Evelyn Fox Keller dubbed the 1900s the “century of the gene”, and for good reason (Fox Keller 2002). During a 100-year span that opened with excitement about the research Mendel conducted decades earlier and closed with the Human Genome Project, disciplines ranging from comparative anatomy to oncology were infused with genetic concepts, genetic principles, and genetic methodologies. The first two decades of the twenty-first century have seen this trend only expand.
So it should not be surprising that philosophers have gravitated to genetics in an attempt to understand how that science works, what it says about the world, and what impact it has on people living in a society where there is so much focus on genes. This encyclopedia represents well this significant philosophical interest. Over 100 entries discuss some aspect of genetics, and those entries engage a wide range of philosophical questions—questions about scientific explanation, questions about the process of evolution, questions about disability, questions about race. With such diverse philosophical interest in genetics, no single encyclopedia entry could do justice to the full scope of that science and the rich philosophical attention it has received. Instead, this entry serves as a door into that philosophical world. After a historically-guided introduction to the science of genetics and its transformative impact, the piece reviews a sample of the philosophical questions that genetics has generated, with direction to entries where those topics are discussed in greater detail. The hope is that the entry will serve as an orientation to the diversity of philosophical thought concerning genetics that is distributed throughout the encyclopedia. (The entry on evolution provides a similar guide to the trove of entries that review philosophical discussions around that topic.)
- 1. The Science of Genetics
- 2. Philosophical Questions about Genetics
- 2.1 What Is the Relationship between Classical Genetics and Molecular Genetics?
- 2.2 What Is a “Gene”?
- 2.3 What Do Genes Do?
- 2.4 Are Genes the Target of Natural Selection?
- 2.5 Who Benefits from Medical Genetics? Who is Harmed by It?
- 2.6 Should Genetics Be Utilized for Human Enhancement?
- 2.7 Is Race “in the Genes”?
- 3. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. The Science of Genetics
Genetics is devoted to the study and manipulation of heredity and variation in living organisms. Genetics is so pervasive in twenty-first century science—in reproductive screening technologies like preimplantation genetic diagnosis, in assessments of what species are endangered, in public health programs that track antibiotic-resistant bacteria, to name a few—that it is easy to forget what these disparate practices all have in common with one another: a focus on the patterns and mechanisms of trait transmission from one generation to the next in order to understand and potentially control that process. This contemporary focus can be traced back to the first years of the twentieth century, when genetics took shape as a unique field of study.
1.1 Birth of a Discipline
Gregor Mendel, the Austrian monk now commonly referred to as the “father of genetics”, never uttered the terms “gene” or “genetics” because those terms weren’t introduced until decades after his death. In 1865, he reported on the results of breeding experiments he performed hybridizing pea plants during which he tracked how a series of traits (e.g., round vs. wrinkled peas, white vs. purple flowers) passed down through generations. Mendel noted certain patterns of inheritance; for example, traits seemed to be transmitted independently of one another (Mendel 1866). Mendel died in 1884, at which point there was little indication that he would end up in biology textbooks (Olby 1985).
It wasn’t until 1900 that the full force of Mendel’s observations became absorbed by the scientific community. That year, three different European botanists reported on the results of their own breeding experiments and linked their results back to Mendel’s work decades earlier. Mendel’s research, at this time, was characterized as revealing heredity to involve the transmission of discrete hereditary factors that obeyed fundamental principles—that organisms get one copy of each factor from each parent and, in turn, pass one copy on to their own offspring (the law of segregation), that the factors segregate independently of one another (the law of independent assortment), and that certain factors dominate other factors when it comes to expressing the trait associated with that factor (the law of dominance) (entry: gene). William Bateson, a biologist at the University of Cambridge at the time, was excited about the implications of Mendel’s work for theories of evolution; he recruited a number of young scientists—women in particular—to Cambridge to perform experiments showing that Mendel’s principles extended across the plant and animal kingdoms (Richmond 2001). He called this new discipline “genetics”, and “gene” became the term for the factor that was inherited (entry: the genotype/phenotype distinction).
With genetics carved out as a unique field of study, two threads of genetic research ensued. One thread focused on identifying the physical unit of heredity that was passed from generation to generation—to figure out what genes were, where they were located, how they operated, and how that operation produced the hereditary patterns consistent with Mendel’s principles (entry: theories of biological development). Thomas Hunt Morgan’s research at Columbia University most contributed to this work. Morgan studied fruit flies, in part because they bred quickly and were easy to maintain. With a team of young scientists, he crossed thousands upon thousands of fruit flies, tracking how traits like eye color and wing shape transmitted across generations. They also induced mutations using a variety of chemical and radiation interventions (see the entry on experiment in biology). This research proved that genes were located on chromosomes, and it showed how the physics of chromosomal action during meiosis impacted the hereditary process; for example, genes closer together on chromosomes were more often inherited together, while genes that were further apart more often separated from one another during chromosomal recombination. This realization allowed Morgan and his students to produce the first gene maps—charts of genes’ relative locations to one another—and also determine that certain traits were sex-linked due to their location on sex chromosomes (Darden 1991; Kohler 1994).
