Boundary

First published Mon Feb 9, 2004; substantive revision Thu Oct 10, 2013

We think of a boundary whenever we think of an entity demarcated from its surroundings. There is a boundary (a line) separating Maryland and Pennsylvania. There is a boundary (a circle) isolating the interior of a disc from its exterior. There is a boundary (a surface) enclosing the bulk of this apple. Sometimes the exact location of a boundary is unclear or otherwise controversial (as when you try to trace out the margins of Mount Everest, or even the boundary of your own body). Sometimes the boundary lies skew to any physical discontinuity or qualitative differentiation (as with the border of Wyoming, or the boundary between the upper and lower halves of a homogeneous sphere). But whether sharp or blurry, natural or artificial, for every object there appears to be a boundary that marks it off from the rest of the world. Events, too, have boundaries — at least temporal boundaries. Our lives are bounded by our births and by our deaths; the soccer game began at 3pm sharp and ended with the referee's final whistle at 4:45pm. It is sometimes suggested that even abstract entities, such as concepts or sets, have boundaries of their own, and Wittgenstein could emphatically proclaim that the boundaries of our language are the boundaries of our world (1921: 5.6). Whether all this boundary talk is coherent, however, and whether it reflects the structure of the world or simply the organizing activity of our mind, are matters of deep philosophical controversy.


1. Issues

Euclid defined a boundary as “that which is an extremity of anything” (Elements Bk I, Df 13), and Aristotle made this more precise by defining the extremity of a thing x as “the first point beyond which it is not possible to find any part [of x], and the first point within which every part [of x] is.” (Metaphysics V, 17, 1022a4–5) This definition is intuitive enough and may be regarded as the natural starting point for any investigation into the concept of a boundary. Indeed, although Aristotle's definition was only meant to apply to material substances, it intuitively applies to events as well (insofar as they have mereological structure) and by extension also to abstract entities such as concepts and sets (compare the topologically standard notion of the boundary of a set x as the set of those points all of whose neighborhoods intersect both x and the complement of x). Nonetheless, precisely this intuitive characterization gives rise to several puzzles that justify philosophical concern, especially with respect to the boundaries of spatio-temporal particulars such as objects and events.

1.1 Owned vs. Unowned Boundaries

The first sort of puzzle relates to the intuition that a boundary separates two entities (or two parts of the same entity), which are then said to be continuous with each other. Imagine ourselves traveling from Maryland to Pennsylvania. What happens as we cross the Mason-Dixon line? Do we pass through a last point p in Maryland and a first point q in Pennsylvania? Clearly not, given the density of the continuum; for then we should have to admit an infinite number of further points between p and q that would be in neither State. But, equally clearly, we can hardly acknowledge the existence of just one of p and q, as is dictated by the standard mathematical treatment of the continuum, for either choice would amount to a peculiar privileging of one State over the other. And we cannot identify p with q, either, for we are speaking of two adjacent States, so their territories cannot have any parts in common. So, where is the Mason-Dixon line, and how does it relate to the two adjacent entities it separates?

The puzzle can be generalized. Consider the dilemma raised by Leonardo in his Notebooks: What is it that divides the atmosphere from the water? Is it air or is it water? (1938: 75–76). Or consider Suárez's worry in Disputation 40 (Sect. V, §58), repeatedly echoed by Peirce (1892: 546; 1893: 7.127): What color is the line of demarcation between a black spot and its white background? Perhaps figure/ground considerations could be invoked to provide an answer in this second case, based on the principle that the boundary is always owned by the figure — the background is topologically open (Jackendoff 1987, App. B). But what is figure and what is ground when it comes to two adjacent halves of the same black spot? What is figure and what is ground when it comes to Maryland and Pennsylvania? What happens when we dive into the water? Besides, it would be natural to suppose that all entities of the same sort be treated alike, for instance, that all material bodies be construed as figure-like entities, each possessing its own boundary. But then, how could any two of them ever come into contact, short of penetrability? (In this last form, the question is widely discussed in recent literature; see e.g. Kline and Matheson 1987, Hazen 1990, Zimmerman 1996b, Kilborn 2007.)

Consider also Aristotle's classical version of the puzzle in regard to temporal boundaries: When a moving object comes to rest, is it in motion or is it at rest? (Physics VI, 3, 234a ff.) Of course, one could maintain that there is no motion or rest at an instant, but only during an interval, as Aristotle himself held (232a32–34). Yet the question remains: Does the transitional moment belong to the motion interval or to the rest interval? (On this version of the puzzle, see Medlin 1963, Hamblin 1969, Kretzmann 1976, and Sorabji 1983, ch. 26.)

