Martin Luther

First published Wed Jul 22, 2020

Martin Luther (1483–1546) is the central figure of the Protestant Reformation. Whilst he is primarily seen as a theologian, the philosophical interest and impact of his ideas is also significant, so that he arguably deserves to be ranked as highly within philosophy as other theologians in the Christian tradition, such as Augustine or Aquinas. Nonetheless, in Luther’s case this may seem more problematic, as his attitude to philosophy and indeed reason can be hostile and dismissive. On closer inspection, however, it is clear that his position is more nuanced than that, and requires contextualisation: for his objection is only to reason put to certain theological ends, while his own thought is deeply steeped in the philosophical tradition, and contributed to it. At the same time, Luther’s ideas had a fundamental influence on northern European philosophers who came after him, such as Leibniz, Kant, Hegel, Schelling, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, Feuerbach, and Heidegger, all of whom worked within a broadly Lutheran context, and against the background of central Lutheran assumptions, often inculcated in them through their upbringing and education.[1]

Several key issues in Luther’s work make him of interest to philosophers and not just theologians or Reformation historians, and will be covered in this entry: his conception of the relation between theology and philosophy, and the place of reason in that relation; his negative conception of Aristotle and the Aristotelian tradition, and his relation to the nominalist alternative; his conception of divine and human freedom; and his conception of ethics and of social and political life. Luther’s influence on subsequent philosophers in the Lutheran tradition is considered in more detail in the separate entry on Luther’s influence on philosophy.

1. Luther’s Life and Works

Luther lived an interesting life in interesting times—where to a significant degree those times were made interesting by his life’s impact upon them. This impact began with the publication of his Ninety-Five Theses on 31 October 1517, in which as a young professor at Wittenberg he attacked the Church’s sale of indulgences; this was then followed by various further disputations and disputes as well as published works that defended his increasingly radical position, leading to his excommunication in 1521 and his famously defiant appearance at the Diet of Worms. Managing to escape capture under the protection of Frederick the Wise, Elector of Saxony, and after a period of seclusion at Wartburg castle, Luther returned to Wittenberg, where he continued his teaching, writing and translating; married; and engaged with the complex and fraught swirl of forces unleashed by his work at various levels—in theology, in the Church, in politics, and in society at large. While he had fathered the Reformation, as it has become known, he did not set out to divide the Christian Church, and the movement quickly took on a momentum that he could not control, but which still in certain fundamental ways bears the stamp of his thought.

Luther was born on 10 November 1483 in Eisleben in the Holy Roman Empire, not into the peasantry as he liked to claim, but into a relatively prosperous mining family.[2] His father, Hans, gave him a good education, intending for him to become a lawyer and thus assist the family business. In 1501 Luther went from school to the University of Erfurt, where in 1505 he became a Master of Arts, a degree which included the study and teaching of Aristotle, while he was also exposed to nominalism and to humanism. However, rather than continuing with his legal training, later in the same year Luther chose instead to enter the Augustinian monastery at Erfurt, much to the annoyance of his father—and as Luther explained it later, on the basis of a vow made in a violent thunder storm to St Anna (the patron saint of miners), that this is what he would do if he was spared. Whatever the truth in this story, in his own mind at least Luther seems to have understood his change of direction as a kind of conversion experience, and the entry into a new type of spiritual life.

However, Luther did not find this life an easy one, later recalling that while he tried to live without reproach and made full use of confession, he still felt that he “was a sinner before God with an extremely disturbed conscience” (“Preface to the Complete Edition of Luther’s Latin Writings”, 1545, WA 54:185/LW 34:336), in spite of the reassurances given him by his mentor Johann von Staupitz (1468–1524), then vicar-general of the observant wing of the Augustinians. This anxiety and fear meant the Luther underwent what he termed Anfechtungen, spiritual trials or temptations, as fears about his salvation could lead him to turn against God, while in later years he felt he was struggling with the devil. Luther was further disturbed by his father’s response when attending the first Mass at which his son officiated upon being ordained in 1507: his father suggested that Luther’s vow to St Anna may have been forced out of him by the devil, causing him to break the commandment to obey one’s parents. Some commentators have speculated that these two difficult relationships with father figures are not unconnected (for a classic but controversial study, see Erikson 1958; see also Roper 2016: 48–49).

As a monk in the monastery at Erfurt and as a temporary lecturer at Wittenberg, Luther’s education continued under his teachers Jodocus Trutfetter (1460–1519) and Bartholomaeus Arnoldi of Usingen (1465–1532), as he followed a theology curriculum dominated by Ockhamism, studying central texts such as Peter Lombard’s Sentences and commentaries on them by Gabriel Biel and Pierre d’Ailly, Aristotle’s works with Ockham’s commentaries, and major works by Augustine, while also lecturing on some of them. In 1512 Luther replaced Staupitz at the university in Wittenberg as professor of the Bible, a position he was to hold until his death.[3] Earlier in the same year, Luther made his only excursion beyond German lands, travelling to Rome on behalf of Staupitz; he was later to present this as an experience that began to turn him against the religious rituals and practices he found there, including that of indulgences.

It was this issue of indulgences that in 1517 led Luther to write ninety-five theses intended for debate or disputation on the topic, criticising this widespread practice as selling the remission of sins; this practice had been intensified by the efforts of Pope Leo X to raise funds for a new basilica of St Peter in Rome, efforts that were spearheaded locally by a Dominican friar Johann Tetzel. While according to legend Luther nailed the text of the theses to the church door, in reality it seems he merely sent them to Archbishop Albrecht of Mainz, and perhaps they were posted up on the door by someone else; but it was thanks to printed versions that they soon began to circulate more widely. This condemnation of indulgences was an act of some defiance within the politics of the Church, as was the criticism of the authority of the power of the Pope which Luther associated with it; but earlier in the same year Luther had taken a step of a more intellectually radical kind with another set of theses, that have come to be called his Disputation Against Scholastic Theology, and which grew out of his lectures and reading in previous years, particularly his engagement with Psalms, Paul’s letters, and the works of Augustine and the latter’s attacks on Pelagianism. In this disputation, written with characteristic vehemence, Luther sketched out what may be called an uncompromising Augustinianism in opposition to what are portrayed as the more Pelagian positions of figures such as Scotus, Ockham, and Biel, behind which was said to stand the malign influence of Aristotle. At the heart of this dispute, as we shall see, is the key issue of grace, and whether this can be attained and earned through our efforts by “doing what in us lies” (facere quod in se est). This question raised in the context of scholastic theology also provides the intellectual background to Luther’s argument against indulgences in the Ninety-Five Theses, which to him were in effect just another dubious method of gaining merit.

It was against this background that around this time Luther had his so-called “tower experience”, which like the thunder storm, was later portrayed by Luther as a life-changing moment in a way that may be more myth than fact, and is named after the tower of the monastery in Wittenberg where it is said to have occurred (1532, WA TR 3 no 3232a–c/LW 54:193–4). In recounting the event, Luther explains that he came to radically re-think how it is that justification and hence salvation is possible for us at all: namely not through our attempts to conform to God’s law, but through faith as a form of “passive righteousness”. From this realization, Luther later claimed (in his preface to the edition of his works published in his life time) that he was freed from his anger against an accusing God, and the anxiety that no such God could ever be known to be placated; instead he now recognised God’s gratuitous love and salvation, bestowed on us through divine grace (1545, WA 54:186/LW 34:336–7).

Luther was able to develop this new position further in another disputation, this time held in Heidelberg in 1518, where thanks to the controversy unleashed by the Ninety-five Theses, he was invited by Staupitz to present his theological ideas to the triennial assembly of the German Augustinians. In this Heidelberg Disputation, Luther continued his assault on “works righteousness”, and developed further an associated attack on free will, while he also presented a contrast that was to prove fundamental to his thinking, between a “theology of glory” and a “theology of the cross”. He associated the former with his opponents, and himself with the latter, arguing that it is only through despair at our failure to gain salvation for ourselves that we are truly made ready to be given salvation through grace. It now became clear to his audience that Luther (who to mark this change in perspective had just previously started signing himself “Luther” in short for “eleutherios” or the “freed one”, instead of his family’s actual name of “Luder”) was attempting not merely to confront the Church on the issue of indulgences, but also to question what he perceived to be its misguided theological outlook.

Luther’s position on indulgences, and his challenge to the Pope, had now begun to draw the attention of higher authorities in the Church, and in 1518 he was summoned to Augsburg to meet with the papal legate Cardinal Tommaso de Vio, known as Cajetan, who was investigating the matter. He tried to get Luther to recant, but he refused to back down in any way. In 1519, Luther travelled to Leipzig for another disputation, this time with Johann Eck, a theologian who had earlier criticised his Ninety-Five Theses. The confrontation was a highly charged affair, also conducted in printed pamphlets and associated satirical texts written by supporters, in which Luther again vehemently defended his ground. Eck then travelled to Rome to make his case, hence contributing to the papal decision to issue the bull Exsurge Domine on 15 June 1520, which threatened to excommunicate this troublesome opponent.

Luther’s response was characteristically defiant, later that year burning the bull in front of his supporters in Wittenberg, while himself accusing the Pope of heresy and worse in his reposts which included Against the Cursed Bull of the Antichrist. Having just published his Treatise on Good Works in which he set out his fundamental position on the relation between grace and works, Luther responded to this new situation in three significant writings also published in 1520: Address to the Christian Nobility of the German Nation, The Babylonian Captivity of the Church, and The Freedom of a Christian. The first two texts argue his case against the Pope and key practices of the Church, and the third reflects on how freedom is possible for human beings trapped in sin. Unsurprisingly, given his recalcitrance, Luther’s formal excommunication followed on 3 January 1521, in the bull Decet Romanum Pontificem. This was followed by a summons from Charles V, the recently elected head of the Holy Roman Empire, for Luther to attend the Diet, or regular imperial assembly, at Worms. Choosing to accept the summons despite the great personal risks involved, knowing that in rather similar circumstances the Czech theologian Jan Hus (c. 1372–1415) had been burnt at the stake for heresy, Luther was once more asked to recant, and once more he refused. It is again doubtful whether he actually uttered the famous words “here I stand, I cannot do otherwise”, but he is recorded as summarizing his position by saying:

Unless I am convinced by the testimony of the Scriptures or by clear reason (for I do not trust either in the Pope or in councils alone, since it is well known that they often erred and contradicted themselves), I am bound by the Scriptures I have quoted and my conscience is captive to the Word of God. I cannot and will not retract anything, since it is neither safe nor right to go against conscience. (1521, WA 7:838/LW 32:112)

Fearing for his safety after this defiant performance, which did indeed lead to the Edict of Worms declaring him a heretic and an outlaw, Luther was spirited away to the Wartburg castle under the protection of the Elector of Saxony, Frederick the Wise. Barring a brief secret visit back to Wittenberg in December 1521, he was based there until he could return openly to the city on 6 March 1522. While at the Wartburg he began his German translation of the New Testament, which would be followed (in serialised fashion) by the Old Testament, and eventually the landmark Luther Bible of 1534/1545. He also responded to criticism in support of the Pope by a Louvain theologian in Against Latomus (1522), re-iterating key elements of his position concerning the relation between sin and grace in forceful language.

As well as responding to attacks from the Catholic Church, in this period Luther began to face increasing challenges from his “own people” within the reform movement itself.[4] Upon returning to Wittenberg from his relative seclusion, Luther found himself embroiled in controversies over the direction being taken by other figures such as Andreas Bodenstein von Karlstadt (1486–1541) and Thomas Müntzer (c. 1489–1525), and was caught up in associated theological disputes, while also facing growing political opposition. Luther preached the Invocavit (Lenten) Sermons which restored order to the city, and responded to his fellow reformers in A Sincere Admonition by Martin Luther to all Christians to Guard against Insurrection and Rebellion (1522), and to some of these political difficulties in his pamphlet On Temporal [or secular: weltlicher] Authority: To What Extent it Should be Obeyed (1523), in which he drew a distinction between two kingdoms or empires (die zwei Reiche) in an attempt to make clear where he took the limits of the power of princes to lie. Now no longer a monk, he published On the Estate of Marriage in 1522, and himself married Katharina von Bora in 1525, after she had left her convent with other nuns, convinced by Luther’s arguments against monasticism. The marriage was a successful and happy one, and they were to have six children together, of whom two daughters were to die young, affecting Luther greatly. Meanwhile, theological and doctrinal disputes were to persist for the rest of Luther’s career, on issues such as the Eucharist (or Lord's Supper: Heiliges Adendmahl) and baptism, both within the evangelical movement involving figures such as the sacramentarian Karlstadt, and the Swiss reformers Ulrich Zwingli (1484–1531) and Johannes Oecolampadius (1482–1531), and outside it with the Anabaptists. On both issues, Luther resisted the accounts of these sacraments as having a mere symbolic value, often arguing that this viewpoint comes from an urge to put reason above the authority of scripture (see, for example, Against the Heavenly Prophets (1525, WA 18:62–125, 134–214/LW 40:79–223), That These Words of Christ, “This is My Body”, Etc., Still Stand Firm Against the Fanatics (1527, WA 23:38–320/LW 37:3–150), and Concerning Rebaptism (1528, WA 26:144–74/LW 40:229–62)).