The other thread of genetic research that emerged attended to the evolutionary implications of Mendelian inheritance. Charles Darwin published On the Origin of Species in 1859, and the fact of evolution was widely recognized by 1900; however, the nature of the evolutionary process remained contested (Darwin 1859). According to Darwin, evolution was a very slow and gradual process, with natural selection favoring subtle differences between organisms (slightly longer legs, for example) that inclined one to be more successful at reproduction in some particular environment (entry: Darwinism). Mendel’s principles of inheritance, when they were hailed at the turn of the twentieth century, were thought by many geneticists to be incompatible with Darwinian evolution because Mendelian inheritance seemed more discrete (e.g., round or wrinkled peas, purple or white flowers), and so it was favored by scientists who advocated for a faster and more discontinuous process of evolution. Indeed, one of the reasons that Bateson so eagerly championed Mendel’s work was because he was a proponent of this less gradual interpretation (entries: evolution; fitness).
The apparent incompatibility between Darwinian evolution and Mendelian inheritance persisted until 1918 when British biologist R.A. Fisher first indicated how the two sciences could be related; if traits were assumed to be the product of many Mendelian factors, then Darwinian natural selection could favor subtle variations in the traits, and the populations undergoing that selection pressure would gradually evolve all while the organisms in that population obeyed the Mendelian principles of inheritance (Fisher 1918). Fisher’s contribution was the first in a series of works—most notably by he, J.B.S. Haldane, and Sewall Wright—to reconceive of evolution as changes in population gene frequencies. The union of Mendel and Darwin came to be called “the modern synthesis”, and the mathematical models that Fisher, Haldane, and Wright developed launched the field of population genetics (Provine 1971; entry: population genetics). Evolutionary biology, which had long been made up of qualitative arguments about, for example, the similarity between selection on domesticated crops/livestock and selection in nature, suddenly became concerned with mathematical arguments about the quantifiable influences of migration, genetic drift, mutation, and natural selection on populations (entries: ecological genetics; heritability; genetic drift).
1.2 Genetics and Eugenics
Francis Galton, the younger cousin of Darwin, coined the term “eugenics” in 1883, meaning “good birth” (Galton 1883). In nature, Darwin’s theory of evolution by natural selection suggested that the fit members of a population would outbreed the unfit members; Galton and other eugenicists, however, worried that this natural process was not playing out in human populations—that, in humans, the unfit were outbreeding the fit. A variety of social, economic, and political forces, the eugenicists warned, inclined people with undesirable traits (like criminality and “feeblemindedness”—a catchall term for intellectual disability) to have more children, while people with desirable traits (like high intelligence and creativity) were incentivized to have fewer children (Paul 1995).
When genetics came on the scientific scene in 1900, many eugenicists embraced the new theory of inheritance, believing that it offered a scientific foundation for their social vision. The eugenicists assumed that human traits like criminality and intelligence played by the same hereditary rules as the traits that Mendel and Morgan made famous, where single genes were associated with single traits. The eugenic task, then, was to decrease the transmission of undesirable genes to the next generation, and increase the transmission of desirable genes. Eugenicists advocated for a variety of social and political interventions to produce more fit and less unfit humans—sterilization of the unfit, immigration restriction acts that prohibited the influx of people from entire nations deemed unfit, anti-miscegenation laws that restricted “race mixing”; as well as “fitter family contests” that praised the fecundity of fit couples, eugenic sermon contests that encouraged clergy to preach the religious justifications for eugenics, and eugenic guidance to couples considering reproduction (Rosen 2004; Lombardo 2008).
By the 1940s and 1950s, a number of social and scientific trends emerged that undermined the eugenicists’ agenda. At the conclusion of World War II, it became clear that Nazi atrocities targeting certain populations for eradication were inspired by eugenic ideas cultivated in the very countries that fought against Germany. Social commentators pointed out that “fit humans” and “unfit humans” were not scientific terms; rather, they were racist, sexist, classist, and nativist concepts designed to privilege wealthy, educated White people and devalue socioeconomically disadvantaged minority populations. On the scientific side, social sciences like anthropology and sociology drew increasing attention to the social and economic forces at work in populations that contributed to criminality, destitution, and mental illness. And genetics too—the eugenicists’ chosen science—ultimately invalidated eugenics. Complex human traits like intelligence and antisocial behavior were not the result of any single gene; they were the result of many genetic and environmental factors all working in complicated and generally unpredictable ways over the course of human development (Tabery 2014). That insight, alongside the social science observations, ensured that no amount of sterilization or immigration restriction would eliminate the traits eugenicists found undesirable (Kevles 1985).
“Eugenics” as a term fell out of favor by mid-century. Eugenic programs rebranded themselves as “medical genetics” programs; eugenic journals and organizations dropped the word in exchange for phrases like “social biology” and “human genetics”. This terminological shift, however, belied an ongoing interest among many scientists and non-scientists alike in using the insights of genetics to control human heredity (entry: eugenics).
1.3 Genetics Goes Molecular
Morgan’s fruit fly research proved that genes were on chromosomes. But by the 1950s it was still unclear what genes were made up of, what their molecular structure was, and how that structure produced the observable hereditary patterns found in nature. Biologists at the time debated whether the genetic material was deoxyribonucleic acid (DNA) or proteins; Oswald Avery, Colin MacLeod, and Maclyn McCarty had previously indicated in research on mice that it was DNA, but this conclusion was by no means universally accepted (Avery, MacLeod, and McCarty 1944). Alfred Hershey and Martha Chase at Cold Spring Harbor Laboratory ingeniously used viruses—made up of a protein body (or “coat”) and DNA inside—that infected bacteria to settle the matter (Hershey and Chase 1952). They first radioactively labeled the viruses’ protein coat and allowed them to infect the bacteria, and then they radioactively labeled the viruses’ DNA and allowed them to infect the bacteria. The question was: When the viruses replicated in the bacteria, would the radioactive marker show up in the bacteria infected by viruses with radioactively-labeled proteins or in the bacteria infected by viruses with radioactively-labeled DNA? It was the latter, and that convinced molecular biologists that deciphering the molecular structure of DNA was the next major challenge (entry: molecular biology).