1.2 Natural vs. Artificial Boundaries

A second sort of puzzle relates to the fact that Aristotle's mereological definition, and the common-sense intuition that it captures, only seem to apply to the realm of continuous entities. Modulo the above-mentioned difficulty, the thought that Maryland and Pennsylvania are bounded by the Mason-Dixon line is fair enough. But ordinary material objects — it might be observed — are not truly continuous (or dense) and speaking of an object's boundary is like speaking of the “flat top” of a fakir's bed of nails (Simons 1991: 91). On closer inspection, the spatial boundaries of physical objects are imaginary entities surrounding swarms of subatomic particles, and their exact shape and location involve the same degree of idealization of a drawing obtained by “connecting the dots”, the same degree of arbitrariness as any mathematical graph smoothed out of scattered and inexact data, the same degree of abstraction as the figures' contours in a Seurat painting. Similarly, on closer inspection a body's being in motion amounts to the fact that the vector sum of the motions of zillions of restless particles, averaged over time, is non-zero, hence it makes no sense to speak of the instant at which a body stops moving (Galton 1994: 4). All this may be seen as good news vis-à-vis the puzzles of Section 1.1, which would not even get off the ground (at least in the form given above; see S. R. Smith 2007 and Wilson 2008 for qualifications). But then the question arises: Is our boundary talk a mere façon de parler?

Even with reference to the Mason-Dixon line — and, more generally, those boundaries that demarcate adjacent parts of a continuous manifold, as when an individual cognitive agent conceptualizes a black spot as being made of two halves — one can raise the question of their ontological status. Such boundaries reflect to various degrees the organizing activity of our intellect, or of our social practices. And it might be argued that belief in their objectivity epitomizes a form of metaphysical realism that cries for justification. We may, in this connection, introduce a conceptual distinction between natural or bona fide boundaries, which are in some sense objective, i.e., grounded in some physical discontinuity or qualitative heterogeneity betwixt an entity and its surroundings, and artificial or fiat boundaries, which are not so grounded in the autonomous, mind-independent world (B. Smith 1995, building on Curzon 1907). Geo-political boundaries such as the Mason-Dixon line are obviously of the fiat sort, and on closer inspection it appears that even the surfaces of ordinary material objects such as apples and tables involve fiat articulations of some kind. So the question is, are there any bona fide boundaries? And, if not, is the fiat nature of our boundary talk a reason to justify an anti-realist attitude towards boundaries altogether? (Compare also how the issue arises in the realm of abstract entities: Are there concepts that carve the world “at the joints”, as per Plato's recipe in the Phaedrus 265e?)

The question has deep ramifications. For once the fiat/bona fide opposition has been recognized, it is clear that it can be drawn in relation to whole objects and events also (Smith and Varzi 2000, Smith 2001). Insofar as (part of) the boundary of a whole is of the fiat sort, the whole itself may be viewed as a conceptual construction, hence the question of the ontological status of boundaries becomes of a piece with the more general issue of the conventional status of ordinary objects and events. Cfr. Goodman: “We make a star as we make a constellation, by putting its parts together and marking off its boundaries” (1980: 213) This is not to imply that we end up with imaginary or otherwise unreal wholes: as Frege wrote, the objectivity of the North Sea “is not affected by the fact that it is a matter of our arbitrary choice which part of all the water on the earth's surface we mark off and elect to call the ‘North Sea’” (1884, §26). It does, however, follow that the entities in question would only enjoy an individuality as a result of our fiat, like the cookies carved out of the big dough: their objectivity is independent, but their individuality — their being what they are, perhaps even their having the identity and persistence conditions they have — would depend on the baker's action (Sidelle 1989; Heller 1990; Jubien 1993; Varzi 2011).

1.3 Sharp vs. Vague Boundaries

A third puzzle relates to vagueness. Aristotle's definition (as well as standard topology) suggests that there is always a sharp demarcation between the inside and the outside of a thing. Yet it may be observed that ordinary objects and events, as well as the extensions of many ordinary concepts, may have boundaries that are in some sense fuzzy or indeterminate. Clouds, deserts, mountains, let alone the figures of an impressionist painting, all seem to elude the idealized notion of a sharply bounded entity. Likewise, the temporal boundaries of many events, let alone their spatial boundaries, seem to be indeterminate. When exactly did the industrial revolution begin? When did it end? Where did it take place? And certainly the concepts corresponding to such predicates as ‘bald’ or ‘heap’ do not posses definite boundaries, either. As again Frege famously put it, to such concepts there seems to correspond “an area that ha[s] not a sharp boundary-line all around, but in places just vaguely fade[s] away into the background” (1903: §56).

