First published Thu Nov 11, 2004; substantive revision Wed Jun 29, 2022

Under the influence of William James’ Varieties of Religious Experience, philosophical interest in mysticism has heavily focused on distinctive, allegedly knowledge-granting “mystical experiences.” Philosophers have dealt with such topics as the classification of mystical experiences, their nature, to what extent mystical experiences are conditioned by a mystic’s language and culture, and whether mystical experiences furnish evidence for the truth of mystical claims. Some philosophers have recently questioned the emphasis on experience in favor of examining broader mystical phenomena. Indeed, “mysticism” is best thought of as a constellation of distinctive practices, discourses, texts, institutions, traditions, and experiences aimed at human transformation, variously defined. But this entry will concentrate on the topics philosophers have discussed concerning mystical experiences.

1. Mystical Experiences

Because of its variable meanings, a definition of “mystical experience” must be partly stipulative. It is common among philosophers to refer to “mystical experience” in a narrow sense: a purportedly nonsensory or extrovertive unitive experience by a subject of an object granting acquaintance of realities or states of affairs that are of a kind not accessible by way of sense-perception, somatosensory modalities, or standard introspection. A unitive experience involves the eradication of a sense of multiple discrete entities, and the cognitive significance of the experience is deemed to lie precisely in that phenomenological feature. Examples are experiences of “union with God,” the realization that one is identical to the being shared with God or that one is identical to the Brahman of Advaita Vedanta (i.e., that the self/soul is identical with the one eternal, absolute reality), experiencing a oneness to all of nature, and the Buddhist unconstructed extrovertive experience devoid of a sense of any multiplicity of realities (see Smart 1958, 1978; Wainwright 1981, chap. 1). However, as discussed in Section 2.2.1, few classical mystics refer to their experiences as the union of two realities: there is no literal “merging” or “absorption” of one reality into another resulting in only one entity. Excluded from the narrow definition are, for example, experiences of “contact” with God in which the subject and God remain ontologically distinct, even if there is a lessening of boundaries, or a Jewish Kabbalistic experience of a single supernal sefirah.

A more inclusive definition of “mystical experience” is:

A purportedly nonsensory awareness or a nonstructured sensory experience granting acquaintance of realities or states of affairs that are of a kind not accessible by way of ordinary sense-perception structured by mental conceptions, somatosensory modalities, or standard introspection.

“Experience,” “consciousness,” and “awareness” are notoriously difficult to define and will be left unanalyzed here, but the other key terms in the definition can be understood as follows:

  1. “Purportedly” allows the definition to be accepted without necessarily accepting that mystics ever really do experience realities or states of affairs in the way they described.

  2. “Nonsenory awareness” includes content of a kind not appropriate to sense-perception, somatosensory modalities (including the means for sensing pain and body temperature, and internally sensing body, limb, organ, and visceral positions and states), or standard introspection. Some mystics have referred to a distinct “spiritual” means of knowing appropriate only to a non-physical realm (nous, intellectus, buddhi). A super sense-perceptual mode of experience may accompany sense-perception as in the cases of “nature mysticism” or “cosmic consciousness” (Bucke 1901), as when, for example, a person has an awareness of God while watching a setting sun.

  3. “Nonstructured sensory experience” consists of phenomenological sensory content but lacks the conceptualization normally structuring sense-perception.

  4. “Acquaintance” of realities in mystical experiences means the subject is putatively aware of one or more realities in a way that overcomes the normal subject/object duality: the “acquaintance” is “knowledge by participation” or “knowledge by identity” (Forman 1990, Introduction). Mystical experiences are allegedly “direct,” “unmediated” insights in that sense.

  5. “States of affairs” include the impermanence of all reality and that God is the ground of the self. “Acquaintance” of states of affairs comes in two forms. In one, a subject is aware of either (one or more) realities on which (one or more) states of affairs supervene. An example would be an awareness of God (a reality) affording an awareness of one’s utter dependence on God (a state of affairs). In its second form, acquaintance of states of affairs involves an insight directly, without supervening on acquaintance, of any reality. An example is coming to “see” the impermanence of all that exists in the phenomenal world.

Hereafter “mystical experience” will be used in the broader sense, unless otherwise noted, not merely for unitive experiences. Correspondingly, the term “mysticism” will refer to practices, discourse, texts, institutions, and traditions associated with these experiences. The definition excludes paranormal experiences such as visions, voices, out-of-body experiences, and powers such as telepathy. All of these are “dualistic” acquaintance of subjects with objects or qualities of a kind accessible to the senses or to ordinary introspection.

The subject may not have the mental separation at the time of the experience by which she could tell herself, as it were, what realities or state of affairs were then being disclosed to her. The realization may arise following the experience.

Mystical experiences occur within all world religions and probably all primal religions. In some traditions, the experiences are allegedly of a supersensory reality, such as God or Brahman. Many Buddhist traditions, however, make no claim for an experience of a supersensory reality but instead cultivate an experience of “unconstructed awareness” involving an awareness of the world on a completely or partially non-conceptual level (see Griffiths 1993). The non-conceptual experience is thought to grant knowledge of the true nature of phenomenal reality, such as the impermanent nature of all things. Prajnaparamita and Madhyamaka Buddhists refer to this as the experience of the “thusness” (tathata) or “thatness” (tattva) of reality that is accessible only in the absence of ordinary sense-perceptual cognition that is structured by cultural conceptions.

It should be emphasized that mystics value achieving enduring states of consciousness over transient experiences — in particular, they value the personal transformation leading to the enlightened state free of a sense of a phenomenal “self” in which they are aligned with the way things really are (as defined by their tradition). Mysticism is a matter of practices and ways of life, not episodic experiences.

Care should also be taken not to confuse “mystical experience” with “religious experience.” The latter refers to any experience having significance appropriate to a religious context. This includes many instances of mystical experiences but also religious visions and voices, and various religious feelings, such as religious awe and sublimity. Also included is what Friedrich Schleiermacher identified as the fundamental religious experience: the feeling of “absolute dependence” (Schleiermacher 1963). Rudolf Otto reserved the term “numinous” (from Latin “numen” meaning “divine” or “spirit”) for experiences allegedly of a reality perceived of as “wholly other” than the subject, producing a reaction of dread and fascination before an incomprehensible mystery (Otto 1957). In the sense of “mystical” used here, Otto’s numinous experience is a dualistic experience and not thus mystical. Your garden-variety sense of God’s “presence” would count as a numinous experience. A “secular” mysticism is also possible (see Section 12).

2. Classifying Mystical Experiences

Mystical experiences can be classified through various dichotomies. (See Wainwright 1981, 33–40 and Jones 2016, 31–34 for detailed typologies.) The most common are these:

2.1 Extrovertive and Introvertive

Walter Stace (1960) fixed the distinction between “extrovertive” and “introvertive” mystical experiences in philosophy of mysticism (also see Otto 1932, 57–72). When an experience includes sense-perception, it is an “extrovertive” experience. Mystical extrovertive experiences include consciousness of the unity of nature overlaid onto one’s sense-perception of the world, as well as non-unitive extrovertive experiences such as “cosmic consciousness.” When not extrovertive, an experience is “introvertive.” Examples include the experience of “nothingness” — an awareness lacking all differentiated content — and an awareness of God lacking sense-experiences.

Extrovertive mystical experiences are not merely stunted introvertive ones but complete experiences in their own right (see Jones 2016; contra Stace 1960). Paul Marshall (2005) has developed a detailed phenomenology of these experiences.

2.2 Dualistic and Monistic

A favorite distinction of Western philosophers is between dualistic and monistic experiences. A dualistic experience maintains some distinction, however tenuous, between the subject and what is disclosed. Thus, theistic mystical experiences typically are dualistic, retaining, at some level, a distinction between God and the mystic. Monistic experiences are the extreme of unitive experiences in that they dissolve all duality (Merkur 1999). They are either experiences of the absolute ontological oneness of everything, free of our conceptual distinctions, or are pure consciousness experiences.

2.2.1 Union with God

Classical mystics did not usually speak of a true “union with God.” The term “unio mystica” was devised in the thirteenth century, but few Christian mystics used that term before the modern era (McGinn 2001, 132; Jantzen 1995) — only in the modern study of mysticism has unio mystica received a central place (McGinn 2006, 427). When Abrahamic mystics do use the language of union, it involves a falling away of the separation between a person and God short of identity: the idea is more of “communion” with God than union. “Deification” means becoming God-like. All mystical experiences involve overcoming a sense of “self,” but usually not a sense of becoming another reality. In theisms, this is an alignment of spirits, not an ontological union of different substances that were once distinct. Christian mystics used various metaphors. Henry Suso (1295–1366) likened union with God to a drop of water falling into wine, taking on the taste and color of the wine (Suso 1953, 185); Jan van Ruysbroeck (1293–1381) described union as “iron within the fire and the fire within the iron;” Teresa of Avila (1515–1882) likened the soul that absorbs and is saturated with God to a sponge and water. (See Pike 1992, chap. 2; Mommaers 2009.) A “spiritual marriage” of the soul (the bride) and Christ (the bridegroom) is common. Bernard of Clairvaux (1090–1153) described unification as “mutuality of love.” Overall, classical Christian mystics usually treated “becoming one with God” as a loving union of wills with God’s or even a fusion of the mind with God’s (McGinn 2006, 427–429). Medieval Christian mystics generally interpreted the biblical claim that “it is no longer I who lives but Christ who lives in me” (Galatians 2:20) to mean the Holy Spirit was filling their mind or spirit resulting in a complete alignment of one’s will with God’s. In Sufism, when one’s sense of self passes away (fana), one is filled with the presence of Allah (baqa), although the orthodox Sufis insist that the soul does not cease to exist but only that one is unaware of it in the blinding light of the presence of Allah (Schimmel 1975).

