Moral Phenomenology

First published Wed Aug 25, 2021

Sometimes the term “phenomenology” is used to refer to the subjective character of one’s experiences or, as it is often glossed, their “what-it’s-likeness”. Used in this way, one may, for instance, focus on the what-it’s-likeness of a sharp pain one is currently experiencing and perhaps attempt to describe the subjective character of that pain—its phenomenology. However, the term is also used as a label for a field of study, having a particular subject matter, methodology, and guiding aim. This is how it will be used in this entry. Generally speaking, then, moral phenomenology is a field of inquiry whose subject matter is moral experience in all its variety, whose aims are to provide accurate descriptions of such experience, guided by methods of first-person inquiry, and to explore the significance of moral phenomenology for select issues in metaethics and normative ethics.

There are two dominant traditions within this field, one associated with the phenomenological tradition initiated by Edmund Husserl, the other closely allied with work in the analytic philosophy of mind. This entry will cover both traditions. Its aim is not to survey the different moral theories proposed in the two traditions, but rather to provide an account of the methodologies involved in moral phenomenology, to illustrate how these methodologies are applied in the discussion of various types of moral experience, and to suggest ways in which the results of these analyses address questions in metaethics and normative ethics.

1. Subject Matter and Methodology

There is a very narrow conception of the sorts of mental states and events that could be the subject matter of phenomenological inquiry, namely, “feeling” mental states and events, including, as paradigm cases, types of physical and psychological pain. Because this is not how the subject matter is understood by those working on moral phenomenology, we put this narrow sense aside.

According to a much broader conception of its subject matter, phenomenology as a field of inquiry is focused on the experiential aspects of all types of experience that are accessible to first-person inquiry, including, for example, all forms of sensory experience, emotional experience, and so on. According to the tradition associated with analytic philosophy of mind, the type of first-person inquiry in question is introspection (see the entry on introspection). Moral phenomenology, done in this tradition, then, focuses on the experiential aspects of various types of moral experience that are accessible to introspection. As a field of inquiry, its central aim is to accurately describe those aspects of moral experience that may be investigated by the use of introspection. As such, it is largely an empirically grounded inquiry into the experiential aspects of types of moral experience.

According to the tradition derived from Husserl, Phenomenology[1] is focused on essential structures of the intentionality—the directedness to an object—proper to various kinds of experience. Moral phenomenology, understood in this sense, (1) focuses on what is essential to the first-personal, intentional directedness of moral experiences, (2) aims to articulate the essences of types of moral experience, and (3) employs a distinctive a priori methodology.

These two conceptions of moral phenomenology as fields of inquiry differ somewhat in their aims and methodology, although they share a common subject matter. Let us begin with what they share in common.

1.1 Varieties of moral experience

Here we wish to propose in a somewhat preliminary way a general taxonomy of types of moral experience—a taxonomy that is intended to cover the territory well enough and is useful for thinking about the subject matter of moral phenomenology.

Moral perception includes moral experiences that crucially involve the use of one’s perceptual faculties, ocular and auditory being the most obvious. An example of visual moral perception is seeing someone gleefully torture a helpless animal and experiencing that action as morally wrong. Hearing someone utter a deliberately insulting remark and recognizing it as such is an example of a moral experience grounded in auditory perception. Understood more narrowly (and quite literally) moral perception, as understood by its defenders, involves (what appears to one as) an instantiated moral property (i.e., an instance of a moral property possessed by an object of moral evaluation) being presented in one’s perceptual experience, as when one’s visual perceptual experience presents the injustice of a perceived action (see, for example, Audi 2013).[2] Moral perception, so understood, is to be distinguished (at least prima facie) from spontaneous, perceptually grounded moral belief as when one sees someone slap a small child triggering the belief that the slapping was morally wrong. Arguably, the content of one’s visual experience need not include the presentation of the property wrongness. (For further discussion of this issue, see section 2.1.)

Moral emotions, both positive (e.g., gratitude, respect, admiration) and negative (e.g., shame, guilt, indignation) are mental states of moral significance that often have, when occurrent, a robust, arguably complex, phenomenal character. In the empirical literature, for example, one finds experimental studies of the differences in people’s experiences of envy compared to jealousy,[3] of guilt compared to shame,[4] as well as studies of people’s experiences of gratitude, of generosity, of disrespect, and other emotions. Note that if, as many theoreticians of emotion suppose, moral judgments are embedded in these emotions (or some instances of them), then the phenomenology of moral emotion will overlap with the phenomenology of moral judgment. For theorists who liken the emotions to perception, the phenomenology of moral emotion will overlap with the phenomenology of moral perception. Of course, for many theorists, the phenomenology of moral emotion will intersect both moral perception and moral judgment.

Moral judgment is understood as occurrent experiences of thinking a moral proposition, whether it is about oneself, including one’s actions, past, present, or in prospect, or about one’s character, past, present, or future, or whether it is about the actions or character of others, or whether it is about the structures and behaviors of institutions. Within this category, many further divisions of phenomenological significance are called for. On phenomenological grounds, Maurice Mandelbaum (1955) distinguished what he referred to as “direct” from “removed” moral judgments—intended to capture the difference in the phenomenologies of perspective between first and third-person moral judgment. He also found reason on phenomenological grounds to distinguish judgments of obligation (and deontic judgments generally) from judgments of value. One might also suppose that spontaneous moral judgments (intuitions) typically have a different experiential aspect to them compared to moral judgments that are the deliverances of moral deliberation.[5]

Moral deliberation includes formulating moral propositions and considering their plausibility (e.g., mulling them over, thinking about reasons for and against), typically aimed at reaching a moral verdict about some issue. This category focuses on the conscious process often leading up to forming a moral judgment or leading up to a decision to act based on one’s deliberations—both typical products of this process.

Moral agency involves exercising one’s capacity to act, including the experience of making moral decisions (an exercise of will), as well as experiences of planning, trying, striving, and acting in ways that have moral significance. Julia Annas (2008) discusses the experiences of a virtuous agent that she describes in terms of the sort of “flow” experience that is extensively explored in the work of Csikszentmihalyi (1990). Hubert and Stuart Dreyfus discuss what they call “ethical comportment”, a developed skill-like capacity in which an agent who has reached the requisite level of moral expertise can see “intuitively what to do without applying rules and making judgments at all” (1990: 243).[6]

Notice two things about this taxonomy. First, these categories of moral experience are porous, as indicated in what we have noted about the possible involvement of moral judgment in experiencing moral emotions. Moral deliberation most often includes moral judgments that one may or may not bring to mind in mulling over some moral issue to reach a verdict about that issue. Second, as indicated in the remarks about moral judgment, there are more fine-grained distinctions one might draw within and across the basic types of moral experience we have just presented (e.g., direct vs. removed moral judgments) that may be of phenomenological significance. The above taxonomy represents only a rough guide to the most general types of moral experience. In section 3 and 4, we return to the work that has been done investigating some of these species of moral experience as it bears on issues in metaethics and normative ethics.

1.2 Methodology

The methodology of phenomenological inquiry is first-personal. However, as noted at the outset of this section, the two traditions—analytic and Phenomenological—differ fundamentally. The former is an empirically grounded, a posteriori philosophical science that proceeds by inductive and abductive methods. It aims to achieve general, psychological truths about the first-personal character of moral experiences. The latter is an a priori philosophical science that proceeds via a systematic consideration of the various parts and aspects of an experience in order to identify which of them are essential to the experience being the kind of experience it is. It achieves (presumptively) necessary truths about the correlation between the intentionally directed experience and its object just as experienced (see below), including the first-personal character of its experiential dimension and the structural components of the object and its significance for the subject. Let us consider these differences in more detail.

Phenomenological inquiry in the analytic tradition relies on introspection as the basis for observing aspects of one’s moral experience, which can then be used for making psychological generalizations about such experience. Here, it is important to distinguish two uses of introspectionist methodology. One use is direct: one attends to some aspect of one’s ongoing experience in order to describe what one observes. By turning one’s attention inward, as it were, one can attend to the pain in one’s thumb and describe it as, say, dull or sharp. Likewise, by attending to one’s occurrent emotional experience, one can immediately determine that one is experiencing anger directed toward some wrongful behavior one just witnessed.