How is such fuzziness to be construed? One option is insist on a purely epistemic account: the fuzziness would lie exclusively in our ignorance about the exact location of the relevant boundaries (Sorensen 1988, Williamson 1994). Alternatively, one may distinguish here between a de re account and a de dicto account. On the de re account, the fuzziness is truly ontological; the boundary of Mount Everest (say) would be vague insofar as there is no objective, determinate fact of the matter about which parcels of land lie on which side (Tye 1990; Copeland 1995; Akiba 2004; Hyde 2008). Likewise, on this account a predicate such as ‘bald’ would be vague because it stands for a vague set, a set with truly fuzzy boundaries. By contrast, the de dicto account corresponds to a purely linguistic (or conceptual) notion of vagueness. There is no vague boundary demarcating Mount Everest on this view; rather, there are many distinct parcels of land, each with a precise border, but our linguistic practices have not enforced a choice of any one of them as the official referent of the name ‘Everest’ (Mehlberg 1958; Lewis 1986; McGee 1997). Similarly, on this view the set of bald people does not have a fuzzy boundary; rather, our linguistic stipulations do not fully specify which set of people corresponds to the extension of ‘bald’ (Fine 1975; Keefe 2000). For boundaries of the fiat sort, a de dicto account suggests itself naturally: insofar as the process leading to the definition of a boundary may not be precise, the question of whether something lies inside or outside the boundary may be semantically indeterminate. But this account does not sit well with boundaries of the bona fide sort (if any); if any such boundary were vague, it would be so independently of our cognitive or social articulations, hence a de re account would seem to be necessary, which means that there would be genuine worldly indeterminacy.

1.4 Bodiless vs. Bulky Boundaries

A fourth source of concern relates to the intuition, implicit in Aristotle's definition, that boundaries are lower-dimensional entities, i.e., have at least one dimension fewer than the entities they bound. The surface of a (continuous) sphere, for example, is two-dimensional (it has no “substance” or “divisible bulk”), the Mason-Dixon Line is one-dimensional (it has “length” but no “breadth”), and a boundary point such as the vertex of a cone is zero-dimensional (it extends in no direction). This intuition is germane to much of what we ordinarily say about boundaries. But it is problematic insofar as it contrasts with several independent intuitions that are of a piece with both common sense and philosophical theorizing. For instance, there is a standing tradition in epistemology (from Moore 1925 to Gibson 1979) according to which boundaries play a crucial role in perception: we see (opaque) physical objects indirectly by seeing their surfaces. Yet it is not clear how one could see entities that lack physical bulk. Likewise, we often speak of surfaces as of things that may be pitted, or damp, or that can be scratched, polished, sanded, and so on, and it is unclear whether such predicates can be applied at all to immaterial entities. In such cases, it would rather seem that surfaces (and boundaries more generally; see Jackendoff 1991) are to be construed as “thin layers” that are schematized as having fewer dimensions than the wholes to which they apply.

Arguably, this conceptual tension between boundaries understood as lower-dimensional entities and boundaries understood as thin layers reflects an irreducible ambiguity in ordinary speech (Stroll 1979, 1988). And, arguably, it is only the first conception that gives rise to the puzzles outlined in the foregoing sections; bulky boundaries can be treated as ordinary, extended parts of the bodies they bound. Yet a general theory of boundaries should have something to say about the second conception as well — and more generally about the interaction between the mathematical idealization associated with the former conception and the physical, cognitive, and philosophical significance of the latter (Galton 2007).

The issue also relates to the question of whether there can be extended mereological simples (raised by van Inwagen 1981 and Lewis 1991: 32, 76 and extensively discussed e.g. in Markosian 1998, Parsons 2000, Simons 2004, Braddon-Mitchell and Miller 2006, and McDaniel 2007, inter alia). For the characterization of boundaries as lower-dimensional extremities is compatible with the possibility that a boundary's spatiotemporal extension transcend its mereological structure. A pointy boundary, for instance, could be pointy in that it has no proper parts, but that does not rule out that it be located at an extended region short of assuming that the mereological structure of a thing always matches perfectly that of its location (what Varzi 2007:1018 calls “mirroring” and Shaffer 2009:138, Uzquiano 2011 “harmony”).

2. Theories

So boundaries are, on the one hand, central to the common-sense picture of the world and yet, on the other, deeply problematic. We may accordingly distinguish two main sorts of theories, depending on whether one is willing to take the problems at face value (realist theories) or to bypass them altogether, treating boundaries as fictional abstractions of some sort (eliminativist theories).

