Mind (Heart-Mind) in Chinese Philosophy
This entry covers major views of mind in the period of classical Chinese philosophy (from about the 6th to the end of the 3rd century BCE). The nearest equivalent to the English term for mind in the classical period is xin 心, which originated as a picture of the heart in human beings and animals and directs body’s behavior. Since ethical guidance in Chinese thought arises from both the cognitive function of the mind and the affective states attributed to the heart, xin is frequently translated as “heart-mind”. This translation will be used here. The xin is credited with thinking si 思, understanding míng 明, knowing zhi 知, intention zhi 志, felt moods and/or emotions qing 情, and desire yu 欲. Xin plays a central role in Chinese ethics, epistemology, and metaphysics; and philosophical disputes often turn on how different schools or Masters portray the role of xin. How it arrives at ethical guidance is a central point of contention between those who treat the guidance as internal (Mengzi) to those who treat xin as navigating an external normative structure and those who advocate emptying or ignoring the xin and taking guidance from some other organ or authority.
The term xin plays a major role in the classical texts with the exception of the Mozi, where the discussion of many issues the other texts approach in terms of the heart-mind is couched instead in terms of the knowing zhi 知, the capacity, the awareness or understanding, by which we come to know objects or acquire skills. Despite this difference, the Mozi shares with the other classical texts a major concern for the learning and practice that enables people to act well and appropriately. The texts are profoundly practical, concerned with understanding how the heart-mind or the knowing works (descriptive epistemology, which has surprising connections with contemporary cognitive and neuro-science) and how it should work (normative epistemology). What social influences should be trained into the heart-mind is a central concern of these texts’ normative epistemology.
Persistent issues that arise in Western discussions of the Chinese theory of heart-mind involve its centrality to the person and the world. As discussed below, different conceptions of the heart-mind in the Chinese philosophical tradition motivate important distinctions in the account of its role in the body (the Mengzi and the Xunzi), in knowing and skills or crafts (the Mozi), and in relation to other natural creatures (the Daodejing and the Zhuangzi).
- 1. The heart-mind and its ontological relation to the body in classical Chinese philosophy
- 2. Normative conceptions of the person
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1. The heart-mind and its ontological relation to the body in classical Chinese philosophy
Comparative interpreters frequently address whether the heart-mind is conceived as being separate or ontologically distinct from the body as they are, for example, in Cartesian dualism. The dominant view in scholarship is that Chinese thought is not dualistic in any fashion. The minority view is that it does not fall into ontological dualism, and that it is all the better for avoiding it, but other forms of dualism may fairly be attributed to Chinese thought.
1.1 Holistic interpretations of the relationship between heart-mind and body
Roger T. Ames interprets the heart-mind and body as parts of a process he calls “bodyheartminding”. He identifies the medium of this process as qi (氣), the “vital energy field” (Ames 2015: 173). What we call “things” are persistent yet transitory perturbations of physical and psychic energy. Life is a process of real energy. In a similar vein, François Jullien (2005 ) contrasts the Greek separation of body or “organic being”, and the principle of life or “animation”, (2005 [2007: 56–59]) on the one hand, with the Chinese view that organic being and animation both emerge from qi, “breath-energy”, on the other hand. All things are condensations or coagulations of a “diffuse and invisible flow of energy that wends its way ceaselessly through the world, animating as it goes” (2005 [2007: 76]). In China, the phenomena associated in the West with the soul is light, refined qi (breath) while bone is denser qi. Jullien sees no ontological divide in these graduated distinctions in Chinese thought.
1.2 Critical discussion of holistic interpretations
Ames’s and Jullien’s interpretations treat Chinese philosophy as starting from the unity to which Western monists like Heraclitus, Spinoza, and Whitehead and the pragmatists William James and John Dewey aspired. The matter of modern physics, moreover, is continuous with energy. The puzzles of quantum entanglement suggest the entire universe might be intermeshed in a single holistic process, not a plethora of separable events in mechanistic causal chains.
In Chinese thought, qi constitutes not merely the somatic, bodily dynamics, but also the motivating force of thoughts, emotions, and intentions of the individual. Originally identified with the blood and breath of living animals, Zou Yan’s theory of qi as the stuff of everything became China’s common view. The Mengzi (latinized form “Mencius”, 4th century BCE) postulates a coherence of qi in the world with the qi of the heart-mind. He asserts the will, the capacity of the heart-mind to form aims or intentions, directs (shuai 帥) the body’s qi (Mengzi 2A8). When he is asked what he means by saying that he is good at nourishing his flood-like qi, he answers that his qi is exceedingly great and strong, and if he nourishes it with uprightness (zhi 直), it will fill the space between Heaven and earth (Mengzi 2A14). Qi, cultivated in appropriate ways, realizes the moral virtues attributed to the heart-mind. Mencius’s heart-mind is the part of a person’s qi that has the function of guiding the rest of its qi.
On the other hand, Chinese popular beliefs about ghosts and spirits have been discussed as weighing against or at least calling into question the idea that Chinese thought is free of dualistic tendencies. One such belief that appears in some early Chinese texts, such as the Chunqiu Zuozhuan zhu春秋左傳注), is that if people die a violent death, their po 魄 soul and their hun 魂 soul become stirred up and take malicious action against the living. This suggests the hun and po souls are hived off from the body’s qi, perhaps in a very rarefied form. Nowhere is there a clear and consistent statement ruling this out (Goldin 2015: 62, n. 13). Separate from ghosts, early Chinese texts refer to shen (神) as somethings ghosts may or may not have which gives the capacity for behavior guidance that the living have. It is sometimes depicted as leaving the body at death and taking up residence in a realm where it can be addressed through sacrificial rituals by descendants. Translators routinely render shen as “spirit”, that sapient part of a person that can be cultivated to promote by their behavior what is central or important in the world. (Zhuangzi and Xunzi). Neither bifurcates shen from qi but suggests shen is the special kind of qi that is pure energy—like light.
Paul Goldin points out passages in the Zhuangzi (莊子) where the heart-mind seems to be unaffected by quite drastic changes in the body, e.g., (Zhuangzi, Da Zongshi 大宗師, sec. 5; Goldin 2003: 228). Edward Slingerland (2013) cites another passage in Zhuangzi (De Chong Fu 德充符, sec. 4), a story of piglets who stop nursing at the body of their dead mother and run away, sensing she was not like them. They didn’t love their mothers shape (xing 形) but what moved or commanded (shi 使) it. Slingerland also cites what he describes as a random sample pre-Qin texts, including the recently discovered Guodian texts which he believes to manifest a strong folk belief in a distinction of some sort. He acknowledges that his reading of the passages is controversial but hopes that it is supported by his comprehensive sampling of texts. He allows that the distinction might not be the Western ontological, substance dualism.
The distinction, he notes, is not a fundamental dualism of substance but of a range of phenomena, from the bodily organ xin to the po and hun ghosts to the sapient shen which, Slingerland notes, can be compounded. And in Mengzi 2A, the heart-mind and bodily qi interact: the heart-mind not only commands the qi through its intentions, but can be moved by its qi when it is not unified in its intentions. Unlike Descartes’ mind, xin’s qi can interact with both the body’s qi and the wider qi filling the space between Heaven and earth. That image merges physical stuff, the body and heart-mind in a spiritual and moral, as well as physical, space. It suggests human unity with the rest of the world as an organic whole.
The heart-mind is not only the seat of cognition but also of emotions and desires, which consist of qi. Chinese philosophers do not explain behavior by a combination of cognitive and affective factors. Finally, even though Slingerland labels the strong holism defended by Ames and Jullien a “myth”, he grants that in early Chinese philosophy neither the mind nor postmortem spirits are immaterial. They are rather some rarefied stuff that is continuous with natural physical world (Slingerland 2013: 37). He (2013: 9) calls this interpretive option a “weak holism”. Raphals (2015: 133–34) observes that there is no clear boundary between “weak holism” and “weak dualism”. Given that physicalism acknowledges the continuity of matter and energy, we can perhaps circumvent these attempts to fit Chinese philosophy into Western categories, and simply observe a similar continuity of these elements of Chinese qi-naturalism that explain the functions of the heart-mind, thinking, feeling and intentions in behavior. The rest of bodily qi, as the Mengzi says, carries out the commands of the heart-mind, or as the Zhuangzi responds, other bodily organs (e.g., the stomach) can exert their own motivational influence, and their guidance sometimes manifests itself in behavior.
We conclude the Chinese view is a genuine alternative to substance dualism, differing from reductive materialism in a way arguably compatible with modern physics. This could lead one to treat the Chinese conception of qi as referring to matter-energy while not having the same intension. It leaves open the choice to see it as a form of panpsychism (David Chalmers 1996 and Thomas Nagel 1979) or not.
Functional distinctions between heart-mind and body accord with the functional holism exhibited by organic wholes constituted by systems of their parts (Wang 2013; Wong 2020). The relationships are sometimes characterized as “correlative”. What is meant by this term varies (see Granet 1934; Needham 1954; Graham 1989; Hall & Ames 1998), but all refer to analogies between kinds (lei 类). The most general of these kinds were yin and yang, two types of qi that constitute other things by their interaction: yin to contract and yield (associated with darkness and the feminine), and yang to expand and dominate associated with light and the masculine). Together, they form a whole, whether in the world or the human person. Their interaction can involve opposition, complementarity, and cyclical alternation (Wang 2013).
Though the nature of the interactions is sometimes described as non-causal, the contrast is most plausibly made with reference to mechanical and linear notions of causation in which the effect (like a billiard ball hit by another billiard ball) is purely passive and inert. The interactions envisioned in Chinese philosophy are not necessarily incompatible with alternative notions of causation in which the cause “works with the tendencies of the thing affected” (Perkins 2019). This is in keeping with the paradigm of wholes being the biological and the organic. Mengzi conceives of moral seeds/sprouts in human nature (discussed in §2.4 below) that grow into moral virtues through the agent’s moral reflection and action as these are influenced by secure material livelihood and ethical education. Cultivating a person’s virtue-seed, then, is an instance of external factors interacting with innate tendencies.
One distinctive characteristic of Chinese philosophy is its practical and ethical orientation (‘ethical’ is here meant broadly to include all normative guidance and not merely morality). Daoist dao is broader than the moralist’s concern with yi (morality). The Zhuangzi focuses on this broad sense of how (the way) to live (see §2.5 below). The organization and function of these parts of humans as well as our interaction as part of the natural world (natural dao) are relevant to this discussion. The Confucians, especially Mengzi, focus more inwardly on a hierarchy of functions/organs. Daoists, and to a lesser degree, Mohists and the Xunzi address a broader arrangement of humans as a part of nature. These different conceptions of how the heart-mind is to relate to other parts of the body (the appetites and moods) and natural world ground ethical discussion in ancient China. The Zhuangzi offers a less hierarchical conception than the Mengzi.
2. Normative conceptions of the person
How should the heart-mind relate to other parts of the person? What is knowing? What is the role of reflective thinking about emotions, desires, etc. as inputs to the heart-mind? These are the questions posed in Classical discussions of how to live.
The tendency in early Chinese Confucianism was to distinguish among and to rank parts of the person, with the heart-mind in the lead. The leading role is holistic in important ways, involving integration of the perceiving, thinking, desiring, emotional, and intending functions of the heart-mind. Further, the resulting conceptions of virtue are of excellence physically embodied and realized in relationship with others.
The Mohists emphasized the “eyes and ears” especially of the common people and the operation of tools of measurement that enable people to come to more reliable agreement in cooperative arrangements. This focus on measuring fueled their tilt toward utilitarianism as the goal of personal and social organization of parts.