A number of geneticists, structural chemists, and physicists descended on the structure of DNA in the 1950s (Olby 1994). It was James Watson and Francis Crick at the University of Cambridge who first determined that DNA was a double-helix (Watson and Crick 1953). Utilizing Watson’s genetic expertise, Crick’s work in theoretical physics, and Rosalind Franklin’s x-ray crystallographic images of DNA (appallingly, without her consent or even knowledge), Watson and Crick built a model of DNA showing two polynucleotide strands spiraling around one another (de Chadarevian 2002; Maddox 2002). The strands were made up of a sequence of nucleic acids—combinations of adenine (A), thymine (T), cytosine (C), and guanine (G), such that an adenine on one strand hydrogen-bonded with a thymine on the other and a cytosine on one strand hydrogen-bonded with a guanine on the other (entry: models in science).
Molecular biologists spent the remainder of the 1950s and 1960s determining how the double-helical structure of DNA helped to elucidate the mechanisms of genetic replication and function. This research was guided by the notion that the gene was an informational molecule (Kay 2000). The nucleic acid bases were “letters” which, in sets of three, made up “words” that “coded” for one amino acid. Each chromosome was a “chapter” in an organism’s entire genome—the “book of life”. These weren’t just catchy phrases for newspaper headlines. The technical language of molecular biology employed the information metaphor. DNA was “transcribed” into RNA, which was then “translated” into proteins—the central dogma of molecular biology (entry: biological information).
Evolutionary biology also followed this reductionistic trend down to molecules. Molecular evolution emerged as a field of study where evolutionary changes were tracked at the level of DNA sequences, and DNA became thought of as a ledger of evolutionary history. Most genetic mutations, it became clear, had little to no impact on an organism’s fitness—either because the mutation occurred in such a way that the same amino acid was produced anyway (a product of redundancy in the genetic code) or because the mutation occurred in a region of the genome where no proteins were coded; this, in turn, forced biologists to rethink the extent to which DNA sequences could be understood as the product of natural selection alone (Kimura 1968; Dietrich 1994). Mutation rates in homologous DNA sequences shared by different species (say, humans and chimpanzees) also allowed for inferring how far back those two species diverged from a common ancestor (entries: ecological genetics; genetic drift).
1.4 Medical Genetics
In the 1940s and 1950s, as the science of genetics was just beginning to go molecular, a new batch of programs started showing up at medical schools with names like “heredity clinic” and “medical genetics”. The faculty and staff at these units eschewed direct reference to eugenics, but their methods and clinical advice were quite similar. They advertised reproductive counseling in local newspapers. When couples showed up at the clinics, the geneticists asked questions about what medical conditions ran in their family, and then the scientists constructed pedigrees to track the conditions. This facilitated hereditary risk assessments of what could be transmitted to children born from that genetic union, and couples at risk of bearing a child with some disability were advised not to procreate (Comfort 2012).
With the onset of the molecular revolution in biology in the 1950s and 1960s, the suite of services that medical geneticists could offer patients expanded. Carrier screening became available, which allowed for informing a patient that they carried a recessive allele of a disease-causing gene and so may pass that trait onto a child even if they did not show symptoms of the disease themselves. Amniocentesis was also developed, which allowed for extracting fetal cells from the amniotic sac, culturing those cells, and then testing for a range of medical conditions in the fetus (Harper 2008).
The proliferation of genetic technologies in the mid-twentieth century brought with it a demand for healthcare workers who could process that information and help patients understand it. The result was genetic counseling programs. The professional emergence of genetic counseling occurred at the very same time that abortion was decriminalized in a number of countries, the disability rights movement and second-wave feminism gained momentum, and bioethical attention to patient autonomy became a serious consideration in clinical care. This created a profound tension for the young community of genetic counselors. On the one hand, genetic counseling had a disciplinary ancestry that ran directly through heredity clinics and straightforward eugenics before that; many of the genetic counselor’s tools (e.g., constructing a family pedigree) and many of the traits that received genetic counseling attention (e.g., Down syndrome) were the very same tools and traits at the center of the earlier practices. On the other hand, the genetic counselors—mostly women—were much more attuned than the heredity clinic and medical genetics pioneers—mostly men—to the moral and social problems with paternalistic medicine and eugenics highlighted by the critics from feminism, disability rights, and bioethics. The genetic counselors navigated this tension by embracing a principle of nondirectiveness; rather than telling patients how to act on the genetic information they received, genetic counselors aspired to simply convey that genetic information in a non-biased way and help the patients decide for themselves how to act on that information (Stern 2012).
Throughout the 1980s and 1990s, teams of researchers in the ever-expanding pool of medical genetics and human genetics programs competed to be the first to find the precise genomic location of disease-causing genes. The challenge was to determine which chromosome, then which stretch of DNA, and finally which specific nucleic acid mutation was responsible for conditions like cystic fibrosis and breast cancer; the leaders of the teams that crossed the finish line first became scientific celebrities. The excitement surrounding the genetic discoveries was partly about the thrill of a scientific race; but more than that, it was also about the promise of genetic tests that could tell patients more accurately whether or not they were likely to develop some devastating disease and, beyond that, lead to the development of gene-based treatments or even cures for those diseases.