2.2.2 Identity with God

Theistic mystics sometimes speak as though they have the awareness of being fully absorbed into God or even becoming identical to God. Examples are the Islamic Sufi mystic al-Husayn al-Hallaj (858–922) proclaiming “I am the Real” (see Schimmel 1975, chap. 2) and the Jewish Kabbalist Isaac of Acre (b. 1291?) who wrote of the soul being completely absorbed into God “as a jug of water into a running well” (Idel 1988, 67). The Hasidic master Rabbi Shneur Zalman of Liadi (1745–1812) wrote of a person as a drop of water in the ocean of the Infinite with an illusory sense of individual “dropness.” The Christian mystic Meister Eckhart (c. 1260–1327/8) claimed that we and God share the same being (esse) supplied by a transcendent Godhead (Eckhart 2009, 109). It is still controversial, however, as to when such declarations are to be taken as assertions of true identity and when they are hyperbolic variations on descriptions of union-type experiences. Shankara’s Advaita gives a nontheistic example: our “essence” (atman) is identical to the only reality there is (Brahman) — there is a nonduality (a-dvaita) of all essences.

2.3 Theurgic and Non-Theurgic Mysticism

In theurgic (from the Greek “theourgia”) mysticism a mystic intends to activate the divine (e.g., God’s grace) in a mystical experience (Shaw 1995, 4). Nonetheless, theistic mystics typically claim that experiences of God’s activity do not result from their own endeavors. So too, most mystics are not involved in theurgic activity. The Jewish Kabbalah is the most prominent form of theurgic mysticism. In it, the mystic aims to bring about a modification in the inner life of the Godhead (see Idel 1988).

2.4 Apophatic and Kataphatic Mysticism

Apophatic mysticism (from the Greek “apophasis,” meaning negation or “saying away”) is contrasted with kataphatic mysticism (from the Greek “kataphasis,” meaning affirmation or “saying with”). Apophatic mystics claim that nothing positive can be said about objects or states of affairs that they experience. These are absolutely indescribable, or “ineffable.” Thus, apophatic theology typically will be negative theology — that we can say only what God is not. Kataphatic mysticism does make claims about what a mystic experiences. Pertaining to God, this means that God can be described by positive terms. Analytic philosophers of mysticism have mainly dealt with kataphatic conceptions. (For an exception see Alston 2005 in the Other Internet Resources.)

Shankara’s Advaita Vedanta is apophatic: nothing describing phenomenal features can be applied to Brahman. Even discussing Brahman without qualities (nirguna-brahman) is still a form of the formless Brahman (Brahma-sutra-bhasya III.2.14). So too, Plotinus stated that no name applies to the One (Enneads IV.9.5). In a remark echoed by Augustine and Thomas Aquinas about God, he wrote that we can only state what the One is not, not what it is (Enneads V.3.14).

The two approaches can represent two stages in mystical contemplation with the apophatic approach usually treated as higher. Theologians also may utilize the apophatic approach (and ineffability) in contexts unrelated to mystical experiences. Even the theologian who introduced the via negativa to Christianity, Pseudo-Dionysius the Areopagite (c. 500), also wrote works in the affirmative kataphatic approach on religious symbolism and the names of God, while still stressing that God cannot be fully captured by any name.

3. The Attributes of Mystical Experience

Three purported features of mystical experiences are of special interest to philosophers:

3.1 Noetic Quality

Mystical experiences, both introvertive and extrovertive, are alleged to be “noetic,” i.e., giving knowledge of what a subject apprehends (see James 1958). As Chris Letheby puts it: “Noetic quality refers to a strong sense of gaining a genuine and unmediated insight, or of encountering ultimate reality; the mystical experience, by definition, is felt to be ‘more real than real’” (Letheby 2021, 25). To what extent this knowledge could come from the experiences alone will be discussed in Section 9.

3.2 Ineffability

When classical mystics invoke “ineffability,” it is typically to affirm that there is more to what was experienced that can be expressed in any language, not to deny anything can be said about that reality. But William James (1958, 292–93) deemed absolute ineffability or indescribability to be an essential mark of mysticism. Even indirect depictions of what is experienced through analogies, metaphors, and art turn it into something like a phenomenal object and thus must ultimately be denied. Moreover, it is not always clear whether it is the experience or its alleged object or both that is considered ineffable by a given mystic.

A logical problem with ineffability was noted long ago by Augustine: God should not be said to be ineffable, for to say that X is ineffable is to say something about X, which contravenes ineffability (Augustine 1958, 10–11). This problem has been raised by Alvin Plantinga (1980, 23–25) and Keith Yandell (1975).

Several responses to this problem are possible. One is to avoid speech altogether and remain silent about what is revealed in experience. Mystics, however, have not been very good at this. A second is to distinguish first-order from second-order attributions, where “ineffability” is a second-order term solely about all first-order phenomenal descriptive terms (Jones 2016, 204–208). That is, to say that something is ineffable would be to assert that it could not be described by any first-order terms, including “ineffable.” A third possibility is to say that “X is ineffable” is really a statement about the termX,” saying about it that it fails to refer to any describable entity.

A fourth possibility lies in the ongoing negation of whatever is said about X ad infinitum in an infinite “unsaying” or taking back of what has been said (Sells 1994, chap. 1). An example of unsaying can be found in the endless negations in some Zen Buddhist meditative exercises. Since the truth about reality “as it is” lies outside of our conceptualizations of it, we cannot say that truth, only experience it. Hence, when we say, “Reality is not reality” (i.e., that reality as it is differs from what we take it to be conceptually), we must also say that “Reality is not not-reality” to counter an affirmation of its nature as not-reality. We must then negate the latter by saying “Reality is neither not-reality nor not-not-reality.” And so on. (See Nhat Hanh, 1994, chap. 5.) But classical mystics typically affirmed, as Shankara did with Brahman, that a reality lay behind all negations. So too, Eckhart prayed to God to make him free of God (Eckhart 2009, 424, 531) — it is not a denial of God but an attempt to get to the Godhead behind God and creation.

William Alston (1991) offers a fifth possibility: when mystics talk about “indescribability,” they refer only to the difficulty of describing in literal terms rather than by metaphor, analogy, and symbols.

A sixth solution comes from Richard Gale and Ninian Smart each of whom have argued that “ineffability” is merely an honorific title marking the value and intensity of an experience a mystic considers profound (Gale 1960; Smart 1958, 69).

As another possibility, Wayne Proudfoot (1985, 125–27) argues that invoking ineffability is not to describe but to prescribe that no language shall be applicable, and so serves to create and maintain a protective sense of mystery. However, experiences of ineffability occur in art and music (Gallope 2017) and in everyday experience. Think of the impossibility of describing the taste of coffee to someone who has never tasted it (King 1988). This diminishes the “protective strategies” argument.

Some philosophers think that a stress on ineffability signifies an attempt to consign mysticism to the irrational, thus excluding it from more sensible human pursuits, or consign them to the realm of the emotions (Jantzen 1995, 344). Others have staunchly defended the rationality of mysticism against charges of irrationalism (Staal 1975; Jones 2016, chap. 7).

3.3 Paradoxicality

Scholars of mysticism sometimes stress the alleged “paradoxical” nature of mystical experiences. Four senses of “paradoxical” are relevant. (1) According to its etymology, “paradoxical” refers to what is surprising or “contrary to expectation.” (2) Language can be intentionally “paradoxical” in using a logically improper form of words to convey what is not intended to be logically absurd. This may be for rhetorical effect or because of difficulty in conveying a thought without resort to linguistic tricks. (3) A “paradox” can involve an unexpected logical contradiction, as in the “Liar Paradox.” (4) “Paradoxicality” may be an intended logical contradiction. Walter Stace sees this as a universal feature of mystical experiences (Stace 1960, 212).

Insofar as mystical experiences are out of the ordinary, and the unitive quality strange to most of us, reports of them may very well be surprising or contrary to expectation. Hence, they may be paradoxical in sense (1). Reports of mystical experiences may be paradoxical also in sense (2) because at times mystical language does assume logically offensive forms when actual absurdity may not be intended. Frits Staal argued that paradoxical mystical language has been used systematically to make logically respectable claims (Staal 1975). However, paradox in this sense occurs less frequently in first-hand reports of mystical experiences and more in second-order mystical systems of thought (Moore 1973).

There is no good reason for thinking that reports of mystical experience must imply logical absurdity, as in (3) or (4). As noted above, while there do occur forms of expression that are contradictory, the contradiction is often removed by the device of “unsaying” or canceling out that propels the discourse into a non-discursive realm.