The texts that came to be associated with Daoism, the Daodejing 道德經 and the Zhuangzi, treat the heart-mind as only part of the process of de 德 (practical competence) of political leaders, artisans, gymnasts, and philosophers. Knowing how to live involves a combination of wisdom, skill, and disciplined engagement of emotion and desire. In the Daodejing, the heart-mind’s conduit of guidance function is often treated as emptiness and stillness to attune and be responsive to an external path dao 道, path or way to live in the natural cosmos. Human dao is a part of a holistic natural dao that accounts for the emergence and guidance of all natural kinds.
In the Zhuangzi, this sometimes takes the form of demoting the heart-mind’s role in favor of a more egalitarian involvement of all parts of a person’s system of qi (conceived as pervading all the organs, not just in the heart-mind). The full body achieves attunement and responsiveness to the world—as in skills ranging from archery to wheelmaking to cicada catching.
The Xunzi builds on previous Confucian ideas about hierarchy within the person, but also incorporates ideas from Zhuangzi as well as implicitly taking from their pragmatic conception of knowing and explicitly replying to Mohist reformism and Daoist skepticism of past models of music and ritual.
2.1 The Analects
The Analects (Lun Yu 論語) is the text traditionally taken to be the most reliable reflection of the teachings of the historical Kongzi 孔子 (latinized name “Confucius” 551–479 BCE; see entry on Confucius, §2.1 for more information on the Analects). Confucius presents himself as transmitting ethical guidance from ancient Sages (see Jiang 2021). The heart-mind of the junzi 君子 (exemplary person) and the sheng ren 聖人 (sage) thus play pivotal roles of examples of how to morally cultivate people who can, advise rulers or themselves become rulers.
In Analects 2.4, Confucius presents a mini autobiography that identifies several stages in his moral cultivation. At age fifteen he set his heart-mind on learning (all references to the text in Chinese will be to Analects, CTP, unless otherwise indicated). At thirty, he was able to take his stand (his place in society). At forty he had no perplexities (performed role-rituals flawlessly). At fifty he knew the mandate of Tian 天 (his nature-assigned mission). At sixty, his ears were attuned (spontaneously reacted to spoken cues). At seventy, he could follow his heart-mind’s desires without overstepping the boundaries.
The stages indicate the centrality of learning and practice to the heart-mind. Moral cultivation was learning one’s role well. At seventy his learning made him an unerring in his second-nature responses to situations with no inclination to immoral behavior. This holistic cultivation is inherent in the heart-mind as guiding behavior according to a learned role—which one views as natural for oneself. Cultivation encompasses the whole person, not just the heart-mind, but the qi of the body.
Moral excellence throughout that text is embodied. Book 10 contains close observations of Confucius’ ways of speaking, his physical bearing, facial expressions, gestures, and bodily postures as they vary over different contexts. In his home village, he looked humble and hesitant in his speech, but in the ancestral temple or at court, he spoke articulately but carefully (Analects 10.1). The way he carried himself upon entering the duke’s gate showed his reverence for the office (10.4). Upon seeing someone in mourning dress, even an intimate associate, he took on a solemn expression, or riding past someone in mourning, he would bow to the crossbar of his carriage (10.25).
The different ways his physical bearing and movements express respect and sympathy according to context is related to the way that moral cultivation involves dedicated performance of rituals that attach to one’s roles, such as greeting one’s fellow villagers, getting up to speak at the ancestral temple or at court, and greeting those in mourning. Performing these rituals is a way of training oneself to have the desired affective and bodily stances toward others. Performance constitutes an individualized expressions of moral excellence. Confucius thus becomes a model from which others may learn. Modeling was key to this learning process. Knowing one’s roles is knowing one’s “names” as they pertain to these roles, and rituals constitute a self-training in how to perform one’s named role: let the ruler rule, the minister minister, the father father, and the son son (Analects 12.11; see also 13.3).
The heart-mind is expected to take the lead in cultivation of the entire person: “setting one’s heart-mind on learning”. Its learning is not knowing facts but performing a behavior guided by a model. The student follows examples of moral standards. This eventually lets one to achieve moral excellence, shaping one’s desires and emotions so that they do “not overstep the bounds”, and so that the whole person is attuned to Tian’s calling. Yan Hui (a remarkable student whose early death breaks Confucius’ heart) is praised by Confucius for never repeating the same mistake (Analects 6.3), and for a heart-mind that didn’t deviate in its focus on practicing ren 仁for three months. Others could maintain focus for only days or a month (6.7). In the Analects, ren is is this comprehensive moral excellence. Confucius sums it up as loving or caring for persons (12.22). Later the Mengzi, would identify ren as the particular virtue often translated as “benevolence”. Here we translate ren as “human-heartedness”. The heart-mind’s aim (zhi 志) on becoming ren is all-important. In 9.26, Confucius says,
The three armies may be deprived of their commander, but even commoners cannot be deprived of their aim. All commit to their aim as armies to protecting their commander.
Confucian ethics centers on an ideal of fully-realizing humanity. The ideal is rooted in family relationships and grows to all social relations. Thus, learning about the heart-mind of others is crucial to ethical cultivation. When he is asked whether there is a single word that can sum up his guidance, Confucius replies, “It is sympathetic understanding (shu 恕): what you do not want, do not do to others” (Analects 15.24). This has been called the “negative” Golden Rule of Confucianism, and 6.30 supplies the positive version when Confucius says that ren people (仁人) wishing to establish themselves also seek to establish others and in wishing to be a model of excellence, helps others achieve excellence. He goes on to say that to be able to draw from what is close as an analogy is called the method of ren. The Doctrine of the Mean in the Book of Rites (Liji 禮記 Zhongyong 中庸) comments further on what shu might mean when applied to sympathetically understanding others to whom one stands in a role relationship: to serve my father as I would expect my son to serve me, to serve my ruler as I would expect my minister to serve me, to serve elder brothers as I expect younger brothers to treat me, and to treat my friends as I expect my friends to serve me (Liji Zhongyong 13).
Shu is a method for achieving shared moral excellence in communion with social others. One reflects on what is close to guide one’s aspirations to a life in a human social community. One’s desire for excellence is not transparent but emerges over a lived life with others. Confucius’s conception of moral progress is sensitive to differences in each life circumstance, from formative early social roles to physical characteristics and temperament. One sympathizes with others by identifying both relevant similarities and differences. Each person’s heart-mind is similarly sensitive to their particular capacities and roles in their lives as they unfold.
In one conversation, Confucius suggests to his students Zilu and Yan Hui that they each tell what they would most like to do. Zilu says that he would like to share his horses and carriages, his clothing and furs, with his friends, and if they damage them, to bear them no ill will. Yan Hui says he would like to refrain from bragging about his own abilities, and to not exaggerate his own accomplishments. When they ask the Master what he would most like to do, Confucius replies that he would like to bring peace and contentment to the aged, to share relationships of trust and confidence with his friends, and to love and protect the young (Analects 5.26 ). Zilu’s and Yan Hui’s statement of their aspirations reflect their particular preoccupations as individuals. Confucius’ statement not only comprehends their aspirations as particular ways of fulfilling his own, but identifies what everyone might ultimately want. The heart-mind, then, is the source of attunement not only to the Dao of Tian but to the others with whom one’s relationships go into a fully realized social life.
The use of analogy in setting forth a fundamental tenet signals the centrality of this type of reasoning in Confucianism and in Mohism, as shall be seen below. Analogy plays an important role in the Mozi but gets incorporated into a conception of knowledge as skillfully and reliably classifying things and distinguishing them from each other so that one may act rightly and benevolently in the world.
2.2 The Mohists
The Mozi (墨子) is named after its founder Mo Di (墨翟, 470–391 BCE). The school of Mohism is rightly credited for bringing argumentation into Chinese philosophy (Hansen 1992). It is revealing that Mengzi says in 3B9 that while he is not fond of arguments, he is compelled to argue with the Yangists and the Mohists because “their language (yan) fills the world beneath the sky”. The Mohists contrast utilitarian consequentialism with reliance on tradition. Tian (sky-nature) desires human well-being. Traditional rituals guiding conduct or social and political policies should be reformed to improve people’s livelihood. The argument is a strong one against total reliance on tradition, but Mozi seems to compromise when he reflects on the standards of correct yan (language use—see below). He shares Confucius’ insight about the role of learning to the heart-mind’s guidance of behavior. He also shares Confucius’ view of the role of political leader as educator-in-chief. If the ruler’s speech and behavior promote universal human well-being, the people’s behavior will change “in a single generation”.
Mozi’s focus on developing a social and political dao that creates and sustains general well-being starts from assumptions about the heart-mind different from the Confucians. He envisions a counterpart of Hobbes “state of nature” with the important difference that the disorder is not a produce of universal self-interest but of moral disagreement. Everyone is assumed to be motivated morally, but to have different 義 yi (moralities). The social project he imagines is one of unifying the varying conceptions of morality.
That social project, however, presupposed another fundamental psychological assumption—that the social world could identify and agree on who was “wisest and best” to lead the social construction project. And the project itself hints at some assumptions about human psychology. The leader, apparently selected by acclimation, admits he’s unable to unify all the world’s moralities. He appoints a Confucian-style hierarchical bureaucracy to assist him. Each level of the hierarchy reports to those in the next higher level. Still, even those at the bottom of the hierarchy (e.g., the village) admit their inability to say what is moral, so they consult with ordinary people, who are to report what they find moral and immoral. This stage is where Mozi speaks of punishing whoever will not cooperate in this project of social morality construction by withholding judgment.
Each level of the construction bureaucracy reports up the hierarchy. However, the original assumption of moral disagreement is seemingly ignored. Either at each level, there is no disagreement or the officer taking the reports resolves disagreements somehow. The “wisest and best” makes the final decision. Hints of how that decision is made come from the contributions Mohists make to developing a Chinese practical conception of knowing (zhi 知). Practical knowing, knowing-how, can underlie how we use words and how we adapt modeled behavior in our own practice. The skill we learn in learning 名míng (names or terms) is learning to 辯 bian (divide) into 是 shi this and 非fei not-that. When paired, the translators routinely use “right-wrong” as in right-from-wrong, right and wrong, right or wrong. The demonstrative form reminds us that such choices are made in real-time contexts.
Mozi suggests three standards for right and wrong use of terms:
- Looking to the roots and original baptism with terms by the Sage Kings and in accordance with the historical record of their ritual behaviors. This is Mozi’s compromise with Confucianism. Continuity in language is important if know-how from the past is to be successfully stored and transmitted to later generations.
- According with the eyes and ears of the people, a kind of
intersubjective consensus of observation. This “empirical”
standard informs Mohist emphasis on measurement operations.
The hundred artisans make squares with the set square, circles with the compass, straight lines with the string, vertical lines with the plumb line, and flat surfaces with the level. Whether skilled artisans or unskilled artisans, all take these five as models. The skilled are able to conform to them exactly. The unskilled, though unable to conform to them exactly, by following them in undertaking their work still do better than they do on their own. (Mozi CTP: Book 1.4 [trans. 2020: book 4.1])
- Their practical use leads to general benefit. (Mozi CTP: Book 9.1–2 [trans. 2020: book 35])
These standards seem potentially incoherent in that there seems no guarantee that the results of applying one will be the same as the results of applying the others. One way to help is make utility the primary standard which justifies and guides application of the other two standards: past usage is to be maintained to preserve social know-how and coordination practices which benefit the people. Making usage reflect ordinary empirical judgments makes learning easier and application more reliable. Mozi’s conception of usefulness is robustly natural-bodily goods: food, clothing, housing, time with and care for parents etc. He not only does not focus on pleasure, he disapproves of it. 樂 (le pleasure or yue music—especially royal concerts and funerals) wasted material goods and labor. Stable families and social order included filiality. The early Mohist conception of benefit, therefore, seems to have been constituted by a plurality of basic social goods, which indicates their social and political orientation towards identifying a dao or guiding path for society.