In 1524, Luther faced criticism from a different quarter, as the leading Christian humanist Desiderius Erasmus was finally persuaded to engage with Luther’s position in print, and despite Luther’s earlier hopes for his endorsement,[5] chose instead to focus critically on the latter’s view of freedom which had been initially expressed in the thirteenth of Luther’s theses from the Heidelberg Disputation (1518) and further underlined in Luther’s response to the bull of Leo X (1520).[6] Erasmus replied to the latter in his A Diatribe or Discussion on Free Will (De libero arbitrio diatribe sive collatio)—where “diatribe” here is used not in the modern sense, but in the earlier sense of looking for a consensus on probable opinion through discussion. Luther, however, responded a year later to Erasmus’s intentionally measured and urbane effort with what amounts to a diatribe in the modern form, entitled De servo arbitrio, which may be translated “On the bondage [or slavery] of the will [or free choice]”. Luther’s invective shocked and offended Erasmus, who replied with his two volume Protector of the Diatribe (Hyperaspistes diatribae)[7] in 1526 and 1527, in which Erasmus’s language is almost as intemperate as Luther’s own. As Luther emphasised, at the heart of this dispute lay issues that were central to his thinking, concerning grace, human agency, and divine knowledge and power, played out against the background of Augustine’s earlier disputes with Pelagianism, of which Luther insistently accused Erasmus, much to the latter’s frustration.

Luther was also drawn into controversy of a more political and social kind, as he sought to respond to the events known as the “Peasants’ War” or “Peasants’ Revolt” (Bauernkrieg), when in 1525 large areas of central Europe saw agrarian grievances lead to more general disorder, partly fuelled by appeal to reformation ideas, and partly by an appeal to scripture which Luther himself had seemed to champion. Luther first responded with relative moderation in his Admonition to Peace, in which after criticising both the rulers and the peasants, he urged dialogue between the two parties. But the on-going violence led him to take sides with the secular authorities, as the title of his next work made clear: Against the Thieving, Murderous Hordes of Peasants. The vehement tone of this text shocked even Luther’s supporters, and led him to attempt to clarify his position further in An Open Letter on the Harsh Book Against the Peasants, though his basic stance was not much changed, and by then the damage was done. That stance was perhaps politically expedient to ensure continuing support from the princes for his reformation, but it nonetheless continues to raise questions regarding the integrity of his political judgement, and more generally for the significance of his social and political thought. In the same period, Luther sought to instill his form of theology and religious practice on the growing reformed communities through his German Mass (1526) and his catechisms (1529).

In 1530, Luther was drawn into a further Diet, this time at Augsburg but, fearing for his safety, Luther himself remained in Coburg, while his position was represented by his gifted younger protégé Philip Melanchthon (1497–1560), who had first joined Luther in Wittenberg in 1518. The aim of the Diet, to be attended by the Emperor Charles V, was to achieve some reconciliation between the Catholic and reformed positions. Luther forwarded his strongly worded suggestions as to how the latter should be represented in his “exhortation”, but Melanchthon opted instead to present a more moderate position to the Diet, in 28 articles later known as the Augsburg Confession. This was part of a process through which Melanchthon sought to mediate and in some respects soften Luther’s own views, not always to the liking of the latter, though their close relationship remained largely intact. The Diet ended in failure and, fearing suppression from imperial forces, Luther wrote his Warning to his Dear German People (1531), in which now he sanctioned armed resistance, arguing that defence of the gospel overrode civil obedience. Instead, however, the list of Lutheran territories continued to grow, forming the League of Smalcalden in 1531. It was a Diet of this League held in 1537 which Luther was to address with his Smalcald Articles; published in 1538, these contain his last word on confessional and doctrinal issues. He also argued against a council called by the Pope in The Councils and the Church (1539). While still at Coburg, Luther defended some of his practices on translation against critics in On Translating: An Open Letter (1530), particularly the accusation that in Romans 3:28, in the key phrase “faith alone,” the word “alone” is not in Paul’s text. When back in Wittenberg after the Diet of Augsburg, Luther was to lecture on Galatians in 1531, lectures which were published in 1535 and 1538.

In his last years, Luther continued to fight for his legacy, which included his mock-reluctant acceptance of an edition of his collected works to which he contributed an only partially reliable preface on which (as we have seen) some colourful but probably fictional stories of his life were to draw—though for all that it remains a revealing document. These years are marred by his vitriolic attacks on both Turks (and thus Islam) and Jews, in a marked change of tone from his earlier more considered and appreciative reflections, which had included That Jesus Christ was Born a Jew (1523)—although his positive remarks are based on hopes of Jewish conversion, while many of his comments in his unpublished lectures on Psalms had been hostile; partly because those hopes did not materialise, by 1538 Luther was writing Against the Sabbatarians, a polemic which he was to continue to the end of his life in further anti-Jewish texts.[8]

The end of that life was to come on 18 February 1546, in the town of Eisleben where he had been born. At the burial ceremony in Wittenberg, Melanchthon spoke the eulogy. He noted that while he could not deny the complaint that “Luther displayed too much severity” in dealing with his opponents, nonetheless he cited one of those opponents in response:

But I answer in the language of Erasmus, “Because of the magnitude of the disorders, God gave this age a violent physician”. (1546 [1834–60: 729–730]; the reference is to Erasmus 1529 [1999: 100])

2. Theology and Philosophy

Whilst there is no doubt that Luther saw himself primarily as a theologian, as we have seen his education also involved significant philosophical aspects, whilst he engaged with philosophical issues and debates throughout his career. Nonetheless, he was concerned to demarcate clearly between the two disciplines, which for him also involved becoming clear about the limitations of reason in relation to matters of faith. In some contexts, this led him to polemicizing against reason and philosophy (most notoriously in his assertion that “reason is the devil’s whore” as it “can do nothing else but slander and dishonour what God does and says” (Against the Heavenly Prophets, 1525, WA 18:164/LW 40:175)); but as many would now argue, it would be wrong to take such remarks in isolation and out of context, and to thereby characterise his position as “irrationalist” in a broad sense. Rather, it would be more accurate to say that he was keen to keep reason within its proper boundaries and under the right tutelage.

One text that brings out some of the complexities of Luther’s position on these issues is Disputatio de homine (“The Disputation Concerning Man”, 1536). Comprising 40 theses, the first 9 present the view of human beings and our relation to the world proposed by “philosophy or human wisdom”, which is then contrasted with the view taken by theology (see Ebeling 1977, 1982, 1989; but cf. White 1994: 60–81 for criticisms of Ebeling). The position of philosophy is not rejected entirely, but shown to be severely truncated in the light of theology. According to philosophy, a human being is an embodied animal equipped with a reason that relies on sensations or experience; it thus conceives of us in merely mortal terms and in relation to the world around us. Luther agrees that in this context philosophy is right to view reason as

the most important and the highest in rank among all things and, in comparison with other things of this life, the best and something divine,

for in this realm

it is the inventor and guide of all the arts, medicine, law, and of whatever wisdom, power, virtue, and glory human beings possess in this life. (1536, WA 39.I:175/LW 34:137)

Luther thus also agrees that it is reason that makes the fundamental difference between human beings and animals, by virtue of which we are given dominion over the latter, so that reason is “a sun and a kind of god appointed to administer these things in this life” (ibid.). And Luther also asserts that even after the Fall, God did not take away this role for reason, but continued to uphold it, so in this context it remains a divine gift and a fundamental way in which we fit into God’s creation. Thus, set within a worldly arena, Luther here and elsewhere[9] is happy to affirm the value and function of reason, and philosophy’s high estimate of its significance.

However, Luther then goes on to argue that precisely because philosophy is confined to reason that operates within empirical constraints,[10] and is unaided by revelation, faith, and scripture, it cannot hope to tell us the whole story about human beings and the world, for which the extra resources available to theology are required, which can thereby put all this in relation to God and so define “the whole and perfect human being” (1536, WA 39.I: 176/LW 34:138). This means that theology can not only treat God as fundamental in its account of efficient and of final causes (as creator, and as the source of eternal happiness and salvation respectively), but it also sees human beings in the light of the Fall and also of grace and salvation, in a way that reason without theology cannot fathom—and if it tries to do so, will distort in a fundamental way.

A contemporary empiricist or naturalistic philosopher might have little cause to challenge Luther’s assumptions concerning the nature of reason, and so accept this demarcation between philosophy and theology. However, a more rationalistic philosopher might question whether Luther underestimates the a priori capacities of reason, thus giving reason more of a role within the theological realm when it comes to our knowledge of God. In response, Luther makes several related claims. First, while he does not reject such a priori knowledge altogether (which he takes to be innate), he stresses it is severely limited, partly because it can only bring us a rather general knowledge of God,[11] and partly because it can never lead to the kind of certainty regarding God which can be found through faith and taking seriously his promise to us, particularly when it comes to matters of salvation.[12] Second, he has theological reasons connected not just to the Fall itself but also to his conception of the “hiddenness” of God, to question the scope of such rational capacities, so that reason knows “that there is a God, but it does not know who or which is the true God” (Lectures on Jonah (1526, WA 19:206/LW 19:54–55). Third, in attributing these capacities to ourselves, there is the danger of a kind of theological pride which will disastrously distort our proper relation to God. Fourth, to take reason to be capable of more than helping us navigate the world is to misunderstand its function in our epistemic economy, an economy which can ultimately be traced back to God’s design.[13] Finally, and perhaps most importantly, reason must struggle to make sense of the sheer gratuitousness of God’s forgiveness of our sins, which transcend its sense of justice and fairness, and will as a result lead us to question and doubt that forgiveness, with disastrous consequences.[14]

For Luther, these limitations of reason can be felt within theology in the kind of puzzlement and perplexity which reason feels when confronted by the scriptures and faith, where such puzzlement combined with an undue estimation of reason can lead to the overthrow of the latter by the former. But viewed from Luther’s perspective, this is clearly unwarranted, as within theology this puzzlement is precisely to be expected and even predicted, given the hiddenness of God on the one hand and the effects of the Fall on the other, as well as God’s desire to humble us.[15] Luther is thus happy to revel in the apparently paradoxical nature of religious belief, on some accounts going as far as accepting a doctrine of “double truth”: namely that the same proposition might be true in theology and false in philosophy, and vice versa. That he held this view may seem supported by Thesis 4 of the Disputation Concerning the Passage: “The Word Was Made Flesh” (John 1:14)’ of 1539, which states:

The Sorbonne, the mother of errors, very badly laid down that the same thing is true in philosophy and in theology. (WA 39.2:3/LW 38:239)

However, it is more commonly held that in making this claim, Luther has something more moderate in mind, which is suggested by Thesis 1 of this Disputation:

Although the saying “Every truth is in agreement with every other truth” is to be upheld, nevertheless, what is true in one field of learning [professionibus] is not always true in other fields of learning. (ibid)

This can be interpreted as holding that realms of truth are diverse, in the sense that some truth can only be stated in certain fields but not others, but nonetheless all truths are consonant with one another (see Gerrish 1962: 53–4; White 1994: Chapter 3; Dieter 2009; Luy 2017: 15–16; and see Bianchi 2008 for a history of this issue).