2.1 Realist Theories

Most realist theories about boundaries, construed as lower-dimensional entities, share the view that such entities are ontological parasites: points, lines, and surfaces cannot be separated and cannot exist in isolation from the entities they bound (pace Suárez, who thought that God would be capable of such marvels; see Disputation 40, V, 41). This view does justice to the intuition that boundaries, if real, are somewhat “less real” than bulky entities, and as such it goes back to Aristotle (Metaphysics XI, 2, 1060b12–16) and has been defended e.g. by Boethius (Second Commentary I, xi, 14–21), revived by Abelard (Glosses on Porphyry, 8.1–4), and eventually endorsed by Brentano (1976) and his pupils (Chisholm 1984). Realist theories may differ significantly, however, with regard to how such dependent, lower-dimensional entities relate to the extended entities they bound. Thus, with reference to the first puzzle of Section 1, let A and B be any two extended entities separated by a common boundary (such as Maryland and Pennsylvania). Then we may distinguish four main views (Varzi 1997):

  1. The boundary may belong neither to A nor to B. This was, ultimately, Leonardo's view, though it does not find much support among recent philosophers (possibly with the exception of Hestevold 1986 and, within limits, Sorensen 1986). It implies that contact may obtain between A and B even if both A and B are topologically open, as long as nothing lies between them except for their common, outer boundary (i.e., as long as the closure of A overlaps the closure of B). So, on this view, there is no last point p of Maryland and no first point q of Pennsylvania: the States of the Union do not, strictly speaking, use up the whole territory.
  2. The boundary must belong either to A or to B, though it may be indeterminate to which of A and B it belongs. This theory builds on Bolzano's view (1851), which in turn is mirrored by the standard account of point-set topology. It implies that contact may obtain between A and B only if either A or B is topologically closed while the other is topologically open in the relevant contact area; but the appeal to indeterminacy allows one to leave the matter unsettled. This indeterminacy, in turn, may be construed as semantic or epistemic, depending on whether the relevant boundary is of the fiat sort, as with the Mason-Dixon line, or of the bona fide sort. (For a formal treatment of this theory, see Casati and Varzi 1999, Ch. 5, and Varzi 2007, §2.4.1.)
  3. The boundary may belong both to A and to B, but the relevant overlap is sui generis precisely insofar as it involves lower-dimensional parts. Boundaries do not take up space and so, on this theory, it is not implausible to say that (for example) the Mason-Dixon line belongs to both Maryland and Pennsylvania. This was probably Aristotle's own view, according to which “things are said to be in contact when their extremities are together”, i.e., “when they are in one primary place” (Physics V 3, 226b22–23; see Bartha 2001 for extensive discussion). In some cases, however, this theory may require a dialethic biting of the bullet (Priest 1987). With reference to the Suárez-Peirce puzzle, for instance, if the line of demarcation between a black spot and its white background belongs to both, then it must be both white and black. A way out would be to deny that boundaries, qua lower-dimensional, can enjoy the same sort of properties that characterize extended bodies, color properties being among them (Galton 2003: 167f, contra Aristotle, De Sensu et Sensibilibus 3, 439a30 and 439b10). It is unclear, however, whether this strategy can be generalized. For instance, a dialetheia would seem to resurface with reference to Aristotle's puzzle: at the instant when a (homogeneous) object undergoes the transition from being stationary to moving it would have to be both stationary and moving.
  4. There really may be two boundaries, one belonging to A and one belonging to B, and these two boundaries would be co-located — that is, they would coincide spatially without overlapping mereologically. This view can be traced back to Suárez (Disputation 40) and more recently to Brentano (1976), and has been worked out in detail by Chisholm (1984, 1992/1993). It allows one to reject the distinction between closed and open entities (which Brentano regarded as “monstrous”), treating all extended bodies as closed. In the case of material bodies, the spatial coincidence of their boundaries would amount to a violation of Locke's principle of one object to a place (Essays, II-xxvii-1) but, again, the violation would be sui generis precisely insofar as the entities in question do not take up any space (for a formal treatment, see also Smith 1997).

These four views are mutually exclusive, but they need not be exhaustive and can be further articulated or integrated to address the issues raised by the other puzzles of Section 1. For example, with reference to the second puzzle (Section 1.2), Smith and Varzi (2000) consider a double-barred theory that is of type (2) with respect to bona fide boundaries and of type (4) with respect to fiat boundaries (so there is no coincidence of real boundaries but merely of fiat articulations). Similarly, the indeterminacy hypothesis advocated by type-(2) theories can be regarded as being of a piece with the sort of indeterminacy that is involved in the phenomenon of vagueness (Section 1.3). For fiat boundaries, for instance, a de dicto account may be applied in both cases: statements about such boundaries are true iff they are super-true, i.e., true under every admissible way of precisifying the relevant fiat articulations (Varzi 2001 and references therein). There are other options, too. For instance, Hudson (2005, ch. 3) offers an account of boundaries that permits instances of each of (1), (2) and (3) (and without any dialethic implications). It is also possible to reject the mereotopological setting that leads to the taxonomy above and, with it, the need to choose among (1)–(4). See, e.g., Breysse and De Glas (2007) for a proposal in this spirit.

