2021: 346).

Finally, some argue that the enormous power disparities among states, combined with the absence of centralized and effective enforcement mechanisms, pose a systemic obstacle to the realization of the rule of law (Posner 2009). It is an open question to what extent the proliferation of discrete international legal regimes, e.g., relating to trade, human rights, with associated adjudicatory mechanisms, e.g., World Trade Organization, regional human rights courts such as the European Court of Human Rights or the Inter-American Court of Human Rights, begin to address this problem.

Even if we admit that the rule of law applies to international law, there is a further question regarding the extent to which international law, in its current manifestation, complies with it (Lefkowitz 2020: 90–97). This is an immense topic, so it can only be dealt with very cursorily here by reference to three problem areas pertaining to sources of law (custom), United Nations institutions (the UN Security Council), and one domain of law in which rule of law considerations have occasioned much controversy (international criminal law).

5.3 Custom

Many critics allege that customary international law, with its reliance on vaguely-specified levels and combinations of state practice and opinio juris, renders the existence and content of international legal norms highly indeterminate, thereby violating the rule of law demand for notice and clarity (Goldsmith & Posner 2005). Moreover, the process of reforming customary international law over time, which may involve states contravening existing customary norms in order to give rise to new norms, violates the rule of law requirement of congruence between law and official behaviour. Such criticisms have spurred efforts to construct accounts of the formation of customary international law that secure greater determinacy and that dispense with the need for violating existing custom in order to make new custom. But an alternative view is that greater fidelity to the rule of law requires that treaty law regimes should increasingly displace customary law (For contrasting views, see Bradley (ed.) 2016).

5.4 UN Security Council Resolutions

The United Nations General Assembly’s Declaration on the Rule of Law at the National and International Levels stipulates that

the rule of law applies to all States equally, and to international organizations, including the United Nations and its principal organs. (UN GA Res 67/1, 24 September 2012, para 2)

But there are notorious difficulties about the extent to which the UN Security Council, in particular, has complied with the international rule of law during the post-Cold War period when it has made resolutions “to maintain or restore international peace and security” under Chapter VII of the UN Charter (see Crawford 2014: Ch.XIII). The worry is that exercises of this power—e.g., to impose embargoes, authorize peace-keeping operations or military intervention, set up new rules on topics such as terrorism, establish criminal tribunals etc—is insufficiently regulated by law. Even if an argument can be made that the Security Council is bound not only by the UN Charter, but also by international law generally, a serious question remains as to the means of securing its compliance with such law. Is it enough that the legal validity of its resolutions is in principle justiciable if the issue properly arises in litigation before a court or tribunal? (ICJ 1971: p. 45, para. 88) Or should the ICJ be given the general power to review UNSC resolutions as leading scholars have suggested (Franck 1995; Crawford & Marks 1998)? Ultimately, there is an issue of ensuring adequate respect for the rule of law while giving the UN Security Council the flexibility to respond effectively to any “threat to the peace, breach of the peace, or act of aggression” (Art 39 UN Charter).

5.5 International Criminal Law

As a newly emergent area of international law, one main concern about international criminal law’s respect for the rule of law has traditionally focused on whether it complies with the demand that individuals should have fair warning that certain kinds of behaviour are criminally prohibited and attract liability to punishment. A dramatic illustration of this problem is the Nuremburg Trials, where it was questionable whether all of the grievous wrongs for which Nazi defendants were tried were in fact criminally prohibited by international law at the time they were committed (Kelsen 1947: 171). One response to these concerns is to argue that the wrongs in question were so obviously evil, and the subjection of their perpetrators to criminal trial and punishment so clearly justified and predictable, that the obligation to give due notice did not have great weight (Luban 2010: 583–587). To a significant degree, this problem has now been addressed, both as a result of the Rome Statute of the International Criminal Court, which defines the crimes of genocide, crimes against humanity, war crimes, and the crime of aggression, and assigns jurisdiction to the International Criminal Court, and as a result of the evolution of counterpart norms in customary international law.

Yet a serious problem remains with another component of the rule of law, which is the congruence between official conduct and legal norms, ensuring that like cases are treated alike and therefore that all prospective defendants are equal before the law. This is the scandal that the defendants who stand trial for international crimes overwhelmingly come from the Global South rather than from the powerful North Atlantic democracies. This is deeply troubling, given the great importance that the rule of law is typically thought to possess in the criminal law context, and has led even one expert to speak of the “demise of international criminal law” (Osiel 2014 [Other Internet Resources]). One can imagine various responses to this concern. One is that the absence of a centralized global state whose arbitrary exercise of massive power urgently needs to be reined in by law greatly diminishes this rule of law blemish in the international case (Luban 2010: 583–587). Another is a more pragmatic response, according to which the edifice of international criminal justice must be patiently built up, brick by brick, and that geographically skewed prosecutions have their value, despite the cost incurred in transgressing the rule of law, as they are part of an ongoing effort to make international criminal law more generally effective over time.


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Other Internet Resources


We would like to thank Roger Crisp and Gopal Sreenivasan for their comments on an earlier draft. We are also grateful to two students who provided us with excellent research assistance: Chen Kuang of Notre Dame Law School and Jaden Jarmel-Schneider of Columbia University.

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