Nonetheless, even this more modest position means that Luther can claim that there are truths in theology that philosophy cannot grasp or properly articulate in its own terms, and when it tries to do so, will generate what in philosophy appear to be absurdities or aporia—such as the doctrine of the Trinity, or of the Eucharist, both of which require different ways of thinking than is available to philosophers, who can aspire to no more than “creaturely thought” (The Promotions disputation of Erasmus Alberus, 1543, WA 39.2:254/Appendix to Bielfeldt, Mattox, & Hinlicky 2008: 191–197, 194).[16] It is in this context that Luther can speak of the language of theology needing to be “new” because it behaves differently from that of the “old” language of philosophy, though not necessarily from the language of ordinary life, which can be more flexible than that of philosophy in certain respects (cf. White 1994: 332–48, Bielfeldt 2002b). Likewise, because the philosopher operates with formal systems of syllogistic logic, which do not sufficiently take into account the special nature of the objects of faith, such logics will also break down when dealing with theological matters.[17] To philosophy, these problems will wrongly suggest that theology is nonsensical or is grasping at falsehoods, while instead Luther argues it just highlights the limitations of philosophical concepts and methods when dealing with the subject-matter of theology (see White 1994 for more extensive discussion of these issues). As Luther puts it in Disputation Concerning the Passage: “The Word Was Made Flesh”:

St. Ambrose has rightly said that the dialecticians have to give way where the apostolic fishermen are to be trusted. (1539, WA 39.2:4/LW 38:239)

However, having marked out a hierarchy between philosophy and theology in this manner, Luther does not entirely reject a role for reason within theology, when properly understood, and when thereby illuminated by faith so that it becomes “right reason” (recta ratio).[18] Thus, as Gerrish has argued in relation to Luther’s famous statement when asked to recant at the Diet of Worms, that he refused to do so unless “convinced by the testimony of Scripture or plain reason”, Luther did not mean here to set up reason alongside scripture, but rather to accept the evidential authority of rational inferences from it (Gerrish 1962: 24–5).[19] Likewise, while his doctrine of putting scripture first as the basis for faith (sola scriptura) means he has a correspondingly dim view of theological debates carried out at a purely philosophical level, Luther nonetheless accepts the importance of reason to the interpreter and translator of the scriptural texts such as himself. Indeed, part of his grounds for rejecting Erasmus’s humanistic appeal to authority and tradition in matters of interpretation lies in Luther’s confidence in the capacity of reason to make the Bible clear, when properly coupled with faith and the “understanding of the heart” (see Grosshans 2017: 15–17). However, Luther was himself to face the challenge of those (such as the Anabaptists and the Sacramentarians at the Colloquy of Marburg in 1529) who interpreted scripture in different ways, and for whom conscience guided by “right reason” was to counsel different responses to such key passages as “For this is my body”, leaving little agreed common ground on which to adjudicate these disputes; some see this situation as ironically generating a kind of scepticism which is the very converse of the certainty which Luther himself craved and claimed to make possible.[20]

Luther’s conception of the relation between theology and philosophy, faith and reason, may also be seen to influence his corresponding assessment of mysticism. On the one hand, against the perceived rationalism of the scholastics, Luther was clearly attracted to the need for inner experience, and spoke of achieving a kind of union with or participation in God, while attaching great merit to some writings in the mystical tradition, particularly the Theologia deutsch, a late fourteenth-century work which he discovered and twice edited, in 1516 and 1518, wrongly attributing it to Johann Tauler (c. 1300–1361), though it is influenced by the latter’s ideas. At the same time, Luther also distanced himself from mystical writers such as Dionysius, whose theology (like that of the so-called “Zwickau Prophets”) he accused of making the mediating role for Christ redundant (cf. 1537, First Disputation Against the Antinomians, WA 39.1:389–91, translated in Sonntag (ed. and trans.), Only the Decalogue is Eternal, 55–57), while it is debatable whether Luther’s emphasis on the authority of scripture is compatible with a mystical approach (for further discussion, see Oberman 1992: 126–54, and Leppin 2017b).

3. Luther, Aristotle, and Nominalism

To the extent that Luther is critical of philosophy and of reason, this hostility is often directed at Aristotle and the Aristotelian tradition in particular; and in general, Luther’s departure from Aristotle marks one of the most philosophically distinctive and interesting aspects of his thinking. As with Luther’s critique of reason, however, some of his more notoriously negative judgements—such as his claim in the Disputation Against Scholastic Theology that “the whole Aristotle is to theology as darkness is to light” (1517, WA 1:226/LW 31:12)—need to be balanced against other more positive judgements, and set in context. Part of that context is the reception of Aristotle’s work itself, as it was interpreted in its own terms, and also placed against the background of Christian thought within the scholastic tradition, where it can be a complex matter to place Luther himself into these debates (see Andreatta 1996, White 1996, Dieter 2001 (discussed in Wicks 2007), Dieter 2017).

Broadly speaking, there are three levels in Luther’s critical engagement with Aristotle and his influence: objections at the institutional level, at the level of general Christian theology, and at the level of Luther’s own theological outlook.

At the institutional level, Luther’s concern was over the place of Aristotle within the universities, which had been cemented through the decision in 1255 of the faculty of liberal arts in Paris to include all Aristotle’s known works within the curriculum. This is the context of Luther’s assertion, in To the Christian Nobility of 1520, that in the universities “the blind pagan teacher, Aristotle, is of more consequence than Christ”, so that the universities “need a good, thorough reformation” (WA 6:457/LW 44:200) in order to replace the centrality of Aristotle’s works with the study of scripture and of the Christian faith—and Luther was not alone in having this concern. He thus argues that Aristotle’s Physics, Metaphysics, De anima, and Ethics should all be removed from the curriculum, while his Logic, Rhetoric and Poetics should be retained in an abridged form without commentary, as aids to speaking and preaching. In this way, Luther clearly hoped, rather than “labouring with persistent industry to comprehend only Aristotle” (Explanations of the Ninety-Five Theses 1518, WA 1:611/LW 1:222), students would have time to devote themselves to the more worthwhile study of the Bible instead.[21]

Luther’s choice of works to set aside also reveals what he took to be theologically problematic about the content of Aristotle’s philosophy at the second level. In commenting on De anima, Luther objects that it contradicts Christian teaching on the immortality of the soul. He also says that the Physics is fundamentally flawed, elsewhere arguing that this is because Aristotle has no conception of the Biblical account of creation (Lectures on Genesis, 1535–1545, WA 42:63/LW 1:84). In both areas, Aristotle is hampered by his hylomorphism, his view that matter and form are interrelated, so that in this respect Luther favours Plato over Aristotle.

More interesting, however, is the third level of Luther’s engagement with Aristotle, where his critique focuses on issues central to Luther’s own theology. In To the Christian Nobility, this can be seen in Luther’s response to Aristotle’s Ethics, which is described as being “the worst of all books” as it

flatly opposes divine grace and all Christian virtues, and yet it is considered one of his best works. Away with such books! Keep them away from Christians. (1520, WA 6:458/LW 44:201)

Luther is here contrasting his own account of justification through faith with the idea of justification through works, which he associates with the Aristotelian tradition and traces back to Aristotle’s Ethics. For here, Luther argued, one can find the idea that virtue is something to be developed through our own efforts and instilled in us through habituation, thus making the idea of good works central to the idea of moral improvement. While perhaps plausible in a secular context, once this idea is transposed into understanding our relation to God, Luther took it to be disastrous as it led to the view both that we could act rightly without God’s grace, and that we could to some extent earn his good judgement by doing so, without seeing this grace as unmerited. This, however, is to generate a sense of pride in our own abilities which precisely negates the possibility of good action, for reasons we will consider further in the next section. Luther thus sets his own view in opposition to the Aristotelian one in the Disputation Against Scholastic Philosophy when he writes that “We do not become righteous by doing righteous deeds but, having been made righteous, we do righteous deeds”, so that as a result “Virtually the entire Ethics of Aristotle is the worst enemy of grace” (1517, WA 1:226/LW 1:12). Luther’s criticisms of Duns Scotus, Gabriel Biel and William of Ockham on these issues elsewhere in the Disputation make clear how he sees them as relating to this fundamental Aristotelian error, while his reference to Augustine’s anti-Pelagianism in the first two theses equally makes clear the theological mistake that Luther sees in all such views. And while Luther does not mention him explicitly in the Disputation, not surprisingly he elsewhere occasionally but strongly criticizes Aquinas for also falling under the baleful influence of Aristotle on this issue.[22]

It has also been argued by commentators that this radical critique of Aristotle from the perspective of his view of justification and grace also results in a departure not only from Aristotle’s ethics of the virtues, but also some fundamental assumptions of Aristotelian metaphysics, and its commitment to the substance/attribute model. This change in outlook is said to arise out of Luther’s conception of grace as unmerited, so that in attributing righteousness to a person, this is extrinsic to them, a matter of God’s verdict and hence forensic assessment, and so grounded in his relation to the person rather than in the attributes of the person themselves, which from another perspective remain that of the sinner. Viewed in this relational way, the Christian is thus “both justified and sinner” (simul iustus et peccator), in a manner that is hard to capture on a traditional Aristotelian substance/attribute model.[23] However, the so-called “Finnish interpretation” of Luther, which challenges this purely forensic and relational approach to justification, correspondingly makes Luther’s challenge to traditional Aristotelian ontology less radical. On the Finnish interpretation, justification involves actual participation in the divine life, and thus has ontological implications for the justified individual.[24]

Luther also felt dissatisfied with the Aristotelian framework of substance and accidents, and matter and form, in relation to his distinctive views concerning other aspects of Christian doctrine, particularly concerning the Eucharist, where for example in The Babylonian Captivity of the Church, Luther argues strongly that the Aristotelian assumptions which had structured much of the debate on these matters were wrongly used to support the “babble” of transubstantiation rather than his preferred view of real presence (1520, WA 6:510–511/LW 36:32–4)[25]—though he also accuses Aquinas of causing difficulties through his misinterpretation of Aristotle, rather than just blaming Aristotle himself (1520, WA 6:508/LW 36:29). In general, Luther’s approach here is that we should take literally the word of scripture which he thinks support his view, rather than fall for using a pre-Christian philosophy which may seem to make the Eucharist more comprehensible, but which really does not, and which anyway is not appropriate goal for what should remain a mystery and a matter of faith.

Through Luther’s engagement with Aristotle, it is also intriguing to try to locate him in the complex patchwork of disputing schools that arose in this late medieval period concerning the proper interpretation of Aristotle’s work, and the challenges it faced. One such challenge was from Ockham’s nominalism or (to use the more contemporary label) “termism”; and Luther was to present himself as belonging to this position.[26] However, this issue is merely one of a broad spectrum of debates that shaped the wider dispute between the so-called via antiqua and via moderna, where the latter has links to (but cannot be identified with) nominalist approaches. This has led to a considerable amount of scholarly discussion and research, which has brought out how Luther’s education came through the via moderna, but that he also occupied a position that was independent of any school.[27]

4. Luther on Freedom of the Will

Just as Luther’s distinctive conception of justification and grace plays a crucial role in his debates over the value of Aristotle, so similar issues play a crucial role in his discussion of a related philosophical issue, namely the value and nature of freedom, both human and divine. The central text here is of course The Bondage of the Will, in which as we have seen Luther engages with Erasmus on precisely this issue.

The structure of Luther’s response to Erasmus is largely determined by the structure of Erasmus’s De libero arbitrio, as it attempts to reply to Erasmus point by point. Erasmus’s work begins with a preface and introduction, and ends with a brief epilogue, while in between it has three parts: the first dealing with scriptural texts that Erasmus takes to support free choice; the second dealing with texts that might seem to oppose it; and the third a part which examines Luther’s earlier arguments against free choice in his response to the papal condemnation of 1520. This text is Luther’s Assertio omnium articulorum published in December of that year, in which (following John Wyclif (1324–1384)) he defended and went beyond the claim from the Heidelberg Disputation which had been condemned, namely that “Free will, after the Fall, exists in name only, and as long as it does what it is able to do, it commits a mortal sin” (WA 1:354/LW 31:40).[28] Correspondingly, Luther’s reply to Erasmus has a brief introduction, and then five main parts: the first two discuss Erasmus’s preface and introduction; a third part which questions Erasmus’s use of scriptural passages in support of free choice, and a fourth which uses scriptural passages against it; and a fifth part which challenges Erasmus’s arguments against the position Luther defended in the Assertio, while the final part marshals Luther’s general argument against free choice.

In an introduction heavy with irony and sarcasm (which sets the rhetorical tone for much of the rest of the book, and which so offended the urbane Erasmus), Luther apologies for his delay in replying to Erasmus’s Diatribe, but says that the cause was “neither pressure of work, nor the difficulty of the task, nor your great eloquence, nor any fear of you”, but rather “sheer disgust, anger, and contempt” at the quality of Erasmus’s work, and its “evasive and equivocal nature”:

you fancy yourself steering more cautiously than Ulysses between Scylla and Charybdis as you assert nothing while appearing to assert something. (WA 18:601–2/LW 33:17)

Nonetheless, Luther declares, he has seen that he really ought to overcome this aversion and respond to those who have entreated him to reply to Erasmus, as in expressing his views he may succeed in winning over a reader to the truth and the Spirit that informs Luther’s works, where that reader might even be Erasmus himself.