This solution has the advantage of explaining curious aspects of Mozi’s defense of “there are ghosts” and opposition to “there is fate”. He explains the first by testimony as to the appearance and actions of ghosts who punish wrongdoers and reward those who do what is right. However, chapter 31 of the Mozi simply justifies sacrifices on the grounds that the sage-kings practiced them, and the doctrine promotes good effects among the living (i.e., sacrificial ceremonies to spirits build kinship among the living and provide them with the food and wine). It suggests ghosts do not exist but teaching and acting on their existence is beneficial. It is probably a mistake to infer from this one passage that the early Mohists theorized about truth vs. pragmatic benefits of belief, though later Mohists may be interpreted as noticing such a distinction.
The early Mohist primacy of the benefit standard makes its ethics the first consequentialist ethic in history. Destructive conflict among people, families, and states is diagnosed in the Mozi as due to conflicting social mores and relative bias toward our own family, village, state and culture. Utilitarian reasoning yields a normative psychological solution: adopt jian ai (兼愛) (Mozi, CTP: book 4, chapters 14–16 [trans. 2020: books 14–16]). Sometimes translated as “universal love” but now more often as “inclusive” or “impartial caring”, it is best understood as opposed to an exclusive focus on the well-being of oneself and one’s relatives as the source of destructive behavior (for discussion of these controversies, see entries on Mohism and Chinese ethics). Jian ai is a moral attitude of care towards everyone and supports governance that distributes benefits to all, taking special care of those in need and less able to provide for themselves. The Mohists assume (arguably with Confucians) that our heart-minds are shaped by the teachings promoted by social leaders—starting with the ruler.
Jian ai is a moral attitude of care towards everyone and supports governance that distributes benefits to all, taking special care of those in need and less able to provide for themselves. The Mohists assume (arguably with Confucians) that our heart-minds are shaped by the teachings promoted by social leaders—starting with the ruler.
The later Mohists shifted most weight to an empirical standard and taught that the language to be used should emphasize something more like “carving nature at the joints”. The main object of all learning was skills in sorting things reliably into their correct categories according to the patterns of their similarities and differences (Mozi, CTP: Book 12.8 [trans. 2020: Book 47.9]). Interest in human well-being expressed itself in widening interest in knowing the natural world. The utilitarian core was ren（仁）the virtue of impartial or inclusive care and the behavior was yi (義) morally right. The Mohist concept of measurement standards (fa 法) remain central in this realist later Mohist phase. The zhi 志will of Tian (Sky or Nature), Mozi’s original source of normative guidance, was measurement-like utility. We naturally choose the lesser of two harms and greater of two benefits.
The role of Tian in Mohism suggests a kind of naturalism in their conception of psychology and the capacity to adopt an attitude of jian ai. In chapter 28 on Tian’s intent, Mozi says that he measures Tian nature’s intent as a wheelwright measures with a compass and a carpenter the square. Tian’s intent is a command, but a pattern in things—flipping the Western argument from design. The world is here for human benefit. It benefits and nourishes everyone; it rewards societies who act together and share and harm those that do not. It makes no distinction among humans and provides life and sustenance to rich and poor, noble and low, kin and non kin; it created the regular and constant pattern of the seasons and weather that makes all these broadly distributed benefits possible.
The Mohists’ theories revolve around the concept of 辯bian distinctions in language. The role of Tian is tied to nature’s joints, natural points of distinction. The natural normative distinction is between benefit and harm. Appealing to that distinction as a measure of “this” and “not-that” yields a naturalistic argument for universal concern in government. Bian comes to be used of any theorist’s justifying of a guiding distinction. This makes the Mohist use of the concept unlike “argument” in Western philosophy. The conventional translation is misleading. The Mohists did not conceive of arguments as consisting of premises and a conclusion and a form that guaranteed truth was preserved. It is rather that some distinctions are assumed in arguing for other distinctions. The Mohists appeal to distinctions where nature takes a stand as in operational use of a measurement tool. Compasses, carpenter’s squares, and plumb lines, give reliable and precise distinctions for sorting and choosing. This guides effective and beneficial action and policy in government both because nature is involved and ordinary people, using their eyes and ears, can recognize and acknowledge the result. This makes the operational measurement useful as well as reliable and accurate (true).
The Mohist conception of bian is deeply pragmatic. The ways of teaching language and behavior is ultimately guided by the natural bian of benefit-harm—arguably a distinction deeply embedded in our heart-minds. This pragmatism is also illustrated by the different kinds of appeal they make in their arguments for jian ai. Given their view that chaotic conflict results from everyone acting on their own view of what is right, one might infer that they believe people to be typically motivated to do what they think is right. However, they argue for jian ai on other normative grounds besides its naturalness. It seems to require both modeling from the leader and a punishment and reward structure. There is not much worry over the tensions between saying that Tian and other supernatural agents reward and punish to enforce the moral order and also asserting the need for a strict and rigid hierarchical government structure that incentivizes conformity to that moral order. Perkins (2014) puts the problem of evil in its most general form: bad things happen to good people, and this regular occurrence troubles accepting that Tian or nature is equally benevolent to all human beings. In a philosophical tradition that is developing vigorous, argumentative debate, that belief will become increasingly troubled. This may be a reason why Tian drops out of the discourse of the later Mohists, who contributed to increasing conceptual resources for debate.
The later Mohists kept the basic outlines of the consequentialist ethic that Mozi and the early followers developed, but further developed and revised that ethic along with their methodology of argument, philosophy of language and epistemology. In addition, they wrote on metaphysical topics such as causality and space and time, and in a number of the sciences such as geometry and mechanics. Their writings comprise six chapters of the Mozi (see CTP: chapters 40–45 [trans. 2020: part IV]). The later Mohists are true to their forebearers in conceiving the cognitive capabilities of human beings as functioning to bian discern different kinds and identifying which things belonged or did not belong to these kinds. Though these capabilities involve empirical contact with the world, the later Mohists didn’t invoke mental representations of propositions. The contact makes the heart-mind aware of distinctions, boundaries of things. And this information guides the practical ability to sort things appropriately for behavior. Assigning a name to a thing or thing to a name is sorting into shi, right or this, and fei, wrong or not-that. The translation of bian as argument leads some to attribute the Mohists with developing syllogistic reasoning. They rather cultivate skill or know-how in carving the world with linguistic distinctions. They reflect no conception of reasoning with ideas, mentalistic items in container-like heart-mind. The primary term of epistemology is “knowing” zhi （知), which is a capacity like eyesight (Mozi, CTP: Book 10 Canon I.3 [trans. 2020: books 40–3, A3]. They are focused on the capabilities or skills to reliably sort out the relations between various kinds, e.g., that the category of oxen belongs to the larger category of animals.
As to the question of whether the later Mohists made more fundamental changes to their tradition, scholars diverge in their interpretations. A.C. Graham, in his influential Disputers of the Tao, saw the later Mohists as engaging in a kind of a priori systematization of the earlier ethic through a series of interlocking definitions of crucial terms such as ren and yi (Graham 1989: 146). Such a reading may be too much in tension with the pragmatic reliabilism exhibited by their concern to sort things out into the right kinds. Stephens (2021; see him also for a detailed critique of Graham’s interpretation) provides another interpretation that has the later Mohists broadening their conception of benefit and harm on the basis of a preference satisfaction criterion using pleasure and displeasure as indicators (Mozi, CTP: Book 10 Canon I and Expositions 26–27 [trans. 2020: Books 40–3 A 26–27]). This addresses criticisms they might have received about the narrowness of the earlier list of benefits, as well as the Zhuangzi’s point about the diversity of things that people value (see §2.5 below). The later Mohists also introduced the conception of weighing benefits and harms, which makes possible an all-things-considered judgment as to what actions or policies most benefit or least harm a society (Mozi, CTP: Book 11.3, 11.5 [trans. 2020: Books 44.3a–c, 44.5 ]). They recognized the permissibility of benefiting one’s parents and the elderly more than others (Mozi, CTP: Book 11.6 [trans. 2020: Book 44.6), perhaps in response to criticism from Confucians such as Mengzi. These changes in Mohist philosophy indicate significant interaction and adjustment between the different traditions and have ramifications for an implicit broadening of capacities of the heart-mind conception.
2.3 The Daodejing
The Daodejing (道德經 The Book of the Way and Its Power) may have begun to take shape in fifth century BCE and reached the form as we know it in the second century CE (references to the Chinese text will be to the Daodejing in CTP). It shares with the Mozi the attribution of impartiality to the natural source of norms—tian’s dao. However, impartiality in the Daodejing is broader than it is in the Mozi. Chapter 10 celebrates its giving of life and its nurturance of all things, not only humans. Chapter 5 declares that Tian and earth are not ren, that it treats the myriad things as “straw dogs”, i.e., ritual objects treated reverently during the season of rites but afterwards tossed aside. Rather than attributing callousness or cruelty to Tian and earth, the message is that each thing is given its time, which then inevitably passes. It is not just that the desires fostered by Confucians and Mohists have no basis in Tian and earth. We project our time and place’s human concerns onto the natural world in both social daos.
The Daodejing reminds us that the dao path metaphor used by the social moralists to talk about how people should live was taken from its home domain of how things naturally came into being (ch. 14). It says both dao and tian follow ziran natural or spontaneous (self-realized) unfolding (ch. 25). The Daoist conception of paths is this natural path structure. Language and human social daos have path structure, but not all path structure is in language or human affairs. Natural, tian dao’s structure is a distribution of what is and what is not—you (being) and wu (non-being). The structure of nature also emerges and evolves in nature. The first chapter says, the Daos can be dao-ed (guided or evolved). They are not constant daos. So dao only moves forward, unlike physical law that applies forward and backward in time. The actual environmental context of unfolding of all things, named or not, moves in one direction as things self-realize their non-being possibilities, the possibles which are not yet part of being. “Non-being” names the beginning of the cosmos (Tian and earth). “Being” names “the mother of 10,000 kinds of things”. Cosmic dao unfolds in silence and effortlessly. It exists where there is emptiness that invites filling with behavior (ch. 11).
Dao makes no names constant. Natural material (uncarved wood) can be distributed to make utensils (ch. 28). But no human authority can make uncarved wood its servant. When we take it into a human structure, we use names. When we have names, we will know “to stop” (ch. 32). Why stop? Names of things generate desires that go beyond natural desires. Nameless uncarved nature is free from such desires and these are dangerous, competitive desires, e.g., for social status. This is the crux of Laozi’s (“Old Master” or the anonymous author’s) view of psychology. Acquiring any social dao through learning names and ritual behaviors, takes us away from our natural self. Going back to that natural self is to cease to guide our behavior using social constructs—無為 wuwei is the paradigm of self-realization without social domination.
The Daodejing hints at other ways our self-nature is changed by learning language and a social dao. The distinctions marked in language are poverty stricken in comparison to the ability of our eyes and ears to register hues and tones (ch. 11). Linguistic instructions using names are more rigid and less accurate—imagine trying to explain how to follow a forest trail by recipe-like instructions such as, “Walk 7 steps NNE then turn 12º west and take 4 steps, then …”. compared to pointing to the trail. With natural dao, we respond to the suppleness and constantly changing flux of ongoing experience of the world (ch. 76). It could be said of much of Chinese philosophy but is most dramatically presented in the Daodejing’s stress on constant, ceaseless transforming.