The attempt to designate mystical experiences as paradoxical in senses (3) and (4) may result from being too eager to take logically deviant language literally. For example, Zen Buddhists speak of reaching a state of mind beyond both thought and “no-thought” and perception and “no-perception” — i.e., having thoughts but not projecting our conceptual distinctions onto reality, thereby avoiding the fabrication of a false world of discrete objects. Labeling mental activity ceases. No logical absurdity infects this description. While mystics use much literal language in describing their experiences (see Alston 1992, 80–102), the literality need not extend to paradox in senses (3) or (4).

But paradox is only natural in mystical discourse: mystics want to affirm something of the nature of what they experienced, but they must utilize language originally designed for phenomenal realities and so must then deny the ascriptions as not actually applicable. Thus, the paradox of affirming something and then denying it is not irrational or nonsense. But we would need to have a mystical experience to see why the features were affirmed and why they are denied as not truly applicable.

4. Pure Consciousness Events

Is the content of mystical experiences “given” to a mystic, or is it constructed by the mystic in accordance with the mystical, religious, and cultural tradition in which he or she is embedded? First consider the possibility of “pure consciousness events” (PCEs) — mental events that allegedly involve an “emptying out” by a subject of all phenomenological qualities and content (including concepts, thoughts, sense-perception, and sensuous images) and yet remaining awake, thereby leaving only unconditioned consciousness. Do such events occur? And if they do, how significant are they in mysticism?

4.1 Defenders of Pure Consciousness Events

Defenders of PCEs depend on alleged references to pure consciousness in the mystical literature. One example is the Buddhist philosopher Paramaartha (499–569) who stated explicitly that all of our cognitions were “conditioned” by our concepts save for the “unconditioned” experience of the emptiness of phenomena (Forman 1989). Another example is Meister Eckhart who described a “forgetting” that abandons concepts and sense-experience to sink into a mystical “oblivion” (Forman 1990, 121–159). In addition, Robert Forman has testified to a PCE he himself underwent (Forman 1990, Introduction).

4.2 Denial of Pure Consciousness Events

Criticisms of the possibility of PCEs include: (1) Reports of PCEs found in the literature may not be decisive in establishing the occurrence of PCEs. We should suspect an “idealization” in these reports in which an ideal goal is presented as achieved when in fact it wasn’t. Mystics thereby remember an experience with content as pure consciousness only because of a “confirmation bias” of what was expected. (2) Reports of “emptying out” and “forgetting” may refer only to an emptying of ordinary experiential content, thereby making room for an extraordinary content. This accords well with the conception of ayin (nothingness) in Jewish mysticism, which is positively saturated with divine reality (Matt 1997). For a theist such as Eckhart, emptying the mind by “unknowing” is to empty the mind of all content other than the being that we share with God (Eckhart 2009, 34–36, 42–43), not an absolute emptiness of content. (3) Even if a subject honestly reports on a pure consciousness episode, there may have been conceptual events the subject either repressed or experienced in a nebulous way (Wainwright 1981, 117–119). The latter simply do not remain for memory. (4) Some argue that because of the way our brain has evolved for our survival, all experience or awareness is necessarily intentional. Consciousness is always consciousness of something to a subject and hence necessarily contains some dualistic content. Thus, because of our nature, there can be no experiences free of any content (Katz 1978). Defenders of the possibility of PCEs reply that it is the interpretation of the experience’s content a mystic gives after the experience that reflects cultural ideas, but the experience itself is only a pure consciousness.

But even if PCEs occur, PCE defenders may be exaggerating the centrality in mysticism of complete emptying out. The goal of classical mysticisms is to align oneself with reality (as defined by one’s tradition) — e.g., attaining the selflessness of nirvana or aligning one’s will with God’s. It is questionable if a PCE is central in mainstream theistic mysticisms where a mystic forgets all else usually only to better contemplate God. Typical is the Christian mystic Jan Ruysbroeck who wrote that emptying oneself is but a prelude to the mystical life of contemplating God through an act of divine grace (Zaehner 1957, 170–171). Likewise, the “shedding of corporeality” in early Hasidism was meant to enable the mystic to contemplate the unified supernal structure of the divine sefirot. And the Zen master Dogen (1200–1253) wrote about “wrongly thinking that the nature of things will appear when the whole world we perceive is obliterated” (Dogen 1986, 39).

5. Essentialism

“Essentialists” claim that there is a “common core” to all mystical experiences independent of culture. That is, the common low-ramified accounts of mystical experiences in different cultures and eras reveal that a universal mystical consciousness — the PCE — grounds all the different cultural expressions. Alternatively, at least there is a shared commonality of certain phenomenological features in all mystical experiences that is invariant from culture to culture and era to era even if all mystical experiences are constructed and so each mystical experience is flavored differently by a particular culture. This universal state of consciousness is independent of any religion or culture and produces some common phenomenological features in all types of mystical experiences. The common core is always culturally mediated in the expressions of each mystic’s culture, but this does not erase the experiential uniformity since experience and interpretation can be distinguished.

Thus, essentialists argue there is only one type of mystical experience or that all types of mystical experiences share common phenomenological features. For many essentialists today, the common physiology or neurology of all people regardless of culture is responsible for this commonality, not any alleged objects of mystical experiences.

Stace’s essentialism has generated much discussion (Stace 1960). He proposes two mystical experiences found “in all cultures, religions, periods, and social conditions.” First, he identifies a universal extrovertive experience that apprehends the One or the Oneness of all in or through the multiplicity of the phenomenal world that is the inner life or consciousness of the world. The Oneness is experienced as a sacred objective reality in a feeling of “bliss” or “joy.” This universal extrovertive experience (or the experienced reality, it is not always clear which) is paradoxical, and possibly ineffable (Stace 1960, 79). Second, Stace identifies a universal monistic introvertive experience that “looks inward into the mind” to achieve “pure consciousness” — i.e., an experience phenomenologically not of anything but consciousness (Stace 1960, 86) — i.e, a PCE. Stace calls this the “unitary consciousness” or the “void and empty unity” that is left when all empirical content is excluded (Stace 1960, 110). Like his extrovertive experience, Stace’s universal introvertive experience involves a blissful sense of sacred objectivity and is paradoxical and possibly ineffable. Stace considers the universal introvertive experience to be a ripening of mystical awareness beyond the halfway house of the universal extrovertive consciousness.

Stace assimilates theistic mystical experiences to the PCE by distinguishing between experience and interpretation: theistic mystics are conditioned (perhaps subconsciously) by their surroundings to put a theistic interpretation on their empty introvertive experiences. Ninian Smart (1965) concurs: descriptions of theistic mystical experiences reflect an interpretive overlay upon an experiential base common to both theistic and non-theistic experiences.

The psychologist Ralph Hood (2006 and 2017) argues that psychometric studies provide “strong empirical support” for the common core thesis. Does the fact that neuroscientists have found different patterns in the brain for different types of mystical experiences and meditative practices (see Section 9.7) mean that the experiences must be different? Even if there is a common neural basis to all mystical experiences, does it mean that the phenomenology of the experiences must be identical?

Stace has been strongly criticized for simplifying or distorting mystical reports (see Moore 1973 for a summary) and for failing to properly articulate the differences between extrovertive and introvertive experiences (e.g., Almond 1982, chap. 4). Nelson Pike (1992, chap. 5) criticized the Stace-Smart position because in Christian mysticism union with God is divided into discernible phases, which finds no basis in Christian theology. Thus, these phases plausibly reflect experience, not a culturally-controlled interpretation.

In contrast to Stace and essentialism in general, R. C. Zaehner identified three distinct types of mystical consciousness: (1) a “panenhenic” extrovertive experience in which one experiences the oneness of nature, one’s self included; (2) a “monistic” experience of an undifferentiated unity transcending space and time; and (3) the “theistic” experience where there is a duality between the subject and the object of the experience (Zaehner 1957). Zaehner thought that theistic experiences are an advance over the monistic since the latter, he thought, express a self-centered interest of the mystic to be included in the ultimate. But in his typology he had to tell Buddhists what their experiences really were (type 2) despite their explicit rejection of that position. He later admitted that Zen mystical experiences did not fit his typology.

6. Perennialism

Essentialists make a claim about mystical experiences, not doctrines. The term “perennial philosophy” has been a matter of doctrines since Leibniz. In the twentieth century, philosophers dubbed “perennial philosophers” or “perennialists” claimed that there are universal mystical doctrines about what is allegedly experienced that transcend all cultures and religions — a common core of esoteric doctrines that are expressed differently in different religions and cultures (Huxley 1945; Schuon 1975; Smith 1976 and 1987). That is, perennialists argued for a universalism of “esoteric” mystical doctrines lying beneath the “exoteric” expressions of each salvific religion, not of mystical experiences. Scholars today who are labelled the “new perennialists” such as Kenneth Rose (2016) and Steve Taylor (2017) are more properly labelled “essentialists.” (Constructivists unnecessarily confuse philosophical issues by mislabeling essentialism as perennialism [see Jones 2020].)