In the first main part, which focuses on Erasmus’s preface, Luther begins by picking up on Erasmus’s statement that outside “the Holy Scripture…and the decrees of the Church” (Erasmus 1524 [1969: 37]), he is cautious in making assertions, and even would prefer the attitude of the Sceptics, who suspend judgement on complex matters such as free will. In response, Luther rises to the bait, where on the one hand Erasmus was clearly contrasting his more modest position with Luther’s own Assertio and sense of conviction more generally, as well as on the other hand making a point of referring to the authority of the Church alongside scripture. Against Erasmus, Luther argues that scepticism is not an appropriate outlook for Christians who are called on to assert their faith as trust in God, while also criticising him for putting any weight on the decrees of the Church, rather than on scripture alone, which Luther insists is clear enough in its essentials and what it tells us, even though the mind of God himself may be harder to fathom, and it may be difficult for us to make philosophical sense of doctrines such as the Trinity. Moreover, Luther criticises Erasmus for his suggestion that it is not in fact necessary for the Christian to try to settle matters relating to free will, particularly given the dangers that attach to speculating on such questions. In response, Luther argues that this issue cannot be avoided and is central, for

as long as [Christians] are ignorant of what and how much they can do, they will not know what they should do; and being ignorant of what they should do, they cannot repent if they do wrong; and impenitence is an unforgivable sin…[so] if we do not know these things, we shall know nothing at all of things Christian, and shall be worse than any heathen. (WA 18:614/LW 33:35)

Likewise, Luther argues, the question of divine foreknowledge and of whether everything happens necessarily is also an issue which cannot be avoided:

For if you doubt or disdain to know that God foreknows all things, not contingently, but necessarily and immutably, how can you believe his promises and place a sure trust and reliance on them?… [T]his is the one supreme consolation of Christians in all adversities, to know that God does not lie, but does all things immutably, and that his will can neither be resisted nor changed nor hindered. (WA 18:619/LW 33:42–3)

Luther then goes on to criticise Erasmus’s suggestion that discussion of these issues should be kept from common ears, for fear of leading people astray and causing strife, responding that the Word of God is not to be supressed, and anyway tumult is to be expected from a doctrine as radical as Christianity. Luther also challenges Erasmus’s claim that the Lutheran position on free will, even if it were true, if widely broadcast would have deleterious effects on the life of the believer, making them more likely to give up any attempts to combat their evil, and to no longer believe in a God who punishes them for what they cannot control. For Luther, however, this is simply to beg the question, as living a better life and believing in God are not things we can bring about in ourselves, but only occur through God. Moreover, on Luther’s account, it is only by recognizing our impotence in these respects, and being thereby humbled regarding what we can do and what we can understand, that we have any chance of standing in the right relation to God at all.

Finally in this part, Luther turns to consider Erasmus’s contention that there is a fundamental paradox in the idea that “whatever is done by us is done not by free choice but of sheer necessity” (WA 18:139/LW 33:64; cf. Erasmus 1524 [1969: 41]), where he makes several key claims that will be developed further in what follows. First, he argues that this is entailed once we accept that our salvation is the work of God, from which it follows that if we do good it is a result of his agency, while if that agency is not present all we can do is what is bad, so that we lack any power of choice in this matter. However, secondly Luther stresses that this does not mean we are compelled or forced to act as we do, so that

by “necessarily” I do not mean “compulsorily” [coacte], but by the necessity of immutability (as they say) and not of compulsion,

so that

when a man is without the Spirit of God he does not do evil against his will [nolens], as if he were taken by the scruff of the neck and forced to it, like a thief or a robber carried off against his will to punishment, but he does it of his own accord and with a ready will [libenti voluntate]. (WA 18:634/LW 33:64)

Thus, though we lack free choice, we do not lack free will, understood as a force that leads us to act, a force that grows stronger the more it is resisted. At this point, Luther makes his famous use of the traditional simile, that the human will is like a horse that can fall under two riders, Satan or God, who will determine which way it goes, but like a horse it follows either perfectly willingly:

If God rides it, it wills and goes where God wills, as the psalm says: “I am become as a beast [before thee] and I am always with thee” [Psalms 73:22–23]. If Satan rides it, it wills and goes where Satan will; nor can it choose to run to either of the two riders or to seek him out, but the riders themselves contend for the possession and control of it. (WA 18:635/LW 33:65–6)

Luther further argues that as Erasmus himself allows that free choice without the grace of God is “entirely ineffective” (Erasmus 1524 [1969: 41), he does not really disagree with Luther’s position, as

to say that free choice exists, and has indeed some power, but that it is only an ineffective power, is what the Sophists call oppositum in adjecto [a contradiction in terms]. (WA 18:636/LW 33:66)

The only being with genuine free choice, Luther asserts, is God, and it is misleading to apply the term to us, so that it would be best if we did not attach it to human beings at all—or if we must continue to use it, to do so only in relation “to what is beneath him and not what is above him”, where it makes some sense to speak of free choice in a limited sense:

That is to say, a man should know that with regard to his faculties and possessions he has the right to use, to do, or to leave undone, according to his own free choice, though even this is controlled by the free choice of God alone, who acts in whatever way he pleases. On the other hand in relation to God, or in matters pertaining to salvation or damnation, a man has no free choice, but is a captive, subject and slave either of the will of God or the will of Satan. (WA 18:638/LW 33:70)

In the second part of his text, Luther turns to Erasmus’s introduction, where Erasmus had questioned Luther’s position on the grounds that few of the saints, Church fathers, and scriptural authorities have adopted a view of this sort. Luther’s response is that while these authorities may have said there is free choice, in their actions they have not shown they possess it, while they also have all conceived of it in rather different ways, so it is not clear that there is any consensus here at all—and at the same time, Luther argues that the all-important figure of Augustine is on his side, not Erasmus’s as the latter had claimed. Given this confused picture, Luther concludes that as a result, the matter must be settled by appeal to scripture alone, and not by appeal to the authority of previous commentators, or of the Church. Luther thus proceeds to the first main part of Erasmus’s text, in which Erasmus had offered a number of biblical passages that he claimed to support the idea of free choice.

At the beginning of Part Three of his own work, before getting on to these passages, Luther begins with an important critique of the definition of free choice with which Erasmus had started his discussion:

By free choice in this place we mean a power of the human will by which a man can apply himself to the things which lead to eternal salvation, or turn away from them. (WA 18:661–2/LW 33:102–3, citing Erasmus 1524 [1969: 47])

Luther raises various objections to Erasmus’s definition (for Erasmus’s replies, see 1529 [1999: 261–91]). First, he points out that as free choice applies to God and angels, Erasmus is wrong to define it as applying only to human will. Second, he argues it is misleading to apply the term “free” to human choice, as this would wrongly imply that a human being “can do and does, in relation to God, whatever it pleases, uninhibited by any law or any sovereign authority”, which Luther takes for granted is not what Erasmus has in mind. The human will clearly cannot simply do as it pleases when it comes to matters of eternal salvation, as if it operated in a normative vacuum. Rather, the will is obliged by God to act in different ways, so it is only free insofar as it fails to do so because it is “vertible” or “mutable”, by failing to do what is required of it by being turned away from the good, which is hardly a form of freedom to be admired, as Augustine and others have noted. Thus, while Erasmus’s attempted definition confuses matters, Luther argues that the question at issue is therefore whether human beings have the capacity to actively and legitimately turn their will to follow or not follow what God has made it right to do—so Luther says that when he uses “free choice” in what comes next, he will be using it in this way.

Luther’s third objection is that even when we get clear what we are trying to define, Erasmus’s definition is itself unclear, particularly the terms “to apply”, “to the things which lead” and “to turn away”. The only way to understand “to apply” and “to turn away”, Luther argues, is to think that the will is not merely a power that gives rise to action, but at the same time stands between that willing and action, as a capacity for deciding how the will is to be exercised, as a

capacity or faculty or ability or aptitude for willing, unwilling, selecting, neglecting, approving, rejecting, and whatever other actions of the will there are. (WA 18:662–3/LW 33:105)

However, this then means, Luther argues, that on Erasmus’s account, if a human being does “the things which lead” to eternal salvation, this is not just because they have willed these things, but rather have chosen to act on them through exercising this capacity for choice—which is enough to make him a semi-Pelagian, who believes in this capacity for choice even though he disagrees with Pelagius himself over our ability to also know unaided the matters of salvation and thus the good concerning which we are said to choose. Moreover, Luther argues, this view contradicts what Erasmus himself had said previously, namely that “in those who lack grace” the power of the will is “unable to perform the good” (Erasmus 1524 [1969: 49]) and is thus (as Luther puts it) “incapacitated without grace” (WA 18:665/LW 33:108), and so not able to “apply itself” to such matters at all. Luther thus poses a question to Erasmus which he thinks could also be posed to the Scholastics (who are labelled as Sophists throughout this text):

If anyone told you that a thing was free which could operate by its own power only in one direction (the bad one), while in the other (the good one) it could of course operate, though not by its own power, but only by the help of another—would you be able to keep a straight face my friend? (WA 18:665/LW 33:109)

Luther then turns to consider Erasmus’s treatment of the effect of the Fall on the human will, in which Erasmus had distinguished three views on where this left free choice once the Pelagian option is set aside: those that hold human beings can choose to strive towards the good but cannot attain it without grace (co-operative grace); those who hold that left to ourselves we only choose to sin, so that grace alone can enable us to attain the good; and those who hold there is no free choice at all, which is thus said to be “an empty” name—where Erasmus calls this view “the hardest of all”, and is of course the one put forward by Luther himself (as well as John Wyclif in his early work, who Erasmus associated with Luther, an association the latter was happy to accept).[29] Luther’s strategy in response is to argue that by conceding that human beings without grace cannot will the good, Erasmus has already ruled out the first option even though he is clearly attracted by it, while Luther argues that the second must collapse into the third, as if free choice in humans is always for sin, it always goes in one direction and so is not really choice at all. Luther also makes a diagnostic point, that underlying Erasmus’s confusion here is the idea that while the will cannot will the good unaided, it is not necessarily therefore committed to willing the bad but still has some choice, as it could remain in a “neutral” position between the two; but Luther rejects this picture, as once the will has turned away from the good, it is willing the bad, rather than being in some “middle” or “unqualified” state.

Luther then returns to the passage from Ecclesiasticus 15:14–17 with which Erasmus had prefaced his discussion, to consider how Erasmus uses it to support his view. Luther first considers the opening line, which says that “God… left [man] in the hands of his own counsel”, which might suggest that we are left free to choose; but Luther counters that this only means we are given dominion over the rest of the creatures on earth, while beyond this we remain bound by the commandments of God which are referred to in the next line of the biblical text. However, Luther then considers one of Erasmus’s key arguments, namely that talk of such commandments here and in many other passages also implies we have free choice, for otherwise they would make no sense, and nor would the punishment attached to failing to act on them be warranted, thus raising the problem for Luther of “ought implies can”, and of imputation (cf. Erasmus 1524 [1969: 50]).

In response to the first issue of “ought implies can”, Luther uses this as an occasion to bring out the folly of reason when it considers such matters, because reason thinks it can appeal to our ordinary use of words like “ought” and “must” to infer “can”—but Luther thinks that in fact even in ordinary practice, we can intelligibly tell someone they ought or must do something, knowing full well they cannot, as when a parent does so in order to demonstrate to a child the limitations of their ability, or a doctor in order to demonstrate such limitations to their patient. Luther argues that Scripture, unlike Erasmus, takes our human limitations very seriously, so it is therefore not surprising that such uses of command language abound, where Luther deals with many similar passages in the same way:

The words of the law are spoken, therefore, not to affirm the power of the will, but to enlighten blind reason and make it see that its own light is no light and that the virtue of the will is no virtue,

and he cites Paul as being on his side:

“Through the law”, says Paul, “comes knowledge of sin” [Romans 3:20]; he does not say the “abolition” or “avoidance” of sin. (WA 18:677/LW 33:127)

In response to Erasmus on this issue, Luther thus offers what has been called his “convicting” view of the law, which is designed to reveal our impotence to us, thus provoking the kind of despair and sense of helplessness that can open us up to grace, in accordance with the “theology of the cross”—a process Erasmus would forestall if we took him seriously, and inferred instead that because we fall under the law, we can take steps to follow it through our own choice (cf. WA 18:680–1/LW 33:133).

Luther also deals with the problem of imputation and divine punishment, which seems to arise if we lack free choice: for how can our sins be imputed to us, and how can God allow us to be punished when we cannot do otherwise and he could remove the defect in our will which means we are not saved but are punished? Here Luther appeals to the inscrutability of God’s plans and purposes, into which we are not entitled to probe:

[W]hy that majesty of his does not remove or change this defect of our will in all men, since it is not in man’s power to do so, or why he imputes this defect to man, when man cannot help having it, we have no right to inquire; and though you may do a lot of inquiring, you will never find out. It is as Paul says in Romans 11 [sic; the correct reference is 9:20]: “Who are you, to answer back to God?” (WA 18:686/LW 33:140)

Likewise, Luther goes on to argue that when it comes to rewards, these are similarly unearned, where to think otherwise will only lead to a kind of works righteousness.