1.5 Genetics Goes Genomic and Postgenomic
As more and more diseases were being linked up to locations in the human genome throughout the 1990s, geneticists shifted their attention to the grand prize—sequencing the entire human genome (Cook-Deegan 1994). Ever since the discovery of the double-helical structure of DNA, geneticists knew what genes were made of and what structure they took. But they did not know how many genes there were. And with the exception of the handful of genes that had already been discovered, they did not know where the vast majority of genes were located. The challenge was to spell out the ordered sequence of the human genome in its entirety—no small task when you consider that all three billion base pairs of the human genome reside in cells no bigger than the period at the end of this sentence. The Human Genome Project met the challenge with the largest and most expensive biological collaboration in history. An international consortium of scientists at twenty different sequencing centers spread out across the United States, the United Kingdom, France, Germany, Japan, and China took charge of different portions, breaking up the entire genome into smaller and smaller overlapping segments until stretches several thousand base pairs at a time could be sequenced. Then the whole thing was pasted back together using the areas of overlap as guides. The Human Genome Project was officially completed in 2003 (entry: the Human Genome Project).
The successful completion of the Human Genome Project was met with lofty language. The media hailed the effort as uncovering the “Holy Grail of biology”, and project leaders compared it to splitting the atom and putting a human on the moon. At a celebration of the Human Genome Project in 2003 (for video see Other Internet Resources), Francis Collins—one of the directors of the effort—boldly predicted that the major genes for diabetes, mental illness, asthma, and many other diseases would all be discovered in the next few years. These genetic findings, he claimed, would in turn completely transform the way those very common diseases were diagnosed and treated. By 2010, Collins foresaw a world of individualized medicine where genetic testing was common and physicians tailored treatment plans and lifestyle changes all to a patient’s unique DNA. And by 2020, he hoped “we will have a gene-based designer drug available for almost any disease that you can name.” A genomic revolution was promised, where traditional “one-size-fits-all medicine” was going to be replaced with “personalized medicine” (entry: philosophy of medicine).
Interestingly, while the geneticists and news reporters were looking ahead to the bright future of personalized medicine, the actual results from the Human Genome Project pointed to a much more complicated and daunting path ahead. Going into the sequencing, geneticists assumed humans carried over 100,000 genes around with them. Humans are more complex than mice or rice, the thought went, so they should have more genes. Instead, the Human Genome Project revealed that humans bore only 20,000 genes, while mice carried 25,000 and rice more than 30,000. This gene-count surprise was a strong indication that there would be much more to personalized medicine than simply assigning different stretches of DNA to different diseases (entry: genomics and postgenomics).
We live now in the postgenomic era. Just what “postgenomic” means, though, is a point of contention. On the one hand, many life sciences have embraced genomics, bringing DNA sequencing methods and an attention to genes into their domain—conservation genomics, cancer genomics, behavioral genomics, immunological genomics, bacterial genomics, and marine genomics, to name just a few (entries: biodiversity; philosophy of immunology; conservation biology). On the other hand, it’s become abundantly clear that there is a great deal of complexity between a sequence of DNA and a trait, and that there are far more variables affecting that trait than just the order of As, Cs, Ts, and Gs. This has spawned the proliferation of other “omic” disciplines that attempt to catalogue and functionally understand the great variety of molecular and cellular entities and processes that contribute to the structure and function of organisms—proteomics, transcriptomics, metabolomics, lipidomics, and glycomics, to name just a few. What’s more, genome-wide association studies, which scour entire genomes for regions that are associated with traits, have revealed that in most case, tens, hundreds, or thousands of genomic regions are implicated in even fairly simple human traits like height. This tension—between an urge to trace things down to genes and a realization once you get there that there is far more to the story than genes—is at the heart of many philosophical reflections on genetics (Richardson and Stevens 2015; Reardon 2017; entries: genomics and postgenomics; philosophy of systems and synthetic biology; heritability).
2. Philosophical Questions about Genetics
The prominence of genetics—its impressive rise throughout the twentieth century, its infiltration of other life and health sciences, and its practical impact on human lives—made it a natural object of scrutiny for philosophers interested in science and the relationship between science and society. Philosophers have attended to a great many conceptual, theoretical, metaphysical, epistemological, methodological, ethical, legal, political, and social questions pertaining to genetics. A sample of those questions and direction to the entries where they are discussed in greater detail follows.
2.1 What Is the Relationship between Classical Genetics and Molecular Genetics?
Philosophy of science, throughout the early- and mid-twentieth century, was predominated by attention to examples, problems, and concepts from physics. Not surprisingly, the philosophical insights produced a vision of how science worked that was modeled on physics. Scientific explanations, as one example, arose from the derivation of phenomena from physical laws of nature; rainbows are explained by reference to the laws of reflection and refraction, alongside the position of the sun, the position of raindrops, and the position of the person seeing the rainbow. Scientific progress, as another example, proceeded by way of higher-level sciences reducing to lower-level sciences; thermodynamics (with its concepts of temperature and pressure), the thought went, was reduced to statistical mechanics (with its concepts of mean kinetic energy and force) (entries: scientific reduction; intertheory relations in physics; scientific progress; laws of nature).
In the 1960s, philosophers of science started turning their attention to biology in order to see how the philosophical insights applied there. The earliest, influential example of this was Kenneth Schaffner’s proposal for classical, Mendelian genetics reducing to molecular genetics (Schaffner 1969). The great successes of molecular biology following Watson and Crick’s discovery of the double-helical structure of DNA can be best understood, Schaffner argued, by recognizing how classical genetics was in the process of being reduced to the biochemical processes investigated by molecular biologists. On this reading, the “gene” from classical genetics was reduced to a sequence of amino acids in DNA, and other concepts from classical genetics like “dominance” were likewise being reconfigured in the language of biochemistry (entry: reductionism in biology).