Note that this view of the match between human naming and classificatory capacity and the world runs against the view presupposed by the Mohists. Usefulness often presupposes some socially constructed of name-influenced desire or value. So, it cannot mediate between different systems of constructing such values.
The Daodejing prizes attentiveness and responsiveness to the present situation. Terms in language elide the differences in situations. We see the world through the filter of our desires and try to manipulate things and other people to make names apply. We cannot stop the process of ceaseless change and unfolding.
We should neither elevate some people above others (so-called worthies), nor value things for their rarity only, nor seek out things of desire. These confuse the heart-mind. To achieve peaceful stable life, sage leadership works to empty the people’s minds of such things so they focus simply on natural goals of adequate clothing, health, and control of our own lives. In the battle of nature and nurture, Laozi chooses nature. That is why the sage is for the belly and not the eye (beauty) (ch. 3).
This goal of emptying the heart-mind of inculcated desires and the crude distinctions behind names forms the basis of the later blending of Daoism and Buddhism. We see hints of breath control and meditation motivated by the paradox implicit in their goal—nirvana or empty mind (ch. 10). The achievement is likened to returning to being a newborn infant. A child’s receptivity to the world is celebrated. It finds its way as streams and rivers find valleys (ch. 6 and 15). The ideal for the heart-mind is to find its own equilibrium in the world without the domination of a past culture’s presuppositions. The heart-mind’s calmness (stillness) and emptiness underpin this receptivity to undistorted nature. (ch. 16). The heart-mind can attune to dao and follow its invitations to behavior. This conception of forming a unity, becoming one with dao, makes the heart-mind’s self-realization the standard guiding the changing dao (ch. 25). The heart-mind that empties itself is able to attune to and participate in this primordial movement of dao.
This unity of the empty and still heart-mind with the dao of unfolding is why wuwei can be efficacious. It emerges from supple receptiveness to the moment or situation at hand. In the Daodejing, this is described as practicing teachings without words, producing things without “owning” them, acting without expectation of reward, and not lingering after one’s work is done (ch. 2). Wu wei is contrasted with behavior to achieve a socially motivated end. Sometimes wuwei is identified with spontaneous action, but not in the sense of impulsive action but of self-realization of possibilities offered by dao.
The text adopts various devices to help. Chapter 63 says to overcome the hard while it is still easy and to achieve the large while it is small. Difficult things start with what is easy, and great things begin with the small. Chapter 64 says to set things in order before they become chaotic. These sayings suggest careful attending to things and a foresight born of perceiving incipient patterns of development. Such careful attending may give rise to action that might be called spontaneous, not impulsive, but instead supremely responsive to others. The responsiveness is transparent to the shape of dao’s invitation to behavior.
The text signal’s awareness that wuwei is practically contradictory since it recommends a type of behavior using two social concepts—wu and wei (ch. 48). The text (especially the 2nd de book) charges into social and political ethics implied in this conception despite their notorious tension with this anti-social domination beginning. The invitations to behavior include social contexts. An open, transparent pursuit of natural options include how one’s actions are complementary to others as in a dance. One is sensitive to others so as to blend and complement one’s energies with theirs. Our joint receptiveness gives us a dao which we self-realize in our joint behavior.
The political implication is the greatest sage rulers are barely known to the people; the next greatest are those who are loved; after that come those who are feared, and after that those who are ridiculed. Tasks are completed and duties are fulfilled, and the people simply say that this is their natural way (ch. 17). Sage rulers do this by emptying their heart-mind and making the people’s heart-minds their heart-mind (ch. 49).
Some descriptions of how sage rulers do this seem controlling and manipulative, where ancients good at enacting dao do not enlighten the people but keep them stupid and ignorant (ch. 65). This, however, is consistent with the basic worry about conventional knowledge as frustrating self-realization. Sage rulers themselves should be “without [such] knowledge” and nurture the people’s unfolding future without commanding it (ch. 10). In chapter 20 the speaker refers to their own heart-mind as belonging to a fool, empty of conventional wisdom.
The contrast is also with conventional morality. From the perspective of the Daodejing, the Confucians and Mohists are locked into an untenably anthropocentric view of Tian and earth that sees them as somehow favoring humanity. The straw-dogs metaphor de-centers humanity, placing it simply among the myriad things. Conventional morality not only embodies an illusion. Following it does not make matters better. Ren and yi, along with cleverness and deception, emerge when Dao is abandoned (ch. 18). When adopted to steer us toward a better course, its fixed values are too rigid to allow the flexible response to the flow of experience necessary for efficacy; moreover, they become instruments of personal ambition and attempts to outdo others. It is better renounce ren, abandon yi, along with cleverness and profit, maintaining simplicity and embracing plainness, reducing desires (ch. 19).
Laozi’s philosophical psychology is reflected in The Mengzi’s more elaborate theory of the heart-mind’s natural moral unfolding. A late chapter lists ci 慈 (compassion) among “my three treasures” (ch. 67). Ci figures centrally in how that Confucian text seeks to rehabilitate the Mozi’s ren (benevolence) and yi (morality). Mozi and Laozi had put guidance in the natural world to which the heart-mind through its training could be attuned or prejudiced and unreceptive. Laozi and Mengzi share a concern about the arbitrariness of education in mores. Laozi finds the map in the natural world; Mencius will find it in the original human mind.
The shared attitude in the ancient Chinese conception of mind in nature is the basic goodness of the world, but the rejection of anthropocentrism in Daoism’s interpretation of Tian and earth puts into question the meaning of what this goodness could be.
2.4 The Mengzi
The Mengzi (unless otherwise indicated, all references to the Chinese text will be to Mengzi in CTP) carries forward the idea that heart-mind should lead or command bodily qi (2A2). In 6A15, he distinguishes the part of the person that is great from the part that is small. Those who follow the great part become great persons and those who follow the small part become small persons. In 6A14, nourishing the small part is associated with being given to eating and drinking. This fits with the 6A15 association of the small part with faculties of hearing and sight that do not think and are led by things perceived through these senses. By contrast the faculty of the heart-mind is to think, and it is the performance of this faculty that is associated with establishing the greater part of ourselves. This conception of the heart-mind as leader seems to overlap with the contemporary conception of the executive functions of the mind: perception of patterns of similarity and difference in the world, responding to these patterns through reasoning and feeling, setting aims, and initiating action to achieve those aims.
Mengzi’s conception of the heart-mind is holistic, i.e., it’s guiding blends the heart-mind’s thinking, emoting, desiring, and conating. The human heart-mind begins with innate duan 端, seeds or sprouts of goodness. Mencius attributes these to Tian’s implanting them in human nature (ren xing 人性). These inborn duan are dispositions to feelings or emotions (qing 情) linked with the body. Cognition also has a duan which takes the form of intuitions of right and wrong (是非 shi-fei). When the heart-mind develops from these sprouts it both acts well and grows in the sense that it acquires new moral knowledge and motivation to perform better in other situations. Reasoning and reflecting on emotions therefore involve the body. Therefore, when Mengzi says that the function of the heart-mind is to lead the rest of the person, he is not thereby contrasting something that is purely mental or cognitive with another thing that is purely physical or affective. The leading part of the person is both mental, physical, cognitive, and affective (see entry on the emotions in early Chinese philosophy).
Mengzi numbers the duan, calling them the four heart-minds. Each develops into a different dimension of ethical excellence: ceyin zhixin 惻隱之心 (compassion) can develop into ren 仁 (human-heartedness); xiuwu羞惡 (shame and dislike) can develop into yi義 (righteousness); ciran辭讓 (deference and yielding) can develop into li 禮 (ritual propriety, etiquette); and shi/fei 是非 can develop into zhi智 or wisdom.
The heart-mind links humans with Tian. In 6A16, Mengzi distinguishes the nobility of Tian from the nobility of humans. Human-heartedness, righteousness, loyalty, truthfulness, and taking untiring pleasure in doing good is the nobility of Tian. Being a duke, minister, or high-ranking official is the nobility of humans. In 2A2, Mengzi states his “unmoved heart-mind” enables him to remain steady in the face of inevitably uncertain fortune in pursuit of the nobility of humans. He achieved this state, he explains, through cultivating his flood-like qi. He cultivates it through the formation of zhi (intent or aim; see also Analects 9.26), which rightly leads and nourishes the body’s qi. If nourished uprightly, it fills the space between Tian and earth. The suggestion here is that Tian’s goodness, implanted in human nature, runs throughout the material world. Humans who cultivate their goodness merge with that larger universal goodness. This brief metaphysically pregnant passage that links the heart-mind to attunement with the entire world comes to blossom in Neo-Confucian metaphysics (see entries on metaphysics in Chinese philosophy, Song-Ming Confucianism, Zhu Xi, and Wang Yangming).
Mengzi focuses most on compassion and its development into human-heartedness, the first duan. Of the four duan, shi/fei and its development into wisdom bears most directly on the way that the heart-mind’s reflection and reasoning foster growth of the sprout of compassion into human-heartedness and of the other two sprouts into their corresponding virtues. Accordingly, the discussion here will focus on the compassion/human-heartedness and shi/fei/wisdom. However, there is a growing body of literature on the Confucian view of shame and a sense of shame as playing important roles in the development of moral character, contrary to some prominent views in the Western literature that shame is seldom, if ever, a productive moral emotion (see Van Norden 2002 ; Seok 2017; Tiwald 2017; and Hu 2022) for examples of discussion along these lines.
Mencius illustrates compassion with his story of the alarm, distress and compassion that anyone would feel upon seeing a child about to fall into a well (2A6). Clearly it starts with a cognitive recognition of another as about to suffer. Alarm and distress are the natural qing (emotion) in the situation and the compassion implicit in that natural affection. In 2A6, Mengzi describes it as the heart that is unable to bear or endure [the suffering of] others. The qing also is an impulse to action—to prevent or alleviate suffering. The impulse to action is the impulse to identify what should be done; thinking in conjunction with empirical knowledge of the world is required. Developing human-heartedness requires learning to act on the emotion in the right way. In this, the sprout of shi/fei and its corresponding virtue of wisdom come into play.
Mengzi does not engage in much explicit discussion of shi/fei, but the way that shi and fei are used in the text provide clues. Shi is often used to identify (“this”) or to compare actions, events, or qualities of persons under certain categories (lei類), and fei is used to exclude them (“not this”) from certain other categories. In 1A3, Mengzi explains to King Hui why people are not flocking to his state despite the King’s perception that he is more human-hearted toward his people than neighboring kings are to their peoples. Compare, he asks the king, a soldier who throws down his weapon and flees from the enemy for one hundred paces to one who flees for fifty paces. Is not the second still fleeing? The King agrees by saying that “this” is also fleeing. Mengzi then points out that the King lets dogs and swine eat food meant for human beings while his people die of famine. The implication is that the king’s policies still fall far short of being human-hearted, even if metaphorically they go fifty paces less in the wrong direction. If the King attempts to excuse himself by saying that it has simply been a bad year, Mengzi asks, “How is ‘this’ different from killing a person by stabbing him and then saying, ‘It was not I; it was the weapon’?” Here shi as “this” is used to liken the king’s inadequate efforts to save his people to the soldiers who stop at fifty paces and to a killer who blames the knife instead of himself.