Finally, in the concluding discussion of this third part of his text, Luther repeats a claim he has made at several previous points: namely, that if Erasmus’s arguments prove anything, they prove too much, by establishing the full-blown Pelagianism Erasmus thinks he can avoid. For, if the arguments from “ought implies can” and from imputation are taken seriously at all, then they would establish that we are not merely free to the limited degree Erasmus claims, but are fully free to do the good, so that “if anything is proved, complete freedom of choice is proved with it”—but this is “a complete subversion” of what Erasmus wanted to show, as he tried instead to argue for the more moderate view that “such a free choice can do nothing good and is in bondage to sin” (WA 18:696/LW 33:156). Luther claims, therefore, that Erasmus’s position undermines itself.

In the fourth part, Luther now considers Erasmus’s arguments challenging those scriptural passages which seem to count against free choice, such as Exodus 9:12: “The Lord hardened the heart of Pharaoh”. Luther criticises not only Erasmus’s various interpretative suggestions, but also his motives in offering them, which is to try to make God’s actions morally comprehensible to our reason, rather than simply accepting the goodness of God (WA 18:707–8/LW 33:173–4). He goes on to suggest that for our reason to ask for more than this, and to insist that God is constrained by certain moral norms, is to violate God’s omnipotence, thus leading Luther to take clear sides on the so-called Euthyphro dilemma, in adopting a form of voluntarism that may be traced back to Duns Scotus and to Ockham:

He is God, and for his will there is no cause or reason that can be laid down as a rule or measure for it, since there is nothing equal or superior to it, but it is itself the rule of all things. For if there were any rule or standard for it, either as cause or reason, it could no longer be the will of God. For it is not because he is or was obliged so to will that what he wills is right, but on the contrary, because he himself so wills, therefore what happens must be right. Cause and reason can be assigned for a creature’s will, but not for the will of the Creator, unless you set up over him another creator. (WA 18:712/LW 33:181)

Luther then follows Erasmus’s discussion, in turning from this text to Paul’s discussion of it in Romans 9:15–18, which raises the issue of divine foreknowledge, and how that relates to free choice in human beings. In considering this issue, Erasmus had made use of the scholastic distinction between the necessity of the consequence and the necessity of the consequent, arguing that while it may be that if God wills something it happens necessarily (necessity of the consequence), it does not follow that this happening is necessary (necessity of the consequent), thus leaving space for free choice (Erasmus 1524 [1969: 66–8]). In response, Luther argues that divine foreknowledge makes this distinction moot: for if we allow this foreknowledge, then what God knows must happen necessarily otherwise he could not know it infallibly in advance; and if God did not have this knowledge,

you take away faith and fear of God, make havoc of all the divine promises and threatenings, and thus deny his very divinity. (WA 18:715/LW 33:186)

Luther thus rejects Erasmus’s attempt to leave any space for free choice, given divine foreknowledge (for Erasmus’s response, see Erasmus 1527 [1999: 493–520]):

If God foreknows that Judas will turn traitor, or that he will change his will to betray, whichever God has foreknown will necessarily come about, or else God will be mistaken in his foreknowing and predicting, which is impossible. (WA 18:722/LW 33:194–5)

After the discussion of some other relevant scriptural passages, Luther returns to consider Erasmus’s motives in resisting what Luther takes to be the plain meaning of these texts in his conclusion of this fourth part—which is that Erasmus wishes to constrain God within the bounds of what is comprehensible to human reason, and so refuses to let God be God. In response, Luther writes:

Human nature [caro] does not think fit to give God such glory as to believe him just and good when he speaks and acts above and beyond what the Code of Justinian has laid down, or the fifth book of Aristotle’s Ethics. The Majesty that is the creator of all must bow down to one of the dregs of his creation, and the famed Corycian cavern must reverse its role and stand in awe of the spectators!… [W]hat becomes of the potter’s power to make what he likes, if he is subjected to merits and laws and not allowed to make what he likes, but required to make what he ought? (WA 18:729–30/LW 33:206–7)

Furthermore, Luther argues, if we did try to hold God to human norms of justice, we should be as critical of divine grace and forgiveness, which also violates these norms—or if it does not, and God rewards only those who deserve it, then in the case of someone who receives this reward in full, their goodness must be wholly due to their will, thus denying a role for grace at all (WA 33:733/LW 33:211). Luther argues once again, therefore, that Erasmus’s argument overshoots and so undermines itself.

In the fifth part of his text, Luther moves on to discussing Erasmus’s arguments over the scriptural passages which Luther had used to challenge free choice in his Assertio. In response and in defending his own interpretation of those passages, Luther makes a number of similar points to those used in previous parts, such as: Erasmus ignores the convicting sense of the law (WA 18:736/LW 33:216); he confuses lack of free choice with coercion (WA 18:747/LW 33:233); he treats free choice as if it could occupy normatively neutral ground (WA 18:750/LW 33:237); and his argument overshoots, so that if followed consistently it results in Pelagianism (WA 18:755/LW 33:245). Likewise, in the sixth part, when offering further passages against free choice, Luther again reiterates his earlier arguments, particularly that works in accordance with the law do not justify (WA 18:764/LW 33:258); that the role of the law is to bring knowledge of sin (WA 18:766/LW 33:261); that Erasmus’s position is an unstable form of semi-Pelagianism (WA 18:769–70/LW 33:267–8); that divine foreknowledge and predestination leave no room for free choice (WA 18:772–3/LW 33:272); that free choice is not in a neutral space between good and evil (WA 18:779/LW 33:281–2); and that our dominion over creation does not entail that we have free choice in relation to God (WA 18:281/LW 33:284–5). In the concluding pages, Luther makes vividly clear the underlying spiritual concerns which motivate his position: namely that for salvation to be dependent on the properly used free choice of the believer is to leave the believer in the sort of uncertainty regarding salvation which had plagued Luther’s own earlier spiritual life, and which he was now thankful to have escaped, once he saw that “God has taken my salvation out of my hands into his, making it dependent on his choice and not mine” (WA 18:783/LW 33:289). Moreover, he adds the Christological argument: if human beings had the capacity to save themselves through their choices, Christ would have died in vain.

5. Luther’s Ethics and Social Philosophy

Luther’s rethinking of these issues of grace and salvation were not seen by him as merely concerning the individual’s relation to God, but also to have wider ethical and social implications concerning the relation of individuals to one another, and of individuals to the community to which they belong. It is thus clear throughout his writings that Luther saw his transition from “justification through works” to “justification through faith” as having a major impact on his conception of ethics and social philosophy.

At the centre of Christian ethics is the commandment to love one’s neighbour; but Luther thinks this is only properly understood and made possible on his account of our relation to God, for a variety of reasons. First, if justification it to be earned through works, our justification remains uncertain in a way that fuels the kind of introspective anxiety that makes it impossible to love the neighbour, by instead turning us in on ourselves.[30] Second, these works become instrumental in earning our own salvation, thus no longer involving genuine concern for our neighbour but only for our own well-being.[31] Third, the works that will be our primary focus are religious works such as penance, and thus not ethical ones that concern the neighbour.[32] Fourth, if we think we can achieve good works without a prior act of grace, this will fuel a pride and sense of self-cultivated virtuousness which will cause us to look down on the neighbour rather than love them, a difficulty that leads Luther to be critical of the kind of virtue ethics associated with the Aristotelian tradition.[33] Thus, by starting with justification through works we will be unable to truly love the neighbour, for as we have seen, this love will be blocked by a mixture of anxiety about our own salvation and pride at our own achievements, so finally the most we will be able manage in relation to the neighbour is a kind of dutiful obedience of the commandment as a law, which itself gets in the way of a genuine attitude of love.

By contrast, Luther argues, once we move from justification through works to justification through faith, love of the neighbour becomes possible as these obstacles are removed. Instead of feeling both anxious and prideful, the believer is released from this anxiety through the promise of a grace that does not have to be earned, and from their pride by realising that this grace is unmerited. This frees the individual from their self-absorption which had turned them in on themselves, and enables them to face outwards towards the neighbour, who they no longer view as an instrument to their own salvation. In experiencing God’s love of us through grace, and of Christ’s giving of himself for us, we then turn to express this love not only to God, but also to pass on this gift to the neighbour, thereby doing the good works we ought to do in a spontaneous way rather than feeling compelled to act in an imperatival manner.[34] This shift in perspective is captured by Luther’s famously dialectical claim in The Freedom of the Christian: “A Christian is a perfectly free lord of all, subject to none”, in so far as the Christian is freed from following the law in an instrumental manner and out of fear for its penalties; on the other hand “A Christian is a perfectly dutiful servant of all, subject to all” (WA 7:21 (German), 7:49 (Latin)/LW 31:344), as the Christian feels a gratitude to God and to Christ that also opens them up to their neighbour, who they serve in love.[35] Luther thus insists that works still play a fundamental role in the Christian life, but a role that takes a different and healthier form.

Likewise, as Luther made particularly clear towards the end of his life in his dispute with Johann Agricola (1494–1566) in his open letter Against the Antinomians (1539) and associated Disputations (1537–40), whilst the freedom of the Christian means that they are freed from a kind of subjection to the law and fulfilling it plays no role in their salvation, this does not mean that they are somehow outside or beyond the law, and nor does this mean that the preaching of the law should play no part in the life of the Church. As regards the latter point, we have already seen that consciousness of law can play an important “convicting” role in leading to the kind of despair that opens us up to grace. And as regards the former point, while the Christian qua Christian will not feel the law as a constraint or as a vehicle for salvation, this does not mean that the law does not apply to them. Luther also presents himself as occupying a similar middle position when it comes to ceremonial laws (cf. The Freedom of the Christian WA 7:70–3/LW 31:375–77).[36]

Moreover, Luther’s theological anthropology of course recognizes that we are not just Christian, but also have to deal with the “outer man” or “fallen man” who still requires control, so that the Christian who is also human will find it hard not to see the law as something before which they are required to submit, though they will do so willingly. Likewise and more generally, the Christian lives in a society in which not all are good, so that laws are required in order to constrain the behaviour of the wicked—which alongside its “convicting” use, is the other function of the law in Luther’s account.[37] Such laws will require authority in those who institute and enforce them, an authority grounded in the important role that these public bodies play in enabling fallen human beings to live together, and thus in fulfilling God’s purposes for the world.

In recognizing how far law and the legitimacy of public authorities and social structures rest on the role of both in furthering the ends of God’s creation, there is an important connection between Luther’s ethics and social philosophy and the theistic natural law tradition. Moreover, Luther forms part of this tradition in frequently arguing on the basis of Paul’s statement in Romans 2:15, that this natural law “is written in the depth of the heart and cannot be erased” (Against the Antinomians WA 50:471/LW 47:110), so that human beings are naturally born with a knowledge of fundamental moral precepts, which are accessible to us through reason and felt through conscience. However, the Fall has impacted on this knowledge, which is why there can also be a place for a law that is revealed to us, as Moses did to the people of Israel, and preached on that basis, though in doing so what is revealed does not provide us with a new law, but reawakens our awareness of the law that is written on our hearts.[38] Furthermore, while the decalogue is fundamental and eternal,[39] other aspects of the law of Moses are more context specific and require further elaboration.[40] In some discussions, however, Luther distinguishes between the natural law which applies and is known to all and which “even the heathen, Turks, and Jews have to keep if there is to be any peace or order in the world”, and “the law of Christ, and of the gospel, which is not binding on the heathen”, and which requires more than the former law, such as love of the enemy and the willingness “to give up life and property, and let whoever takes it have it”, and thus if necessary to set aside temporal goods (Admonition to Peace, 1525, WA 18:307–311/LW 46:27–29).