7. Constructivism

The approach that opposes both essentialism and perennialism is “contextualism.” Under this approach, all mystical phenomena, including the mystics’ own understanding of their experiences and of what they experienced, must be understood in term of each particular mystic’s culture and era. “Constructivists” assert the conceptual “construction” of mystical experiences by cultural influences — i.e., beliefs, memories, expectations shaped by a mystic’s cultural structure the experiences. There are cultural, social, psychological, and linguistic influences. Thus, context penetrates mystical experiences themselves and not merely the post-experiential understanding given by mystics. There is no way to separate mystical experiences completely from their interpretations since our conceptual apparatus shapes our very experience. (See Jones 1909, introduction; Katz 1978 and 1983; for criticism, see Evans 1989; Forman 1990 and 1999; Stoeber 1992).

“Soft constructivism” is the view that there are no mystical experiences without at least some structuring from the conceptualizations provided by the mystic’s culture. “Hard constructivism” is the view that a mystic’s specific cultural background completely determines the alleged cognitive content of all mystical experiences, not merely shapes or influences an independent experiential element. On the assumption that mystical traditions are widely divergent, hard constructivism entails the denial of both essentialism and perennialism. Soft constructivism is consistent with essentialism, however, since it is consistent with there being some transcultural mystical experiences involving conceptualizations common across mystical traditions. “Nonconstructivism” is the view that some or all mystical experiences are in fact free of any cultural influence, and the divergence in understanding their content comes from post-experiential interpretations.

Constructivism is based on prevailing philosophical theories of the nature of consciousness. Nonconstructivists, as noted below, can invoke some suggestive work in neuroscience. But the principal difficulty in resolving the issue of constructivism is that we only have mystics’ post-experiential accounts, which all parties agree are shaped by a mystic’s culture — we can never get to the experiences themselves to see if they are constructed or not.

7.1 Soft Constructivist Arguments Against Pure Consciousness Events

Both soft and hard constructivist arguments have been mobilized against the possibility of PCEs. Here is a sampling of soft constructivist arguments:

  1. PCEs are impossible because of the “kind of beings” that we are (Katz 1978, 59). It is a fact about being human that we can experience only with the aid of memory, language, expectations, and conceptualizations. Thus, we cannot have a “pure” awareness empty of all content. (Also see Section 4.2).

  2. We should distinguish an “experience” from an “event” (Proudfoot 1985, chap. 4; Bagger 1999, chap. 4). That X has an experience E entails that X conceptualizes E during the event. Hence, even if pure consciousness events happen to occur, they do not count as “experiences” until the subject conceptualizes them, and at that moment they cease to be “pure consciousness.”

  3. A survey of mystical literature shows that mystical experiences always have conceptual content and thus are not empty of conceptualizations.

  4. Subjects could not know they had undergone a PCE if the experience were truly empty of all conceptual content (Bagger 1999, 102–103) since there would be nothing to observe while it is going on, and hence nothing to retain later. Nor could a subject surmise that a PCE had transpired by remembering a “before” and an “after” with an unaccounted for middle. This would fail to distinguish a PCE from plain unconsciousness.

  5. Suppose a PCE has occurred and that a subject somehow knows that. Still, there is a problem of the relationship of a PCE to the subsequent claims to knowledge: if a PCE were empty of all experiential content, the experiencers could not claim to have had acquaintance of anything (Bagger 1999, 102–103). Nothing could be retained from the experience to shape a mystic’s beliefs or values.

  6. So too, if PCEs were empty of everything but a featureless consciousness, they could not have an impact on the life of a mystic, and yet the experiences do have an impact. Thus, the state must have some differentiated content.

7.2 Criticism of Soft Constructivism

Several objections can be raised against soft constructivism:

  1. While our cultural sets shape our ordinary experience, there is no good reason to believe that we could not enjoy experiences on a pre-conceptual level of awareness, especially through a regimen of training. The constructivist Steven Katz notes our “most brutish, infantile, and sensate levels” of experience when we were infants (Katz 1988, 755). It is hard to see why in principle we could not retrieve such an unconceptualized level of experience.

  2. It makes little difference whether a PCE is called an “experience” or an “event.” A PCE occurs within a wider experience of the subject, including the subject’s coming out of the PCE and assigning it meaning. Let this wider experience be the “experience” under discussion, rather than the PCE alone.

  3. Neuropsychological studies of mystical experience point to the possibility of a state of pure consciousness. For example, a theory by Eugene d’Aquili and Andrew Newberg (1999) accounts for PCEs by reference to occurrences in the brain that cut off ordinary brain activity from consciousness. (Also see Hood 2006 and Section 9.7 below.)

  4. There may be no problem about mystics knowing they had PCEs. If we accept a reliabilist account of knowledge, a belief is knowledge if produced by a reliable cognitive mechanism (perhaps with some further conditions). In order to have knowledge, a person does not have to be aware of and judge evidence, nor be cognizant of the reliability of the mechanism that produces the knowledge. Hence, “awakening” from what is in fact a PCE, if it produces the belief that one has “awakened” from a PCE, could be a reliable cognitive mechanism sufficient for knowing one had had a PCE. If we stick to an evidentialist conception of knowledge, mystics might be able to have evidence they had undergone a PCE, though not at the time of its occurrence, since a conscious event can have elements that one does not note at the time but recalls afterward. This is especially possible when the recall immediately follows the event. That is, some content was retained and the experience was not truly empty, even if the content is only a nondual consciousness. Therefore, it should be possible for a mystic who undergoes a PCE to recall immediately afterward the awareness that was present in the PCE, even though that awareness was not an object of consciousness at the time of the PCE.

  5. Defenders of PCEs can champion their epistemological significance, although PCEs are not experiences of anything. The noetic quality of a mystical experience can come from an acquaintance of states of affairs involving an insight directly, without supervening on acquaintance of any reality. Nor need the insight be simultaneous with the occurrence of the experience but may arise later. Hence, a person could undergo a PCE that granted acquaintance of states of affairs by a direct insight. The PCE plus the insight would constitute a complex mystical experience that afforded awareness of a state of affairs not otherwise accessible.

7.3 Hard Constructivism Against Essentialism

Hard constructivism’s main argument against essentialism and PCEs is as follows (Katz 1978):

Premise A: The conceptual scheme a mystic possesses completely determines the nature and content of the mystical experience.

Premise B: Mystics from different mystical traditions possess pervasively different conceptual schemes.

Conclusion: Therefore, there cannot be a common experience across cultural traditions. That is, essentialism is false.

Regarding Premise B, Katz (2013) has edited a massive volume on mysticism with the aim of displaying the stark differences between mystical experiences of different traditions, due to linguistic, cultural, religious, and sociological factors.

So too, theistic experiences are theory-laden and even their interpretation as theistic is the result of being embedded in a propensity to think theistically. That is why, allegedly, such experiences are rarely reported by those not already theists or in theistic communities. Such experiences, then, are “polluted” by theory (Oppy 2006, 350).

7.4 Criticism of Hard Constructivism

Some objections to hard constructivism are not objections to soft constructivism:

  1. It seems quite possible for subjects in the first instance to apply “thin” descriptions to experiences, involving only a small part of their conceptual schemes. Perhaps only on second thought will they elaborate on their experience in terms of the richness of their home culture. This would be like a physician with a headache, who experiences pain in the first instance just like ordinary folk and only subsequently applies medical terminology to the headache (compare King 1988). If so, there is a possibility of common first-instance mystical experiences across cultures, contrary to Premise A.

  2. Premise A is thrown into further doubt by expressions of surprise by mystics-in-training about what they experience (Gellman 1997, 145–146 and Barnard 1997, 127–130). So too, constructivists have trouble accounting for why some mystics become heretics (Stoeber 1992, 112–113) — under constructivism, their mystical experiences should reinforce their orthodoxy. These illustrate the possibility of getting out from under one’s cultural background to have new experiences. Likewise, hard constructivism’s inherently conservative take on mysticism will struggle to explain transformations within mystical traditions, and cannot easily account for innovative geniuses within mystical traditions.

  3. Two people walk together down the street and see an approaching dog. One experiences the dog as “Jones’s pet black terrier” while the other experiences it as “a stray mutt that the dog-catchers should take away.” Because of the excessive conceptual differences in their experiencing, constructivist must insist that there was no worthwhile sense in which both observers had the same experience. However, there is a valuable sense in which they are having the same experience: seeing that black dog at that place and time. Similarly, there might exist a valuable commonality of experiences across mystical traditions despite conceptual disparity. The conceptual differences might not be sufficient to deny this important commonality (Wainwright 1981, 25).

  4. Cultural conditioning does not influence everyone to the same degree and in the same way. Individuals have rich and varied personal histories that influence their experiences in their lives in widely differing ways. Some accept cultural restraints gladly, others rebel against them, others are blessed with a creative spirit, and so on.

  5. Mystical traditions characteristically involve disciplines aimed at loosening the hold of one’s conceptual scheme on subsequent experience. Meditative techniques promote a pronounced inhibition of ordinary cognitive processes — what Arthur Deikman (1980) labelled “deautomization.” This plausibly restricts the influence of one’s cultural background on one’s mystical experiences, in turn making possible identical experiences across mystical traditions to the extent that our neurology is the same in relevant respects.