Mencius here draws on the analogical reasoning employed by the Mohists talk of shi/fei as right/wrong. In another example, 2B3, Mengzi is asked why he declined to accept money from King Xuan on one occasion and accepted on two subsequent occasions. Mengzi points to what he claims are relevant differences in the circumstances. Declining was shi in the first case but it could be fei on subsequent occasions. Shi/fei is used in such contexts to exemplify the relevance of wisdom to ethical excellence. The fourth duan involves inborn dispositions to perceive or judge patterns of similarities and differences that play crucial roles in the cognitive aspects of the other duan, in recognizing moral relevance. The duan develop into full moral virtues with the growing guidance of the cognitive moral intuition. The intuition identifies who is suffering and which acts are shameful, and which are not.
Analogical reasoning is pervasive in the Mengzi. In the most general sense, analogical reasoning infers a conclusion in a problematic case on the basis of that case’s relevant similarities with another case in which the conclusion is regarded as correct. Has the King done enough for his starving people? Not if what he has done is like the soldiers who stop fleeing from battle at 50 paces. Is it the King’s fault that the year’s harvest has been a bad one? Yes, it is still his fault if his failure to prevent or make up for the bad harvest is like the killer who blames the knife and not himself. However, as the example in 2B3 illustrates, an analogical inference may be defeated if a morally relevant dissimilarity is pointed out (see Lau 1970; Wong 2002).
When the dispositions to deploy shi/fei develop into abilities to reliably discern patterns of a morally relevant sort, they grow to constitute zhi as wisdom. Wisdom is implicitly ethical. In 4A27, authentic wisdom is identified as knowing the most authentic expression of ren (human-heartedness) as serving one’s parents and the most authentic expression of yi (righteousness) as following one’s elder brothers. In 2A7 Mengzi says that no one can cause us not to be ren—failure in this derives from a lack of wisdom. In 7A46 Mengzi says that what is urgent for the wise is confronting what is fundamental. There is no one whom those who are ren do not love, but what is fundamental is earnestly caring for the worthy. Mengzi does not make explicit what the meaning of “most fundamental” is, but one possibility is that it is to be given priority in the order of development. One begins with concentrating most of one’s efforts to what is most fundamental and extends it to what is less fundamental.
Wisdom includes weighing conflicting values and judging correctly which takes precedence. In 4A17, when challenged by an example where the situation seems to call for a violation of li (ritual propriety) by taking the hand of one’s sister-in-law to save her from drowning, Mengzi replies that only a wolf would not save her. Mengzi is then asked why he does not save the whole world when it is drowning, the implication being that he refuses to sweep aside the niceties of ritual propriety to do what is necessary. He answers that it is a matter of discretion (quan 權) to determine that saving one’s sister-in-law takes precedence over ritual propriety, but he wonders whether he is being asked to save the world by pulling it out with his hand. One saves the world through the way, the Dao 道, and the implication is that saving the world with the dao cannot involve simply sweeping aside ritual propriety.
Crucial for Mengzi, then, is how the duan develop into full virtues. Since analogy is the central method of reasoning featured in the text, we may conclude it is a major way innate knowing grows into moral knowledge. The initial knowledge is sprouts of inborn moral intuition. We start, e.g., from knowing to serve parents and following elder brothers and infer who else to serve and to follow in developing ren and yi (4A27 and 7A46).
However, the central example in 2A6 of the operation of compassion is one’s emotional response to an endangered child who is neither in one’s family nor known. But even if human beings are naturally disposed to spontaneously care for their family members and for innocent children who are not their own, they may not be disposed to spontaneously care for an irascible villager or for a stranger they’ve never met. To know that we have a reason to care for these others, we must see the relevant moral similarities between them and the family member or child we do spontaneously care for. We infer what we have reason to do from cases in which we are confident that we know what to do. These base cases for further inference by analogy are supplied by intuitions from the duan.
Still, such inferences are not valid if there are relevant moral dissimilarities between the base cases and the problematic cases at hand. This is an implication of 4A17, discussed above with reference to quan. Though one may not accord with the ritual of men and women not touching one another to save a drowning sister-in-law, one has to save the drowning world through the Dao, and part of following the Dao is to restore ritual propriety. Mengzi’s horizontal reasoning coming from comparing particular cases stands in significant contrast with vertical, top-down reasoning from general principles. It holds superior appeal if one thinks that one’s moral intuitions are more solid when rooted in the particular, and it allows for building up to general principles through noting recurrent patterns of similarities and dissimilarities (Wong 2002). In 1A3, as seen above, Mengzi uses analogies to get King Hui to see that he has to do more to keep his people from starving.
Since the duan include emotions, however, growth of the sprouts also depends on growth or maturation of the sprouts of emotion. Mengzi attempts to foster that maturation in King Xuan in 1A7. King Xuan asks whether he has the capacity to be the kind of true king Mengzi has been urging him to be. Mengzi prompts the king to remember a time he spared an ox being led to ritual slaughter. The King, moved by seeing the oxen’s eyes, decides to spare the ox. But he is uncertain about what his motivation was since, when asked whether the ritual should be canceled, he orders a sheep to take the ox’s place. He is aware that his people surmise that he was being cheap (a sheep not being as costly).
Mengzi expresses understanding as to why sparing the ox but sending a sheep to be slaughtered confused the King, and his people, about his motivation. However, he asserts that the King was rather moved by compassion for the ox, and the King not only remembers being moved by the ox’s trembling in fear but also experiences the feeling of compassion in his conversation with Mengzi. The King is prompted by Mengzi’s interpretation of his motivation to reflect back on the incident and recalls likening the ox to an innocent person being led to the execution ground. One implication of this very rich and complex passage is that Mengzi seems to be trying to spark the feeling of compassion in the king and get that compassion to flow from the ox to his people. That is why Mengzi immediately asks the King how his kindness could be sufficient to extend to animals but not to his people. If it does not so extend, it is not because he is incapable, but simply because he does not do it, thus implicitly answering the King’s original question of whether he could be a true king.
Notice that Mengzi has again deployed an analogy here: from the ox’s suffering to the people’s suffering and has appealed to the king’s capability to respond to the ox to support the inference that he has the capability to care for his people. But what Mengzi is most after is not the purely intellectual recognition that the King has the capability. He has gotten the King to feel again the compassion he felt with the ox, and by bringing up his people’s plight, is trying to get the King’s compassion to engage with his people. That is, the most relevant analogy is from an emotion felt in one case to a hoped-for emotion in the second case. It is all the more plausible because the King himself mediated his compassion for the ox with the thought of an innocent person being led to execution. Analogy plays a crucial role not only in extending intellectual assent but also the affective motivation to act on that assent. Recognition of a reason to spare one’s people suffering must be enlivened with emotion to be motivationally effective.
There is more to be gleaned from this very rich and complex passage. In his discussion with the King, Mengzi accepts the permissibility of sacrificing an animal for the performance of a ritual, but he also accepts that the King was right to spare the ox, having seen it’s suffering. The underlying rationale may be that one’s sensitivity to the suffering of animals is so close to one’s sensitivity to the suffering of persons that it can be harmful to squelch the former, even if the sacrifice would have been justified had he not seen its suffering. The junzi 君子 or “exemplary person” (see Analects ) cannot bear to see the suffering of animals, and so he stays away from the kitchen (there is disquieting silence here on the moral plight of those in the kitchen; some people’s moral sensitivities apparently matter less than those of others). The constructive point to be taken here is that the sensitivity to other’s suffering is something that must be both nurtured and protected. It cannot be turned off simply because it is justifiable to kill the suffering creature in question in one case. In other words, compassion as an emotional capacity has a course of development that is not malleable to being regulated by moral judgments that ignore the natural course of its development. In 1A7, Mengzi also mentions that deprivation of a constant means of livelihood can entirely divert one’s focus on developing the sprouts to the urgent task of subsistence.
These views pertain to the kind of hierarchy Mengzi has in mind for the relation between the heart-mind and the rest of the person. Recall the close relation between emotions and the body. The heart-mind can seek to direct the flow of the qi of emotive attitudes, as Mengzi attempts to coax King Xuan’s compassion to flow from the ox to his people, but the qi has natural tendencies that the heart-mind must respect. This point seems to be made in a more general way by the passage in 2A2 about the farmer from Song. The farmer was worried that his seedlings were not growing. He pulled on them, intending to help them grow, and his sons returned to the field to find them all withered. There are few people, says Mengzi, who do not try to help their seedlings to grow, but on the other hand there are some who mistakenly believe that they can do no benefit to their seedlings and consequently neglect and do not weed among them. Perhaps the thought about the need to weed is connected to the thought in 6A15 that those who nurture the small part of the person become small persons. The weeds may be excessive desires for objects of the senses, and weeding may be controlling these desires so that they do not deprive the moral sprouts from nutrition. But further, it is possible to damage and even to kill the sprouts in trying to help them grow. Underlying this implication is the belief that the inborn duan have a structure such that they grow in response to certain kinds of treatment and wither in response to other kinds.
Mengzi’s conception of the relation between the heart-mind’s reflection and reasoning and its affective dispositions is not a simple hierarchical one. It is of an organic unity and mutual dependence. This conception presents a substantial and, in many respects, appealing alternative to Humean and Kantian conceptions of this relation. The heart-mind is not a slave to emotion, but neither does it act independently of emotion when it acts morally (Wong 2017). Emotions go into the very composition of the duan of the heart-mind. Emotions have cognitive content embedded within them which shapes their intentional direction. For example, the affective disposition identifies another’s potential or actual suffering as a salient feature of the situation that could constitute a reason and conative impetus for acting. On the other hand, the heart-mind’s reflective and reasoning evaluation identifies other relevant features of the situation as possible reasons that may augment or counteract suffering as a reason. For example, in 1A7 (where King Xuan likens the ox’s suffering to an innocent person being led to the execution ground) and 3A5 (where Mengzi associates the ancient kings’ solicitous treatment of the people as if they were innocent infants), Mengzi identifies a person’s innocence as relevant to having the compassionate response. This of course implies that the heart-mind might override an incipient compassionate response if the recipient is in some sense deserving of suffering. Reflection, reasoning, and emotion are more like partners in the human moral response to the world, rather than one being dominant over the other, either descriptively or normatively.
2.5 The Zhuangzi
The Zhuangzi puts the focus back on the epistemic and normative (guidance) functions of the heart-mind, i.e., Mencius heart of 是非 shi-fei (this-not that). This reconnects him with the later Mohist’s theory of the norms of language/name use. But his style differs and is unique. He relates insights through vivid and often humorous stories and metaphorical imagery.
The Zhuangzi questions the very notion of a hierarchy with the heart-mind leading the rest of the person (references are to Zhuangzi in CTP). Zhuangzi advises listening to all the natural parts of one’s body, of which the heart-mind is only one. This egalitarian conception of the parts of a person puts the heart-mind in conversation with the rest of the body rather than in command.
Zhuangzi’s theory of cognition and guidance receives its most sustained, varied, and intricate expression in the second chapter, “Equalizing Assessments of Things” (Qi Wu Lun 齊物論). Its blend of illustrations of knowing and of mistaking ignorance for knowing challenges interpreters to reflect on how his theory of mind works. The opening reflection by Ziqi 子綦 starts the analysis of the heart-mind regarding the body. Seemingly deep in some meditative state, Ziqi describes it as having “lost myself”. He further explains to his interlocutor using the metaphor of pipes. We know of human pipes but haven’t known of the pipes of earth; We’ve heard the pipes of earth, but not yet the pipes of Tian. The Great Clump (earth) blows its breath, its qi, through ten thousand natural hollows. When blown lightly, it generates small harmony, and when powerful, a vast and grand harmony.
So, what then are the pipes of Tian? It blows out the 10 thousand dissimilarities and makes them one’s own, along with one’s own choosing, where does the impulse arise? (Zhuangzi CTP: Qi Wu Lun, 1 [trans. 2009: 9]). Zhuangzi’s obscure answer has provided fuel for many interpreters’ employment (see entry on Zhuangzi).