However, this use of introspection is of limited value when it comes to addressing certain philosophical controversies. One such controversy in the philosophy of perception is whether visual perceptual experiences have “rich contents”. According to a rich content view, visual experiences can and often do present the instantiation in perceptual awareness not just of lower-level physical properties such as colors, shapes, illumination, and motion, but also such experiences can and typically do also present the instantiation of higher-level properties including, for instance, properties that categorize objects (cars, cacti, clouds), actions (starting a car, planting a cactus, pointing to a cloud) and causal relations. But as Susanna Siegel (2011: chap. 3), a defender of the rich content view, points out, the controversy over this view cannot be settled by the direct use of introspection; one cannot reliably tell just by attending carefully to one’s visual experience whether its perceptual contents are rich. But this does not mean that introspection is of no use. Rather, it figures importantly in phenomenal contrast arguments. There is a variety of such arguments that differ importantly in their probative power that need not concern us here.[7] Generally speaking, such arguments draw a conclusion about the phenomenal character of a certain type of experience, by appealing to a phenomenal difference of some sort between two experiences being compared. For example, in defending the claim that visual experiences present one with object kinds, Siegel contrasts one’s visual experience of pine trees, situated among other trees in a forest, before acquiring the disposition to easily recognize pine trees, with one’s visual experience of the forest after acquiring the disposition. Siegel points to a “feeling of familiarity” in one’s overall phenomenology in the second experience that is salient to introspection. This introspectable difference figures in a premise in an abductive argument (i.e., inference to the best explanation) for the claim that one’s visual experience after gaining the appropriate recognitional disposition includes the presentation of pine tree, an instance supporting the rich content view, which then generalizes to a wide range of visual experiences. Introspection plays an ineliminable role in phenomenal contrast arguments. However, at least as employed by Siegel in defending the rich content view, its use is to reveal something reliably detectable about one’s contrasting experiences, which can then provide the basis for an argument to a conclusion about phenomenal character.

Turning for a moment to moral experience, one controversy (which we discuss below in section 2), is whether certain types of moral perceptual experience purport to present instantiated moral properties. If so, and if one takes such experience to bear on philosophical disputes over moral metaphysics, then one can appeal to such experiences as providing presumptive evidence for some form of moral realism. Suppose, though, that one cannot reliably tell by directly introspecting one’s moral experiences whether they have such realist purport. One might then hope to provide evidence that such experiences do have such purport by employing a phenomenal contrast argument.

Of course, there are important questions about the nature and reliability of introspectionist methodology. (We refer readers to the entries on introspection and on self-knowledge for relevant discussions.) The important points for present purposes are these. First, the role introspection plays in addressing philosophical disputes may vary, the basic division being between direct methods and the method that employs phenomenal contrast arguments. Second, the uses of introspection in the analytic tradition are intended to yield empirically grounded psychological claims about the phenomenal character of moral experiences, employing, inductive and abductive methods. As we have already noted, this empirically grounded methodology and its aims differ sharply from the methods and aims one finds in the Phenomenological tradition to which we now turn.

The methodology of Phenomenology as initiated by Husserl involves three key aspects: (1) a specification of the main theme for phenomenological reflection, namely, intentionality (the feature of experience whereby it is directed upon an object); (2) a description aimed at revealing the necessary constituents of the correlation between intentionally directed experiences and their objects just as experienced, that is, in their significance for the subject , and (3) a methodology involving imaginative variation, governed by a whole-part logic, of the parts and aspects of the correlation.

The specification of the main theme of phenomenology as intentionality is a result of exercising the “phenomenological reduction” (Husserl 1913: §§30–84). Without entering into the various debates about the possibility, extent, and significance of the reduction—all of which are disputed—the minimal sense of the reduction common to Phenomenologists is the suspension of one’s participation in the belief in the existence of the world (and the objects therein), a belief characteristic of our straightforward, everyday experience of the world. Husserl (1913: §31) also uses the term “bracketing” in speaking of the reduction, and this provides a useful metaphor. Just as absolute two, represented as [2], is the number two without a positive or negative index, the reduced experience—say, [perceiving the table]—is the experience along with its object as meant, as significant for us in a particular manner, without the index of existence or non-existence. Some Phenomenologists (e.g., Scheler 1913/1916) reject the deployment of the reduction because they wish to preserve a strong realism regarding the existence of values, and they believe the reduction commits one to a form of metaphysical idealism.

Alternatively and more generally, we can say the reduction focuses attention upon the object intended in experience simply as experienced. Either formulation captures the correlation of experience and its object. The reduction, in other words, is a reflective turn that leads our attention away from the object as given in everyday experience back (re-ducere) to the correlation—what we call the “intentional correlation”—between the experience intending the object and the object just in the manner it is experienced. It leads our attention back to the experiences in which objects have meaning for us. At the same time, the reduction reveals the correlational inseparability of the phenomenal content proper to the experiential, subjective side of the correlation and the intentional content proper to the objective side of the correlation.[8]

The second and third aspects of the Phenomenological method are joined in the idea of descriptive analysis carried out in terms of a whole-part logic that (1) identifies the parts or aspects of the experience, its object, and the correlation itself, and (2) imaginatively varies the whole by thinking away different parts or aspects of the whole to determine which of them must be present for the experience or object to remain the kind of experience or object that it is. Stated more formally, imaginative variation systematically varies the whole under consideration (W) by trying to imagine it first without part A, then without part B, then without part C, and so forth. If W can be imagined without part A and still be considered a W, then A is a “piece” that does not belong necessarily and universally to Ws. If, by contrast, W cannot be imagined without part B, then B is a “moment” of W and belongs necessarily and universally to Ws. The existence of any W entails the presence of B (Husserl 1900–1901 [2001: 2:5–7]). The deployment of this methodology yields a priori truths regarding the necessary and universal features of the intentionality proper to different kinds of experiences.

The inability to imagine the separate existence of a moment is not merely a psychological limitation of the human imagination. It is instead a rational inability to separate specific logical (conceptual) contents from one another. The necessity of moments supplementing and complementing one another in the formation of a whole arises out of a necessity in the nature of the things themselves, a necessity in the sense of the moments themselves (Husserl 1900–1901 [2001: 2:11]). Consider, for example, the moral emotion of guilt: guilt involves distressing feelings about something one has done and knows or thinks to be wrong. If one tries to think away the feelings of distress, one would not recognize the emotion as guilt, and if one tries to think away the knowledge or thought that what one did was wrong, one would again not recognize the emotion as guilt. Feelings of distress and the recognition of wrongdoing are moments of—that is, essential to—guilt.

The majority of Phenomenologists do not engage in the kind of detailed methodological reflections that Husserl did. However, virtually all Phenomenologists employ something like the minimal notion of the phenomenological turn to the intentional correlation as the whole that is under investigation and seek to identify the essential constituents of experience and its objects as experienced. Moreover, virtually all Phenomenologists utilize an analysis of whole-part relations, even if they do not use the terms, in order to discover essential features of the correlation itself, as well as of its experiential and objective moments. Since the whole under investigation is not a psychological subject—that is, a particular worldly subject—but any possible subject, and since the method discloses necessary and universal structures that make the experiences the kind of experience they are, the result is an a priori Phenomenology.

2. Moral Phenomenology and Metaethics

Metaethics addresses second-order questions about morality, including metaphysical, epistemological, and semantic questions (see the entry on metaethics). Phenomenological questions about moral experience significantly impact views on these topics. If, for instance, some form of moral experience has as an aspect of its presentational content[9] putatively instantiated moral properties (e.g., wrongness) or relations (e.g., fittingness), this would be some evidence in favor of a realist moral metaphysics.[10] Also, such experiences would arguably provide an experiential basis for justified moral belief and perhaps moral knowledge. And, if moral experience presents such properties and relations as aspects of their content, this would invite a moral semantics according to which judgments in which a moral property or relation is predicated of some item of moral evaluation are truth-apt. Such issues bear on the question of whether ethics is or can be an “objective” enterprise.

