Philosophy of Biology in Latin America

First published Mon Aug 21, 2023

Philosophy of biology is a sub-discipline within philosophy of science, and it became professionalized and institutionalized in regions like the United States, Canada, and Europe during the 1970s and 1980s. In Latin America, this process began a decade later, after a long period of early history from the colonial period to the mid-twentieth century. The professionalization and institutionalization of philosophy of science, including the germination of philosophy of biology, took place between the mid-twentieth century and the 1980s–1990s. Since then, the field of philosophy of biology grew consistently in Latin America, with contributions of international impact.

This article provides an overview of the work done on three topics that are most characteristic of how philosophy of biology has developed in the subcontinent. The themes chosen are the analysis of the concept of race, the analysis of biological theories, and different ways of relating philosophy of biology with history of biology. The main focus is placed on contributions that thinkers living in Latin America have made to philosophy of biology, most of them born in the region. We will also review contributions made by Latin American thinkers working outside the region.

This entry has six parts. Sections 1 and 2 provide context for the remainder of the entry. Section 1 gives a brief introduction to philosophy of biology, and Section 2 provides historical background and general characteristics of philosophy of biology in Latin America. Sections 3 through 5 are devoted to the three topics mentioned above: Section 3 to the theme of race, Section 4 to the issue of the nature, structure, and function of biological theories, and Section 5 to the strong connection to history of biology. Section 6 offers final thoughts and considers some future prospects for philosophy of biology in Latin America.

1. A Brief Discussion on Philosophy of Biology

We will begin with a few words about philosophy of biology before diving into a more detailed discussion. As in all regions, there are many ways of working within philosophy of biology in Latin America. Various authors (Griffiths 2008 [2018]; Odenbaugh & Griffiths 2020; and Kitcher 2005) have identified four distinct kinds of philosophical inquiry that fall under the general heading of philosophy of biology, and we could add a fifth.

First, there is the reassessment of some problems, theses, and solutions developed in general philosophy of science or in other special philosophy of science, within the context of biology. Second, we have the analysis of logical, semantic, pragmatic, epistemological, methodological, ontological, praxiological, axiological, ethical, and aesthetic aspects of biology. Third, specific conceptual problems in biology are analyzed philosophically. Fourth, biology, or its philosophical analysis, contributes to the development of new approaches and answers to traditional philosophical questions (e.g., the topic of abortion in ethics, or evolutionary epistemology and naturalized epistemologies). Fifth, ethical and social implications of biological knowledge and the technological applications of biology are analyzed.

Ethics and epistemology in general, mentioned in the fourth kind of philosophy of biology above, constitute specific areas in themselves. As such, they have their own philosophical sub-communities, as well as conferences, journals, and associations, and deserve a specific and separate treatment beyond this entry. In the fifth kind of doing philosophy of biology, analysis of the ethical and social implications of biological knowledge takes place within bioethics, and analysis of the ethical and social implications of technological applications of biological knowledge takes place within philosophy of technology in general and philosophy of biotechnology in particular. Therefore, although we will mention them, these ways of working within philosophy of biology will not be discussed in detail here.

With regards to the first type of philosophy of biology, it is important to mention that science makes philosophical presuppositions of different kinds. Moreover, in the presentation of results, empirical scientists use a variety of types of languages: the technical language of the science in question, natural language(s), the language(s) of logic(s) and mathematics, and a language to talk about science. The first three types of languages could be called scientific-language-in-use. This is different from what might be called metascientific-language-in-use, that is, expressions used to talk about science, such as scientific “concepts”, “hypotheses”, “laws”, “models”, “theories”, or “mechanisms”. The precision and clarification of concepts is called conceptual analysis or explication (Carnap 1950) and constitutes a fundamental task for philosophers. The explication of scientific and meta-scientific concepts may be carried out by philosophers of science and by scientists themselves. Though generally scientists explicate meta-scientific concepts in a more introductory and informal manner.