This distinction reflects a wider distinction in Luther’s ethics and social philosophy, between the structures necessary to enable the flourishing of fallen human beings as parts of God’s creation, and a concern with our spiritual lives to which different considerations apply. This distinction is reflected in Luther’s well-known but complex and evolving distinction between “two kingdoms” [die zwei Reiche] and the related distinction between “two governments” (or “regiments”) [die zwei Regimente]. The worldly or temporal kingdom is where human beings live within the world, which is structured by God to make this possible into three “orders” or “hierarchies” or “estates”, which were the politia or civitas, the oeconomia, and the ecclesia, namely government and state, the household and economic human interactions more generally, and the Church. The individual then has an office or calling or station within these various orders, which because these are divinely ordained are a way for individuals within their station to serve God, and may give some individuals in certain offices authority over others. Within the worldly kingdom, therefore, there are also worldly authorities operating at the political and social level (including within the Church), who should exercise that authority with a view to enabling fallen human beings within God’s creation to live together as well as they can; they therefore do not get that authority from the world, or exercise it on their own behalf, so that in this sense they also fall under divine authority and are subordinated to God’s spiritual kingdom, while nonetheless remaining distinguishable from it in terms of their primary focus, which is “life and property and external affairs on earth” (Temporal Authority, 1523, WA 11:265–6/LW 45:111–2). By contrast,

[t]he spiritual government or authority [Regiment oder Amt] pointed Christians above itself, towards God, to do right and find salvation. (WA 51:241/LW 13:197)

As this is the kingdom of grace, and God’s grace is present in Christ, it is ruled by Christ who brings the gospel and grace to human beings, in conjunction with the Holy Spirit. As a spiritual being who is also a citizen of the world, the Christian therefore lives under both governments, as well as a two-fold law, reflected in the distinction between the natural and Christian law outlined above.[41]

This complex structure obviously raises the question of how these two aspects of the Christian life can be related, and whether they can come into conflict. Luther’s position here is nuanced, as while he distinguishes between these aspects in the way we have seen, he does not treat them dualistically as is sometimes suggested, by separating off the this-worldly from the other-worldly, the temporal from the spiritual, the outer from the inner, or social life from the individual’s relation to God. Rather, in On Temporal Authority, Luther argues that while “no one can become righteous in the sight of God by means of the temporal government” (1523, WA 11:252/LW 45:92), and while Christians who have the Holy Spirit in their heart have no need of such a government to constrain them (1523, WA 11:249–50/LW 45:88–9), nonetheless the Christian who is enabled by God’s love to love the neighbour will thereby be engaged with what this requires of them in the world as a result of this neighbour love, including occupying its various offices and upholding its laws, which can include if necessary exercising force over others.[42] The Christian will not adopt these practices for their own good, or think that following them counts as a route to their own salvation; but they will see that these practices can be necessary for the good of the neighbour, and that love for the neighbour will therefore involve not withdrawing from the world into spiritual other-worldliness and isolation, but engaging with it.

However, this approach of course gives rise to a further question: namely, under what conditions should the Christian be committed to supporting the secular authorities, particularly when their power is made greater through Luther’s downgrading of the authority of the Church in temporal matters. This issue was made vivid for Luther in the context of the Peasants’ Revolt discussed above. On the one hand, Luther places limits on political obedience, as princes have no absolute authority but are merely the “masks” or larvae of God, and so are themselves constrained to act as God ordained, and so for the good of their people and in accordance with God’s word; the people of a prince who does wrong in these terms are therefore not required to obey him.[43] Moreover, such princes are not to compel their citizens on matters of faith, which do not fall under their jurisdiction.[44] On the other hand, as the individual Christian should ultimately have little concern for their own temporal interests, if the secular power acts against those interests, the Christian will not see this as giving them a right to rebel and overthrow the secular power,[45] while only God can act as its judge and inflict punishment upon those who rule.[46] It remains a matter of dispute whether Luther succeeded in striking a stable balance here, as on other issues discussed above.

6. Luther’s Influence

Luther’s thinking exerted a considerable influence not only on his own time and on his immediate contemporaries, but also on those who have come after him. While his most significant impact has of course been in theology, and while it would be wrong to suggest that there is anything like a Lutheran school in philosophy, nonetheless Luther has played an important role for a range of key philosophical figures from Hobbes and Leibniz, to Heidegger. This impact is considered in more detail in a separate entry, as well as his influence on “modernity” more broadly. For a fuller discussion, see the entry on Luther’s influence on philosophy.


Abbreviations for references to Luther’s works

  • [WA] D. Martin Luthers Werke: Kritische Gesamtausgabe, 65 vols in 127. Weimar: Hermann Böhlau, 1883–1929, Abteilung 1: Schriften vols 1–56.
  • [WA TR] D. Martin Luthers Werke: Kritische Gesamtausgabe, 65 vols in 127. Weimar: Hermann Böhlau, 1883–1929, Abteilung 2: Tischreden vols 1–6.
  • [WA DB] D. Martin Luthers Werke: Kritische Gesamtausgabe, 65 vols in 127. Weimar: Hermann Böhlau, 1883–1929. Abteilung 3: Die Deutsche Bibel vols 1–12.
  • [LW] Luther’s Works, American edition, 55 vols. St Louis and Philadephia: Concordia and Fortress Press, 1958–86; new series, vols 56–75, 2009–.

Other Works by Luther

  • The Sermons of Martin Luther, edited by John Lenker, 8 vols (Reprint: Grand Rapids: Baker, 1989).
  • The Book of Concord, edited by Robert Kolb and Timothy J. Wengert, Minneapolis, MN: Fortress Press, 2000.
  • Only the Decalogue Is Eternal: Martin Luther’s Complete Antinomian Theses and Disputations, edited and translated by Holger Sonntag, Minneapolis, MN: Lutheran Press, 2008.
  • Martin Luther, the Bible, and the Jewish People: A Reader, Brooks Schramm and Kirsi Stjerna (eds.), Minneapolis: Fortress Press, 2012.
  • A Commentary on St. Paul’s Epistles to the Galatians, Based on Lectures Delivered at the University of Wittenberg, in the Year 1531, 1531/1575 [1953], Philip S. Watson (ed.), London: James Clark. A revised and completed translation based on the “Middleton” edition of the English version of 1575.

Useful collections of some of Luther’s main writings

  • Martin Luther: Selections from his Writings, edited by John Dillenberger, Garden City: Anchor Books, 1961.
  • The Ninety-Five Theses and Other Writings, William Russell (trans.), Harmondsworth: Penguin, 2017.
  • The Annotated Luther, edited by Timothy J. Wengert et al., 6 vols., Minneapolis, MN: Fortress Press, 2015–17.

Translations have been modified where necessary.

Luther’s Life and Work

Primary texts

  • Luther, Martin, 1545, “Preface to the Complete Edition of Luther’s Latin Writings” (WA 54:179–87/LW 34:323–38).

Secondary texts

  • Brecht, Martin, 1981 [1985], Martin Luther: sein Weg zur Reformation, 1483–1521, Stuttgart: Calwer. Translated as Martin Luther: His Road to Reformation, 1483–1521, James L. Schaaf (trans.), Minneapolis, MN: Fortress Press, 1985.
  • –––, 1986 [1990], Martin Luther: Zweiter Band: Ordnung und Abgrenzung der Reformation, 1521–1532, Stuttgart: Calwer. Translated as Martin Luther: Shaping and Defining the Reformation, 1521–1532, James L. Schaaf (trans.), Minneapolis, MN: Fortress Press, 1990.
  • –––, 1987 [1993], Martin Luther : Dritter Band : Die Erhaltung der Kirche, 1532–1546, Stuttgart: Calwer. Translated as Martin Luther: The Preservation of the Church, 1532–1546, James L. Schaaf (trans.), Minneapolis, MN: Fortress Press, 1993.
  • Carlyle, Thomas, 1841, On Heroes, Hero-Worship, and The Heroic in History, London: James Fraser. Reprinted 1983, New York: Chelsea House.
  • Ebeling, Gerhard, 1964 [1970], Einführung in sein Denken, Tübingen: J.C.B. Mohr. Translated as Luther: An Introduction to his Thought, R. A. Wilson (trans.), Philadelphia, PA: Fortress Press, 1970.
  • Erikson, Erik H., 1958, Young Man Luther: A Study in Psychoanalysis and History, New York: Norton.
  • Helmer, Christine, 2019, How Luther Became the Reformer, Louisville, KY: Westminster John Knox Press.
  • Hendrix, Scott H., 2015, Martin Luther: Visionary Reformer, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.
  • Leppin, Volker, 2010 [2017a], Martin Luther: vom Mönch zum Feind des Papstes Darmstadt: WBG. Translated as Martin Luther: A Late Medieval Life, Rhys Bezzant and Karen Roe (trans.), Grand Rapids, MI: Baker Academic, 2017.
  • Melanchthon, Philip, 1546 [1834–60], “Oratio in funere D. Martini Lutheri”. Reprinted in Corpus Reformatorum, Carolus Gottlieb Bretschneider (ed.), Halix Saxonum: C. A. Schwetschke, 1834–60, vol 11, 726–734.
  • Metaxas, Eric, 2017, Martin Luther: The Man Who Rediscovered God and Changed the World, New York: Viking.
  • Oberman, Heiko Augustinus, 1977 [1981], Werden und Wertung der Reformation, J. C. B. Mohl: Tübingen. Revised, abridged, and translated as Masters of the Reformation: The Emergence of a New Intellectual Climate in Europe, Dennis Martin (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511897399
  • –––, 1982 [1989], Luther: Mensch zwischen Gott und Teufel, Berlin: Severin und Seidler. Translated as Luther: Man Between God and the Devil, Eileen Walliser-Schwarzbart (trans.), New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.
  • Rex, Richard, 2017a, The Making of Martin Luther, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University.
  • Roper, Lyndal, 2016, Martin Luther: Renegade and Prophet, London: Bodley Head.
  • Schilling, Heinz, 2012 [2017], Martin Luther: Rebell in einer Zeit des Umbruchs, München: C. H. Beck. Translated as Martin Luther: Rebel in an Age of Upheaval, Rona Johnston (trans.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2017.

Theology and Philosophy

Primary texts

  • Luther, Martin, 1518, The Heidelberg Disputation (WA 1:353–74/LW 31:35–70).
  • –––, 1536, Disputation Concerning Man (WA 39.1:175–80/LW 34:133–44).
  • –––, 1539, Disputation Concerning the Passage: “The Word Was Made Flesh” (John 1:14) (WA 39.2:3–30/LW 38:235–77).

Secondary texts

  • Barone, Marco, 2017, Luther’s Augustinian Theology of the Cross, Eugene, OR: Resource Publications.
  • Becker, Sigbert W., 1999, The Foolishness of God: The Place of Reason in the Theology of Martin Luther, second edition, Milwaukee, WI: Wisconsin Publishing House.
  • Bielfeldt, Dennis, 1990, “Luther, Metaphor, and Theological Language”, Modern Theology, 6(2): 121–135. doi:10.1111/j.1468-0025.1990.tb00211.x
  • –––, 2002a, “Luther on Language”, Lutheran Quarterly, 16: 195–220.
  • –––, 2002b, “Luther and the Strange Language of Theology: How ‘New’ is the Nova Lingua?”, in Caritas et Reformatio: Essays on Church and Society in Honor of Carter Lindberg, Carter Lindberg and David Mark Whitford (eds.), St Louis, MI: Concordia Publishing House, pp. 221–244.
  • Bielfeldt, Dennis D., Mickey Leland Mattox, and Paul R. Hinlicky, 2008, The Substance of the Faith: Luther’s Doctrinal Theology for Today, Minneapolis, MN: Fortress Press.
  • Bianchi, Luca, 2008, Pour une histoire de la “double verité”, Paris: Vrin.
  • Blanshard, Brand, 1974, Reason and Belief, London: George Allen & Unwin, Chapter 5 (“Reason and Faith in Luther”). [Blanshard 1974 available online]
  • Bornkamm, Heinrich, 1959, “Faith and Reason in the Thought of Erasmus and Luther”, in Religion and Culture: Essays in Honor of Paul Tillich, Walter Leibrecht (ed.), New York: Harper, pp. 133–139.
  • Büttgen, Philippe, 2011, Luther et la Philosophie, Paris: Vrin.
  • Dalferth, Ingolf U., 1988, Theology and Philosophy, Oxford: Blackwell, Chapter 7 (“The Law-Gospel Method”), pp. 76–88.
  • Dieter, Theodor, 2009, “Martin Luther”, in Early Modern Philosophy of Religion, Graham Oppy and N. N. Trakakis (eds.), London: Routledge, pp. 33–46.
  • –––, 2011, “Martin Luther’s Understanding of ‘Reason’”, Lutheran Quarterly, 25: 249–78
  • Ebeling, Gerhard, 1977, Disputatio de homine: Erster Teil: Text und Traditionshintergrund, Tübingen: Mohr.
  • –––, 1982, Disputatio de homine: Zweiter Teil: Die philosophische Definition des Menschen, Tübingen: Mohr.
  • –––, 1989, Disputatio de homine: Dritter Teil: Die theologische Definition des Menschen, Tübingen: Mohr.
  • Forde, Gerhard O., 1997, On Being a Theologian of the Cross: Reflections on Luther’s Heidelberg Disputations, 1518, Grand Rapids, MI: Eerdmans.
  • Grosshans, Hans-Peter, 2017, “Reason and Philosophy in Martin Luther’s Thought”, in Oxford Research Encyclopedia of Religion, John Barton (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acrefore/9780199340378.013.343
  • Gerrish, B. A., 1962, Grace and Reason: A Study in the Theology of Luther, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Hamm, Berndt, 2010 [2014], Der frühe Luther: Etappen reformatorischer Neuorientierung, Tübingen: Mohr Siebeck. Translated as The Early Luther: Stages in Reformation Reorientation, Martin J. Lohrmann (trans.), Grand Rapids, MI: Eerdmans, 2014.
  • Heine, Heinrich, 1835 [2007], Zur Geschichte der Religion und Philosophie in Deutschland. Translated as On the History of Religion and Philosophy in Germany, Howard Pollack-Milgate (trans.), in On the History of Religion and Philosophy in Germany and Other Writings, Terry Pinkard (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007, pp. 3–120
  • Hockenbery Dragseth, Jennifer (ed), 2011, The Devil’s Whore: Reason and Philosophy in the Lutheran Tradition, Minneapolis, MN: Fortress Press.
  • Kellerman, James A., 2008, “A Pure Critique of Reason: Reason within the Limits of Sound Theology Alone”, Logia, 17(4): 31–38.
  • Kolb, Robert, 2002, “Luther on the Theology of the Cross”, Lutheran Quarterly, 16: 443–466.
  • Leppin, Volker, 2017b, “Luther’s Mystical Roots”, in Melloni 2017: 157–171. doi:10.1515/9783110499025-010
  • Lohse, Bernhard, 1958, Ratio und Fides: Eine Untersuchung über die ratio in der Theologie Luthers, Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht.
  • Luy, David, 2017, “Martin Luther’s Disputations”, in Oxford Research Encyclopedia of Religion, John Barton (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acrefore/9780199340378.013.285
  • Malter, Rudolf, 1980, Das reformatorische Denken und die Philosophie: Luthers Entwurf einer transzendental-praktischen Metaphysik, Bonn: Bouvier.
  • Marshall, Bruce D., 1999, “Faith and Reason Reconsidered: Aquinas and Luther on Deciding What Is True”, The Thomist: A Speculative Quarterly Review, 63(1): 1–48. doi:10.1353/tho.1999.0041
  • Mattes, Mark, 2013, “Luther’s Use of Philosophy”, Lutherjahrbuch, 80: 110–141.
  • McGrath, Alister E., 1989, Iustitia Dei: A History of the Christian Doctrine of Justification, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press; second edition, 1998; third edition, 2005; fourth edition, 2020. doi:10.1017/9781108560702
  • Popkin, Richard H., 1979, The History of Scepticism from Erasmus to Spinoza, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Rex, Richard, 2017b, “Luther Among the Humanists”, in Melloni 2017: 203–220. doi:10.1515/9783110499025-013
  • Steinmetz, David C., 1980, Luther and Staupitz: An Essay on the Intellectual Origins of the Protestant Reformation, Durham, NC: Duke University Press.
  • Vercruysse, Joseph E., 1981, “Gesetz und Leibe: die Struktur der ‘Heidelberger Disputation’ Luthers”, Lutherjahrbuch, 68: 7–43.
  • Zur Mühlen, Karl-Heinz, 1984, “Luthers Kritik der Vernunft im Mittelalterlichen und Neuzeitlichen Kontext”, in Lutheriana: zum 500. Geburtstag Martin Luthers, pp. 3–15.