In the remainder of this section, we review some of the debates concerning the bearing of moral phenomenology on metaethical issues. We organize our review according to what we identified earlier as major types of moral experience, beginning with moral perception.

2.1 Moral perception

Moral perception has recently become a major topic of interest among analytic philosophers and, in this sub-section, we will confine our remarks to how it has been discussed in such circles. In the following sub-sections, we focus primarily on the Phenomenological tradition.

As noted earlier, the phenomenological issue concerning moral perception is whether human beings can perceive instantiated moral properties or relations, in the sense that such properties and relations are presented in experience as part of the content of what an individual literally sees or hears (to pick two sense modalities).[11]

To clarify the topic under consideration, three comments are in order. First, our use of “moral perception” in this sub-section is confined to modes of perception associated with the five senses plus proprioception and excludes consideration of other mental phenomena such as emotions which, on some accounts, are perceptual or quasi-perceptual states. (Moral emotions are taken up in the following sub-section.) Second, contemporary discussion of moral perception centers on whether it is possible to perceive moral properties without postulating a special moral sense for detecting moral properties.[12] Third, it is assumed (though by no means uncontroversial) that perceptual experience has informational content understood as providing accuracy conditions of one’s perceptual experience, analogous to truth conditions for beliefs (see the entry on the contents of perception). Thus, if I’m having a visual experience as of a red object spatially located on the table in front of me, then my visual experience includes as part of its content the presentation of the property redness and is thus accurate in this regard just in case the object I am looking at is red.

Turning now to moral perception, earlier we alluded to a now-famous example from Gilbert Harman:

If you round a corner and see a group of hoodlums pour gasoline on a cat and ignite it, you do not need to conclude that what they are doing is wrong; you do not need to figure anything out; you can see that it is wrong. (Harman 1977: 4)

There are at least two ways to understand Harman’s remark. One may take it as the claim that the property of wrongness is part of the presentational content of one’s visual experience, alongside one’s visual experience of seeing the group of hoodlums pour gasoline on a cat and igniting it. This understanding commits one to what we will call the thesis of moral perception (MP, for short) according to which at least some moral properties can figure in the presentational contents of ordinary veridical perception. On this view, it is possible to see the wrongness of what those kids are doing. Moral perception is not restricted to visual perception, but examples of such putative perception dominate the literature.

An alternative understanding of Harman’s cat example is that one does not perceive the wrongness in question, rather what one sees in rounding the corner are the non-moral descriptive properties one witnesses (e.g., the kids pouring gasoline) that spontaneously triggers the response “that’s wrong!” However, the property of wrongness is not part of the content of one’s visual perception. On this interpretation, then, saying that one sees that what those kids are doing is wrong should be understood as a kind of intellectual seeing, i.e., a matter of intellectually (and, in the example, spontaneously) apprehending the relation between what one sees and the wrongness of the act—a mental act downstream (or at least distinct) from one’s visual experience.

In twentieth century analytic metaethics it was long accepted that moral properties cannot be perceived, even if they are instantiated in actions, persons, institutions, and other items of moral evaluation. Thus, we find W. D. Ross remarking:

Rightness is always a resultant attribute, an attribute that an act has because it has another. It is not an attribute that its subject is just directly perceived in experience to have, as I perceive a particular extended patch to be yellow, or a particular noise to be loud. (Ross 1939: 168)

Suppose, following Ross, moral properties (assuming they are ever instantiated) are higher-order resultant properties—properties whose instantiation depends on descriptive base properties. In this picture, it is in virtue of such descriptive properties as the hoodlums intending to torture the cat and igniting it that what they are doing instantiates the property of wrongness. Further, suppose Ross is correct in claiming that moral properties, even if they are sometimes instantiated, are not presented in visual experience (to pick one sensory modality) as are low-level properties such as color and sound. Might it still be true that one’s visual experience includes as part of its presentational content resultant moral properties even if they aren’t perceived in the way one perceives color and sound? Recent work on perception gives the defender of moral perception some reason to be optimistic.

In section 1.2 on methodology, we mentioned the method of phenomenal contrast and how it is used by some in defense of the rich content view of ordinary visual perception. On this view, what is or can be presented in ordinary visual experience is not restricted to lower-level properties such as shape, color, illumination, and motion, but may include the presentation of higher-level descriptive properties including object kinds, causal relations, and actions. (Siegel’s pine tree example is often cited as an example of how the method is deployed in defense of the rich content view.) This recent development in the philosophy of perception has figured in some recent defenses of MP.[13]

The question in the context of recent developments in the philosophy of perception, then, is whether this rich content view can be extended to moral properties—higher-order normative moral properties (and perhaps to normative and evaluative properties generally). The matter is controversial, as one might expect. For example, Preston Werner (2016) employs the contrast method (à la Siegel) in defense of MP. He considers two individuals witnessing the Harman cat incident and differing in their overall resulting phenomenology because one of them (Pathos) lacks the capacity for emotional empathic responses to cases like Harman’s cat that the other person (Norma) has. Werner then proceeds to argue that from among the candidate explanations for the interpersonal difference in the experiences of Pathos and Norma, the hypothesis that the visual experience of Norma includes as part of its presentational content the property of wrongness (presumably not present in the visual experience of Pathos) best explains the phenomenological difference in question. Werner’s defense of MP is opposed by Pekka Väyrynen (2018) who advances a two-pronged reply. First, even if Norma’s experience of witnessing the cat immolation includes a presentation of the property of wrongness as part of the content of her overall experience, Werner’s argument does not show that the property is an element of the presentational content of her visual experience that is included as a part of her overall experience, i.e., it doesn’t show that she sees the wrongness. Second, Väyrynen proposes a competing hypothesis according to which Norma undergoes a spontaneous inferential transition from non-moral perceptual input (together with background beliefs with moral content, training, and habituation) to her moral judgment about the hoodlums (this spontaneous response lacking in Pathos). He then argues that this hypothesis is overall simpler, more unified, and enjoys greater explanatory power compared to the MP hypothesis. (For pertinent details, readers may consult the articles by Werner and Väyrynen.) This particular dispute, we note, is far from settled; questions may be raised about the alleged superiority of Väyrynen’s proposal over MP.

Further questions about moral perception loom large, including whether so-called thick moral properties, e.g., honesty, are better candidates for figuring in the presentational contents of perceptual experiences than are “thin” moral properties like rightness and wrongness. After all, concepts like honesty are at least partly descriptive (making them “thick”) and partly evaluative or normative. For instance, knowingly witnessing someone’s action of interpersonal verbal communication as honest is (in part) to be presented with specific descriptive information about the action—that it was neither a lie nor in some way deceptive. As such, the property of honesty is capable of being presented auditorily. Insofar as honesty is a right-making property of actions, experiencing the honesty with the understanding that it is right-making, would seem to be a case of experiencing a moral property; the moral property is presented in experience by way of its descriptive content.

Another looming question is whether one would be able to perceive moral properties were they non-natural properties. Robert Audi (2013), for example, defends a non-naturalist view of moral properties as being (in his terminology) “perceptible”. (See Crow 2016 for a critical discussion of Audi and related views of moral perception.) Finally, another question, fundamental to the debate over the thesis of moral perception, is whether it is possible to determine by introspectionist methodology alone (including the method of contrast) whether at least some perceptual experiences include as part of their content the presentation of moral properties—whether as Terry Horgan and Mark Timmons put it, such experiences have “realist purport”. In a series of articles (2008b, 2010b, 2017, 2018a,b, 2019), they defend a “neutrality thesis” according to which for a variety of types of moral experience it is not possible to determine by introspectionist methodology alone whether such experiences have realist purport. Their point, if cogent, arguably generalizes to all types of moral experience, including perceptual experience of the sort featured in Harman’s cat example, even if such experiences do have realist purport.

In the remainder of this section, our central focus will be on the Phenomenological tradition, with some mention of the work by analytic philosophers.