The re-ordering, or reconstruction, of the conceptual systems produced by science is also carried out by trained philosophers and scientists themselves. Regarding issues of foundations or of theoretical science, studies executed by philosophers of science and by scientists may coincide, with results published in journals or books either in the field of philosophy or science. And what holds true for science in general also holds true for biology in particular. The scope of this entry allows us to consider only a few of the most significant of these attempts.

Finally, philosophy of biology can also be subdivided according to the particular areas of biology with which it is concerned (Griffiths 2008 [2018]; Odenbaugh & Griffiths 2020). Biology contains a diverse set of sub-disciplines, including evolution, systematics, genetics, and ecology. Each area produces its own philosophical challenges, which could be linked to any of the aforementioned ways of working within philosophy of biology. The following review considers all these areas, including some related disciplines such as biochemistry and biomedical sciences.

2. Historical Background and General Characteristics of Philosophy of Biology in Latin America

The professionalization and institutionalization of philosophy as it is understood today took place first in Europe, in the second half of the eighteenth century (Rabossi 2008). This process also first began in Europe for philosophy of science in the so-called Vienna Circle (1929) and became consolidated after the main Central-European philosophers of science arrived in the United States in the late 1930s (Moulines 2008).

The professionalization of philosophy (Gracia & Vargas 2013 [2018]; Romero 1944; Rabossi 2003, 2008) and philosophy of science took place between the 1940s and 1960s in most Latin American countries, or as late as the 1970s in others (Cordero 2010, 2015 [2016]; Gómez 2011; Marcos & Pérez Ransanz 2015; Lombardi, Cordero, & Pérez Ransanz 2020). However, during those years and the following two decades, less effort was dedicated to philosophical reflections on biology compared to physics. Following professionalization and institutionalization of philosophy of biology as a sub-discipline within philosophy of science in regions like the US, Canada, and Europe during the 1970s–1980s, the situation slowly but consistently changed in Latin America.

Leaving aside the Indigenous Period, three main periods can be distinguished cum grano salis in the philosophy of biology in Latin America. The first took place before the professionalization of philosophy of science in the region, the colonial period to the mid-twentieth century. The second period, from the mid-twentieth century to the 1980s and 1990s, came after the professionalization of philosophy of science but before the professionalization of philosophy of biology as its own sub-discipline. Finally, the third period began in the 1990s and continues today.

2.1 First Period. Early History of “Philosophy of Biology” in Latin America

From a variety of perspectives, reflections on the philosophical aspects of what would later come to be called biology have been made in Latin American throughout its history. As in other areas of philosophy in Latin America, until well into the twentieth century the philosophical discussion of topics involving biology was characterized by the “ideological” use of biological theories, theses, and experimental results for ethical, political, and social goals.

For instance, during the colonial period, an early debate took place between Bartolomé de las Casas (1484–1566) and Juan Ginés de Sepúlveda (1490–1573) at the Council of Valladolid (1550–1551) and was then taken back up by Alonso de la Veracruz (c.1507–1584). This debate was over the supposed rights of the Spanish monarchy over the Indigenous peoples of the Americas with the ideological use of a category from natural philosophy, that of race, which would later be established as a biological category (Casas 1552; Veracruz 1553–1554). Indeed, a new social hierarchy or caste system based on race was developed as a consequence of European conquest and colonization. Moreover, the ideological use of the category of race has been a constant throughout the history of Latin America, continuing in the present day (see Section 3).

The ideological use of biological knowledge continued after most areas of Latin America gained their independence from European colonial powers early in the nineteenth century. Although reception differed from country to country, versions of positivism and Darwinism were instrumental for the dominant classes to create a project of nation-building, usually in conjunction with an educational project and sometimes with policies of “civilizing” the Indigenous populations and encouraging more immigration from Europe. The political and ideological use of positivism and Darwinism, or of “scientific ideologies” such as Spencer’s evolutionism or social Darwinism, and their philosophical discussion characterize the Nationalist period from the mid-nineteenth century to the early twentieth century.