2.2 Eliminativist Theories

Eliminativist theories move from the idea that talk of boundaries involves some sort of abstraction — an idea that can be found already in the medieval and modern debate on anti-indivisibilism (Zimmerman 1996a; Holden 2004) and that has recently become the focus of renewed attention in connection with the hypothesis that the universe might consist of “atomless gunk” (Lewis 1991: 20), i.e., that either space and time or matter, or both, divide forever into smaller and smaller parts (Sider 1993, Zimmerman 1996b; Hawthorne and Weatherson 2004; McDaniel 2006; Hudson 2007; J. T. Russell 2008; Arntzenius 2008). What sort of abstraction would be involved here? And how can one account for our ordinary and mathematical talk about boundaries if these are to be explained away as fictional abstractions? With special reference to the boundaries of spatio-temporal particulars, we may distinguish two main approaches.

  1. Substantivalists about space-time may see the abstraction as stemming from the relationship between a particular and its spatio-temporal receptacle, relying on the topology of space-time to account for our boundary talk when it comes to specific cases. It has been held, for instance, that material bodies are the material content of (regular) open regions of space, boundary contact between bodies being explained in terms of overlap between the closures of their receptacles. This theory can be traced back to Descartes (Principles 2.xv) and has been explicitly articulated by Cartwright (1975). It does, to be sure, yield a hybrid account, an account that does away only with the boundaries of material bodies (and, by extension, events); their receptacles are typically subject to a standard topology in which boundaries are treated as per theory (2) above. Yet this account is enough to bypass the puzzles of Section 1 (especially 1.1) insofar as there is no pressing problem in assuming a standard topology for space-time. The main problem for the theory is, rather, to justify the claim that only some regions (open regular regions, for instance) are receptacles. (See Hudson 2002 for a challenge to this view, and Uzquiano 2006 for a defense.) On the other hand, there are more radical, non-hybrid theories that do without boundaries also with regard to the structure of space-time. Topological theories of this sort may be found e.g. in Johanson (1981), Randell, Cui, and Cohn 1992), Forrest (1996), and Roeper (1997), but see also Gerla (1990) for a geometric account and Skyrms (1993) for a measure-theoretic approach.
  2. If one is not a substantivalist about space and/or time, one can describe the abstraction as invoking the idea of ever thinner layers of the bounded entity. The best formulation of this idea is Whitehead's theory of “extensive abstraction” (1916, 1919), which can be traced back at least to Lobachevsky (1835/1938) and was immediatedly adopted by Broad (1923, ch. 1), Nicod (1924, ch. 4) and Russell (1927, ch. 28). (Alternative formulations may be found in Tarski 1929, Menger 1940, Grzegorczyk 1960, and Clarke 1985 inter alia.) On this account, boundary elements are not included among the primary entities, which only comprise extended bodies, but they are nonetheless retrieved as higher-order entities, viz. as equivalence classes of convergent series of nested bodies. For example, the series of all concentric spheres included in a given sphere converges to the point at the center, the series of all concentric right cylinders of equal length included in a given cylinder converge to the axial line, and so on. Call a convergent series of this sort an abstractive class iff it has no bottom, i.e., iff no object is part of every member of the class. And call two co-convergent abstractive classes equivalent iff every member of the first class has a member of the second as part, and vice versa. (For instance, an abstractive class of spheres is equivalent to the class of all the cubes inscribed in the spheres, which converge to the same point at the center.) Each boundary element, then, can be viewed as an equivalence class of converging abstractive classes, and one can reconstruct ordinary talk about lower-dimensional boundaries as talk about such higher-order entities. This approach has analogues also in the temporal realm, where instants are sometimes construed as sets of time intervals, which in turn are sometimes construed as sets of overlapping events. (The locus classicus is Russell 1914; see also Walker 1947, Kamp 1979, and van Benthem 1983.)

One standard objection to type-(2) theories is that the abstractness of boundaries seems to run afoul of the abstractness of set-theoretic constructions. One can see and paint the surface of a table, and one can even see and paint an infinite series of ever thinner layers of table-parts. But one cannot paint the set of these parts (unless of course this is simply another way of saying that the parts are painted). Indeed, Theodore de Laguna, one of the very first sponsors of Whitehead's method, remarked that the identification of points and other boundaries with classes of solids is open to serious misinterpretation: “Although we perceive solids, we perceive no abstractive sets of solids […] In accepting the abstractive set, we are as veritably going beyond experience as in accepting the solid of zero-length” (de Laguna 1922: 460).