  6. Hard constructivists also fail to account well for widely differing mystical understandings of the same religious text. For example, the metaphysics of the Upanishads and Brahma Sutra is an absolute nondualism for Shankara (c. eighth century CE), a “qualified dualism” for Ramanuja (c. 1055–1137), and a strict dualism for Madhva (1199–1278). (See Radhakrishnan 1968, introduction.) Likewise, the teaching of emptiness in the Buddhist Heart Sutra receives disparate unpacking in different streams of Buddhism. It is plausible to conclude that distinct mystical experiences were responsible, at least in part, for these differences. If so, the experience control the mystics’ understanding of their basic scriptures rather than vice versa.

  7. More generally, hard constructivists overemphasize the influence of pre-mystical religious teaching on the mystic’s experience. Mystical experiences can cause a mystic to reinvent the meaning of doctrines. An example is the Jewish Kabbalistic transformation of the notion of mitzvah (“commandment”) to that of “joining” or “connection” with God. Starting with “commandment,” the mystic ends up with “clinging” (devekut) to God.

8. Inherentists and Attributionists

“Inherentists” believe that there are experiences that are inherently religious or mystical. “Attributionists” believe that there are no inherently religious or mystical experiences (see Proudfoot 1985) — experiences are only deemed religious by the subject or a group. Ann Taves contends that people or groups have experiences of what afterward strikes them as “special.” Only then, depending on various factors, will they attribute a religious or mystical meaning to them (Taves 2009). Some neuropsychological research seems to support this position (Azari et al. 2001). Taves also rejects constructivism: constructivists see religious or mystical experiences to be constituted from the very start by cultural conditioning, but attributionists deny this in favor of a tiered or “block-building” approach from experiencing something “special” to a religious or mystical conclusion.

William Forgie (1984 and 1994) argues, as would an attributionist, that there could not be an “experience of God” if we understand “experience of God to mean that it is phenomenologically given in the experience itself that an experience is in fact of God. He argues that phenomenological content can consist only of general features and not features specifically identifying God as the object of experience. He compares this to seeing one of two identical twins. Which one of the two you perceive cannot be a phenomenological given. Likewise, that someone experiences precisely God and not something else cannot be a phenomenological datum. Pike (1992, chap. 7) argues, against Forgie, that the individuation of an object can be a component of the phenomenological content of an experience, drawing on examples from sense-perception.

We can distinguish “inherently religious” from “inherently mystical.” Today it is increasingly becoming apparent that mystical experiences are real: there is evidence of distinctive configurations of brain activity uniquely associated with mystical experiences (e.g., Newberg, d’Aquili, and Rause 2001, 143; Yaden et al. 2017, 60). However, by “real,” neuroscientists mean only that mystical experiences involve distinct neurological events and are not merely ordinary experiences interpreted as mystical or products of the imagination, not that they are necessarily cognitive. If unique patterns of brain activity do underlie different mystical experiences, then it may be that there are some experiences that are inherently mystical even though their significance varies between different religious and nonreligious experiencers and thus these experiences are not inherently religious.

9. Epistemology

William James asked: “Do mystical states establish the truth of those theological affections in which the saintly life has its roots?” (1958, 415). This question can be divided into two: (Q1) Is a mystic warranted in thinking that his or her experiences are veridical or have evidential value? A mystical experience may be psychologically compelling for the person who had it, but is it also cognitively authoritative? And (Q2), are those who have not undergone any mystical experience, upon examining the evidence presented by mystics, warranted in thinking them veridical or endowed with evidential value? The major philosophical reply in the affirmative to Q1 is called the “Doxastic Practice Approach.” The major defense of an affirmative reply to Q2 is called the “Argument from Experience.”

9.1 The Doxastic Practice Approach

William Alston has defended the beliefs that people form from their mystical and numinous experiences, specifically of a theistic kind, based on their “doxastic practice.” He defines a “doxastic practice” as consisting of socially established ways of forming and epistemically evaluating beliefs (the “output”) from a certain kind of content from various inputs, such as cognitive and perceptual ones (Alston 1991, 100; also see Alston 2005, chap. 9–11). The practice is beholden to an “over-rider system” which is a background system of beliefs against which beliefs supported by the practice are checked for possible over-riders. The practice of forming physical-object beliefs based on sense-perception is an example of a doxastic practice; drawing deductive conclusions from premises is another. Alston (1993) argues that the justification of every doxastic practice is “epistemically circular” — i.e., its reliability cannot be established in any way independent of the practice itself. This includes sense-perception practice. However, we cannot avoid engaging in doxastic practices. Therefore, Alston contends, it is a matter of practical rationality to engage in the doxastic practices we do engage in providing there is no good reason to think they are unreliable.

There are also doxastic practices consisting of forming beliefs about God, God’s purposes for us, and the like, grounded on religious and mystical experiences such as “God is now appearing to me.” The Christian doxastic practice has an over-rider system consisting of scriptures, Christian dogma, and guidelines resulting from the past history of the mystical Christian doxastic practice. It follows from Alston’s argument that it is rational for a person engaged in such a practice to take its belief outputs as true unless the practice is shown to be unreliable. Thus we have an affirmative answer to question Q1.

Most objections to Alston are equally objections to the Argument from Experience or come from general epistemological complaints. Objections that apply specifically to Alston include Jonathan Kvanvig’s (1994) faulting of Alston for a loose employment of “rationality.” He argues that no one meaning of that term can do the work Alston does with it. Another objection is that Alston moves from “It is practically rational to engage in a Christian doxastic practice” to “It is rational for me to believe the Christian doxastic practice is reliable.” Others argue that there is a problem with the construction of the over-rider system of the Christian mystical practice since the guidelines gleaned from the history of the practice, so it is argued, were compromised by androcentric bias and outdated scientific beliefs. (See Section 10.) These detract from the practice’s epistemic legitimacy (Gellman 2011).

It is also a question whether the Christian doxastic practice approach is able to justify conversion experiences since in such experiences the subject is not yet Christian and cannot employ the Christian over-rider system when becoming convinced to accept the Christian practice and its over-rider system.

9.2 The Argument from Experience

Various philosophers have defended the evidential value, to one degree or another, of some religious and mystical experiences, principally with regard to experiences of God (see Baillie 1939, Broad 1953, Davis 1989, Gellman 1997 and 2001a, Gutting 1982, Swinburne 1991 and 1996, Wainwright 1981, Yandell 1993). These philosophers have stressed the “perceptual” nature of experiences of God. This approach can be summarized as follows:

  1. Experiences of God have a subject/object structure with a phenomenological content allegedly representing the object of the experience. Subjects are also moved to make truth claims based on such experiences. Furthermore, there are mystical procedures for getting into position for a mystical experience of God (see Underhill 1911 [1945, 90–94]), and others can take up a suitable mystical path to try to check on the subject’s claims (see Bergson 1977, 210). In all these ways, experiences of God are perceptual in nature.

  2. Such experiences count as at least some evidence in favor of their own validity. That a person seems to experience some object is some reason to think he or she really does have experiential contact with it. Thus, experiences of God count as at least some evidence in favor of their own validity.

  3. Agreement between experiences of people in different places, times, and traditions enhances the evidence in favor of their validity (see Broad 1953). Hence, agreement about experiences of God in diverse circumstances enhances the evidence in their favor. (But see Section 9.6.)

  4. Further enhancement of the validity of a mystical experience can come from appropriate consequences in the life of the person who had the experience, such as increased saintliness (see Wainwright 1981, 83–88). William James proposed a pragmatic “fruit” test for determining true mystical doctrines (James 1958, 368): if a mystical experience produces positive results in how one leads one’s life, then the experience is authentic and the way of life one follows is vindicated, and so the teachings leading to the positive life are correct. In short, the “truth” of one’s beliefs are shown by one’s life as a whole. (But what is considered positive fruit in one mystical tradition may not be considered so in another.)

(1)–(4) yield initial evidence in favor of the validity of (some) experiences of God.

Kai-Man Kwan has developed this type of argument further by specifying theistic experience, in particular, as a “well-established type of experience.” The tokens of such a type of experience occur to many people and on repeated occasions, have a common ontology, and are communicable in a coherent conceptual framework. This strengthens an argument from experience for theistic experience (Kwan 2011, 511).

Kwan (2011 and 2013) has also significantly expanded the Argument from Experience in a way that avoids focusing only on experiential episodes. He argues for what he calls a “holistic empiricism” that considers an array of dimensions of human experience: the noetic (consisting of epistemic seemings), the qualitative (the feel of what it is like to have the experience), and the volitional (action, choice, deliberation, and the like). Kwan argues that when judging the credentials of religious experience we should take into account the following experiences, in addition to narrowly selected religious experiences: experiences of the natural world and of the self, existential experience, interpersonal experience, moral experience, aesthetic experience, and intellectual experience. Kwan argues that the integration, in the appropriate way, of these types of experience coherently and fruitfully constitutes a defeasible justification for relying on the product of religious belief. Kwan argues in this way for theistic belief in particular. A similar argument can be presented for judging narrowly construed mystical experience. The unit of justification of believing a proposition when having had a mystical experience would be the entire holistic complex of all of the mystic’s experiences. Going beyond, but including, discrete mystical episodes, the mystic is able to fashion a cumulative case for mystical conclusions.

Kwan’s argument avoids the objection based on dissimilarities between mystical experiences and sense-experience. The unit of justification then encompasses far more than the mystical experience itself. Kwan’s argument also neutralizes objections based on neuroscience against the validity of mystical experiences: belief in the import of mystical experience will seek justification far beyond what can be possibly identified as a brain state accompanying a mystical experience.