In addition to Latin American contributions to philosophy of biology from Comtian and Spencerian positivism, as well as Darwinian, Haeckelian, and Bergsonian evolutionism, there were also advances in relation to biological causality (J. Blanco 1917) and Kant’s teleological ideas (J. Blanco 1918) (see Bermúdez Barrera 2001). These ran counter to the then contemporary currents of vitalism, as did those that claimed the legitimacy of a mechanical or mechanicist biology (Laclau 1931; Braier 1931; Neuschlosz 1944) and analyzed the nature and methodology of biological sciences and their relationships with physical-chemical sciences or historical social sciences (Neuschlosz 1939, 1944, 1945).

2.2 Second and Third Periods. Some General Characteristics of Philosophy of Biology in Latin America

During the second period, from the mid-twentieth century to the 1980s–1990s, the professionalization and institutionalization or “normalcy” of philosophy and philosophy of science was achieved in Latin America. However, although there were many philosophers of physics, logic, and mathematics, as well as philosophers of science in general, there were very few professional philosophers of biology. In this period, some philosophy of biology was done by the first generation of Latin American professional philosophers of science, as well as by some biologists or biomedical researchers who undertook the philosophy of their disciplines.

This was the case of the Mexican physician and physiologist Arturo Rosenblueth. Together with US mathematician Norbert Wiener and US electronics engineer Julian Bigelow, Rosenblueth made an important contribution to the discussion of teleology, advancing the cybernetic, or non-functional, analysis of teleology in terms of purpose control through negative feedback, with hopes of application to machines and living organisms (Rosenblueth, Wiener, & Bigelow 1943). Another example is Argentine paleontologist Osvaldo Reig with his discussion on the reality of biological species (Reig 1979).

In the third period, from the 1990s to the present day, although there still are professionally active biologists engaged in philosophical reflection on biology, there is an increasing professionalization of philosophy of biology and therefore of people engaged in it, regardless of whether their initial education was in philosophy or biology. It is worth mentioning the early work of perhaps the first professional philosophers of biology in Latin America: Mexicans Margarita Ponce and Jorge Martínez-Contreras. Ponce’s work centered on functional analysis and attributions and on teleology and teleological explanation in biology (Ponce 1987), while Martínez-Contreras focused on philosophical history of biology (Martínez-Contreras 1985a,b, 1989, 1992).

Despite some significant differences between countries, we can identify a similarity regarding the impact that political and economic conditions have had on philosophy of biology, that is, on scholars and their institutions, in the region. Latin America has and continues to suffer from political and institutional instability, with Mexico being perhaps stabler than the rest of the region. Most other Latin American countries have been characterized by repeated military coups d’état (Brazil in 1964, Argentina in 1955, 1966, and 1976, and Chile, Uruguay, and Bolivia in 1973, to mention only some of the most significant) and more or less authoritarian governments engaged in oppression and proscription, including physical disappearance. This context has necessarily truncated individual, group, or institutional projects and promising lines of research.

The most difficult political conditions pushed some philosophers into exile in countries and universities both outside and within Latin America. Although in a forced and unintended way, this situation increased academic dialogue in the region. In addition, scientific funding in Latin America comes from the public sector, and the region has experienced recurrent economic crises. Political agendas and public policies also heavily affect research funding and lead to variable support for undergraduate and graduate education, whether at home or abroad, and also impact research programs through diverse funding sources, such as councils or research agencies and universities.

In many Latin American countries, financial support was relatively scarce until recent democratic governments began increasing investment in research in the 1980s. Education and research in sciences, humanities, and technology became a state policy in the region, especially for the governments of Brazil and Argentina as of the turn of the millennium. This contributed decisively to broadening the critical mass of people trained in philosophy of science and biology who could acquire relatively stable university positions and become researchers with access to both classical and current bibliography. They also enjoyed the possibility of continuous academic exchange through attendance of academic events around the world, thus improving research productivity.