2.2 Moral emotion

Some Phenomenologists approach the analysis of feelings and emotions through the theory of value (axiology) [e.g., Edmund Husserl (1908–9/1911/1914, 1920/1924, 1916–35), Nicolai Hartmann (1926), Alexius Meinong (1917), Adolf Reinach (1912/1913), Max Scheler (1913/1916), Edith Stein (1917), and Dietrich von Hildebrand (1916, 1922, 1953)]. (For additional information, see the entries on Edmund Husserl, phenomenology, the phenomenology of the Munich and Göttingen Circles, Nicolai Hartmann, Alexius Meinong, Adolf Reinach, Max Scheler, and Edith Stein.) For these Phenomenologists moral perception and moral emotion merge in experiencing value properties in general and moral properties in particular. They agree that only beings capable of feelings or emotions can grasp values and the significance attaching to them. Harman’s cat example illustrates this. It is clear that we see the cat and someone performing actions that seriously injure the helpless animal. This is an ordinary perception of the features and actions of worldly beings. We also “see” the wrongness of these actions in the disgust or horror that we feel. This is what axiological Phenomenologists mean when they claim that the value is “perceived” by an intentional feeling or an emotion.

These Phenomenologists also agree that intentional feelings or emotions grasp value-objects independent of those feelings, in the sense that neither a thing’s being valuable nor the truth or falsity of value attributions is reducible to or solely dependent upon the intentional feeling. There are important differences, however, in how Phenomenologists understand the relation between the “mere” perceiving of material things and experiencing the value property and how they understand the independence of the value-object. These differences are tied to different understandings of the German term wertnehmen,[14] which parallels wahrnehmen, to perceive. Focusing on the aspect of “taking”—nehmen—common to perceiving and valuing emphasizes their relation. A taking is a single, unified experience having two distinguishable aspects, a taking as true and a taking as valuable. The truth-taking and the value-taking occur together even as they remain distinguishable. Although their focus is on value in general, these Phenomenologists agree that the emotions have moral relevance and that our choices are in some manner rooted in the emotional disclosure of the value of both the ends at which the agent aims and the actions conducive to those ends. By extension, therefore, and despite differing accounts of the experience of value, they also view themselves as moral realists (see the entry on moral realism).

On one view—a “weak” or response-dependent value realism—to perceive a value (wertnehmen) is for an intentional feeling or emotion[15] to grasp an entity (e.g., a thing, state of affairs, action, event, person, institution) as valued—or, as in the case of Harman’s cat example, disvalued. Someone’s horror upon seeing the boys burning the cat takes the burning of the cat by the boys as dastardly. The (dis)value of the boys’ action is grounded in the particular, non-axiological features involved (the boys’ pouring gasoline on the cat and igniting the gasoline), which, relative to the experiential history, interests, concerns, and commitments (including moral) of the subject, are taken to be (dis)valuable. Just as the perception of a thing S takes S as p (the cat as having gasoline poured on it and ignited by the group of boys), the feeling-apprehension or emotional apprehension takes Sp as v (the cat’s being burned by the boys as horrible). The non-axiological property p psychologically motivates the experience of the emotion with its correlative value property, and p also epistemically (and, contra Väyrynen 2018, non-inferentially) justifies the value-attribution. And just as the perceptual taking of S as p (the cat as having gasoline poured on it and ignited by the group of boys) includes the naive belief in the existence of Sp (has realist purport), the feeling or emotional apprehension of Sp as v (the cat’s having been burned by the boys as horrible) includes the naive belief in the existence of Sp along with its value-attribute v. Feelings and emotions, in other words, are a kind of axiological perception revelatory of value-properties.

The notion of taking something as valuable, on this view, entails that a value is in the first instance just the object experienced as valuable rather than the value-property alone or an abstract value-object of some kind. Finally, since these takings are pre-predicative, the term “value-perception” or “value-taking” (Wertnehmung) further entails that feelings and emotions as evaluative experiences need not involve propositional content (although they can and, perhaps more often than not, do). In other words, a belief or judgment (even a value judgment) can provide the underlying basis for an (additional) experience of value, in which case the feeling-apprehension or emotion takes [that S is p] as v.[16] For more detailed discussion of this view, see Drummond 1995, 2013, 2017; Husserl 1908–9/1911/1914; Loidolt 2010, 2011, 2018; Melle 1991, 1992, 1997, 2007; Peucker 2011; Rinofner-Kreidl 2013; and Vendrell Ferran 2008, 2013. For analyses along these lines of particular moral emotions, see Drummond 2018a, 2020b; Heinämaa 2014, 2018; M. Kelly 2016a, 2016b, 2016c; Ozar 2009, 2010, 2018; Rinofner-Kreidl 2014a, 2014b, 2018; and Vendrell Ferran 2018a.

A second view—a “strong” or response-independent value realism—holds that intentional feelings directly apprehend a priori values ontologically and epistemologically prior to experiencing any particular object as a bearer of value (Scheler 1913/1916; Hartmann 1926; Mulligan 2010; Steinbock 2014, von Hildebrand 1916). On this view, intentional feelings and emotions separate. Intentional feelings apprehend the a priori value itself; they provide access to the domain of values and to their hierarchy, which—to use Scheler’s example (1913/1916 [1973: 86–100])—ascends from sensory values (the agreeable and the disagreeable) to vital values (e.g., the noble and the vulgar), spiritual values (e.g., the beautiful and the ugly, the true and the false), and, at the apex, the holy and the unholy. Values and this hierarchy “flash before us” (Scheler 1913/1916 [1973: 68]) in loving and hating (the two basic feelings) and in preferring and placing behind or after. Emotions, by contrast, do not reveal value in the way intentional feelings do. They are the subject’s responses to the felt value. Von Hildebrand makes the point clearly:

I see a child mistreated on the street and a terrible outrage rises within me. I am outraged by the vulgarity and brutality of this behavior. The outrage is clearly […] a response to these qualities with which I am already familiar (emphasis added). (von Hildebrand 1916 [1973: 137])

The feeling-apprehension of the a priori (dis)value underlies the grasp of an object as a good (or bad). The felt value is the good-making characteristic of the object valued as good or the bad-making characteristic of the object valued as bad. Contra the “weak” view, however, the value itself does not depend on the features of the object that is the bearer of the value. While valued objects (goods), considered as objects of desire, are empirical, variable, and subjective, the values themselves are not; they are a priori, immutable, and objective ideals. The perceptual experience of the bearer is only contingently related to—that is, is the occasion for—the feeling-apprehension of the value. Aspects of this view are analyzed and developed in Barber 1993; Bartky 1997; Blosser 1987, 1995, 2005, 2012; Davis 2009, 2012; Frings 1996, 1997; E. Kelly 1977, 2011; Schneck 1987; Spader 2002; Steinbock 2007, 2013, 2014, 2016; and Vendrell Ferran 2018b.

The difference between the two views of moral emotion can be characterized as follows: On the first view, being outraged at the mistreatment of the child just is to see the treatment of the child with its non-axiological features as vulgar and brutal. On the second view, seeing the mistreatment of the child and feeling the disvalues “vulgar” and “brutal”, I respond with outrage directed at the child’s mistreatment.

Finally, in the analytic tradition, one also finds views featuring affect (Johnston 2001), moral emotion (Döring 2003), desires (Oddie 2005), and experiences of pain (Bain 2013) as modes of experiential access to moral properties, and so in this respect such views are allied with the Phenomenological work just surveyed.

2.3 Moral judgment

We have seen in the preceding section that Phenomenologists understand a feeling’s or moral emotion’s apprehension of a value as tied to the perception of an entity under a certain aspect or under a certain description, for example, the boys’ torturing the cat. The moral emotion, in other words, apprehends the boys’ torturing the cat as wrong. The as—what Phenomenologists often call the “hermeneutic as”—demarcates the entity and the value-aspect under which it is experienced. Focusing attention on the aspect or description under which the object is experienced, the subject recognizes it as a feature of the object or as belonging to the object and, conversely, recognizes that the object is as described or has the feature in question. In short, the as points to an is or a has; seeing the torturing as wrong points to the judgment that the torturing is wrong. It is the attending to the aspect and the explicit recognition of it as an aspect that produces the judgment affirming the relation between the entity and the aspect. The judgment thus introduces a new sense beyond what is contained in the moral emotion. There is an affirmation of the distinction between and the unity of the entity and its aspect, that is, an explicit affirmation of the object’s being a certain way and as having value on the ground of its being that way (Husserl 1900–1901 [2001: 2:278–280, 286–289]). There is a shift from seeing the boys’ wrongfully torturing the cat (that is, seeing their torturing the cat as wrong) to seeing that the boys’ torturing the cat is wrong. The shift is from an attributive mode of experience to a predicative one. (Husserl 1900–1901 [2001: 2:273]), and the boys torturing the cat is now explicitly brought under the concept “wrong”.