The combative moral arguments of humans start from their choosing different ways of marking similarity and dissimilarity in language, e.g., with terms like 義 yi (rightness). We speak of great and small knowing, great and small ways of speaking and even argue in our sleep. Waking, our heart-minds go into battle with feints, deception, threats. We “shoot out” 是 shi’s (this is right) and 非 fei’s (No, that is wrong) like arrows from a crossbow. Then we stick to them as if they were covenants, As the weight of commitments grows we slow, weaken, fade and lose our vitality as if we were “[h]eld fast as if bound by cords”, continuing “along the same ruts”. “Thus, the heart-mind moves closer to death, and nothing can restore its vitality” (Zhuangzi CTP: Qi Wu Lun, 2 [trans. 2009: 9]). Presumably the insight Ziqi reports as “losing my ‘I’” concerns the cognitive and normative capacity. But it views the battles with heart-minds as if from a distance. Then, pointedly avoiding attributing them to the organ, it introduces feelings that arise.
Joy and anger, sorrow and happiness, plans and regrets, transformations and stagnations, unguarded abandonment and deliberate posturing—music flows out of hollows, mushrooms form from steam! Day and night they alternate before us, but no one knows from whence they sprout. Never mind! Merely notice that they are there day and night…they come from somewhere. Without them there would be no “I”, and without an “I” nothing chosen. (Qi Wu Lun, 3 [trans. 2009: 10]).
This Hume-like reflection about the source of the “I” suggests it is not identified with the heart-mind. The body has “hundreds of bones, nine openings and six organs”, is any of them more “I” than the others? The Zhuangzi goes on to muse that there must be some controller or true lord even if we cannot identify it. Once put together, these parts depend on each other as we struggle through life which passes by at a gallop. We’re never sure of what we’ve done or if we achieve goals. As the body fades, the heart-mind fades with it. Sad! (Ibid)
If we follow whatever has so far taken shape, fully formed, in our heart-minds, making that our teacher, who could ever be without a teacher? The historical scholar knows the times and his heart-mind chooses by itself. The fool does so as well. To get “right” and “wrong” before one’s pass structures someone’s heart-mind —that is like leaving for Yue today and arriving yesterday. (Qi Wu Lun, 4 [trans. adapted from 2009: 11])
The heart-mind acquires its structure as it “selects” (qu 取) among alternatives. This cheng xin 成心, the fully-structured heart-mind then “shoots out” “this-right!” and “not that-wrong!” suggests that the piping of human beings is formed on the basis of selecting from some this’s and rejecting others. We acquire a conception of “right” and “wrong” from our past practice.
The passage goes on to say, “Courses are formed by walking them. Things are so by being called so” (Qi Wu Lun, 6 [trans. 2009: 13]). The implication is that the heart-mind’s “right” and “wrong” and “thus and so” and “not thus and so” emerge within the relative space or our lived worlds in which our structure was acquired by our past practice, our concepts of things with certain relations and differences from other things in our environment. Zhuangzi’s view in the Qi Wu Lun is like Nelson Goodman (1978) and Iris Einheuser (2011). On this view, facts are not “in the world” independently of how we conceptualize them. We carve out facts from the stream of goings-on in our environment. An independent world is responsible for this stream, and we systematize and structure it from the very small portion the world we have navigated in our time in that world.
Recent neuroscience also fits within this Zhuangzian picture. It suggests that we focus attention on only part of the overwhelming amount of information we get from the world. We suppress conscious awareness of information that seems irrelevant to that focus. (Nakajima et al. 2019). This is how we can hear other people at our table in a noisy restaurant. Once we have our concept scheme for the world, we suppress alternative ways of naming (concept frameworks). The natural world, independent of our concepts, does impact and constrain the shape of that framework. Constellations of stars are a metaphor for this process of selection. We may see a certain group of stars as forming a “Big Dipper”, but alternatively see that group as part of a larger group forming a “Great Bear”, the dipper stars now forming a portion of the back half of the bear’s torso and its tail. Such alternative parsings cannot produce just any range of facts. But we make the facts we make through the parsings.
Zhuangzi’s epistemology and theory of mind does not concern how we represent mentally a fact that exists out in the natural world. It is of a scheme of navigation with concepts we project on the world to aid us in getting about. Zhuangzi sees a similar orientation by all natural creatures. They are equipped with faculties for getting on with their lives. Our language-ing the world is broadly like bird’s chirping. Both of us are seeking coherence with the structure of the world in our own choices of ways to live.
Constructive skepticism and substantial assertion about the world and how we relate to it do not just sit side by side in this haunting imagery, but are intertwined. Zhuangzi’s skepticism is constructive because it does not compel us to give up on our conceptualization, but to recognize its overarching similarity to other creatures as well as other peoples with different languages—systems of names. Thus, constructive skepticism is compatible with substantive claims about the nature of the world as a whole consisting in interdependent, fluidly interacting things that react to and flow into a shared system. We become an ecosystem of related ways of life fitting this natural world. Each of us emerges from and returns to that greater whole, a living monism with real parts. Indeed, the complexity and fluid plasticity of things is part of what makes the range of alternative conceptualizations of the world significant and wide. The significance of this way of all being “One” is that the world can be expected to be elusive.
The Zhuangzi expresses a keen appreciation for the variability of language and conceptualization across persons and communities. People differ in the inferences that link the terms ostensibly shared in their language. This often results in their talking past each other, as is the case with the Mohists and the Confucians. Each shi’s (affirms) what the other fei’s (negates) and negates what the other affirms (Qi Wu Lun, 4). Mohists, for example, will fei ritual practice that puts resources and human energy into rituals of mourning and burial that could have gone into fulfilling the needs of the living, and Confucians will shi ritual practice that expresses reverence and gratitude toward the deceased as cultivating important emotional dispositions of deference, yielding and gratitude toward others. Mohist bring coherence into their inference relations among terms by making benefit and harm (li hai 利害) central to normative conceptual scheme. Confucians will bring coherence to their inferences focusing on family relations and fidelity to past usage and practice, deference and ritual (li rang 禮讓). The mere fact that both have emerged in Pre-Han China does not, by itself, require either side to abandon its scheme. But it does require that we be more modest about our own constructions, even as we use them. We should recognize that our reasons for them are themselves derived from the scheme constructed in our heart-minds by past practice and exposure. We are well advised to be open to how others construct their worlds and seek understanding of how the others’ scheme works in their way of life rather than warring with or coercing them to follow what we “know” in our way of life. “… if you want to affirm what they negate and negate what they affirm, nothing compares with using the light (yi ming 以明)” (Qi Wu Lun, 4). What does it mean to use the light?
The Zhuangzi is often interpreted as holding that there is a way of knowing that is not subject to skeptical doubt. This way may be a kind of knowing-how different in kind from propositional knowledge (e.g., see Ivanhoe 1993; Eno 1996), or it may be a kind of mystical, ineffable insight into the nature of things or their oneness (e.g., Roth 2003). The skepticism, on this interpretation, is limited to skepticism about words, argument, and discursive theory (for detailed criticism of these interpretations, see Chiu 2018). Given the elusiveness of the language in the text, it is not surprising that it is hard to definitively rule out the presence of a voice that speaks for ineffable, unmediated access to the world as it is. The skill passages, however, require no such interpretation. They often emphasize that the skill is largely independent of language and admit to an inability to teach the skill to others.
A modest constructive skepticism takes care not to overgeneralize skepticism itself. It does not require ruling out skills or realization of our oneness with the world. It is, in fact, the launching point of this theory of a mind that copes with reality as it finds it. The value of Zhuangzi’s skepticism is its combination of cultivating one’s way of structuring by appreciating (shedding light on) other possibilities found in nature and other human views. We are open to other voices in finding ways to live together in a natural unity, but also open to the limitations of these other voices. No performative author (including tian) makes one of these lives required. They are real world, practical options. We, the audience, are left to make up our minds, as would be in the spirit of constructive skepticism!
Moreover, Zhuangzi even hesitates to definitively affirm ways of living (if that means not dying).
How, then, do I know that delighting in life is not a delusion? How do I know that in hating death I am not like an orphan who left home in youth and no longer knows the way back? (Qi Wu Lun, 12 [trans. 2009: 19])
While dreaming you don’t know it’s a dream. You might even interpret a dream in your dream—and then you wake up and realize it was all a dream. Perhaps a great awakening would reveal all of this to be a vast dream. (Qi Wu Lun, 12 [trans. 2009: 19])
Consider perception. In the opening story of the first chapter, “Free and Easy Wandering” (Xiao Yao You 逍遙遊) we encounter an enormous bird named Peng flying 90,000 miles up. Is “the blue on blue” of the sky is its true color or is it the distance that makes it look that way (Xiao Yao You, 1). When Peng looks down, he sees only this earth. We, looking around on earth, see much more detail. Smaller creatures, a cicada and fledgling dove, who struggle to make it from the sandalwood to the elm tree, and they wonder what Peng up to 90,000 miles in the air and head south for. These creatures illustrate that their size and powers determine their Umwelten—the worlds of their aspirations and ways of guiding their behavior (von Uexküll 2010). Each kind of organism lives in a world shaped by their distinctive capacities. Each organism “selects” from the plethora of possibilities in the world, the possible paths to its future given its size, powers and needs (see Cantor 2020 for a similar take on the “Happy Fish” story in chapter 17, “Autumn Floods” Qiushui 秋水 chapter).
Different creatures “fit” their environment in different ways. People eschew sleeping in damp places, unlike eels. People fear living in trees, unlike monkeys. Which of these creatures “knows” the right place to live? Different creatures want to eat different things. Each is attracted to creatures of their own kind and not to other kinds. The passage concludes,
From where I see it, the transitions of Humanity and Responsibility and the trails of right and wrong are hopelessly tangled and confused. How could I know how to distinguish which is right among them? (Qi Wu Lun, 11 [trans. 2009: 18])
If the point of these observations about various animals were a fairly simple relativism to the effect that each picks out the features of the environment that is the most relevant to their size, needs, and powers, there need be no skeptical thrust. Differences in what is right for each type of creature need not pose problems for the prospects of gaining knowledge. Yet the passage ends with the declaration that the trails of right and wrong are hopelessly tangled and confused. The point instead is that different animals are inevitably partial in selecting the features of the environment that are the most suitable given their size, needs, and powers. The Umwelt of an animal is likely to leave out features of the world that are not so relevant to its needs, and maybe some features are out of reach entirely from the creature’s powers of understanding and perception.
Right before this relativist passage, Nie Que asked Wang Ni if he knows what all creatures agree on affirming. He demurs “how would I know that!” “do you knows what you do not know?” Same answer (Qi Wu Lun, 11). This illustrates that the sort of skepticism in play here. It is not a complete denial of knowing that dooms any attempt at discovery. Modest, constructive skepticism encourages discovery. In the first chapter, Zhuangzi chastises Huizi for being unimaginative in using a huge gourd. Why had he not thought of making it into a boat? That Huizi stopped trying to find a use for an unconventionally large gourd because he only had conventional uses for it in his mind meant that he still had a lot of tangled weeds clogging up his mind (Xiao Yao You, 6 [trans: Ziporyn 2009: 7).
The tone of skepticism here arises from our treating conventional knowledge as final. This skeptical stance is constructive in two ways. First, the prospect of overturning received ideas is greeted with delight. We can do this by learning to take the perspectives of others, human and non-human.