However, with extraordinary cutbacks in science and education since 2016 in countries like Brazil and Argentina, Latin American is currently undergoing a concerning setback. Given the change of government in 2019, however, Argentina is slowly recovering from these challenges. Furthermore, the social, political, economic, and financial crisis triggered worldwide by the COVID-19 pandemic, which revealed inequalities both between and within countries, has also had an effect, the consequences of which are still difficult to predict for the region. In any case, we can state that philosophy of biology in Latin America has been and still is often carried out in spite of political and economic conditions, rather than thanks to them.

Nevertheless, it is possible today to distinguish at least two generations of professional philosophers of biology in Latin America, with the usual relationships of professor and student or advisor and advisee. We can even begin to glimpse the emergence of a younger third generation. Most professionals who philosophically reflect on biology in Latin America have written and published in either Spanish or Portuguese. This may be one reason why the visibility and influence of Latin American philosophy of biology, like Latin American philosophy in general, has been relatively low outside the region. However, there are an increasing number of texts written and published in other languages, principally English and to a lesser extent German and French.

But the “internationalization” of Latin American academic production, essentially publishing in English, does not come without a price, as Wolters (2014) argues for the case of European philosophy of science. And while traditional geographical, ideological, or personal barriers are gradually being overcome, Latin American philosophers tend to adopt the agendas and methods established by international publications and cite authors they publish. Furthermore, even those who still write in Spanish tend to “dialogue” with internationally established authors, even if that dialogue only flows one way, more than with philosophers who publish in Spanish. English to Spanish translations of authoritative philosophers of science and biology, with the subsequent accessibility of those texts for Latin Americans, have also contributed to this trend.

However, the creation of national or regional societies constitutes a growing effort to build genuine community. Some examples include the Brazilian Association of Philosophy and History of Biology ABFHiB (Associação Brasileira de Filosofia e História da Biologia) and regional societies like the Association for Philosophy and History of Science of the Southern Cone AFHIC (Asociación de Filosofía e Historia de la Ciencia del Cono Sur) or the Ibero-American Association for Philosophy of Biology AIFIBI (Asociación Iberoamericana de Filosofía de la Biología). These are not simply groups of philosophers of biology living in the same region; they also work on related topics or have shared methodologies, influences, and interests and associate in particular advisor-student and colleague-colleague relationships. They also tend to publish in the same journals or publishing houses and establish rigorous, critical, and fruitful dialogues on topics that constitute a common framework. In this sense, we might also mention Ludus Vitalis: Revista de Filosofía de las Ciencias de la Vida (Ludus Vitalis: Philosophy of Life Sciences Journal), one of the first journals specialized in philosophy. It has been published biannually since 1999 by the Centro de Estudios Filosóficos, Políticos y Sociales Vicente Lombardo Toledano (CEFPSVLT, Center for Philosophical, Political, and Social Studies Vicente Lombardo Toledano), a public Mexican institution that has played an important role in the professionalization, institutionalization, and consolidation of philosophy of biology, particularly of evolution, in Latin America.

There is also growing insertion of Latin American philosophers of biology, and of the community as a whole, into central international circles of philosophy of science in general and philosophy of biology in particular. This insertion is due in part to the fact that some members of the first generation of professional philosophers of biology carried out doctoral studies in the United States, the United Kingdom, France, Spain, or Germany, while the second generation carry out mainly postdoctoral studies in these countries. Another contributing factor is the organization of international conferences of philosophy of biology in Latin America, such as the Meeting of the International Society for the History, Philosophy and Social Studies of Biology, ISHPSSB, hosted in Mexico in 1999 and Brazil in 2017. As occurred in other geographical regions, philosophers of biology in Latin America initially concentrated more on the problem of evolution and related issues, such as the species problem. Although these themes are still prevalent, other areas like genetics, ecology, and developmental biology or evolutionary developmental biology are now being worked on, as well as on a social agenda that includes science education. The scope of this entry allows only for an overview of the main topics in philosophy of biology and, within these, the most significant contributions made in Latin America in recent decades.