Luther, Aristotle, and Nominalism

Primary texts

  • Luther, Martin, 1517, Disputation Against Scholastic Theology (WA 1:224–8/LW 31:3–16).
  • –––, 1522, “Preface to the Epistle of St Paul to the Romans” (WA DB 7:2–27/LW 35:365–80).
  • –––, 1526, The Disputation Concerning Justification (WA 39.1/LW 34:145–96).

Secondary texts

  • Andreatta, Eugenio, 1996, Lutero e Aristotele, Padova: Nuova Vita.
  • Balserak, Jon, 2017, “The Medieval Heritage of Martin Luther”, in Melloni 2017: 141–156. doi:10.1515/9783110499025-009
  • Bielfeldt, Dennis, 2016, “Martin Luther and Ontology”, in Oxford Research Encyclopedia of Religion, John Barton (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acrefore/9780199340378.013.351
  • Braaten, Carl and Robert Jenson (eds.), 1998, Union with Christ: The New Finnish Interpretation, Grand Rapids, MI: Eerdmans.
  • Carlisle, Clare, 2013, “The Question of Habit in Theology and Philosophy: From Hexis to Plasticity”, Body & Society, 19(2–3): 30–57. doi:10.1177/1357034X12474475
  • Dieter, Theodor, 2001, Der junge Luther und Aristotles, Berlin: Walter de Gruyter.
  • –––, 2014, “Luther as Late Medieval Theologian: His Positive and Negative Use of Nominalism and Realism”, in The Oxford Handbook to Martin Luther’s Theology, Robert Kolb, Irene Dingel and L’Ubomír Bakta (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 31–48
  • –––, 2017, “Scholasticisms in Martin Luther’s Thought”, in Oxford Research Encyclopedia of Religion, John Barton (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acrefore/9780199340378.013.265
  • Eckermann, Willigis, 1978, “Die Aristoteleskritik Luthers: ihre Bedeutung für seine Theologie”, Catholica, 32: 114–30.
  • Ghiselli, Anja, Kari Kopperi, and Rainer Vinke (eds.), 1993, Luther und Ontologie, Helsinki: Luther-Agricola Society.
  • Grane, Leif, 1962, Contra Gabrielem: Luthers Auseinandersetzung mit Gabriel Biel in der Disputatio contra scholasticam theologiam 1517, Copenhagen: Gyldendal.
  • –––, 1969, “Luthers Kritik an Thomas von Aquin in De Captivitate Babylonica”, Zeitschrift für Kirchengeschichte, 80: 1–13.
  • –––, 1970, “Die Anfänge von Luthers Auseinandersetzung mit dem Thomismus”, Theologische Literaturzeitung, 95: 241–250.
  • Hägglund, Bengt, 1955, Theologie und Philosophie bei Luther und in der occamistischen Tradition, Lund: C W K Gleerup.
  • –––, 1957, “Was Luther a Nominalist?”, Concordia Theological Monthly, 28(6): 441–452.
  • Hampson, Daphne, 2001, Christian Contradictions: The Structures of Lutheran and Catholic Thought, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511487743
  • Janz, Denis R., 1983, Luther and Late Medieval Thomism, Waterloo: Wilfrid Laurier University Press.
  • –––, 1989, Luther on Thomas Aquinas, Stuttgart: Franz Steiner Verlag.
  • Joest, Wilfried, 1967, Ontologie der Person bei Luther, Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht.
  • Juntunen, Sammeli, 1998, “Luther and Metaphysics”, in Union with Christ: The New Finnish Interpretation of Luther, Carl Braaten and Robert Jenson (eds.), Grand Rapids, MI: Eerdmans, pp. 129–160.
  • Kärkkäinen, Pekka, 2017, “Nominalism and the Via Moderna in Luther’s Theological Work”, in Oxford Research Encyclopedia of Religion, John Barton (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acrefore/9780199340378.013.266
  • Kärkkäinen, Veli-Matti, 2006, “Salvation as Justification and Theosis: The Contribution of the New Finnish Luther Interpretation to Our Ecumenical Future1”, Dialog: A Journal of Theology, 45(1): 74–82. doi:10.1111/j.0012-2033.2006.00296.x
  • Kirjavainen, Heikki, 1984, “Luther und Aristoteles: Die Frage der zweierlei Gerechtigkeit im Lichte der transitiven vs. intransitiven Willenstheorie”, in Luther in Finnland, Mikka Ruokanen (ed.), Helsinki: Schriften der Luther-Agricola-Gesellschaft, pp. 111–129.
  • Kohls, Ernst-Wilhelm, 1975, “Luthers Verhältnis zu Aristoteles, Thomas und Erasmus”, Theologische Zeitschrift, 31: 289–301.
  • Kusukawa, Sachiko, 1995, “Law and Gospel: The Reforms of Luther and Melanchthon”, in The Transformation of Natural Philosophy: The Case of Philip Melanchthon, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 27–74.
  • McGrath, Alister E., 1985, Luther’s Theology of the Cross, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Oberman, Heiko A., 1992, The Dawn of the Reformation: Essays in Late Medieval and Early Reformation Thought, Grand Rapids, MI: Eerdmans.
  • –––, 1963 [2000], The Harvest of Medieval Theology: Gabriel Biel and Late Medieval Nominalism, Harvard: Harvard University Press; reprinted Grand Rapids, MI: Baker, 2000.
  • –––, 2003, “Luther and the Via Moderna: The Philosophical Backdrop of the Reformation Breakthrough”, The Journal of Ecclesiastical History, 54(4): 641–670. doi:10.1017/S0022046903008005
  • Oehlschläger, Gerhard, 2003, “Der junge Luther und Aristoteles”, LutherJahrbuch, 70: 93–125.
  • Oliva, Adriano, 2012, “Luther et la philosophie: Sur un ouvrage récent”, Revue des sciences philosophiques et théologiques, 96(2): 293–312. doi:10.3917/rspt.962.0293
  • Osborne, Thomas, 2002, “Faith, Philosophy, and the Nominalist Background to Luther’s Defense of the Real Presence”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 63(1): 63–82. doi:10.1353/jhi.2002.0006
  • Pesch, Otto Hermann, 1967, Theologie der Rechtfertigung bei Martin Luther und Thomas von Aquin: Versuch eines systematisch-theologischen Dialogs, Mainz: Grünwald.
  • Vignaux, Paul, 1971, “On Luther and Ockham”, in The Reformation in Medieval Perspective, Steven E. Ozment (ed.), Chicago: Quadrangle Books, pp. 107–118.
  • White, Graham, 1994, Luther as Nominalist: A Study of the Logical Methods Used in Martin Luther’s Disputations in the Light of their Medieval Background, Helsinki: Luther-Agricola-Society.
  • Wicks, Jared, 2007, “Luther and ‘This Damned, Conceited, Rascally Heathen’ Aristotle: An Encounter More Complicated than Many Think”, Pro Ecclesia: A Journal of Catholic and Evangelical Theology, 16(1): 90–104. doi:10.1177/106385120701600108
  • Zur Mühlen, Karl-Heinz, 1981, “Luthers Kritik am scholastischen Aristotelismus in der 25. These der ‘Heidelberger Disputation’ von 1518”, Lutherjahrbuch, 48: 54–79.

Luther on Free Will

Primary texts

  • Luther, Martin, 1525, The Bondage of the Will (WA 18: 600–787/LW 33:3–295).
  • Erasmus, Desiderius, 1524 [1969], On the Freedom of the Will, E. Gordon Rupp and A. N. Marlow (trans.), in Luther and Erasmus: Free Will and Salvation, Philadelphia, PA: The Westminster Press, 1969, pp. 35–100. Also translated by Peter Macardle in Erasmus 1999: vol 76, pp. 4–90.
  • –––, 1526, Hyperaspistes diatribae adversus servum arbitrium M. Lutheri, translated by Clarence H. Miller as A Warrior Shielding A Discussion of Free Will Against the Enslaved Will by Martin Luther, book one, in Erasmus 1999: vol 76, pp. 91–298.
  • –––, 1527, Hyperaspistes diatribae adversus servum arbitrium M. Lutheri, translated by Clarence H. Miller as A Warrior Shielding A Discussion of Free Will Against the Enslaved Will by Martin Luther, book two, in Erasmus 1999: vol 77, pp. 334–749.
  • –––, 1999, Collected Works of Erasmus, Charles Trinkaus (ed.), Peter Macardle and Clarence H. Miller (trans.), Toronto: University of Toronto Press.