A third option, alternative to both type-(1) and type-(2) theories, would be an “operationalist” account of the sort advocated by Adams (1984, 1996), where the abstractive process by which boundary elements are derived from concrete observables is explained in terms of “operational tests”. Arguably, however, such an account is best regarded as a parallel story, one that offers an explanation of empirical knowledge concerning boundaries while remaining ultimately neutral with regard to their ontological status.

Excerpts from the Literature

[What follows is a list of significant passages from the philosophical literature. These should provide the reader with a useful set of examples.]

“A point is that which has no part. A line is breadthless length. The extremities of a line are points. […] A surface is that which has length and breadth only. The extremities of a surface are lines. […] A boundary is that which is an extremity of anything.” [Euclid, Elements, Bk I, Dfs 1–3, 5–6, 13 (1908: p. 153)]

“We call a limit the last point [το εσχατον] of each thing, i.e., the first point beyond which it is not possible to find any part [of the thing], and the first point within which every part [of the thing] is.” [Aristotle, Metaphysics V, 17, 1022a4–5 (1984: 1613)]

“[I]nasmuch as it is the same now that belongs to both the times [past and future], and it is possible for a thing to be in motion throughout one time and to be at rest throughout the other, and that which is in motion or at rest for the whole of a time will be in motion or at rest in any part of it in which it is of such a nature as to be in motion or at rest: it will follow that the same thing can at the same time be at rest and in motion; for both the times have the same extremity, viz. the now.” [Aristotle, Physics V, 3, 234a35–234b4 (1984: 395)]

“If we are to suppose lines or what comes after these (I mean the primary surfaces) to be principles, these at least are not separable substances, but sections and divisions — the former of surfaces, the latter of bodies (while points are sections and divisions of lines); and further they are limits of these same things; and all these are in other things and none is separable.” [Aristotle, Metaphysics XI, 2, 1060b12–16 (1984: 1675f)]

“A line is something in a body. And what it is it owes to the body. That is, it keeps its being through the body. This is explained as follows. If it is separated from the body, it does not subsist. Who by any sense faculty ever grasped a line separated from a body?” [Boethius, Second Commentary on Porphyry's Isagoge I, xi, 14–21 (English translation from Spade 1994: 23–24)]

“There are two species of incorporeals. Some of them, such as God and the soul, can endure in their incorporeality outside sensibles. But others, such as a line without subject body, are entirely unable to be outside the sensibles they are in.” [Peter Abelard, Glosses on Porphyry, 8.1–4 (English translation from Spade 1994: 26)]

“[T]he spherical body does not touch the flat body primarily with a part that is such that each of its parts touches the flat body. Therefore, it does not touch it primarily with some part that is prior to all the other touching parts. Rather, any given touching part is still such that a half of it does not touch immediately, and a half of that half does not touch immediately, and so on ad infinitum.” [William of Ockham, Quodlibetal Questions, I, q. 9, ad 2 (1991: 53)]

Points are “things completely indivisible”, lines are “things divisible only in one dimension”, and surfaces are “things divisible in two dimensions.” [Gregory of Rimini, Commentary of the Sentences II, d. 2, q. 2, ad 1 (English translation from Duhem 1985: 25–26)]

“What is it […] that divides the atmosphere from the water? It is necessary that there should be a common boundary which is neither air nor water but is without substance, because a body interposed between two bodies prevents their contact, and this does not happen in water with air. […] Therefore a surface is the common boundary of two bodies which are not continuous, and does not form part of either one or the other, for if the surface formed part of it, it would have divisible bulk, whereas, however, it is not divisible and nothingness divides these bodies the one from the other.” [Leonardo da Vinci, Notebooks (1938: 75–76)]

“Real contact occurs in some entity which truly and formally exists in things; for the contact itself is real, and properly and formally exists in reality; therefore it occurs in some real entity which formally exists in the thing; and yet it occurs in an indivisible thing; therefore such an indivisible entity exists formally in the thing itself.” [Francisco Suárez, Metaphysical Disputations 40, V, §19 (English translation from Zimmerman 1996a: 160)]

“[I]t could plausibly be said that a line can be conserved by God without a limiting point, and a surface without a line, and a body without a surface.” [Francisco Suárez, Metaphysical Disputations 40, V, §41 (English translation by Robert Pasnau)]

“The other difficulty is that these indivisibles cannot be admitted in the case of forms or qualities that are extended in matter or quantity, because otherwise it would follow that two qualities that are maximal contraries with respect to something real and positive belonging to them would be conjoined at the same time in the same indivisible subject, which involves an absurdity. The inference is clear, for suppose that, in the continuous surface of a wall, one half is maximally white and the other half is maximally black, and those qualities each have their own indivisible boundaries [termini] by which they are contained and limited. It will then be necessary that, from that part in virtue of which they are contiguous, they each have their own boundaries inhering at the same time in the same line connecting [continuanti] the quantitative surface. […] From this it further happens that in the same indivisible boundary of matter there would be, at the same, time two specific substantial forms with respect to something that is indivisible in extension.” [Francisco Suárez, Metaphysical Disputations 40, V, §58 (English translation by Robert Pasnau)]