Section 3 explores analysis of the concept of race, Section 4 the analysis of biological theories, and Section 5 the different ways of connecting philosophy of biology with history of biology. While these topics constitute common themes that have been explored and can be considered representative of the work that has been done throughout Latin America, they do not do justice to the rich variety of work produced by a large and ever-increasing number of researchers who make significant contributions to the development of philosophy of biology in the region.

3. The Problem of Race

Due to the persistent occurrence of the term “race” in different fields, as well as the consequent social presence of racialized expressions and thought, the discussion around human races remains current in philosophy of biology in Latin American. The so-called “problem of race” persists due to the continued existence of racial discrimination, such that there is an intertwining between the social problem of domination by the elites, most of whom are white or “whitened”, and the behavior of racial contempt by these elites that becomes hegemonic, regardless of whether these elites discursively deny such behavior.

Philosophical reflection is aware of the moral, political, and legal implications of the concept(s) of race and their analysis, as well as of other issues such as ethnicity (Gracia 2000, 2005, 2008; Jaksić 2015). This discussion is carried out through philosophical reflection on biology and from the point of view of history, biological and social anthropology, ethnography, sociology, political science, and law (Wade et al. 2014a, 2015).

Contemporary philosophical reflections on race are mainly carried out in two closely related fields: first, the analysis of the concept(s) of race, with emphasis on their ontological aspects; and second, the analysis of the theoretical and empirical aspects of certain biological practices, especially genomics and genetic ancestry, as well as genomic medicine and, to a lesser extent forensic genetics, which would appear to the non-expert to reintroduce race-like categories.

3.1 Ontological Issues

In the previous section, we discussed the concept of race, sometimes considered to be biological or scientific, in the history of thought in Latin America. This concept remained influential during the early decades of the twentieth century in the form of a scientific racism. However, similarly to what occurred in the discussion of the concept of race more generally (James & Burgos 2020 [2022]), a consensus has also been reached among biologists and philosophers in Latin America that rejects the traditional biological concept of race and racial naturalism, leading to acceptance of racial skepticism. This has been argued at length by biologists, such as Brazilian Sérgio D. J. Pena (2002, 2005, 2008; Pena & Birchal 2005–2006) and philosophers like Mexican Carlos López Beltrán (2000–2001) and Argentine Gustavo Caponi (2020), who resides in Brazil.

Nonetheless, denying the biological or natural existence of races does not imply denying the existence of a social use of racialized categories and thinking. Indeed, academics accept a kind of racial constructivism, either by affirming that races remain real social objects that were created and exist by means of human culture and human decisions, or accepting race as an idea that people use to categorize themselves and others through classic racial traits, which are typically essentialist in character and refer back to familiar racial categories (Wade et al. 2014b).

The socially attested existence of this idea, which we can call the folk concept of race, and its social use are, of course, compatible with thin constructivism, that is, the idea that superficial properties are prototypically linked with race. However, given the real social consequences of the resulting racialization and the enduring presence of racialized categories in government institutions and public policies, this idea is also compatible with so-called interactive constructivism, or individuals who are labeled according to their ascription to a certain racial category and have certain common experiences, and institutional constructivism, which describes race as specific to the society in which it is embedded and inapplicable to all cultures or historical epochs.

Caponi (2020) analyzes possible explications of the folk concept of race made from the population perspective, such as races as species, subspecies (geographic race) or lineages of populations, and as populations (ecological race or ecotype) or sub-lineages of subspecies, and discards them as inadequate. He points out that the fundamental difficulty of these attempts lies in the differences between the typological perspective, which is proper to the notion of human race, and the population perspective.