Whether any experiences of God are veridical in the end will depend on the strength of the initial evidential case, on other favorable evidence, and on the power of counter-considerations against validity. Defenders of the Argument from Experience differ over the strength of the initial evidential case and have defended the Argument against counter-evidence to varying degrees.

9.3 Disanalogies to Sense-Experience

Several philosophers have argued against either the Doxastic Practice Approach or the Argument from Experience, or both (see Bagger 1999; Fales 1996a, 1996b, and 2001; Gale 1991, 1994, and 1995; C.B. Martin 1955; M. Martin 1990; Proudfoot 1985; Rowe 1982). Philosophers have disputed the Argument from Experience on the grounds of alleged disanalogies between experiences of God and sense-perception. Two issues must be examined: whether the disanalogies exist, and if they do exist, whether they are epistemologically significant.

9.3.1 Lack of Checkability

The analogy allegedly breaks down over the lack of appropriate cross-checking procedures for experiences of God. With sense-perception, we can cross-check by employing inductive methods to determine causally relevant antecedent conditions; we can “triangulate” an event by correlating it with other effects of the same purported cause; and we can discover causal mechanisms connecting a cause to its effects. These are not available for checking on experiences of God. Evan Fales (2001 and 2010) argues that cross-checkability is an integral part of any successful perceptual epistemic practice. Therefore, the perceptual epistemic practice in which mystical experiences of God are embedded is severely defective. Moreover, Richard Gale (1991) argues that in experiences of God there is missing agreement between perceivers as well as missing the possibility of checking whether the perceiver was in the “right” position and psychological and physiological state for a veridical experience. For similar reasons, C.B. Martin (1955) concludes that claims to have experienced God are “very close” to subjective claims like “I seem to see a piece of paper” rather than to objective claims like “I see a piece of paper.”

William Rowe (1982) observes that God may choose to reveal himself to one person and not to another. Thus, unlike with sense-perception, the failure of others to have an experience of God under conditions similar to those in which one person did, does not impugn the validity of the experience. Therefore, we have no way of determining when an experience of God is delusory. If so, neither can we credit an experience as authentic.

9.3.2 God’s Lack of Space-Time Coordinates

Some philosophers have argued that there could never be evidence for thinking a person had perceived God (Gale 1994 and 1995; Byrne 2001). For there to be evidence that a person experienced an object O, and did not merely have an “O-ish-impression,” it would have to be possible for there to be evidence that O was the common object of different perceptions. In turn, this would be possible only if it were possible to distinguish perceptions of O specifically from possible perceptions of other objects that might be perceptually similar to O. This latter requirement is possible only if O exists in both space and time. Only space-time coordinates make it possible to distinguish O from objects of similar appearance existing in other space-time coordinates. God, however, does not exist in space and time. Therefore, there could never be evidence that a person had experienced God.

9.4 Evaluation of the Disanalogy Arguments

Although Alston defends the perceptual character of mystical experiences of God for his Doxastic Practice Approach, there is no restriction that the experiential input of a doxastic practice must be perceptual in nature. Any cognitive input will do. Hence, disanalogies between experiences of God and sense-perception, even if great, would not be directly harmful to this approach (Alston 1994).

Regarding the bearing of the alleged disanalogies on the Argument from Experience, the disanalogists take the evidential credentials of sense-perception as paradigmatic for epistemology. They equate confirming and disconfirming evidence only when evidence strongly analogous to the kind for sensory perception is available. However, the evidential requirement should be only “confirming experiential evidence,” be what it may. If God-sightings have confirming evidence, even if different from the kind available for dualistic sense-perception, they will then be evidentially strengthened. If God-sightings do not have much confirming empirical evidence, be it what it may, they will remain unjustified for that reason, and not because they lack cross-checks appropriate to sense-perception.

Perhaps the justification of physical-object claims should not be our evidential standard since our ordinary physical-object beliefs are far over-supported by confirming evidence. We have extremely large constellations of confirming networks there. Hence, it does not follow that were mystical claims justified to a lesser degree than that, or not by similar procedures, that they would be unjustified at all.

A problem with the argument from God’s lack of dimensionality is that the practice of identifying physical objects proceeds by way of an interplay between qualitative features and relative positions to determine both location and identity. The judgments we make reflect a holistic practice of making identifications of place and identity together. There is no obvious reason why the identification of God cannot take place within its own holistic practice, with its own criteria of identification, not beholden to the holistic practice involved in identifying physical objects. (See Gellman 2001a, chap. 3.)

9.5 The Argument from Experience as Dependent on the Doxastic Practice Approach

In the end, the Argument from Experience might have to yield to the Doxastic Practice Approach (Gellman 2010). One reason is that it is doubtful if many experiencers of God make truth claims solely on the basis of their mystical experiences, rather than within a doxastic practice. For example, Teresa of Avila said that one can tell if an experience comes from God or from the Devil by its fruits in actions and personality, the vividness of the memory of the experience, conformity to Christian scripture, and confirmation by church superiors. Mystical experiences as such were given no special authority. Classical mystics in general did not take their mystical experiences as verifying the doctrines of their basic scriptures but vice versa — the fundamental scriptures vouched for the validity of genuine mystical experiences.

In addition, if identification of God takes place in a holistic practice (see Sections 9.2, 9.4), then quite plausibly this is a social practice in which one judges one’s mystical experiences to be of God.

Finally, it is an open question to what extent alleged God-experiences are sufficiently detailed to provide grounds to the subject that they are of God. Hence, a subject’s judgment that a particular encounter is with God might well be a matter of assimilating the event into a larger social practice.

9.6 The Problem of Religious Diversity

Essentialists and others often rely on the alleged uniformity of claims of mystics around the world. In William James’s words, there is an alleged “eternal unanimity” among mystics (James 1958, 321). But as he also realized, “if we take the larger mass as seriously as religious mysticism has historically taken itself, we find that the supposed unanimity largely disappears” (James 1958, 325). Constructivists in particular emphasize the diversity of mystical experiences, indeed for them each mystical experience is utterly unique.

Diversity of claims, and especially any genuinely conflicting claims, would impact the Argument from Experience for the epistemic value of mystical experiences. In the history of religions, we find innumerable gods, with different characteristics. Shall we say they all exist? Can belief in all of them be rational? In addition, there are experiences of non-personal ultimate realities, such as the Brahman of Advaita Vedanta. Brahman cannot be an ultimate reality if God is (Hick 1984, 234–235) since it is devoid of all personal features. Furthermore, different theistic faiths claim experience of the one and only God, ostensibly justifying beliefs that are in contradiction with one another (see Flew 1966, 126). If theistic mystical experiences lead to such contradictory results, they cannot provide evidence in favor of their validity as experiences of God.

Conflicting mystical claims thus lead to the issue of the reliability of mystical experiences as a source of knowledge: whatever the correct understanding of each type of mystical experience is, many (perhaps most) mystics have misunderstood their own experiences. Mystical experiences may put mystics in contact with a previously unrealized reality, but mystics’ diverse and conflicting understandings of that reality damaged their claim to have gained actual knowledge. Once mystics are aware of competing claims, whether the experiences can be authoritative even for the experiencers themselves, as James believed (James 1958, 324, 414), becomes an issue.

In reply, many discount experiences of polytheistic gods straight away because of their being embedded in settings we today take to be bizarre, and because of the relative paucity of reports of actual experiences of such beings. Regarding clashing experiences within theistic settings, Richard Swinburne (1991, 266) has proposed an ascent to generality as a harmonizing mechanism. He believes that conflicting descriptions of the objects of religious experience pose a challenge only to detailed doctrinal claims, not to general claims of having experienced a supernal being.

Philosophers and theologians may rank different types of mystical experiences according to their cognitive importance. For example, Michael Stoeber ranks theistic experiences occurring after a mystical experience empty of all differentiated content to be higher in importance, calling them “theo-monistic” experiences (Stoeber 1994). But Advaitins would discount all theistic experiences as instances in which the mind is not yet clear of illusory content.

John Hick (1984, chap. 14) has proposed a pluralistic hypothesis to deal with the problem. According to this hypothesis, the great world faiths embody different perceptions and conceptions of one reality that Hick christens “the Real.” The Real itself is indescribable and is never experienced directly but has “masks” or “faces” that depend on how a particular culture or religion thinks of the Real that are experienced. The Real itself is, therefore, neither personal nor nonpersonal, these categories being imposed upon the Real by different cultural contexts. Hence, the typical experiences of the major faiths are to be taken as validly of the Real through mediation by the local face of the Real.

Hick has been criticized for infidelity to the world’s religious traditions (d’Costa 1987). However, Hick is providing a second-order philosophical theory about the nature of religions rather than an exposition of religions themselves that members necessarily would endorse.

Some propose harmonizing some conflicting experiences by reference to God’s “inexhaustible fullness” (Gellman 1997, chap. 4). In at least some mystical experiences of God, a subject experiences what is presented as proceeding from an intimation of infinite plenitude. Given this feature, a claim to experience a personal ultimate (God) can be squared with an experience of a nonpersonal ultimate (e.g., the “unspeakable” Dao): the same one reality can be experienced in its personal attributes or in its nonpersonal attributes from out of its inexhaustible plenitude — e.g., nontheists experience the sheer being of the reality while theists experience its personal nature.