One question about the phenomenology of moral judgment is whether experiences of making a moral judgment have a phenomenal essence in the sense that there is some phenomenal property (or properties) that such experiences have in common and that serves to distinguish them from experiences of making non-moral judgments. Mandelbaum, whose work in ethics links the Phenomenological and analytic traditions, defended this kind of essentialism. As noted earlier, he drew a phenomenological distinction between “direct” moral experiences of obligation and “removed” moral experiences. The former type is where one judges that one is morally obligated to either do or refrain from performing an action that is called for in one’s immediate circumstances. Mandelbaum describes this phenomenon as involving a “reflexive felt demand” emanating from one’s immediate circumstances (rather than from one’s antecedent preferences) directed toward oneself and grounded in one’s sense of a particular response best fitting the circumstances. Because the source of the felt demand is one’s circumstances and not one’s preferences, judgments grounded in this kind of demand are experienced as objective. Removed moral judgments, by contrast, are of two sorts and include judgments of obligation about one’s past self and about others, as well as judgments about the goodness and badness of character traits (virtues and vices). Supposing that direct and removed kinds of moral experience exhaust the realm of judgment-involving moral experiences, the question is whether there is something essential to all such experiences that unifies and distinguishes them from experiences involving non-moral judgments.

Mandelbaum argued that

all moral judgments are grounded in our apprehension of relations of fittingness or unfittingness between the responses of a human being and the demands which inhere in the situation by which he is faced.

They constitute, as he says, a “single genus” (1955: 181). He thus apparently thought that the realm of judgment-involving moral experiences enjoys a phenomenological signature—an essence. Of course, even if Mandelbaum is mistaken about the entire range of judgment-involving moral experiences, it might be true that, for example, direct moral experiences enjoy a phenomenal essence. For recent discussions of Mandelbaum on this issue of essence, see Horgan and Timmons 2005, 2008a; Gill 2008; Sinnott-Armstrong 2008; and Glasgow 2013.

Mandelbaum considered his phenomenological approach to moral theorizing crucial for uncovering universally correct moral norms without begging questions for or against competing views about such norms. His phenomenological description as of direct moral obligations coming from one’s external circumstances as opposed to being experienced as grounded in one’s desires and aversions, favored some form of moral realism.[17] Mandelbaum also took his phenomenological inquiry to favor a deontological normative ethical theory, about which we say more below in section 3.

2.4 Moral deliberation

For the Phenomenological axiologists, deliberation bridges the axiological and practical spheres. It begins in the evaluation of the (apparent) goods we might pursue in action and of the (possible) actions conducive to them. Most importantly, deliberation identifies those ends that appear as ones to which an agent might commit herself in order to give meaning and significance to her life as a whole. Deliberation terminates in the choice to pursue particular ends and to undertake particular actions in that pursuit. Deliberation involves reflection and reason. The subject deliberatively determines which end(s) she will pursue given her abilities, interests, and concerns as well as which actions best conduce to the chosen ends given the particulars of the situation in which she is to act.

Ricoeur (1950 [2007: 137ff.]) speaks of decision as having a “history” and points to what he calls “hesitation” as central to this history. From one point of view, the capacity for choice manifests itself in hesitation, the wavering between different possibilities for projects or for actions. From another point of view, hesitation is an “in-decision”, as a “falling short of choice”, as a being-on-the-way to a choice, which, as of yet, is absent or deferred. “Hesitation”, Ricoeur says, “is a perplexed willing seeking to orient itself” (1950 [2007: 138]). The decision identifies one of these possibilities as my project, as the possibility I will pursue in my voluntary, self-motivated action that executes the decision. The decision articulates a project, but the project is different from the voluntary bodily action that realizes it. Although a decision can be separated in time from the action, in which case it is the capability of acting in conformity with the project that makes it an authentic decision, an action can also be spontaneous. The spontaneous action, however, is genuinely a voluntary action only insofar as the agent could have projected it in a situation to which the action is suitable or with which it is compatible. Put another way, the action is voluntary only when the agent can recognize an implicit decision in it, a decision with its history of hesitation that could be affirmed as the potential project of the action in question.

Such descriptions are well suited to explicit deliberation concurrent or continuous with the action, and they are well suited to means-ends arguments about what to do. This view of deliberation was embedded in a German law that led Adolf Reinach (1912/1913 [1989: 279]) to identify some “remarkable antinomies” in our understanding of deliberation, one of which is that meritorious actions count as less meritorious when done without any deliberation or when done only after long deliberation. If the agent takes no time to deliberate, the agent acts impetuously; if the agent takes too much time in deliberating, the agent is insufficiently attuned to what is right to do in certain kinds of circumstances. However, if deliberation is viewed less as an occurrent rational calculation, Reinach’s paradoxical conclusion can be avoided.

Not all actions are the result of explicit deliberation. There are various ways reasons for action might be at work in action, ways that might involve, say, views about the constituents of an end or views about what conduces to an end. Moral agents inherit a set of views that come to govern their actions without further deliberation. A reflective moral agent strives toward confirming for herself these inherited judgments, beliefs, and emotional attitudes regarding moral goods and moral actions, and on this basis, she adopts, rejects, or revises them. They thereby take on the character not merely of passively accepted moral beliefs but of justified moral convictions, and the agent realizes herself as a person having a particular set of convictions for which the appropriate evidence has been secured and which now defines her character. These convictions inform her subsequent judgments, valuations, and volitions, disposing her to act in determinate ways. Having over time already reflectively weighed the value of competing goods and the rightness or wrongness of various kinds of actions, a reflective agent, just as much as the agent who passively accepts beliefs, need not form a means-end argument or explicitly deliberate concurrently, but her awareness of her beliefs and actions as justified differs from that of the passively accepting agent.

Reasons of this kind dispose the agent to expect certain features in certain kinds of situations, to pick out what is salient in those situations, to have certain kinds of attitudes toward them, and to act in typical ways. In the manner of Aristotle’s brave soldier (Nicomachean Ethics 1117a17–22), the agent just recognizes the situation and knows what to do without further ado. Hence, the claim that an action is considered less meritorious when done without occurrent deliberation is false. Prior reflection and evaluation yield the sense of a specific action—that is, a certain kind of action—as appropriate for the particular circumstances in which an agent finds herself. It is the perceptual and emotional grasp of those circumstances that further determines the agent’s choice to follow a particular course of action to achieve her ends.[18]

The phenomenology of moral deliberation has also been a basis for arguing against certain metaethical views including non-cognitivism and in favor of a realist moral metaphysics. For example, Jonathan Dancy writes:

In moral choice we struggle to find, not any answer that we can bring ourselves to accept, nor any answer that we can accept in consistency with previous answers, but the right answer. We present our search to ourselves as one governed by a criterion which does not lie in ourselves; our fear is that we may make the wrong choice, a fear not allayed by the thought that we might make that choice quite happily and/or consistently with previous choices. Why otherwise should moral choice be so dodgy? Why otherwise should I agonize about what is the right thing to do in the circumstances? Non-cognitivism leaves moral life too easy, and is inconsistent with the phenomenology. It distorts our sense of the authority that the action which we choose as right has over us. That authority is one to which our choice must conform, and cannot itself depend on our choice; our choice is a recognition of an authority which it could not itself create. (Dancy 1986: 172–173; see also Nagel 1986: 149 and Enoch 2011: 73–75 for a similar argument)

Views that attribute realist purport to the phenomenal character of moral deliberation as well as to moral emotion, and moral judgment on the basis of introspection alone are challenged by Horgan and Timmons (2008b, 2019)

2.5 Moral agency

One Phenomenological view of the nature of moral agency derives from Husserl (1908–9/1911/1914 [1988: 107]) who calls the (implicit or explicit) volitional intention that initiates and governs an action the fiat, the “let it be done”. The transition from the evaluation of the envisioned end as (apparently) good to the fiat is mediated by desire. The envisioned good disclosed by the feeling or emotional apprehension is taken as desirable, and the fiat directs the agent to that desirable good as something to be realized through a bodily performance. The fiat, in other words, intends the envisioned good as realizable and is inseparable from the action that realizes (or attempts to realize) it (Melle 1997: 180). At every moment of the action the volitional intention maintains itself both as a partially unfulfilled intention that is at the same time partially fulfilled (Melle 1997: 181), and the action ordered toward the satisfaction of the desire continues just so long as the fiat is operative.