Many authors stress the centrality of an individual’s physical appearance in racial classification in Latin America, both regarding self-identification and hetero-classification (Wade 2017; Kent & Wade 2015; Nieves Delgado, García Deister, & López Beltrán 2017). Caponi aims to refine this idea by explicating the concept expressed by racial typologies, that is, the folk concept of race, and the term “race” itself, through the notion of physiognomic type. Caponi argues that this concept should not be explicated by phenotypes considered in their totality but rather by superficial morphological aspects and details identifiable to the naked eye, though they may also be detectable by a device or measurement system. Physiognomic differences exist (e.g., skin color, which is perhaps socially considered more important in the use of racialized categories and racialized thinking), and individuals are thereby differentiated from each other, but this does not mean that there are natural or biological races. This demarcation is associated with differences of other kinds, such as class or socioeconomic position, “cultural” or educational level, socially acceptable or punishable behaviors, etc. It also entails the social prejudices, suspicions, and discriminations that are greater when these physiognomic differences are close to those that were supposed to be characteristic of traditional biological or natural racial categories. Thus, even though human races are mere taxonomic fictions and, phylogenetically speaking, human races are a myth, the folk concept of race and racialized categories and thinking are not a social myth; they exist and have very real effects. The question then arises, entering the normative realm: how socially useful is this method of classifying humans?

The answer Caponi (2020) gives contrasts with that given by authors like López Beltrán (2000–2001) or Pena (Pena & Birchal 2005–2006). The latter argue for a normative racial eliminativism, recommending the complete abolishment of any concept of race or racialized typologies and thinking given that they reinforce biological misconceptions and categories on which racism is based. Although Caponi partially share’s Pena’s social context of Brazil, similar to López Beltrán’s context of Mexico, he adopts a stance of normative racial conservationism. Even though he rejects all forms of racism, as do Pena and López Beltrán, Caponi maintains that in certain contexts, racial categories understood as mere physiognomic types are functional and may have some epistemic value. One context, though limited, is that of forensic anthropology. Another possible context, also limited and requiring caution, is that of medicine. However, physiognomic types do not have the greatest cognitive relevance regarding biological processes but rather social ones. The fact that an individual corresponds to one physiognomic type or another may influence the way they insert themself and function within certain contexts and social spaces. In Brazil, for example, given the existence of structural inequalities usually correlated with physiognomic type, some public policies have been proposed and implemented to correct these injustices. As a result, affirmative action or the quota system in Brazilian public universities have been the subject of public debate, with the participation of various geneticists, sociologists, anthropologists, educators, and jurists, among others (see Kent & Wade 2015; Wade 2017).

For instance, the geneticist Pena gave evidence on the genetic nonexistence of race in the 2010 Supreme Court hearings on the constitutionality of such quotas. This evidence was drawn from his own research, in which he emphasizes the high levels of genetic diversity in Brazil (Pena, Carvalho-Silva, et al; 2000, Parra et al. 2003; Ventura Santos et al. 2009). In relation to affirmative action policies in general, Pena argues that although they are well-intentioned in promoting necessary social changes, governments should be careful not to provoke artificial and arbitrary tensions and divisions among the people of Brazil (Pena & Birchal 2005–2006). In particular, regarding the system of racial quotas in Brazilian public universities, he argues that modern genetics can provide inputs for policy decisions but cannot claim an explicit prescriptive role (Pena 2005; Pena & Bortolini 2004; Pena & Birchal 2005–2006; Birchal & Pena 2011). However, moving from the field of biological science to the social field, Pena himself opposes such a system (which, by the way, was declared constitutional by the Brazilian Supreme Court in 2012).

In contrast, Caponi (2020) considers that, given the fact that races do not exist but individuals with some differentiated physiognomic traits do exist and are thereby discriminated against, affirmative action or “positive discrimination” programs will tend to diminish discrimination against these individuals with these traits by promoting them to positions of prestige and power, eroding the very condition of possibility for such discrimination.