Schaffner’s case for reduction in genetics invited philosophers to take a hard look at the theories and practices of biologists. A variety of challenges to Schaffner’s thesis ensued. David Hull (1974) claimed that there was no neat connection between classical genetics’ gene concept and molecular genetics’ DNA sequence because there was no neat, one-to-one mapping between stretches of DNA and the traits that the classical geneticists investigated; instead, Hull thought it better to characterize molecular genetics as having replaced classical genetics. Philip Kitcher (1984) agreed with Hull that reduction was the wrong way to understand the relationship; however, he offered a different formulation of the correct way. Kitcher said it was best to understand classical genetics and molecular genetics as operating on different, autonomous levels; classical geneticists investigated the transmission of traits by studying the cytological mechanisms of chromosomal action, while molecular geneticists investigated things like gene replication and mutation by studying the molecular mechanisms of protein synthesis (entries: molecular genetics; the unity of science).
The debate over the relationship between classical genetics and molecular genetics didn’t so much resolve itself as it did evolve into a series of new philosophical questions. That is, as philosophers were working through the details of genetics to assess the relationship between the older version and the newer one, they encountered a series of questions that demanded consideration: What exactly is a “gene”? And what do genes actually do? Philosophers continued to consider the reduction question (for examples of subsequent defenders of reduction, see Waters 1990; Schaffner 1993). But these other questions took on a life of their own and became legitimate targets of inquiry independent of the reduction debate. Philosophy of biology professionally emerged as a unique sub-discipline of philosophy of science in the 1970s and 1980s as this unfolded (entry: philosophy of biology).
2.2 What Is a “Gene”?
No concept is more central to genetics than the “gene”. And yet, the earliest philosophical examinations of genetics quickly uncovered the fact that it was by no means clear that the gene from classical genetics was the same thing as the gene from molecular genetics. Subsequent attention to genetics only compounded the puzzle. In the late 1970s, a series of discoveries complicated the simple relationship between a single, uninterrupted sequence of DNA and its polypeptide, protein product. Overlapping genes were discovered (Barrell et al. 1976); such genes were considered overlapping because two different amino acid chains might be read from the same stretch of nucleic acids by starting from different points on the DNA sequence. And split genes were found (Berget et al. 1977; Chow et al. 1977). In contrast to the hypothesis that a continuous nucleic acid sequence generated an amino acid chain, it became apparent that stretches of DNA were often split between coding regions (exons) and non-coding regions (introns). The distinction between exons and introns became even more complicated when alternative splicing was discovered the following year (Berk and Sharp 1978). A series of exons could be spliced together in a variety of ways, thus generating a variety of molecular products. Discoveries such as overlapping genes, split genes, and alternative splicing made it clear that what counted as a gene was by no means straightforward even if focus was confined to molecular genetics (Griffiths and Stotz 2013; Rheinberger and Müller-Wille 2017; entry: molecular biology).
Philosophers responded to these genetic discoveries in different ways—by proposing multiple gene concepts, or by trying to unify the disparate phenomena under a single gene concept. Lenny Moss’s distinction between Gene-P and Gene-D is a classic example of the multiple gene concepts approach (Moss 2002). Gene-P embraced an instrumental preformationism; it was defined by its relationship to a phenotype. In contrast, Gene-D referred to a developmental resource; it was defined by its molecular sequence. An example will help to distinguish the two: When one talked about “the gene for cystic fibrosis”, the Gene-P concept was being utilized; the concept referred to the ability to track the transmission of this gene from generation to generation as an instrumental predictor of cystic fibrosis, without being contingent on knowing the causal pathway between the particular sequence of DNA and the ultimate phenotypic disease. The Gene-D concept, in contrast, referred instead to just one developmental resource (i.e., the molecular sequence) involved in the complex development of the disease, which interacted with a host of other such resources (proteins, RNA, a variety of enzymes, etc.) (entry: gene). (For other examples of multiple gene concepts, see Fox Keller 2002; Baetu 2011; Griffiths and Stotz 2013).
A second philosophical approach for conceptualizing the gene involved rethinking a single, unified gene concept that captured the molecular complexities. For example, Eva Neumann-Held claimed that a “process molecular gene concept” embraced the complications; on her unified view, the term “gene” referred to “the recurring process that leads to the temporally and spatially regulated expression of a particular polypeptide product” (Neumann-Held 1999). Returning to the case of cystic fibrosis, a process molecular gene for an individual without the disease referred to one of a variety of transmembrane ion-channel templates along with all the non-genetic influences on gene expression, involved in the generation of the normal polypeptide product. And so cystic fibrosis arose when a particular stretch of the DNA sequence was missing from this process (entry: molecular genetics). (For additional examples of gene-concept unification, see Falk 2001; Portin and Wilkins 2017.)