Willing is founded on and inseparable from desire, but it is not reducible to desire. Desiring is not willing insofar as it is not constrained by practical modalities (e.g., possibility versus impossibility) and it is not a determination to undertake an action. I can wish for the impossible or for what is past (or both, as in “I wish I did not have that second piece of pie at dinner last night”), and I can desire some future good but not wish to do what is required to obtain that good. Moreover, once one chooses to do A, and nothing interferes, one does A. We do not resist performing an action once we have willed it, but we do regularly resist some desires (Husserl 1908–9/1911/1914 [1988: 103, 221–224]; Melle 1997: 179; see also Bratman 2012: 73). The wishing that is relevant for the will and for action is a wishing for what is practically possible, what is realizable in action. This wishing takes the form of desire, and the volitional intention—the fiat—determines us to act.

The progressive completion of a volitional intention that initiates and controls a physical performance aimed at a desired end is a voluntary action. On Ricoeur’s view, the decision indicates a present or future voluntary action which depends on me and which is within my power. But, as seen above, Ricoeur’s position adopts a means-end conception of deliberation and action, and this masks an important distinction introduced by Husserl between two kinds of volition, namely, the distinction between action-will [Handlungswille] and decision-will [Entschlußwille]. Actions executing an action-will are initiated by a desire for an end that is not explicitly intended in the willing. They involve no prior choice and manifest themselves in the very performance of the action.[19] We shall call these voluntary actions. Actions executing a decision-will, that is a prior choice or intention, are initiated by a choice in the light of an end that is explicitly intended in the willing.[20] We shall call these chosen actions. Chosen actions differ from voluntary actions, then, in that they not only aim at a desired end but are explicitly undertaken in the light of that end. I might eat a chocolate sundae because, as a matter of desire, I like sundaes, but I might choose to snack on a piece of fruit (rather than the sundae) for the sake of my health. Eating the fruit is chosen as conducive to the end (Sokolowski 1985: 11; Drummond 2020a). In chosen action the agent wills that the action be done as conducing to an articulated end, whereas in merely voluntary action the agent wills that the object of desire be realized by acting. While the outcome of a merely voluntary action aiming at a particular end and that of a chosen action aiming at the same end might be the same, the intentional structures of the two volitional experiences and the actions undertaken to fulfill them differ.

Although the early Husserl inherited an idealized utilitarianism from Franz Brentano, later in his career he favored a view that “absolute loves” generate “absolute oughts” (Husserl 1919–20 [2012: 146]; 1916–35 [2014: 391–392]). For example, a mother’s love for her child demands that she protect her child from harm even when sacrificing her child is a lesser good for the aggregate and even when saving her child leads to harm for others. The central idea is that an objective value can become an “individual, subjective value of love”, i.e., that “the same value can be infinitely more ‘significant’ for one person than another” (Husserl 1919–20 [2012: 146n.]). Such absolute loves—we can also think of them as commitments—unconditionally bind that subject to honor those commitments regardless of what any purely objective, consequentialist calculation might require (Husserl 1916–35 [2014: 391–392]). These commitments motivate an agent to adopt an ethical life-project and to undertake the actions necessary to realize that project, a project that is “the deepest ground of [her] personal identity and individuality” (Melle 1991: 131; 2002: 243–244).[21] This view is consistent with and an extension of “weak” value-realism. The “absoluteness” of the imperative is relative to the committed subject; the imperative, in Kantian terms, is a hypothetical imperative binding only on those who satisfy the condition of being so committed (Drummond 2018b: 141–42).

What we have called “strong” value realism, by contrast, points to universal imperatives tied, for example, to the hierarchy of values mentioned above: sensuous values; vital values; spiritual values; and the values of the holy and unholy. This list notably includes no moral values. Scheler distinguishes between the purely ideal ought-to-be (the value) and the moral ought-to-do (Scheler 1913/1916 [1973: 203ff.], cf. Blosser 1987). Moral values, then, attach to actions that realize the values named in the hierarchy. Hartmann is committed to a similar view regarding imperatives. Ideal values are experienced as demands, and the gravity of the violation of a demand and the merit derived from fulfilling a demand are measured by the value’s strength and height. Hartmann acknowledges, however, that these categorical demands are problematic. Personal and universal values conflict in ways that can never be fully resolved. To do what everyone should do in the same circumstances is, in effect, to say an agent is replaceable by anyone, and this, for Hartmann, is to deny the agent’s individuality as a person (1926 [1963: 357]). Appeals to universal principles depend upon a typicality among the situations in which we are called upon to act, but any maxim of action must be tied to a particular situation and to a particular agent in that situation. Hence, on Hartmann’s view, the universality of a principle undercuts its applicability to a particular situation that, owing to the uniqueness of persons and their interests and commitments, is itself unique (Hartmann 1926 [1963: 358–360]). Universal principles, in a paradoxical way, just insofar as they fail to heed the individual personalities of agents, do not, and cannot, offer moral guidance. This conclusion pushes back in the direction of the Husserlian position on axiological approaches to the phenomenology of action.

Not all Phenomenologists adopt the axiological approach to moral theory. Heidegger (1927 [2010: 97]), for example, was dismissive of then-prevalent theories of value, and he turns instead to freedom and “authenticity” to characterize ethical subjectivity. By “authenticity”, he means a subject’s taking responsibility for and ownership over the choices she makes that give meaning and value to her life. She thereby lifts herself out of the moral complacency that characterizes agents who passively accept traditional and cultural conceptions of what “one” does (Loidolt 2018: 703–704). It is disputed whether Heidegger thus commits himself to a “decisionism”—that is, the view that a subject chooses who she will be without recourse to reasons or evaluative standards (cf., e.g., Tugendhat 1979, Okrent 1999)—or a “deep deliberation”—the view that the subject chooses who she will be in a critical reflection on her own identity (see Crowell 2007, 2013; Burch 2010).

If Heidegger is read in the direction of decisionism, however, he foreshadows those Phenomenologists who offer a constructivist account of value centered on the notion of freedom (e.g., Sartre 1943, Beauvoir 1947, and Merleau-Ponty 1945; also see the entry on constructivism in metaethics). They believe that values are created (“constituted” or “constructed”) in the exercise of human freedom. The Phenomenologists who take a constructivist approach to value and who claim that values are created in the exercise of human freedom adopt somewhat differing accounts of freedom. The most radical view (e.g., Sartre 1943) claims that the exercise of the freedom definitive of human beings constitutes the reality of values in consciously and actively transcending the agent’s situation, and that this exercise lacks transcendent values to justify it. Freedom, although itself unconstrained, nevertheless in its exercise, encounters factical obstacles, including most importantly the presence of other autonomous agents. A weaker version (e.g., Beauvoir 1947) also places freedom and transcendence at the center of her ethical life while recognizing the obstacles freedom faces. The goal at which freedom aims “is not fixed once and for all” but rather “is defined all along the road which leads to it” (Beauvoir 1947 [1948: 153]). For Beauvoir, this fundamental ambiguity characterizes human existence. Against the stronger view, however, Beauvoir believes that the other’s freedom cannot be viewed simply as an obstacle to one’s own exercise of freedom. Rather, one’s own freedom and the realization of one’s projects requires the cooperative freedom of others.

A third constructivist alternative (see Merleau-Ponty 1945) frames the ideas of freedom, transcendence, and ambiguity as analogous to artistic expression. Freedom seeks to create value within the limitations of a given situation. On this view, the significance and value of things is not constituted in the free choices of agents, even when unconscious and non-deliberated; instead persons are born into a world already permeated with meaning, and freedom is exercised in this context. Moral agents take the world as a task to be completed, a task of instituting meaning and value wherever and whenever possible through action. To create value consists in actively taking up our situations of chance, making something out of contingency, establishing communicative relationships, and creating and recreating values by actively changing the world.