3.2 Mestizo Genomics

Despite the majority consensus among scientists and philosophers on racial skepticism, certain theoretical, empirical, technical, and technological developments in genetics in recent decades may appear to the layperson to reintroduce racial or race-like categories. Moreover, independent of the position and personal intentions of scientists with regards to the subject of race, genetics has transformed common sense notions of race, despite also partially reinforcing some of them.

Here, we must consider developments that involve theoretical, empirical, and technical aspects of genomics and genetic ancestry studies on the one hand, and two of their respective technological applications, namely genomic medicine and forensic genetics, on the other. Because of their presence in Latin America, all these areas have been the subject of philosophical reflection.

In relation to genomics research, Wade, López Beltrán, Restrepo and Ventura-Santos (2014b) have noted that, given the iconic status of the fact that all humans share 99.9% of their genomes, the development of new technologies has made it possible to explore the remaining 0.1% that, in principle, causes much of the obvious physical diversity of humans. As in other regions of the world, some laboratories in Latin America, particularly in Mexico, Brazil, and Colombia, have been mapping the genomes of local populations with the goal of tracing population histories and locating the genetic basis of disease, in addition to establishing their genomes. This has given rise to the respective Mexican and Brazilian genome mapping projects and the Mexican mestizo and Homo brasilis genome projects.

As has been pointed out by Kent, García-Deister, López Beltrán, Ventura-Santos, Schwartz-Marín and Wade (2015) in their comparison of both cases from the point of view of social studies of science, these projects have been developed in different national contexts with distinct scientific and social trajectories. While in Mexico, mapping the genomic mestizo is driven mainly in relation to health, in Brazil, the main issue is that of race, as we saw in the previous section.

The very notion of mestizo, including Mexican mestizo in particular, was the subject of criticism in genomic studies not only from philosophy but also from cultural anthropology, sociology, biological anthropology, history of science, and the social studies of science (Wade et al. 2015). With regards to philosophy, several authors agree with this criticism connected to both the ontological problem of race and the story of the birth of a nation and the genetic reification of the Mexican national identity (López Beltrán, García-Deister, & Ríos Sandoval 2014; Wade 2014; Wade et al. 2014b, 2015). In this regard, some authors point out that a variety of mestizaje (interbreeding) has taken place, as opposed to a single process (Wade et al. 2014b), while others focus on methodological problems (Winther 2011; Pascacio Montijo 2011, Arroyo Santos 2011; Schwartz Marín 2011; López Beltrán & Vergara Silva 2011; López Beltrán & García Deister 2013).

In relation to these methodological issues, Danish philosopher of biology Rasmus Grønfeldt Winther, who grew up in Venezuela and completed postdoctoral studies in Mexico, analyzes the two mathematical methods used in the genetic classifications of human groups: diversity partitioning and clustering analysis. He argues that although both are legitimate and consistent methodologies, neither implies anything specific with regards to the reality of these groups. In fact, the results of these two methods point in opposite ontological directions. While models partitioning diversity indicate that the abstraction of race is not grounded in genetic data, those that assign particular individuals to robust clustering could be taken as evidence of a strong sense of the reality of these human groups. However, both the results and inputs of these methodologies are subject to interpretation and bias, in addition to being theory-laden. Thus, both diversity partitioning and cluster analysis genetically reify the concept of race due to their sensitivity to highly questionable assumptions of various kinds (Winther 2011).