2.3 What Do Genes Do?
At a celebration of the Human Genome Project completion in 2003 (see section 1.5 above), genome enthusiasts promised that the major genes for heart disease, mental health disorders, and diabetes would all be discovered shortly, that treatments would soon follow, and that genetic cures would be available by 2020. To call those claims “hype” would be an understatement. Genome-wide association studies following the Human Genome Project revealed that the most common human diseases were impacted by many, many places in the genome, each of which made a very small contribution to the risk of having or not having the ailment. That, in turn, meant that there were no simple targets for genetic interventions because there were simply too many genetic points and pathways from those points. Most strikingly, even the traits for which single genes were discovered—cystic fibrosis for example—remained stubbornly resilient to cures, even though those genes were identified 30 years prior. Philosophical critics of genetics pointed to this mismatch between genetic promises and genetic deliveries to argue against misleading and harmful notions of genetic essentialism (Nelkin an Lindee 2004). “Misleading” because studies about complex relationships between some portion of DNA and some human trait often were simplified down to claims about discoveries of “the gene for” that trait. And “harmful” because the language encouraged continued investment of public resources in gene-hunting research, when it was possible that society would gain more from focusing biomedical research agendas elsewhere (entries: feminist philosophy of biology; the human genome project; theories of biological development; philosophy of medicine; sociobiology).
One source of confusion, according to the critics, were the metaphors that got embedded in molecular genetics in the mid-twentieth century. Computing and architectural metaphors suggesting that the genome was a “program” or “blueprint” for development conveyed misleading ideas about how cells operated (Kay 2000). Informational metaphors may capture some features of biology, but the error was in thinking that only DNA carried that biological information (Griffiths 2001; Jablonka 2002; entry: biological information).
An alternative way of making sense of what genes do without the baggage of metaphors is to characterize it in causal language. C. Kenneth Waters drew on a manipulationist theory of causation that treated causes as manipulable difference-makers, where Waters’ insight was to add a distinction between “potential difference-makers” and “actual difference-makers” (Waters 2007). In carefully controlled genetic experiments such as Morgan’s classic work on fruit flies (see section 1.1 above), Waters pointed out that there were many potential difference-makers for a trait under investigation like eye color, but it was the actual genetic difference that was responsible for the actual difference in eye color. Waters claimed further that the spread of genetics throughout the life sciences was partly attributable to this feature of scientists being able to manipulate phenotypes by manipulating genes (entries: molecular genetics; causation and manipulability). As with the information metaphor, though, philosophical critics have been willing to accept Waters’ distinction between potential and actual difference-makers, but then challenged the idea that only genes acted as actual difference-makers (Griffiths and Stotz 2013; entry: developmental biology).
Research agendas for investigating the living world now commonly reference genes as one unit, element, or level to be considered by biologists (entry: levels of organization in biology). The Research Domain Criteria of psychiatry lists genes as one unit of analysis alongside cells, circuits, and physiology (entry: philosophy of psychiatry). Conservation biologists attend to different targets of conservation—genes, but also species, sub-species, populations, and biomes (entries: conservation biology; biodiversity). The ubiquity of these references to genes in scientific practices that range from understanding major depressive disorder to saving the Great Barrier Reef serves as an affirmation of Waters’ point about the power of genetics to act as a point of intervention in the world. At the same time, the fact that genes are but one item in these lists of possible points of intervention reminds us that they are not unique.
2.4 Are Genes the Target of Natural Selection?
On Darwin’s original formulation, natural selection acted on individual organisms (entries: Darwinism; natural selection). As a population of organisms struggled to survive in some particular environment, some of the organisms had traits that made them slightly fitter in that environment, and this meant they were more likely to survive and reproduce; the offspring of those organisms in turn inherited the traits of their parents, and so the character of the population changed over time, eventually forming a new or different species if the process went on long enough (entries: evolution; fitness). For example, in an environment that is growing increasingly cold, animals with thicker fur might have an advantage over the animals with less fur because of their ability to tolerate the temperature; these thicker-furred animals would be more likely to survive in that cold environment and also more likely to reproduce offspring that inherit their parents’ thicker coats. Eventually, the entire population of those animals may display this thicker fur (entry: adaptationism).
Even Darwin recognized, however, that nature presented some cases that did not fit this picture. In particular, seemingly altruistic behaviors in the animal kingdom posed a puzzle (Wilson 2015). Take social mammals like ground squirrels that whistle alarm calls to notify other members of the group of a nearby threat. On the original Darwinian formulation of natural selection, alarm calling should not arise because it is not beneficial to the ground squirrels that display the behavior. A ground squirrel that is more prone to notifying its counterparts of a looming threat is presumably also more likely to get killed by that threat, and so the proneness to warn shouldn’t get propagated in the population if all the altruistic ground squirrels are dying by very virtue of their altruistic behavior (entry: biological altruism).
W. D. Hamilton proposed kin selection as a resolution to the altruism puzzle (Hamilton 1964). If the population of ground squirrels above were related, then the genes associated with alarm calling could propagate in the group even if the altruistic ground squirrels were killed more often because their kin who shared the genes survived. G. C. Williams and Richard Dawkins subsequently generalized Hamilton’s observation, arguing that all of natural selection could be understood as operating at the genetic level (Williams 1966; Dawkins 1976). On this “gene’s-eye view of evolution”, natural selection targets genes (the “replicators” in Dawkins’ language), while organisms are the “vehicles” (or “interactors”) that carry around the genes and interact with the environment (entry: replication and reproduction).
The gene’s-eye formulation of natural selection sparked an explosion of philosophical attention to evolutionary biology (which happened to roughly coincide with the attention to the relationship between classic and molecular genetics discussed in section 2.1). This “levels” or “units of selection” debate revolved around a number of questions (Keller 1999; Okasha 2006; entry: units and levels of selection). For example, at what level does natural selection act? Genes, individuals, groups, entire species (entry: biological notion of individual)? Group selectionists argued altruistic behavior could arise if one group was fitter than another group because it had more altruistic members in that group (Sober and Wilson 1998). Stephen Jay Gould made the case for selection acting on entire species when, for example, ecological specialists were more common than generalists (Gould 2002). Other philosophers questioned the entire replicator/interactor distinction; Developmental Systems Theorists advocated instead for seeing the developmental system as a whole (genes and the environment) as the evolving unit (Oyama, Griffiths, and Gray eds. 2001; see the entry on developmental biology).