Yet other Phenomenologists adopt a deontic viewpoint and challenge the axiological and constructivist approaches on the ground that values are often experienced as prescriptions, norms, imperatives, obligations, demands, and requirements. Since values are experienced in relation to feelings and emotions, the objection goes, it would seem that we are always free to value and choose otherwise, precisely because our feelings, interests, and choices can vary. Because of that, it is difficult to understand in what sense the values we encounter can be thought to impose unconditional obligations.

One response would be to ascribe a strict necessity and universality to at least some moral values such that anyone recognizing those values would recognize the duty to realize the value in action. Scheler (1913/1916 [1973: 203ff.]), for example, claims that insight into the purely ideal ought-to-be (the value) serves as the basis for willing and realizing the moral ought-to-do. But there is no clear account in Scheler of the transition from the insight into ideal value-possibilities to the experience of moral imperatives, and it is not clear that the experience of obligation would arise were one not to recognize the value. Von Hildebrand, by contrast, thinking that Scheler’s view entails that the spontaneous love of value motivates action only hypothetically, insists that moral obligation has categorical force. The “importance” (Bedeutsamkeit) of an object enables it to awaken a person’s interest or motivate her action. Value is the kind of importance that a thing has in itself (von Hildebrand 1916), and von Hildebrand isolates a group of values that are good per se apart from any relation to a subject’s interests, needs, and wants. In making this move, however, if he gains a ground of obligation, he does so at the expense of divorcing these values and their attendant demands on us from their importance to the agent and thereby their character as motivating the subject to act.

Similarly, the deontic Phenomenologists argue that, since the constructivist believes that values are created in the exercise of human autonomy, it is difficult to understand how an agent’s choices, while self-binding (at least for the moment), can legislate universal obligations that an agent would experience as a duty. Lacking the view of practical reason found, for example, in Kant, constructivism cannot underwrite moral normativity, in particular, the experience of universal obligation.

The deontic Phenomenologists seek to ground the notion of obligation independently of any notion of value or volition. On their view, the experience of obligation is prior to all acts of evaluation, all choices, all projects, and all dictates of reason, and it reveals itself in the experience of other persons (the Other). The deontic view grounds ethics in intersubjectivity, adopting a “second-person perspective” in which encountering the “face” of the Other is the ground of obligation (Levinas 1961; 1974; Løgstrup 1956; cf. Darwall 2006; see the entry on Emmanuel Levinas). The subject encounters an ethical transcendence in encountering the face of the Other insofar as the face is expressive (Levinas 1961 [1969: 51])—the “revelation” (1961 [1969: 73]) or “epiphany” (1961 [1969: 194])—of the Other. My original ethical access to the Other disrupts my subjectivity; the Other “speaks” to me and calls me out of my subjectivity. The Other, in short, is encountered as a summons and a command, and the only appropriate form of encountering the Other, therefore, is to respond. Only to the extent that I acknowledge this summons and command do I live in a world with the Other and thereby become a person—a moral agent—myself. The Other and I exist in an asymmetrical relation wherein the Other’s ethical superiority outweighs my egoism, unsettles my conscious intentionality, and contests my freedom in such a way that I must respond. On this view, moral agency begins with neither my feelings and their correlative values nor my (constructive) freedom, but with the recognition that my freedom is arbitrarily limited by my responsibility to the Other. The experience of the Other is thus from the beginning an experience of obligation.

3. Moral Phenomenology and Normative Ethics

While metaethics addresses second-order questions about morality, normative ethics addresses first-order ethical questions about what to do and how to be and divides into applied ethics and ethical (or moral) theory. The former, also referred to as “practical ethics”, addresses questions about specific ethical issues (e.g., abortion, capital punishment) and ethical issues that arise in the professions (e.g., medical ethics, business ethics). Normative ethical theory (ethical theory henceforth), by contrast, addresses general questions about which types of actions are morally right or wrong and what kind of person is morally good and why. In this section, we focus primarily on the bearing of moral phenomenology on ethical theory, in particular theories of right conduct (obligation), organized around three “formal” issues: (1) deontology vs. consequentialism about the structure of ethical theory, (2) monism vs. pluralism about the number of fundamental morally relevant factors that determine, e.g., whether an action is right or wrong (an action’s deontic status), and (3) atomism vs. holism about the significance of morally relevant descriptive features in explaining the instantiation of normative or evaluative properties. We take these up in order, after which we conclude with some remarks about other normative ethical issues that have received attention from moral phenomenologists.

3.1 Deontology vs. consequentialism

John Rawls describes normative ethical theory as

the study of substantive moral conceptions, that is, the study of how the basic moral notions of the right, the good, and moral worth may be arranged to form different moral structures. (1975: 286)

Each of these basic notions corresponds to a branch of any complete ethical theory: theory of right conduct (or obligation), theory of value, and theory of moral worth (or virtue). A common way to distinguish different ethical theories by their structure is in terms of which of these three notions (and corresponding theories) is most basic in relation to a theory of right conduct. Consequentialist theories explain right conduct in terms of the value of consequences associated with an action or with rules for action guidance; they represent value-based theories (see the entry on consequentialism). Deontological theories are united in rejecting consequentialism and, for instance, appealing to respect for persons as a basis for explaining right conduct (see the entry on deontology). Virtue ethical theories take considerations of virtue (e.g., the activities of a virtuous agent) as a basis for explaining right conduct (see the entry on virtue ethics). Because virtue ethical theories of obligation have emerged relatively recently, twentieth century debates in ethical theory were dominated by debates between consequentialists (sometimes referred to as teleological theories) and deontologists. How might phenomenological inquiry be brought to bear on the dispute between these two types of theory?

We have already touched on such debates in the previous section (Brentano’s teleological ideal utilitarianism opposed by Levinas’s non-teleological ethics). Mandelbaum defended a type of deontological view, so-called perceptual intuitionism, according to which in both direct and removed moral judgments of obligation, the focus of one’s judgment is on the fittingness (or unfittingness) of the act in relation to the agent’s circumstances, a relation that one directly apprehends—a kind of intellectual perception. Although perceptual intuitionism is a kind of deontological theory, in arguing for this view on phenomenological grounds Mandelbaum attempted to “resolve … the conflict between utilitarianism and deontology” (1955: 71). So, for instance, regarding direct moral judgments of obligation focused on promoting good consequences, Mandelbaum argues that as with felt obligations to keep a promise, or express gratitude, whose grounds lie in one’s past, a felt obligation to bring about some good state of affairs rests upon one’s apprehension that an action one can perform is felt to be a fitting response to the envisioned state of affairs in question, indeed, that refraining from the action would be unfitting. He thus concludes that there is no genuine phenomenological difference between finding the ground of obligation in the envisioned end of action (its consequences) and finding the ground of this same obligation in the fittingness of the action to one’s situation. In this way, he claims, one can reconcile the phenomenology associated with teleologically focused judgments of direct obligation with the phenomenology of direct judgments of obligation whose experienced ground is the fittingness of the action to one’s situation. What Mandelbaum attempts to thereby show is that the phenomenology of judgments of obligation (both direct and removed) have a common phenomenological character properly captured in his favored perceptual intuitionism—a form of deontology—and thus on phenomenological grounds his form of deontology is to be preferred over versions of teleology.[22]

This is but one example of bringing phenomenological considerations to bear on ethical theory. We have dwelt on Mandelbaum because of the depth and subtlety of his phenomenological analysis which he brings to bear on the issue of structure. However, increasingly, philosophers in the analytic tradition have been more attentive to the relevance of phenomenological considerations in defending ethical theories. For instance, T. M. Scanlon defends a “contractualist” ethical theory that he finds attractive partly because, “the account it offers of moral motivation is phenomenologically more accurate than any other I know of” (1998: 187). Specifically, Scanlon argues that his contractualism fits with one’s experience of the priority and significance of moral reasons for action (compared to nonmoral reasons for action) and does so in a way superior to competing ethical theories.