“[B]y superficies we do not here mean any portion of the surrounding body, but merely the extremity which is between the surrounded body and that surrounded, which is but a mode; or […] we mean the common surface which is a surface that is not a part of one body rather than the other, and that is always considered the same, so long as it retains the same magnitude and figure.” [René Descartes, Principles of Philosophy, Part II, Principle 15 (1911: 261)]

“The schoolmen were so sensible of the force of this argument, that some of them maintained, that nature has mixed among those particles of matter, which are divisible in infinitum, a number of mathematical points, in order to give a termination to bodies; and others eluded the force of this reasoning by a heap of unintelligible cavils and distinctions. Both these adversaries equally yield the victory. […] Thus it appears, that the definitions of mathematics destroy the pretended demonstrations; and that if we have the idea of indivisible points, lines and surfaces conformable to the definition, their existence is certainly possible: but if we have no such idea, 'tis impossible we can ever conceive the termination of any figure; without which conception there can be no geometrical demonstration.” [David Hume, A Treatise of Human Nature, I-ii-4 (1941: 44)]

“In all bounds there is something positive (e.g., a surface is the boundary of corporeal space, and is therefore itself a space, a line is a space, which is the boundary of the surface, a point the boundary of the line, but yet always a place in space), whereas limits contain mere negations.” [Immanuel Kant, Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics, §57 (1977: 94)]

“I define the limit of a body as the aggregate of all the extreme [äusserst] ether-atoms which still belong to it. […] A closer consideration further shows that many bodies are at certain places altogether devoid of limiting atoms; none of their atoms can be described as the extreme ones among those which still belong to it and would accompany it if it started to move. [Two bodies are in contact] when the extreme atoms of the one, […] together with certain atoms of the other, form a continuous extension.” [Bernard Bolzano Paradoxes of the Infinite, § 66 (1851: 167–168)]

“One of the two lines into which the line would be split upon division would […] have an end point, but the other no beginning point. This inference has been quite correctly drawn by Bolzano, who was led thereby to his monstruous doctrine that there would exist bodies with and without surfaces, the one class containing just so many as the other, because contact would be possible only between a body with a surface and another without. He ought, rather, to have had his attention drawn by such consequences to the fact that the whole conception of the line and of other continua as sets of points runs counter to the concept of contact and thereby abolishes precisely what makes up the essence of the continuum.” [Franz Brentano, ‘Nativistic, Empiricist, and Anoetistic Theories of our Presentation of Space’ (1976: 146)]

“If a red surface and a blue surface are in contact with each other, then a red and a blue line coincide.” [Franz Brentano, ‘On What Is Continuous’ (1976: 41)]

“One calls the equator an imaginary line, but it would be wrong to call it a line that has merely been thought up. It was not created by thought as the result of a psychological process, but is only apprehended or grasped by thought. If its being apprehended were a matter of its coming into being, then we could not say anything positive about the equator for any time prior to this supposed coming into being.” [Gottlob Frege, The Foundations of Arithmetic § 26 (1884: 35)]

“A definition of a concept (of a possible predicate) must […] unambiguously determine, as regards any object, whether or not it falls under the concept (whether or not the predicate is truly assertible of it). […] We may express this metaphorically as follows: the concept must have a sharp boundary. To a concept without sharp boundary there would correspond an area that had not a sharp boundary-line all around, but in places just vaguely faded away into the background. […] The law of the excluded middle is really just another form of the requirement that the concept should have a sharp boundary.” [Gottlob Frege, The Fundamental Laws of Arithmetic, Vol. II, §56 (1903: 159)]

“A drop of ink has fallen upon the paper and I have walled it round. Now every point of the area within the walls is either black or white; and no point is both black and white. That is plain. The black is, however, all in one spot or blot; it is within bounds. There is a line of demarcation between the black and the white. Now I ask about the points of this line, are they black or white? Why one more than the other? Are they (A) both black and white or (B) neither black nor white? Why A more than B, or B more than A? […] The logical conclusion […] is that the points of the boundary do not exist.” [Charles S. Peirce, ‘The Logic of Quantity’ (1893: 7.127)]

“[We must distinguish between the category of Natural Frontiers and] the category of Artificial Frontiers, by which are meant those boundary lines which, not being dependent upon natural features of the earth's surface for their selection, have been artificially or arbitrarily created by man.” [George Nathaniel Curzon, Frontiers (1907: 12)].