Learning is using one’s capacities to increase know-how. An essential part of learning is practice. When the dao of our inner parts, our li, is coherent with a dao in our environment, we can achieve extraordinary skills. Skill learning involves the entire body. Such sublime exercise is described with Zhuangzi’s usual skill with words in “The Primacy of Nurturing Life” (Yangsheng zhu 養生主) chapter. Zhuangzi describes the coordination of his hand, foot, shoulder, and knee as he carved the ox—like performing an elegant dance—even the sounds of the cutting, flopping, ripping were like the musical accompaniment. The artist, Cook Ding, replies to a ruler’s praise of his elegant dance-like butchering, that what he values is dao through which his skill advances. When he first began butchering, he saw only the oxen. After three years, he never again saw the ox as whole. Now his “spirit” (shen 神) guides rather than his eyes depending on natural lines (Tianli 天理) dividing its joints and spaces (Yang Sheng Zhu, 2).
Three years of practice led to a changing conception of his performance as a natural way through the path structure in the ox. He no longer self-consciously performs the constituent behaviors, but focuses on the dao and li of his movements and the environment. He is totally absorbed and yet performs in relaxed joyous ease. His body knows the way; no Cartesian pilot in the head directs it.
Recent work on human embodied activity reflects Zhuangzi’s description of elevated skills. Sean Gallagher (2005) has written about the way embodiment of know-how shapes our “body schemas”, the sensory-motor capacities that give us a sense of our bodies in space. When we close our eyes and raise an arm, our body schemas enable us to know exactly where our arm is located. Our body schemas become engaged with the environment to help us accomplish our task. When we get good at using these available things as tools, they in effect become part of our body schemas, at least in that context (see also Barrett 2011: 200).
Zhuangzi’s reflections on this kind of knowing invariably includes notice of its defects and limitations. The modest skepticism that motivates being open to further advancing know-how remains for Cook Ding. When he comes to a difficult spot in the ox, he pauses and focuses, looking carefully at the point of difficulty, and carefully, cautiously, goes at cutting the knot. The experiential immersion in a learned behavior never reaches absolute or total perfection, the flow, no matter how advanced, always possible to improve or achieve with greater ease and satisfaction.
Further, even great skill may not amount to an ability to teach others. The wheelwright of the “Heaven’s Way” (Tian Dao天道) chapter says he cannot pass onto his son the right way to chisel a wheel, and likens his situation to the ancients who left their words in texts but not what they accomplished and how—know-how that died with them (Tian Dao, 9).
Humans learn complex patterns of motor responses involved in playing musical instruments and driving cars, in which the acquired knowledge is not fully accessible to discursive awareness (Clegg, DiGirolamo, & Keele 1998), and much of the way we learn language, especially the first language, is natural programming. (Cleeremens, Destrebecqz, & Boyer 1998; Reber 1967, 1989). When intuitive know-how or ability is unconsciously learned, conscious monitoring of performance can be a matter of degree. Learning skilled motor responses involve being guided by kinesthetic feelings—e.g., walking on two feet. Knowing how to ride a bicycle is notoriously persistent as “second nature”. The same applies to navigating the internet, playing an instrument, reading the emotions and body language of others (Rosenthal et al. 1979; Edwards: 1998; Lewicki 1986), or, as Zhuangzi notes, Hui Shi’s philosophical reflections (Qi Wu Lun 7). Propositional knowledge is easily explained as activation of an acquired capacity to formulate an answer to a question with “kinesthetic” sense of confidence in our performance. (Cohen et al. 1990; Dimitrovsky 1964; Rosenthal et al. 1979)
Zhuangzi links his theory of how learning cheng (shapes) the body and heart-mind and what he calls “fasting the heart-mind” (Ren Jian Shi 1). The text advises Yan Hui to fast (zhai 齋) his heart-mind in advising a violent ruler. In interacting with him, Yan must listen with the heart-mind rather than with the ears, but not just with the heart-mind but listening with his bodily qi:
For the ears are halted at what they hear. The [heart-]mind is halted at whatever verifies its preconceptions. But the vital energy is an emptiness, a waiting for the presence of beings. (Ren jian shi, 2 [trans. adapted from 2009: 26])
One may have a strategy, but its implementation must respond to the whole situation.
Having the heart-mind involved the way it was in learning after the performance has become bodily, second-nature motor memory, may actually impinge on performance flow. (Lieberman 2000: 121; McDonald & White 1993; Packard et al. 1989; Rauch et al. 1995; Fletcher et al. 2005). Thus, the relation between heart-mind’s engaging in learning and intuitive flow and bodily performance is complex. Thought focused on method can also take over when intuitive performance hits a problematic spot, as in Cook Ding’s difficult spot in the ox. At other times, it can be better to suspend the heart-mind’s judging in favor of sensitive responsive processing because the two can interfere with one another. If there is sometimes competition between the disciplined learning and practice and the immediate processing of the complexities of a situation of performance, Zhuangzi encourages fasting the heart-mind and responding with one’s whole qi.
Zhuangzi thus rejects Mencius’ hierarchical conception of the person with the heart-mind in control of all behavior. The whole body works together, and the role of the heart-mind may fit (as in learning and practice) or distract. When Confucius advises Yan Hui to fast his mind it is in the context of his going into a dangerously complex environment which demands totally alert focus on minute details of the situation. Moral lecturing and strategic manipulation of the ruler may have a counter-productive effect. More fundamentally, the appeal is to the deliberative mind to recognize how elusive the complex and changing world is, and to take seriously the possibility that it is tapping into just a sliver of the information coming in from that world.
Some link Zhuangzi’s “fasting the heart-mind” to meditation. Certain forms of meditation may increase one’s capacity for attentiveness to features of the present situation, including cues as what others are thinking and feeling. There is some evidence that it increases attentional focus and cognitive flexibility. (Cahn & Polich 2006; Davidson et al. 2003; Moore & Malinowski 2009; Moore et al. 2012; Siegel 2007; but see Hartkamp & Thornton 2017 for a negative result). “Be cognitively flexible” is in part the message of the stories of Huizi’s gourds and the trainer’s alternative offer of chestnuts to his monkeys, and the heart-mind might be able to learn it through meditation. Chan Buddhism or Zen has a complex theory of this which some link to fasting the mind.
This distinction between the conscious deliberative heart-mind as such and the heart-mind that is rigidly committed to certain conceptualizations of the world is used by advocates of combining Confucian with Daoist approaches to decision-making and epistemic inquiry. They see the Zhuangzi as affirming or approving of conscious deliberation as a learned process. When Confucius presents Yan Hui with a dao or way of “fasting the heart-mind”, they engage in conscious, deliberative discussion governed by training-induced pathways in their brains.
When Cook Ding employs caution upon encountering a complicated place in the ox, his conscious, deliberative heart-mind is taking over control from the first-order heart-mind. Zhuangzi’s advice on the organs taking turns in guiding the body, operates on a meta or second-order level. It is advice about how to prepare oneself to make quick, selectively precise and perceptively sensitive decisions on a first-order level (Kahneman 2011). The training takes place on the second level, the deliberative, cognitive level. One may be advised to turn off the second-level, meta-dao in a real-time. If you can’t recognize an ox when you see one, you won’t recognize the words we used in teaching you a dao for butchering one. Thus, Cook Ding underwent three years of study and practice after which he didn’t have to rehearse his lessons to distinguish and divide the thigh joint from the femur. He saw the animal as a composition of its natural parts. He goes about carving at the first level.
A later Confucian, Wang Yangming (1472–1529 see entry on Wang Yangming) influenced by Daoist theory, argued that we go about learning to do second order deliberation at a first order level. We are, that is, natural learners. Cook Ding went about learning to carve, but now he’s learning to practice in a different context, the king’s palace. He learned a dao of carving an ox as Hui Shi learned his discursive deliberative, deliberative, rhetorical teaching style. Both gradually came to shift from deliberate learning through practice to fast, first-order responsiveness.
Later Chinese inheritors of the Laozi and the Zhuangzi would as enthusiastically embrace teach and learning logic and scientific method. Yan Fu (1854–1921) saw science and logic as a dao of learning about natural dao. Metaphorically, he treated evolution as our natural dao. Similarly, Jin Yuelin (1895–1984) taught mathematical logic at Tsing Hua university modernized Zhuangzi’s Daoism. Nothing in Zhuangzi’s conception of naturalism rules out being trained in a dao of logic to use in guiding first-order deliberative, discursive interactions with others.
2.6 The Xunzi
The Xunzi (references to the Chinese text will be to Xunzi in CTP) is named after Xun Kuang (荀況, c. 310–c. 220 BCE). It further develops the Confucian tradition of appealing to authority of a leader to conceptualize the role of the heart-mind. Xunzi was a synthetic thinker, and his work shows influence from and response to the Mohists, the Daoists, Zhuangzi in particular, and Mengzi who becomes a foil in chapter 23 “Xing E” (Human nature is bad). Xunzi takes Confucius teaching about the role of ritual and music in moral cultivation more seriously than does Mengzi’s focus on innate moral knowledge.
In the “Correct Naming” (Zheng Ming 正名) chapter, Xunzi identifies what emerges in our lives as our nature (xing 性). This nature includes our capacity to register sense distinctions accessed in the real world through the five sensory faculties. Our nature also includes liking, disliking, happiness, anger, sadness and joy which we call “dispositions” (qing 情). The qing reacts to events in the world and the heart-mind deems what is permissible or impermissible to seek through deliberating (lv 慮). When the heart reflects and one’s abilities act on it, this is called “deliberate effort” (偽 wei).
That which comes into being through accumulated reflection and training of one’s abilities is also called “deliberate effort”. (Xunzi 22.2 [trans. 2014: 236])
Social things and activities are measured by utility, and behavior (行 xing walking) is measured by morality. That by which people understand things is called “the understanding” (zhi 知), and when the understanding connects to things it is called “knowledge” (zhi 智). The ability to do things is called “ability” (neng 能) . To do things well, we correctly sort parts of the world into named categories according to their similarities and differences. Xunzi shares with the Mozi and the Daoists a conception of knowledge as practical know-how.
To correctly sort things, one must use the names for them consistently and with clarity:
If the names and their corresponding objects are tied together in a confused fashion, then the distinction between noble and base will not be clear, and the like and the unlike will not be differentiated … Thus, the wise person draws differences and establishes names in order to point out their corresponding objects. Most importantly, he makes clear the distinction between noble and base, and more generally, he distinguishes the like and the unlike. (Xunzi 22.4 [trans. 2014: 237])
To explain how one achieves comprehensive clarity, Xunzi draws from Zhuangzi’s account of the 情 qing as the basis of choosing. Xunzi adopts the concept of emptiness (xu 虛) to talk about being receptive to impressions and keeping memories of earlier learning from interfering with this receptivity. He similarly adapts Daoist unity (yi 壹) as bringing all one’s diverse impressions into a harmonious whole in which none obscure others; Daoist tranquility (jing 靜) is remaining calm and alert, not swept away by the plethora of thoughts and perceptions, stimulation or even “irritation” (characterizations of the three concepts from Stalnaker 2003: 90–91; see Xunzi CTP: 21.8 [trans. 2014: 228]).
What Xunzi omits from Zhuangzi, however, is the idea that bodily qi plays a crucial role in providing avenues to the world’s structure that plug into the deliberating heart-mind. Xunzi recommends the three states of heart-mind to equip it in picking out, sorting, and systematizing. Xunzi is also less open than Zhuangzi to the possibilities of alternate conceptualizations of the environment for behavior. He takes for granted that there are just the similarities and differences in things that our concepts register. Sorting them correctly just is using the established, conventional names correctly. Direct realism must not be confused with Xunzi’s doctrine.