Whether any of these solutions succeed, the body of experiential data is too large to simply scrap on the grounds of contradictory claims. We should endeavor to retain as much of the conflicting data as possible by seeking some means of conciliation.

But it must be noted that religious theorists are just as willing as naturalists to tell mystics that they are mistaken about the content of their experiences. For example, Caroline Franks Davis has to twist the Advaitins’ and Buddhists’ accounts to show that mystical experiences really support a “broad theism” — i.e., Shankara was really experiencing God although he explicitly argued that the nonpersonal and non-loving Brahman alone is real, and the Buddha was totally unaware that he was experiencing a god. She claims that all mystics, despite what they say, really experience “a loving presence . . . with whom individuals can have a personal relationship” (Franks Davis 1989, 191). That is just what one would expect someone raised a Christian to see as the true “common core” of all mystical experiences. But the same process, mutatis mutandis, would be available for nontheists raised in other traditions for their claims.

As things stand, the diversity problem raises the issue of how much is given in mystical experiences and how much is a matter of interpretation based on a tradition’s beliefs. This limits how much actual knowledge mystics can claim.

9.7 Scientific Studies: Meditation and Psychedelics

Various psychological explanations of mystical experiences, both their nature and their causes, have been offered. These include pathological conditions such as hyper-suggestibility, severe deprivation, severe sexual frustration, intense fear of death, infantile regression, pronounced maladjustment, and mental illness, as well as non-pathological conditions, including the inordinate influence of a religious mental “set” (see Wulff 2000). In addition, some have advanced a sociological explanation for some mysticism in terms of the socio-political power available to an accomplished mystic (Fales 1996a and 1996b).

In the 1990’s, interest revived in studying meditation and psychedelic drugs to see what they may reveal about how the brain works. Different meditative techniques (especially mindfulness meditations) are now being studied through neuroimaging to gain data on the brain activity occurring during these experiences and practices. (For an overview, see Schjoedt 2009.) Losing a sense of a phenomenal “self” necessarily alters our ordinary ego-driven state of consciousness. (See Millière et al. 2018 for an overview on different senses of “loss of self” and their phenomenological differences.) Thus, the phenomenology of mystical experiences also has become an important subject for the study of consciousness. As noted in Section 8, neuroscientists are finding unique patterns of brain activity during mystical experiences. Different neurophysiological effects and unique patterns of brain activity have also been detected in mindfulness practices and in introvertive concentration practices (Hood 1997 and 2001; Dunn, Hartigan, and Mikulas 1999). The neurological effects of concentration differ from those of mindfulness meditation (Valentine and Sweet 1999). This suggests as strongly as neuroscience can that the mystical experiences enabled by meditation differ from more ordinary experiences and our normal waking state of consciousness and that the effects of different types of meditations are distinguishable. Possible neural correlates of different mystical features — a loss of a sense of self, a sense of connectedness to others, a feeling of certainty, feeling the experience has great significance, loss of a sense of time — have been identified. For example, a loss of a sense of self is correlated to the decrease of activity in the brain connected to a sense of self and a sense of separation from the world.

The study of the mystical experiences enabled by psychedelics (in particular, psilocybin and LSD) is now also a major topic (Barlett and Griffiths 2018). Psychedelics are reported to occasion some of the most spiritually significant experiences in the life of the participants (Doblin 1991). There is also the clinical study of psychedelics in therapy for such conditions as depression and addiction that are resistant to more conventional forms of therapy. An important issue is whether the positive effects of a psychedelic drug on a patient’s well-being are the result solely of the chemical effect of the drug on the brain or whether the mystical experiences enabled by the drugs are also a necessary part of the treatment.

This research leads to philosophical issues. Does brain activity alone cause these experiences, or does meditation or a psychedelic drug merely disrupt our normal state of consciousness thereby enabling new experiences to arise that are not caused by brain activity itself? If the former, can the alleged cognitive content of mystical experiences be discounted because mystical experiences are reduced to “merely brain events”? If the latter, does the same brain state underlie different meditation and psychedelic-enabled experiences? If so, the situation is the opposite of the “multiple realization” problem in philosophy of mind: multiple experiences are connected to the same brain state. So too, the question remains of whether neuroscientists are actually studying mystical experiences at all by studying neural activity correlated with them. (See Jones 2018, 2016, chap. 9.) Concerning psychedelics, the most important question is whether the mystical experiences enabled by psychedelics are mere hallucinations that are no more cognitive than the LSD-induced distortions of perception. Another important question is whether the experiences enabled by the drugs are the same as “natural” mystical experiences or only pale copies. And does the fact that such experiences can be touched off fairly consistently by drugs with the proper dosage and a conducive “set and setting” for the participant mean that the experiences are only products of the brain? Or do the drugs only set up new conditions in the brain enabling new experiences to occur that are not caused by brain activity? (See Smith 1964 and 2005; Letheby 2021; Jones 2019.)

9.8 A Critique of Naturalist Explanations

Bertrand Russell (1935, 188) once quipped that “We can make no distinction between the man who eats little and sees heaven and the man who drinks much and sees snakes. Each is in an abnormal physical condition, and therefore has abnormal perceptions.” C.D. Broad (1935, 164) wrote, to the contrary, “One might need to be slightly ‘cracked’ in order to have some peep-holes into the super-sensible world.” Thus, the issue is engaged whether we can explain away religious and mystical experiences by reference to natural causes. Can science “explain away” mystical experiences by showing that “It’s all in the head”?

If all mystics had a demonstrable pathology or brain-defect, a naturalist explanation would carry great weight. However, that is not the case. Naturalist proposals often exaggerate the scope and influence of the cited factors, sometimes choosing to highlight what is eye-catching at the expense of the more common occurrences.

For an example of the overreach and problem of simple reductive explanations, consider a popular pathological explanation: temporal lobe epileptic seizures (e.g., Persinger 1987, 111). However, ecstatic experiences of well-being, self-transcendence, and certainty from temporal lobe epileptic seizures are very rare (1% to 2% of patients) (Devinsky and Lai 2008). That may be significantly less common than in the general population. Nor are all mystical experiences “ecstatic” in the emotional sense — serenity and calm characterize many mystical experiences. The epileptic experiences usually last only a few seconds out of a larger episode and usually are not a matter of joy but fear and anxiety (Kelly and Grosso 2007, 531–534). If seizures were the cause, why the vast majority of patients do not have mystical experiences would have to be explained. Moreover, visions and voices are more common than mystical experiences for these patients. Mystical experiences have a different phenomenological content, but studies aligned with the temporolimbic model truncate and misrepresent the “felt” phenomenological features of mystical experiences (Bradford 2013, 113).

Nor can we simply assume that mystics in the past must have had some pathology despite their lack of observable symptoms — a study of medieval Christian mystics and ascetics did not turn up evidence of any major forms of mental illness such as schizophrenia or manic-depressive disorder (Kroll and Bachrach 2005). Today mystical experiences have been correlated with healthy indices of personality and adjustment (Hood and Byrom 2010, Griffiths et al. 2011). Mystical experiences also more often correlate with positive changes in family life, reduced fear of death, better health, and a greater sense of purpose, although some patients do require therapeutic care, than do pathological experiences (Yaden et al. 2017, 59). The loss of a sense of self outside of mystical experiences is associated with maladaptive outcomes such as a sense of disconnection to other people and a loss of empathy (Yaden et al. 2017, 59). The pathology model does not explain any of this. It also makes emotion, rather than cognition, the central feature of mystical experiences, and this does not jibe with the historical record (Bradford 2013).

In sum, these pathologies may be one possible trigger, but they are not a total explanation. Secondly, at least some of the proposals are perfectly compatible with the validity of claims that mystics experience a transcendent reality. For example, a person’s religious mental set can just as well be a condition for enjoying and being capable of recognizing an experience of God as it can be a cause of delusion. However, there might be naturalist explanations that would make it implausible that God would appear in just certain ways.

9.8.1 Evaluation of Neuropsychological Explanations

In principle, neuroscience can give as complete an account of brain activity during a mystical experience as it can for any conscious event or state. But a neuropsychological theory can do no more than relate what happens in the brain when a mystical experience occurs, and merely identifying the activity does not discredit mystical claims any more than a neurological account of perception discredits sense-experience as cognitive — all human experiences have some grounding in neural activity. Neurology cannot tell us that the ultimate cause of brain events is altogether internal to the organism. True, there may not be “God-receptors” in the body, analogous to those for sensory perception, and this might reinforce a suspicion that it’s all in the head. However, such receptors are neither to be expected nor required with non-physical stimuli, as in mystical experiences. For example, God, Brahman, or the Dao would not exist at a physical distance from the brain. Thus, God could act directly upon the brain to bring about the relevant processes for a subject to perceive God or otherwise use a natural medium (see Wainwright 1981, chap. 2). In sum, simply identifying and explaining what is occurring in the brain while a mystical experience is occurring is neutral to whether that is all there is to producing the experience.

Plausible natural explanations would tend to discredit religious explanations of mystical experiences only if people with pathologies or negative psychological conditions had mystical experiences. But as noted in the last section, that is not the case. Nevertheless, plausible natural explanations do weaken the religious case by offering a reasonable alternative — there is competition for the best explanation where before there was none.