“The limits [Grenzen] of my language mean the limits of my world.” [Ludwig Wittgenstein, Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, 5.6]

“An indefinite boundary is not really a boundary at all.” [Ludwig Wittgenstein, Philosophical Investigations, I, §99 (1953: 45e)]

“It is unnatural to draw a conceptual boundary line where there is not some special justification for it, where similarities would constantly draw us across the arbitrarily drawn line.” [Ludwig Wittgenstein, Remarks on the Philosophy of Psychology, II, §626 (1980: 108e)]

“I hold it to be quite certain that I do not directly perceive my hand; and that when I am said (as I may be correctly said) to ‘perceive’ it, that I ‘perceive’ it means that I perceive (in a different and more fundamental sense) something which is (in a suitable sense) representative of it, namely, a certain part of its surface.” [G. E. Moore, ‘A Defence of Common Sense’ (1925: 217)]

“‘Surface,’ it is true, is a substantive in grammar; but it is not the name of a particular existent, but of an attribute.” [H. H. Price, Perception (1932: 106)]

“If we can give a definition of points which will make them fulfil a certain pair of conditions, it will not matter though points in themselves should turn out to be entities of a very different kind from what we had supposed them to be. The two conditions are (i) that points must have to each other the kind of relations which geometry demands; and (ii) that points must have to finite areas and volumes such a relation that a reasonable sense can be given to the statement that such areas and volumes can be exhaustively analysed into sets of points.” [C. D. Broad, Scientific Thought (1959: 39)]

“It is […] wrong to imply that everything has a surface. Where and what exactly is the surface of a cat?” [John L. Austin, Sense and Sensibilia (1962: 100)]

“The surface is where most of the action is. The surface is where light is reflected or absorbed, not the interior of the substance. The surface is what touches the animal, not the interior. The surface is where chemical reactions mostly take place. The surface is where vaporization or diffusion of substances into the medium occurs. And the surface is where vibrations of the substance are transmitted into the medium.” [J. J. Gibson, The Ecological Approach to Visual Perception (1979: 23)]

“The picture of reality as an amorphous lump, not yet articulated into discrete objects, thus proves to be a correct one, so long as we make the right use of it […] Such a picture corrects the naïve conception […] [that] presupposes that the world presents itself to us already dissected into discrete objects, which we know how to recognize when we encounter them again, in advance of our acquiring any grasp of language at all.” (Michael Dummett, Frege. Philosophy of Language (1973: 577)]

“Now as we thus make constellations by picking out and putting together certain stars rather than others, so we make stars by drawing certain boundaries rather than others. Nothing dictates whether the skies shall be marked off into constellations or other objects. We have to make what we find, be it the Great Dipper, Sirius, food, fuel, or a stereo system.” [Nelson Goodman, ‘Notes on the Well-Made World’ (1983: 104)]

“If the continuous object is cut in half, then does the one boundary [that demarcates two adjacent parts] become two boundaries, one thing thus becoming two things? […] But how can one thing — even if it is only a boundary — become two things? And does this mean that when two things become continuous, then two things that had been diverse become identical with each other, two things thus becoming one thing?” [Roderick Chisholm, ‘Boundaries as Dependent Particulars’ (1984: 88)]

“The reason why it's vague where the outback begins is not that there's this thing, the outback, with imprecise borders; rather there are many things, with different borders, and nobody has been fool enough to try to enforce a choice of one of them as the official referent of the word ‘outback’.” [David K. Lewis, The Plurality of Worlds (1986: 212)]

“There is no line which sharply divides the matter composing [Mount] Everest from the matter outside it. Everest's boundaries are fuzzy. Some molecules are inside Everest and some molecules outside. But some have an indefinite status: there is no objective, determinate fact of the matter about whether they are inside or outside.” [Michael Tye, ‘Vague Objects’ (1990: 535)]

“A vague concept is boundaryless in that no boundary marks the things which fall under it from the things which do not, and no boundary marks the things which definitely fall under it from the things which do not definitely do so; and so on. Manifestations are the unwillingness of knowing subjects to draw any such boundaries, the cognitive impossibility of identifying such boundaries, and the needlessness and even disutility of such boundaries.” [Mark Sainsbury, ‘Concepts without Boundaries’ (1990: 257)]

“The world is capable of being cut up in so many ways, and whenever we consider such a cut (some principle of individuation), we are considering the world cut that way, i.e., so articulated. An articulation will specify both actual conditions which must be met for something to be (an) F, and identity conditions for tracing Fs through space, time, and possible worlds. If there are portions of the world which meet the actual conditions, then there are Fs.” [Alan Sidelle, ‘Rigidity, Ontology, and Semantic Structure’ (1992: 172)]

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