Names are conventionally established to stand for object types. With them, we can communicate with distant peoples. There is no inherent property of a name that suits it to be the name of what is conventionally established to be its referent. Once established, however, there must not be competing accounts of its referent until it is disestablished (e.g., by a “Later King”) in favor of another, purportedly better, name for common use in picking out a natural kind.
In the “Discourse on Heaven” chapter (Xunzi CTP 17.4: Tian Lun 天論 [trans. 2014: 176]), Tian is said to give human beings their inborn dispositions, the sensory faculties, and the heart-mind for controlling these faculties to act as their lord. In the “Undoing Fixation” chapter (Jie Bi 解蔽) the heart-mind is said to be the lord (jun 君) of the body, to be the one to issue orders but taking orders from no other part (Xunzi 21.9 [trans. 2014: 229]). The next chapter “Correct Naming” goes on to say, however, that
Deeming something permissible and guiding one are what the understanding must provide. Thus, even were one a gatekeeper, the desires cannot be eliminated, because they are the necessary equipment of the nature. Even if one were the Son of Heaven, one’s desires cannot be completely satisfied. Even though the desires cannot be completely satisfied, one can get close to complete satisfaction. Even though desires cannot be eliminated, one’s seeking can be regulated. Even though what is desired cannot be completely obtained, the seeker can approach complete fulfillment. Even though desires cannot be eliminated, when what is sought is not obtained, one who is reflective desires to regulate his seeking. When the Way advances, then one approaches complete fulfillment. (Xunzi CTP: 22.15 [trans. adapted from 2014: 244]).
The import of this passage seems to be that Xunzi’s way brings the society of seekers close to fulfilling desire by regulating seeking, not, as Laozi had suggested, by forgetting desires along with names. The understanding takes satisfaction of desire as the basis for social regulation of seeking behavior with the aim of maximizing satisfaction of desire.
Xunzi’s normative development of this picture of human nature, desire, and government compares to Mill’s classification of pleasures. His “heavy” vs. “light” are like Mill’s “higher and lower” pleasures—metaphors for making good judgments about superior versus inferior desire satisfactions. One problem posed by the text is how Xunzi can validate this classification on the naturalistic grounds with which he started his account of the hear-mind, feelings, and pleasure so it does not look like arbitrary declaration from the “regulator of seeking”.
His most notorious chapter “[Human] Nature is Bad” (Xunzi 23 Xing E 性惡) seems an attempt to derive the ranking from natural assumptions. Human nature is bad, he says, and goodness is a result of deliberate effort. People are born with a fondness for benefit, and if they follow along with this, struggle and contention arise. This inference seems to presuppose psychological egoism and Xunzi would be alone among the Classical masters in taking selfishness to be natural. That interpretation, however, is controversial. Others find greater continuity with Mengzi than the title slogan suggests.
However, he goes on to list inborn feelings of envy and dislike and sight and sound “desires”. The former lead to cruelty and villainy and the latter to licentiousness. It is only through transforming nature using teachers and models daoing ritual and traditional mores (yi), that human beings can be shaped to be yielding and deferent to proper order and end up becoming controlled. Rituals (and traditional music) and yi (ritual mores) generated by the sage kings are the only ones suited for the task of reshaping human beings to be compliant and deferent to proper authority and order. This is the context for making sense of Xunzi’s striking crafts metaphor: reshaping natural dispositions is like steaming and straightening crooked wood on the shaping frame, or honing and grinding blunt metal until it becomes sharp (CTP: 23.2 [trans. 2014: 248]). Thus, morality is not part of Tian’s order, but something set up by the sage-kings to correct what is dangerous and unruly in people’s nature.
The heart-mind does not have the power to reshape natural desires and emotions simply through its command. Xunzi consistently stresses the need for unrelenting “deliberate effort” to reshape and beautify people’s motivational system and character. In fact, in one famous passage, he says that the exemplary person
repeatedly recites his learning in order to master it (beauty), ponders it in order to comprehend it, makes his person so as to dwell in it, and eliminates things harmful to it in order to nourish it. He makes his eyes not want to see what is not this, makes his ears not want to hear what is not this, makes his mouth not want to speak what is not this, and makes his heart not want to contemplate what is not this. He comes to the point where he loves it, and then his eyes love it more than the five colors, his ears love it more than the five tones, his mouth loves it more than the five flavors, and his heart considers it more beneficial than having the whole empire. (Quan Xue 勸學 CTP: 1.18 [trans. 2014: 18])
If this passages about finding far greater satisfaction and peace of mind in performing actions on behalf of a beauty ideal and not for the sake of the self is put alongside the selfish characterization of human nature, the question immediately arises how one starts with a nature like that and ends up in a startlingly different place. Merely coming to realize the benefits to self-interest in cooperation rather than conflict would be insufficient for explaining how this transformation could come about (Wong 1996, 2000). Sheer persistent effort does not explain how interests in the self can become interests in the welfare of others for their own sake.
It may be that the only plausible alternative for Xunzi to work out his theory is to admit that among the inborn dispositions there is at least latent and incipient interest in others as well as the self-concerned interests highlighted in the famous passage from the “Human Nature is Bad” chapter. There are passages in the text that seem to make this concession. In the chapter “Discourse on Ritual” (Li Lun 禮論), Xunzi says that
Among all the living things between Heaven and Earth, those that have blood and qi are sure to have awareness, and of those that have awareness, none fails to love its own kind.
He gives as examples birds or beasts who become separated from their groups, grow distressed, and who seek to rejoin them. Xunzi concludes by saying that
among creatures that have blood and qi, none has greater awareness than man, and so man’s feeling for his parents knows no limit until the day they die. (CTP: 19.26 [trans. 2014: 213]).
That Xunzi identifies a disposition which humans and other animals share implies that it is natural. How is this consistent with Xunzi’s saying that human nature is bad? People’s nature can still be called bad if the self-concerned, envious and hateful dispositions become dominant when they get no education in ritual and mores or when education fosters dominance of selfishness. Human beings in their nature can be nurtured to behave on powerful impulses that get them into endemic, destructive conflict. Human nature is mixed and conflicted. Absent an environment that nurtures control of the impulses that lead to conflict, people show their worse sides.
Thus, while Xunzi appeared to postulate a strong hierarchy of the heart-mind over the rest of the person, the way he fills out the picture suggests that the heart-mind attends to the total system of desires and daos a strategy for the greatest satisfaction of this total. This impression is supported by the language of “nurturing” (yang 養) the desires arising from the natural dispositions. He concludes that rituals and rightness make it possible for humans to constrain seeking behavior by dividing things and ranks so that seeking never exhausts nor depletes material goods (Li Lun 禮論 CTP 19.1).
Xunzi’s conception of a mixed human nature and reliance on social nurturing to reshape the natural mix brings him into sharp disagreement with Mengzi about the goodness of human nature. He argues that Mengzi did not distinguish nature from what, with deliberate effort is nurtured:
What is in people’s nature is not learned and cannot be worked at. Those things they learn and achieve through working at them are their deliberate effort. (Xing E 性惡; CTP 23.9 [trans. 2014: 249])
This sharp dichotomy rejects Mengzi’s metaphor of natural sprouts growing into morality, benevolence and wisdom. Xunzi treats moral intuition on the analogy of the natural acuity of the senses. It is not something that can be learned or worked at:
people’s nature is such that their eyes can see, and their ears can hear. The brightness by which they see does not depart from their eyes, and the acuity by which they hear does not depart from their ears. Their eyes are simply bright, and their ears are simply acute. One does not learn this brightness. (Xing E 性惡; CTP: 23.4 [trans. 2014: 249])
Scientific inquiry has not been kind to this particular view of Xunzi’s, and it relates to what he does not take from Laozi and Zhuangzi. Scientists have discovered that perception is both bottom-up and top-down. We receive sensory input, but the mind fills in gaps (e.g., the famous “blind spot” to preserve awareness of a world as we “know” it. Our conceptual scheme exerts a top-down organization of the sensory input. Some of the classifications we get are inborn, but most are learned from infancy partly from our culture and from our exploring our environment, seeing which of our guesses as to what is bringing sensory input to us are correct. Acuity of perception in Xunzi’s terms, the range of distinctions our senses can distinguish may be something given to us by Tian but the world we see is profoundly influenced by top-down processes.
Zhuangzi can retort that different systems of names can result in differently populated and structured worlds. Contemporary conclusions about the relation between nature and nurture may support Mengzi’s conception of the inborn capacity as like a sprout that develops under the right environment conditions as well as Xunzi’s emphasis on nurture. But Mengzi is also vulnerable to Zhuangzi’s insight that nurture can take nature in many different directions, so it becomes daunting to try to sort tian (nature) from ren (human social nurturing).
Xunzi’s theory of reasoning and reflection vs. emotion and desire is also different from Mengzi’s. However, the differences are nuanced and his position closer to Mengzi’s than the twenty-third chapter title (“Human nature is bad”) would suggest. Clearly, the heart-mind has a supervisory role. It determines what behaviors best promote optimal fulfillment of natural desires. His language of nurturing the capacity to resist seeking satisfaction of certain desires, stresses the wise and foresighted desires of the person. The supervisory role is ultimately geared toward the good of the whole person, as is Mengzi’s. The heart-mind’s effective supervising entails paying attention to the direction and rhythms of our emotional life, e.g., our responses the death of a loved one. When the heart-mind is sensitive to the overall pattern, it can select how to channel seeking behavior to achieve personal and social harmony.
Many of the following Chinese texts can be found online at the Chinese Text Project (CTP) started in 2006. In some cases, English translations are also provided by the CTP, but for the most frequently cited texts in this entry more recent (and frequently more accurate) translations are listed.
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- Chunqiu Zuozhuan zhu 春秋左傳注, CTP: https://ctext.org/chun-qiu-zuo-zhuan.
- Daodejing 道德經， CTP: https://ctext.org/dao-de-jing. English translation Tao Te Ching, D. C. Lau (trans.), Baltimore, MD: Penguin, 1963; The Daodejing of Laozi, Philip J. Ivanhoe (trans.), Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing, 2003.
- Liji Zhongyong 禮記 中庸, CTP: https://ctext.org/liji/zhong-yong.
- Mengzi, CTP: https://ctext.org/mengzi. The text contains seven “books,” each book divided into two parts. The books of the Chinese text have titles, usually taken from the name of the first interlocutor Mengzi encounters in that book. However, the convention for referring to the books in scholarship numbers the books in order of their appearance, with the two parts named 'A' and 'B.' E.g., '1A' refers to the first book, first part, while '1A7' refers to the numbered section in that part of the book. English translation Mencius, Irene Bloom (trans.), New York: Columbia University Press, 2009.
- Mozi, CTP: https://ctext.org/mozi. The CTP version contains partial English translations. English translations of the most important parts are given in The Essential Mòzi: Ethical, Political, and Dialectical Writings, Chris Fraser (trans.), (Oxford World’s Classics), Oxford/New York, NY: Oxford University Press, 2020. Both the CTP and the Fraser translation use “books” as the major divisions of the text, but they are organized quite differently (the CPT version subdivides fewer books into chapters), so the numbers of the books in the respective versions do not match up.
- Xunzi, CTP: https://ctext.org/xunzi. English translation can be found in Xunzi: The Complete Text, Eric L. Hutton (trans.), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 2014. doi:10.1515/9781400852550
- Zhuangzi 莊子, CTP: https://ctext.org/zhuangzi. English translation can be found in Zhuangzi: The Essential Writings with Selections from Traditional Commentaries, Brook Ziporyn (trans.), Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing, 2009.
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Great thanks go to Chad Hansen for extensively editing this entry.