2.5 Who Benefits from Medical Genetics? Who is Harmed by It?
Eugenics had many things wrong with it (see section 1.2 above). In part it was based on a poor understanding of human genetics. Beyond that, though, it was also morally abhorrent. Eugenics was grounded on biased ideas about what made lives worth living. And it put decision-making power over what lives were worth living into the hands of government bodies and institutions. Dozens of states in America passed some form of sterilization law that targeted people deemed undesirable, so that society wouldn’t be burdened by people with physical and intellectual disabilities (Largent 2011). States also enacted anti-miscegenation laws to prevent interracial marriages that could contribute to “race suicide” (Pascoe 2009; entry: eugenics).
Architects of the pivot to medical genetics and genetic counseling programs in the mid-twentieth century tried to curtail some of the abhorrent features of this history by shifting control over reproductive decisions from governments/institutions to individuals/families (see section 1.4 above). A technology like amniocentesis allowed a woman to decide whether or not she wanted to carry a fetus that was likely to have Down syndrome to term or alternatively terminate the pregnancy. Carrier screening for cystic fibrosis let prospective parents know what the chances were that they could conceive a child with that condition. For families with Huntington’s disease, preimplantation genetic diagnosis after in vitro fertilization opened the door to only implanting embryos that did not carry the Huntington’s disease allele. Genetic counselors saw their role as facilitating these patients’ reproductive decision-making in a non-biased way. Medical geneticists hailed these genetic technologies, claiming they empowered families (and women in particular) with greater autonomous control over their reproductive decisions (entry: pregnancy, birth, and medicine).
Critics from disability studies, however, argued that medical genetics’ break from eugenics was not so clean-cut (Barnes 2016; Parens and Asch 1999; Silvers 2016). When hospitals offered pregnant women the opportunity to screen for traits like Down syndrome and cystic fibrosis but not other traits like sex or eye-color, it sent a message to prospective parents that some traits—like Down syndrome and cystic fibrosis—should be considered for termination while other traits—like sex and eye-color—should not (Parens and Asch 2000). Genetic counselors aspired to offer genetic information in a non-directive fashion, but disability-oriented critics argued that information shared with prospective parents about living with a disability was often skewed against disability (Asch 1989). The general message disability studies scholars highlighted was that medical genetics reinforced the idea that disability was something to be avoided, not accommodated (Scully 2008). This was seen as just the modern instantiation of the straightforwardly eugenic idea that some lives are not worth living (Saxton 1997; Wendell 1996). What’s more, the critics pointed out that standardizing these genetic technologies in the healthcare system actually put pressure on prospective parents to use them, which meant the reproductive decisions were not as autonomous as genetic defenders proclaimed (entries: disability: health, well-being, and personal relationships; feminist perspectives on disability).
Medical genetics faced other criticisms as well. The standardization of genetic technologies contributed to the medicalization of conception, pregnancy, and birth; this altered the relationship between expecting parents and fetuses because a pregnancy became thought of as “tentative” until screening was complete, and it also impacted the way expecting parents prepared for and communicated about a pregnancy (Duden 1993). Racial health disparity scholars also criticized biomedical research investment in medical genetics because it pulled resources away from known causes of health disparities in the environment that had a bigger impact on the problem (Roberts 2011). In some cases, the concerns about medicalization and the concerns about racial health disparities converged; for example, Dorothy Roberts warned that it takes social and economic resources to access the sorts of genetic technologies that hospitals offer (at least in the United States), and so medical genetics only exacerbated health disparities (Roberts 2009; entries: feminist bioethics; the human genome project).
2.6 Should Genetics Be Utilized for Human Enhancement?
A common distinction in the medical world is that between “treatment” and “enhancement”, where the general idea is that biomedical interventions that are designed to restore or sustain health count as treatments while those that go beyond restoring or sustaining health count as enhancements (entry: human enhancement). The discussion in the previous section about disability largely pertained to the treatment end of that spectrum (entry: neuroethics). Philosophical debates about medical genetics have also revolved around the enhancement end (Buchanan 2011).
To a certain extent, the ability to screen for genes associated with certain traits meant some form of genetic enhancement was always possible, even if it seemed impractical (think worries about blue-eyed, blond-haired “designer babies”, which were common in the 1990s when the Human Genome Project was launched). The emergence of relatively fast and cheap gene-editing technologies like CRISPR-Cas9 has made the debates over genetic enhancement feel much more pressing (National Academies of Sciences, Engineering, and Medicine 2017). The ethical stakes have not really changed, but the sense that discussions have shifted from purely hypothetical to potentially realistic has changed.
Philosophical critics of enhancement offer a number of cautions against the practice. Michael Sandel famously associated desires for enhancement with hubris, where contentment with what nature (and chance) present was the more virtuous attitude (Sandel 2002). Parental attempts to genetically enhance a child were also criticized on the grounds that they violated the autonomy of the child because parents were seeking too much control over the child’s future (Habermas 2003). Philosophers also warned of an unjust future made up of genetic “haves” (those who have benefited from enhancement) and “have nots” (those who remained unenhanced)—a scenario popularized in the film GATTACA (entry: theory and bioethics).