Secondary texts

  • Alfsvåg, Knut, 2015, “Luther on Necessity”, Harvard Theological Review, 108(1): 52–69. doi:10.1017/S0017816015000036
  • Boisset, Jean, 1962, Érasmus et Luther: Libre ou serf-arbitre?, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France.
  • Boyle, Marjorie O’Rourke, 1982, “Stoic Luther: Paradoxical Sin and Necessity”, Archiv für Reformationsgeschichte, 73: 69–93.
  • Forde, Gerhard O., 2005, The Captivation of the Will: Luther vs Erasmus on Freedom and Bondage, Grand Rapids, MI: William B. Eerdmans Publishing Company.
  • Fromm, Erich, 2001, The Fear of Freedom, second edition, Abingdon: Routledge.
  • Gaebler, Mary, 2013, The Courage of Faith: Martin Luther and the Theonomous Self, Minneapolis, MN: Fortress Press.
  • Hodgson, Peter C., 2009, “Luther and Freedom”, in The Global Luther: A Theologian For Our Times, Christine Helmer (ed.), Minneapolis, MN: Fortress Press, pp. 32–48.
  • Jenson, Robert W., 1994, “An Ontology of Freedom in the De Servo Arbitrio of Luther”, Modern Theology, 10(3): 247–252. doi:10.1111/j.1468-0025.1994.tb00039.x
  • Kolb, Robert, 2005, Bound Choice, Election, and Wittenberg Theological Method: From Martin Luther to the Formula of Concord, Grand Rapids, MI: William B. Eerdmans Publishing Company.
  • Lodone, Michele, 2017, “Erasmus and Luther: Free and Bound Will”, in Melloni 2017: 281–294. doi:10.1515/9783110499025-017
  • Martin, Wayne, 2009, “Ought but Cannot”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 109(1pt2): 103–128. doi:10.1111/j.1467-9264.2009.00260.x
  • –––, 2010, “The Judgement of Adam: Self-Consciousness and Normative Orientation in Lucas Cranach’s Eden”, in Art and Phenomenology, Joseph D. Parry (ed.), London: Routledge, pp. 105–37.
  • McSorely, H. J., 1969, Luther: Right or Wrong? An Ecumenical-Theological Study of Luther’s Major Work, The Bondage of the Will, Minneapolis, MN: Augsburg Publishing House.
  • Massing, Michael, 2018, Fatal Discord: Erasmus, Luther, and the Fight for the Western Mind, New York: HarperOne.
  • Pigden, Charles R., 1990, “Ought-implies-can: Erasmus, Luther and R. M. Hare”, Sophia, 29: 2–30.
  • Saarinen, Risto, 2011, “The Lutheran Reformation”, in his Weakness of Will in Renaissance and Reformation Thought, Oxford: Oxford University Press, Chapter 3.
  • Smith, John H., 2011, Dialogues Between Faith and Reason: The Death and Return of God in Modern German Thought, Cornell, NY: Cornell University Press, Chapter 1 (“Erasmus vs. Luther: Philo-logos vs. Faith”), pp. 23–44.
  • Trinkaus, Charles, 1999, “Introduction” to Erasmus 1999: vol 76, pp. xi–cvi.
  • Urban, Linwood, 1971, “Was Luther a Thoroughgoing Determinist?”, The Journal of Theological Studies, 22(1): 113–139. doi:10.1093/jts/XXII.I.113

Luther’s Ethics and Social Philosophy

Primary texts

  • Luther, Martin, 1519, Two Kinds of Righteousness (WA 2:145–52/LW 31:293–306).
  • –––, 1520, The Babylonian Captivity of the Church (WA 6:497–573/LW 36:3–126).
  • –––, 1520, The Freedom of the Christian (WA 7: 1–38;42–73/LW 31:327–77).
  • –––, 1520, To the Christian Nobility (WA 6:404–69/LW 44:15–114).
  • –––, 1522, A Sincere Admonition by Martin Luther to All Christians to Guard Against Insurrection and Rebellion (WA 7:676–87/LW 45:51–74).
  • –––, 1522, Invocavit (Eight Wittenberg) Sermons (WA 10.3:1–64/LW 51:70–100).
  • –––, 1523, Temporal Authority: To What Extent It Should Be Obeyed (WA 11:245–80/LW 45:75–129).
  • –––, 1525, Admonition to Peace (WA 18:281–334/LW 46:3–43).
  • –––, 1525, Against the Robbing and Murdering Hordes of Peasants (WA 18:291–334/LW 46:45–55).
  • –––, 1525, An Open Letter on the Harsh Book Against the Peasants (WA 18:357–61/LW 46:47–85).
  • –––, 1526, Whether Soldiers Too Can be Saved (WA 19.2:623–62/LW 46:87–137).
  • –––, 1529, On War Against the Turk (WA 30.2:107–48/LW 46:155–205).
  • –––, 1535, A Commentary on St Paul’s Epistle to the Galatians (WA 40.1:40–688 and 40.2:1–184/LW 26:1–461 and 27:1–144).
  • –––, 1537–40. Antinomian Theses and Disputations (WA 39.1:343–584, WA 39.2:124–44, translated in Holger Sonntag (ed and trans), Only the Decalogue is Eternal: Martin Luther’s Complete Antinomian Theses and Disputations. Minneapolis: Lutheran Press, 2008).
  • –––, 1539, Against the Antinomians (WA 50:468–77/LW 47:99–119).

Secondary texts

  • Alfsvåg, Knut, 2016, “Natural Theology and Natural Law in Martin Luther”, in Oxford Research Encyclopedia of Religion, John Barton (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acrefore/9780199340378.013.368
  • Althaus, Paul, 1965 [2007], Die Ethik Martin Luthers, Gütersloher Verlagshaus G. Mohn. Translated as The Ethics of Martin Luther, Robert C. Schultz (trans.) Minneapolis, MN: Fortress Press, 2007.
  • Andersen, Svend, 2010, Macht aus Liebe: Zur Rekonstruktion einer lutherischen politischen Ethik, Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • –––, 2018, “Two Kingdoms, Three Estates, and Natural Law”, in Lutheran Theology and the Shaping of Society, Bo Kristian Holm and Nina Javette Koefoed (eds.), Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht, 189–214. doi:10.13109/9783666551246.189
  • Baker, Robert C. and Roland Cap Ehlke (eds), 2011, Natural Law: A Lutheran Reappraisal, St. Louis, MO: Concordia.
  • Bayer, Oswald, 1998, “Nature and Institution. Luther’s Doctrine of the Three Estates”, C. Helmer (trans.), Lutheran Quarterly. 7: 125–59.
  • –––, 1995 [2007], Freiheit als Antwort, Tübingen: Mohr Siebeck. Translated as Freedom in Response: Lutheran Ethics: Sources and Controversies, Jeffrey F. Cayzer (trans.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007.
  • Biermann, Joel D., 2014, A Case for Character: Towards a Lutheran Virtue Ethics, Minneapolis, MN: Fortress Press.
  • Bornkamm, Heinrich, 1955 [1966], Luthers Lehre von den zwei Reichen im Zusammenhang seiner Theologie, Gütersloh: Gerd Mohn. Translated as Luther’s Doctrine of the Two Kingdoms in the Context of his Theology, Karl H. Hertz (trans.), Philadelphia: Fortress Press, 1966.
  • Cargill Thompson, W. D. J., 1969, “The ‘Two Kingdoms’ and the ‘Two Regiments’: Some Problems of Luther’s Zwei-Reiche-Lehre”, The Journal of Theological Studies, 20(1): 164–185. doi:10.1093/jts/XX.1.164
  • –––, 1984, The Political Thought of Martin Luther, Brighton: Harvester Press.
  • Carty, Jarrett A., 2017, God and Government: Martin Luther’s Political Thought, Kingston: McGill-Queen’s University Press.
  • Couenhoven, Jesse, 2017, “The Protestant Reformation”, in The Cambridge History of Moral Philosophy, Sacha Golob and Jens Timmermann (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 208–220. doi:10.1017/9781139519267.017
  • Cranz, F. Edward, 1956, An Essay on the Development of Luther’s Thought on Justice, Law and Society, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Estes, James, 2005, Peace, Order and the Glory of God: Secular Authority and the Church in the Thought of Luther and Melanchthon, 1518–1559, Boston: Brill.
  • Heckel, Johannes, 1973 [2010], Lex charitatis: Eine juristische Untersuchung über das Recht in der Theologie Martin Luthers, 2nd edn, Cologne: Verlag Böhlau. Translated as Lex Charitatis: A Justistic Disquisition on Law in the Theology of Martin Luther, Gottfried G. Krodel (trans.), Grand Rapids: Eerdmans.
  • Herdt, Jennifer, 2019, “Natural Law in Protestant Christianity”, in The Cambridge Companion to Natural Law Ethics, Tom Angier (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 155–178. doi:10.1017/9781108525077.009
  • Holm, Bo Kristen, 2019, “Luther, Seneca, and Benevolence in Both Creation and Government”, in Apprehending Love, Pekka Kärkkäinen and Olli-Pekka Vainio (eds.), Helsinki: Luther-Agricola-Society, pp. 287–312.
  • Irwin, Terence, 2007, “The Reformation and Scholastic Moral Philosophy”, in his The Development of Ethics, Volume 1: From Socrates to the Reformation, Oxford: Oxford University Press, Chapter 29.
  • –––, 2012, “Luther’s Attack on Self-Love: The Failure of Pagan Virtue”, Journal of Medieval and Early Modern Studies, 42(1): 131–155. doi:10.1215/10829636-1473127
  • Laffin, Michael Richard, 2016, The Promise of Martin Luther’s Political Theology, London: Bloomsbury.
  • Lazareth, William, 2001, Christians in Society: Luther, the Bible and Social Ethics, Minneapolis, MN: Fortress Press.
  • Lindberg, Carter, 2003, “Luther’s Struggle with Social-Ethical Issues”, in McKim 2003: 165–178. doi:10.1017/CCOL0521816483.010
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair, 1967, “Luther, Machiavelli, Hobbes, and Spinoza”, in his A Short History of Ethics, London: Routledge, Chapter 10.
  • McKim, Donald K. (ed.), 2003, The Cambridge Companion to Martin Luther, Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CCOL0521816483
  • McNeill, John T., 1941, “Natural Law in the Thought of Luther”, Church History, 10(3): 211–227. doi:10.2307/3160251
  • Meilaender, Gilbert, 1988, “The Examined Life is Not Worth Living: Learning from Luther”, in his The Theory and Practice of Virtue, South Bend, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, pp. 100–26.
  • Nitti, Silvana, 2017, “Luther and Political Power”, in Melloni 2017: 241–263. doi:10.1515/9783110499025-015
  • Raunio, Antti, 1998, “Natural Law and Faith: The Forgotten Foundations of Ethics in Luther’s Theology”, in Union with Christ: The New Finnish Interpretation of Luther, Carl E. Braaten and Robert W. Jenson (eds.), Grand Rapids, MI: Eerdmans, pp. 96–124.
  • –––, 2006, “Divine and Natural Law in Luther and Melanchthon”, in Lutheran Reformation and the Law, Virpi Mäkinen (ed.), Leiden: Brill, pp. 21–61.
  • Saarinen, Risto, 2005, “Ethics in Luther’s Theology: The Three Orders”, in Moral Philosophy on the Threshold of Modernity, Jill Kraye and Risto Saarinen (eds.), Dordrecht: Springer, pp. 195–215.
  • Sanders, E. P., 1977, Paul and Palestinian Judaism, London: SCM Press.
  • Schorn-Schütte, Luise, 2017, “Luther and Politics”, in Melloni 2017: 565–577. doi:10.1515/9783110499025-034
  • Skinner, Quentin, 1978, The Foundations of Modern Political Thought: Volume 2: The Age of Reformation, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, Part One. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511817892
  • Troeltsch, Ernst, 1912 [1992], Die Soziallehren der christlichen Kirchen und Gruppen, Tübingen: Mohr Siebeck. Translated as The Social Teaching of the Christian Churches, Volume II, Olive Wyon (trans.), New York: Mcmillan, 1931. Reprinted Louisville, KY: Westminster John Knox Press, 1992.
  • Voegelin, Eric, 1998, History of Political Ideas, Vol. IV: Renaissance and Reformation, in The Collected Works of Eric Voegelin, volume 22, David L. Morse and William M. Thompson (eds.), Columbia: University of Missouri Press.
  • Wannenwetsch, Bernd, 2003, “Luther’s Moral Theology”, in McKim 2003: 120–135. doi:10.1017/CCOL0521816483.007
  • Whitford, David M., 2003, “Luther’s Political Encounters”, in McKim 2003: 179–191. doi:10.1017/CCOL0521816483.011
  • Wingren, Gustav, 1942 [1957], Luthers lära om kallelsen, PhD thesis, Lund: C.W.K. Gleerups Förlag. Translated as The Christian’s Calling: Luther on Vocation, Carl C. Rasmussen (trans.), Philadelphia: Muhlenburg Press, 1957.
  • Witte, John, 2002, Law and Protestantism: The Legal Teachings of the Lutheran Reformation, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511613548
  • Wolin, Sheldon S., 2004, Politics and Vision: Continuity and Innovation in Western Political Thought, expanded edition, Princeton: Princeton University Press, Chapter 5 (“Luther: The Theological and the Political”), pp. 127–147.
  • Wright, William J., 2010, Martin Luther’s Understanding of God’s Two Kingdoms: A Response to the Challenge of Skepticism, Grand Rapids, MI: Baker.

Other Cited Works

  • Boyle, Nicholas, 2008, German Literature: A Very Short Introduction, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/actrade/9780199206599.001.0001
  • Melloni, Alberto (ed.), 2017, Martin Luther: A Christian Between Reforms and Modernity (1517–2017), Berlin: De Gruyter. doi:10.1515/9783110499025

Other Internet Resources


I am grateful to the following for extremely useful comments on previous versions of this entry, and for general discussions of Luther that have helped shape the views expressed herein: Maria Rosa Antognazza, David Bagchi, David Batho, Ryan Byerly, Sophie Grace Chappell, Benjamin Crowe, Theodor Dieter, Josh Furnal, Daphne Hampson, Susanne Herrmann-Sinai, Iona Hine, Bo Christian Holm, Volker Leppin, Wayne Martin, Alister McGrath, John Monfasani, Kees van Kooten Niekerk, Rory Phillips, Simon Podmore, Bjørn Rabjerg, Richard Rex, Daniel Roche, and Joe Saunders.

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