9.8.2 The Claimed Superiority of Naturalist Explanation

Some philosophers have argued that because the “modern inquirer” assumes everything is ultimately explicable in naturalist terms, we should in principle reject any supernatural explanation of mystical experience (see Bagger 1999). Invoking God to explain mystical experiences is like invoking miracles to explain natural phenomena. We should match our elimination of miracles from our explanatory vocabulary with an elimination of a supernatural explanation of mystical experiences of God. Hence, we do not have to wait until we discover a live alternative explanation to the theistic explanation of mystical experiences of God. We should resist any theistic explanation in the name of our epistemic standards.

This argument raises the important question of the relationship between theistic explanation and a naturalist program of explanation. Arguments have been presented for the compatibility of religion and natural science (e.g., Swinburne 1989 and Plantinga 2011). Of course, a person for whom supernatural explanations are not a live option would have reason to reject the Argument from Experience and refuse to engage in a doxastic practice of identifying valid God-experiences. However, most defenders of the Argument from Experience advance it as at best a defensible line of reasoning rather than as a proof of valid experiences of God that should convince anyone, and the Doxastic Practice Approach is not meant to convince everybody to participate in a theistic doxastic practice (see Gellman 2001b). The bar is lowered from advancing assent-compelling proofs to establishing merely the rationality of participation in a doxastic practice that would justify belief.

10. Gender and the Study of Mysticism

Some feminist philosophers have criticized what they perceive as the androcentric bias of male philosophers of mysticism. There are three main objections:

  1. Contemporary male philosophers treat mysticism as centered on private psychological episodes of a solitary person. They believe these private experiences reveal the meaning and value of mysticism (Jantzen 1994 and 1995; also see Turner 1996). Instead, philosophers should be studying the socio-cultural dimensions of mysticism, including its patriarchal failings. Sarah Coakley (2009) maintains that the focus of mysticism should be on the ongoing contemplative practice and all that entails.

  2. At times. scholars of mysticism have systematically ignored or marginalized much of women’s mysticism. Closer attention to women would reveal the androcentric bias in mystical studies (Jantzen 1995). Nancy Caciola (2000 and 2003) argues that the criteria the Christian church developed for authentic mystical experiences curtailed the power of women in the church. For example, on the basis of theories about female physiology, women were deemed more vulnerable to devil possession than men and so their experiences were more suspect. Coakley (2009) also notes that while some analytic philosophers attend to the mysticism of Teresa of Avila, they do not do justice to the full content of her mystical writings, picking out experiences only.

  3. The traditional male construction of God has determined the way male philosophers think of theistic experiences. Thus, theistic experiences are conditioned from the outset by patriarchal conceptualizations and values, and by sex-role differentiation in the practice of religion (Raphael 1994).

Under this view, men typically understand theistic experience as a human subject encountering a being wholly distinct, distant, and overpowering. A paradigm of this approach is the numinous experience of a “wholly other” reality that is unfathomable and overpowering, engendering a sense of dread and fascination in which the mystic is “submerged and overwhelmed” by his own nothingness (Otto 1957). Otto claims that this is the foundational experience of religion. This approach, it is claimed, is mediated by the androcentrism of Otto’s worldview, entrapped in issues of domination, atomicity, and submission. Some feminist thinkers deny the dichotomy between the holy and the creaturely that makes Otto’s analysis possible (Daly 1973, Goldenberg 1979). Feminist theologians stress the immanent nature of the object of theistic experiences, and bring to prominence women’s experience of the holy in their fleshly embodiment, denigrated by androcentric attitudes.

Feminists have also supported the constructivist position in the name of anti-essentialism and diversity of experience (Lanzetta 2005, chap. 1). Thinking that there is a common unconstructed essence to mystical experience has worked against the recognition of women’s experiences as properly mystical.

The feminist critique poses a valuable corrective to unperceived androcentric biases in mysticism and mystical studies. This critique should help neutralize the conception of mysticism and mystical experience as completely private, introduced to philosophy largely by William James. Objection (2) has begun to produce scholarship dedicated to women’s mysticism and its significance (e.g., Hurcombe 1987, Brunn and Epiney-Burgard 1989, Beer 1993, Borchert 1994, Hollywood 2002). Several collections on women mystics have helped change the over-emphasis on male mystics (in particular, Furlong 2013). Regarding (3): the rich variegation of religious and mystical experience among men throughout history must also be considered. This includes men’s experiences of God’s immanent closeness as well as mystical “union” with God, unlike Otto’s dualistic numinous experiences.

The principal impact of the feminist critique on philosophy of mysticism would be to give more reasons to expand the consideration of mysticism to more than episodic experiences.

11. Mysticism and Morality

Some scholars maintain that there is an intrinsic connection between mysticism and moral behavior, or even that mystical experiences are the source and only justification of a moral concern for others. This is because mystical experiences blur or erase the distinction between the subject and others (Stace 1960) and so remove the barrier to moral motivation, or because one’s sense of a “self” disappears entirely. Several scholars have argued, to the contrary, that at least some mystical doctrines are incompatible with morality (Danto 1987, Kripal 2002). Monistic mystical metaphysics eliminates all distinctions between one person and others — all is one — and so there is no recognition of real persons distinct from oneself toward whom one can exercise a moral concern. Hence, monistic mysticism precludes morality. Morality must be between “independently real persons” (Wainwright 1983, 211–212). David Loy (2002) argues that even if monistic morality is not incompatible with morality, it fails to reveal the best way to help people with compassion. Others argue that morality can get off the ground with the ability to conceptualize “the welfare of others” without the need to recognize others as ontologically distinct beings (Zelinski 2007).

Others maintain that there is no intrinsic connection between mystical experience and moral behavior: one can empty oneself of all self-centeredness and self-interest without necessarily adopting a concern for others. Enlightened mystics may no longer be self-centered, but they can be either moral or indifferent to others (Jones 2016, chap. 9). We need look no further than to Christian complaints about mystical antinomian excesses of the “Free Spirits,” the Mahayana Buddhist rejection of the alleged selfishness of the Arhat ideal in Theravada Buddhism, or the moral scandals of some Eastern mysticism in the West today (Kripal 2002). If moral behavior is part of a mystical way of life, it does not issue from mystical experiences but from a mystic’s cultural background and training. The normative behavioral standards of the group are not derivable from mystical experiences. Mystical experiences, so the claim goes, in themselves are nonmoral. Thus, much will depend on the moral or nonmoral orientation of the mystical practices meant to lead to mystical experiences. The resulting behavior will be a consequence of both the practices undertaken to reach mystical experience and the resulting detachment of the selfless mystical state (Jones 2004).

12. Secular Mysticism

The new scientific interest in meditation (especially mindfulness), the new cultural interest in meditating for limited psychological or physiological benefits rather than transforming one’s entire character, and the utilization of psychedelics in psychotherapy have given rise today to a new phenomenon — “secular mysticism.” Awe and wonder at nature is prominent, but this mysticism is not a matter of “nature mysticism” or of aesthetic experiences as possible triggers of mystical experiences. Rather, the interest is in the psycho-physiological effects of meditation and psychedelics, with mystical experiences understood within a naturalist framework. Neuroscience appears to validate the positive effects of meditation and psychedelics on our well-being. Secular forms of meditation for limited benefits, such as Jon Kabat-Zinn’s mindfulness-based stress reduction program. Secularists can disconnect traditional practices from a mystical tradition (e.g., Batchelor’s “secular Buddhism” [2015]) or focus only on limited practices (e.g., Harris 2014, Letheby 2017).

Mysticism becomes “naturalized.” It is reduced from a full way of life to eliciting mystical experiences for limited benefits or as mere recreation. Mystical experiences break the sense of a narrow “self’” and makes one feel connected to others and the rest of the world, and secularists see this in terms of the natural world alone. This naturalist spirituality appears more tied to mystical experiences than other psychedelic experiences (Letheby 2021, 200). Patients often attach great spiritual importance to mystical experiences even if their metaphysics remains naturalist (see Griffiths 2011). Mystical experiences often touch off awe and wonder at the universe and being alive and also an interest in the “big questions” of philosophy and science even if the experiences themselves are not taken to be cognitive. That mystical experiences may involve transcendent realities or may give knowledge of reality is either denied in favor of a naturalist metaphysics, or the issue is simply ignored. In fact, while mystical experiences are normally seen in terms of transcendent realities, these experiences may lead those inclined toward naturalism to becoming convinced that there is no god or life after death and to abandoning religion entirely (Newberg and Waldman 2016, 60, 67–81).

Secular mysticism raises three central philosophical questions. First, it impacts the epistemological question of whether mystical experiences give any insight into reality or other knowledge. If the experiences do not necessarily lead to cognitive claims, we have to ask whether mystics’ knowledge-claims come only from their tradition and ask what role mystical experiences actually play. The issue of whether mystical experiences have any epistemic or ontological implications becomes clearer. Second, it highlights the issue of the role of cultural interpretation in understanding mystical experiences and the constructivist claim that cultural influences penetrate some or all mystical experiences. Third, can the effect of mystical experiences lead to a meaningful or purposeful life without reference to transcendent realities?


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