Defenders of enhancement were quick to point out that many of the arguments against enhancing were not reasonably confined to just genetic technologies. Parents control their child’s future when they send her to space camp rather than soccer camp; likewise, wealthy parents are able to enhance their children with all sorts of educational resources, like tutors, that poor parents cannot provide, and these surely contribute to disparities. But parents are given wide latitude to decide what camp their child will attend and how much they will (or won’t) invest in their child’s educational development. Julian Savulescu (2001) even argued that parents are obligated to take advantage of genetic technologies if they offer opportunities to increase the chances of a child living the best life. Of course, just what counts as the “best life” is an inherently value-laden judgment, and critics pointed out that Savulescu’s characterization of it looked frighteningly similar to the vision promoted by eugenicists a century ago (entries: parenthood and procreation; eugenics).
2.7 Is Race “in the Genes”?
Eugenicists understood races to be biologically distinct human populations with rank-able physical and behavioral profiles (see section 1.2 above). Black people were more prone to criminality and lower intelligence than White people, they believed; and a child who was born of mixed-race parents was likely to fall somewhere in between. The anti-miscegenation laws promoted by eugenicists were explicitly designed to prevent White people from breeding with Black people. Black people were not the only targets though. Eugenicists also spoke of the “Irish race”, the “Italian race”, and the “Slavic race”. These racial categories were just as real for the eugenicists as the categories of Black, White, and Asian, and anti-immigration laws were passed to keep undesirable races away (entry: race).
The simplistic ideas about race held by eugenicists did not hold up to scientific scrutiny. Twentieth century developments in fields like human evolution, anthropology, and sociology proved that races were not so cleanly distinguishable—that there were no racial atomic numbers that carved up Black and White in the same way that proton number neatly distinguished gold from mercury. Still, interest in race and genetics persisted. Insights from the study of human evolution revealed how the earliest humans moved out of Africa roughly 70,000 years ago in a series of migrations, some moving east across the Asian continent, some moving north up into what is now Europe, some eventually crossing the Bering Strait and entering the Americas. As these human populations moved about, they encountered very different environments with unique selection pressures (Herrera and Garcia-Bertrand 2018). What counted as adaptive in the fjords of Northern Europe looked quite different from what was adaptive in the deserts of Northern Africa, and so the human populations over time adapted to the distinct environments—some developing darker skin while others grew lighter, some developing a resistance to cholera while others developed a resistance to malaria.
The revised conceptions of race and genetics worked off this evolutionary story, where the idea was that racial categories represented human groups with unique genetic profiles tied to those different selection histories (Hardimon 2017). A Black person, the thought went, came from African ancestry, while a White person came from European ancestry. In turn, the Black person was likely to have a different genetic profile when it came to melanin production (which controls skin shade) than the White person, and the Black person was more likely to be a carrier for sickle-cell anemia (a blood disorder that also offers some resistance to malaria) while the White person was more likely to be a carrier for cystic fibrosis (a respiratory disorder that also offers some resistance to cholera) (Spencer 2018). Proponents of these newer ideas about race and genetics were eager to say that they were not in the business of ranking races; they were just tracing different racial histories and the modern phenotypic results of them (entry: the social dimensions of scientific knowledge).
Even the revised understanding of race and genetics, however, faced challenges. First, the groupings from human evolution did not map neatly onto the traditional folk concepts of race; for example, if “White” applied to people descended from the migration that ultimately wound up in Northern Europe, then that would mean children born today in Bangalore, Oslo, and Damascus all count as “White”—a counterintuitive grouping of “White” people (Smith 2011). Critics also pointed out that the folk concepts of race evolved over time, largely in response to political and economic pressures (like census counting and justifying slavery), not biological insights (like paleogenetic discoveries) (Roberts 2011). Some critics have encouraged distinguishing “race” from “ancestry”, confining talk of genetics (e.g., genetic ancestral testing, genetic medicine) to the ancestry side of that distinction and keeping it out of discussions of race (Yudell et al. 2016; entry: identity politics).
As the second century of genetics unfolds, there is little reason to think the influential science will slow down. In New Zealand, government leaders proposed using gene-editing technologies to eradicate invasive species from the island nation (Yong 2017). In the United States, the All of Us Research Program rolled out, with the aim being to collect DNA from 1,000,000 Americans and link that information up with medical records so as to usher in a new genomic paradigm of precision medicine (Pear 2016). In China, scientists inserted a human gene involved in brain development into monkeys in order to see how the addition of that human gene altered the monkey’s own development (CBC Radio in Other Internet Resources). These programs, practices, and proposals raised profound questions about the dangers of intervening on complex ecosystems, the politics of distributing scarce biomedical resources, and the ethics of non-human animal research. As genetics progresses, so too will the philosophical questions about it.
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
- Canadian Eugenics Archive
- Cold Spring Harbor Laboratory’s Eugenics Archive
- Genetic Science Learning Center’s Learn.Genetics
- New Zealand’s Predator Free 2050 Initiative
- National Human Genome Research Institute: A Brief History and Timeline
- Nature’s What is DNA?
- United States’ All of Us Research Program
- celebration of the Human Genome Project, 23 April 2003 (video, 03:26:30 runtime)
- CBC Radio, 2019, “Scientists Have Put a Human Brain Gene into Monkeys. Have They Crossed the Line?”, Quirks and Quarks, 20 April 2019. Available online at: https://www.cbc.ca/radio/quirks/scientists-have-put-a-human-brain-gene-into-monkeys-have-they-crossed-the-line-1.51 01890.