3.2 Monism vs. pluralism

This distinction cuts across the deontology/consequentialism/virtue ethics distinctions. A monistic moral theory of right action takes there to be a single right-making feature of actions, while pluralist views take there to be more than one. According to one sort of hedonistic act utilitarian ethical theory, there is a single fundamental descriptive property—an action’s utility, understood as the net balance of pleasure versus pain it would bring about—that explains why some actions are wrong (they fail to maximize utility) and others are not. This kind of monistic theory is opposed by such pluralist theories as Ross’s ethics of prima facie duty, according to which there is a multiplicity of basic right (and wrong)-making features; Ross identified seven: fidelity, reparation, gratitude, justice, beneficence, self-improvement, and non-maleficence. How might considerations of moral phenomenology be brought to bear on this dispute?

One sort of phenomenological argument appeals to the difference between experiences of regret and remorse. Assume (along with those who marshal this argument) that it makes sense to regret finding oneself in circumstances involving difficult moral choices, while it makes sense to feel remorse about having acted wrongly. Suppose, then, that in the past a co-worker had intervened to save your job from a vindictive administrator who unjustly wanted you fired for personal reasons not related to how well you did your job. Now, some years later you both find yourselves in new positions. You are asked by a supervisor your opinion of your co-worker’s suitability for their current position and your honest opinion is that they are not suitable. On Ross’s ethical theory, both the prima facie duty of gratitude and the prima facie duty of fidelity apply to this situation and one must choose which of them is most stringent in these particular circumstances. Suppose you choose to answer truthfully about your colleague’s job performance. Besides the regret you feel about finding yourself in this difficult situation, on Ross’s view, whichever choice you make, it is fitting for you to feel some remorse for not having complied with the prima facie duty of gratitude, which was in force when you made your decision. By contrast, on a monist theory like hedonistic utilitarianism where the only right-making feature of actions is their utility, it is not fitting to feel remorse if being truthful in this circumstance brings about a higher degree of utility than lying. In choosing to truthfully express one’s opinion, one does not leave undone a duty that was in force, even if overridden. Thus, on a monistic view, the conflict is only apparent, while on a pluralist view it is genuine. The argument, then, is that a pluralist view accommodates people’s experiences of remorse (not mere regret) in such circumstances, thus making sense of agonizing moral decisions (as Michael Gill 2012 labels such cases) as they are normally experienced (see also McNaughton 1988: chap. 13).

What Ross’s theory takes for granted is that in any circumstance where one might do something out of gratitude (and similarly for all of the basic Rossian prima facie duties) the fact that the act would be an expression of gratitude is always relevant in assessing one’s moral obligations, and always counts as a favoring reason for expressing gratitude, even if in some circumstances like the one just described, it is overridden. This reveals a commitment to what is called “reasons atomism” which is opposed by holistic conceptions of reasons, our next topic.

3.3 Atomism vs. holism

According to an atomistic view, then, some morally relevant reasons are invariant in their relevance and their valence. Opposed to this view are holists who claim that whether a consideration like pleasure is relevant and whether it counts in favor of an action depends on what other factors may be present in some set of circumstances. Holists claim that in some circumstances a factor that is normally relevant is “silenced” and moreover even when relevant its valence may be reversed! Although pleasure tends to have a positive valence, the pleasure a bully would derive from bullying someone has a negative valence, which contributes to the wrongness of the bully’s act.

Mandelbaum used the example from the previous section (his example) to argue against Rossian atomism (although the atomism/holism terminology had not yet been introduced as labels for the pertinent distinction). As we explained, if Ross’s atomistic view is correct, the fact that one has a chance to express gratitude is a morally relevant consideration that favors lying about your co-worker’s competence. In not acting on this consideration, one ought to feel some remorse (having failed to comply with a prima facie duty), remorse being a proper reaction to wrongness. However, if, upon contemplating this scenario and projecting into it, one imagines experiencing regret at being in this difficult situation, but not remorse, this signifies that one takes considerations of gratitude to be irrelevant in deciding what to do in this case. Mandelbaum argues that “the essential aspect of the situation” (1955: 78) is that one has been asked a legitimate question, and the person asking it is either unaware of one’s personal tie with the co-worker or expects one to put it aside in answering the question. Viewed this way, considerations of gratitude are not relevant in the situation one confronts. Mandelbaum further reports that he imagines feeling regret at being in such a situation, but not remorse for telling the truth.

Thus, while the experiential difference between regret, whose object is one’s circumstances, and remorse, whose object is one’s action (or omission), is used in defense of pluralism over monism regarding the fundamental right- and wrong-making features of actions, this same contrast has been marshaled in defense of holism over atomism about the relevance and valence of such features.

3.4 Further issues

Two further issues in normative ethics that deserve mention, if only briefly, are these.

Regarding three of the most prominent types of ethical theory—consequentialism, deontology, and virtue ethics—phenomenological considerations specific to each can help illuminate them. Some versions of consequentialism hold that pleasure and pain have positive and negative value respectively that figure in determining the deontic status of actions. Since these experiences arguably have a phenomenological element to them, one can expect phenomenological analysis to help explain the value they do have. Taking a Kantian view as a model of deontology with the emphasis on respect for persons, the phenomenology of respect for persons will bear importantly in fully illuminating this kind of theory (see Drummond 2006, Kriegel 2018, Kriegel & Timmons 2021) And, we have already noted work on the phenomenology of virtue (Annas 2008) that can be brought to bear on virtue ethics. (These points are taken from Kriegel 2019).

Moreover, as touched upon above in section 2.2 and section 2.5, Phenomenologists go beyond mere description of the feelings or emotions as apprehending value to bring their analyses to bear on normative issues. While some, for example, Levinas, adopt a straightforward deontic approach, others who adopt an axiological approach also address the normative. Recall that for Scheler the feeling-apprehension of the ideal, a priori value motivates (in an unspecified manner) the awareness of a moral ought-to-do that will instantiate the value. Hence, we can think of such thinkers as deontologists. Others, however, who adopt a weaker version of value realism move in the direction of virtue ethics and an aretaic, rather than deontic, conception of “right” action. Husserl’s notion of “absolute loves” as generating “absolute oughts” is a case in point. The mother’s absolute love generates an “ought” in the sense that the mother feels she must do her “best” for the child. It’s the right action insofar as it is the best action available rather than a deontic demand. Drummond (2006, 2010), while claiming that respect imposes obligations upon an agent, nevertheless locates respect within a eudaimonistic, virtue framework, and Irene McMullin (2019) develops an account of the virtues that incorporates first-person, second-person, and third-person perspectives.

Finally, phenomenological evidence has been brought to bear on the various roles that morally relevant reasons for action might play. Dwelling on the controversial category of the supererogatory, Horgan and Timmons (2010a) argue that making sense of the supererogatory as it is normally experienced requires recognizing that in addition to such reasons playing requiring and justifying roles (Gert 2004), we must recognize what they call a “merit-conferring” role for reasons—reasons that morally favor a course of action without prima facie requiring it, let alone requiring it all-things-considered.


There has been a growing tendency on the part of philosophers to put aside the distinction between “Continental” and analytic philosophy and to focus on problems of common concern. This development is perhaps most evident in the philosophy of mind. See, for example, Shaun Gallagher and Dan Zahavi’s The Phenomenological Mind (2012), which situates Phenomenology in relation to the analytic philosophy of mind and the cognitive sciences. Think, too, of the recent explosion in the study of the emotions. We have mentioned a number of moral phenomenologists who explore the emotions, and their work involves dialogue with others working on the emotions who do not explore their moral dimension. Drummond and Rinofner-Kreidl’s (2018) collection on emotional experiences, for example, has brought together Phenomenological and analytic philosophers of mind. More important, if you look at the list of references in the separate articles, almost all of them cite authors from multiple traditions. Conversely, analytic philosophers of mind are looking to Phenomenological thinkers and to new possibilities for conceiving moral experience. The work outlined in this contribution is an instance of these more inclusive approaches and suggests an agenda for further research.


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This entry is thoroughly collaborative; the order of authorship is alphabetical.

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