Going deeper into the criticism of the methodology of clustering analysis, Mexican biologist and philosopher of biology Yuriditzi Pascacio Montijo points out that the classification and population partitioning on which Mexico’s National Institute of Genomic Medicine (Instituto Nacional de Medicina Genómica or INMEGEN in the original Spanish) bases its analysis and characterization of the genetic structure of a population corresponds to various pre-established categorizations. The problem lies in the fact that these classifying categories, e.g., Zapotec, are not natural classes but rather are established based on interests and objectives that could be relevant in a particular context, for example Mexico’s National Commission for the Development of Indigenous Peoples (Comisión Nacional para el Desarrollo de los Pueblos Indígenas or CDI in the original Spanish) or Mexico’s National Indigenous Languages Institute (Instituto Nacional de Lenguas Indígenas or INALI in the original Spanish) but not necessarily in others, like that of INMEGEN, whose genotyping is neither useful nor representative of the complexity and dynamics of populations in Mexico (Pascacio-Montijo 2011).

In a similar vein, Mexican Alfonso Arroyo Santos, first trained as a biomedical researcher and later as a philosopher, argues against INMEGEN’s genomic diversity project. He maintains that it is impossible to appeal to objective variables that allow for both the creation of a particular class for Mexican mestizos and the identification of genes that cause common multifactorial and polygenic diseases in Mexico, such as type 2 diabetes, obesity, or certain types of cancer. For him, the central problem lies in the fact that multivariate diseases can only be studied by means of surrogate variables, and it is a mistake to reify a surrogate variable in the context of causal claims that, at best, only have some probability of occurrence. In the case of the study of genetic diseases, the surrogate variable is known as the risk gene or haplotype. To discover genetic risk factors, a genome-wide association study (GWAS) or whole genome association study (WGAS) is usually carried out. However, these studies have known limitations. It is clear that correlating a chromosomal region with the occurrence of a disease is not the same as stating that a genetic element, or causal gene, has been identified. Thus, INMEGEN’s analyses only account for surrogate variables, and any historical attribution of racial origin and population morbidity due to ethnicity is incorrect. In order to support their genetic findings, then, researchers must appeal to history, anthropology, geography, and other disciplines in which the notion of mestizo has been constructed. According to Arroyo-Santos (2011), a tautological dialectic is thus created between the molecularized humanities and genetics since one field becomes the theoretical basis of the other or, in other words, one takes epistemic credit from the other, reifying theories that never received empirical support.

3.3 Genomic Medicine and Forensic Genetics

The flagbearer of the promises of genomic medicine in Mexico is the INMEGEN (Schwartz Marín 2011; López Beltrán & Vergara Silva 2011). In addition to the aforementioned problematic situations that genomic medicine must still overcome in order to fulfill its promises, Arroyo-Santos (2011), García-Deister and López-Beltrán (2015), and López Beltrán (2018) have emphasized that the relevant correlation in terms of prevention and improvement of the health of Mexicans is not between obesity or diabetes and certain genetic variants but rather between obesity or diabetes and the country’s socioeconomic deterioration and the associated growing malnutrition.

Finally, we will refer to the analysis that has been made of forensic genetics. In addition to the distinct degrees of development, the different roles it plays in different countries have been pointed out by García-Deister and López-Beltrán (2015, 2017). Thus, whereas in Argentina forensic genetics was organized around social movements like Las Abuelas de la Plaza de Mayo, it has played a key role in the process of returning the remains of disappeared persons to their families and in the search for children appropriated during the last military dictatorship (Penchaszadeh 2011, Argentine Forensic Anthropology Team [Other Internet Resources]). In Colombia, although forensic technicians are aware of disputes among population geneticists, they use and endorse the relations established between genetics, race, and geography because they fit with common-sense notions of visible bodily difference and the regionalization of race in the Colombian nation (Schwartz-Marín, Wade, Cruz-Santiago, & Cárdenas 2015).

4. Theories

The five different kinds of philosophical inquiry that fall under the general heading of philosophy of biology distinguished in Section 1 are often interrelated. This can be clearly seen when a philosophical analysis is made of a biological theory. In this section, we will focus on the first three types mentioned above: the reassessment of some problems, theses, and solutions developed in general philosophy of science or in other special philosophy of science in the context of biology; the analysis of logical, semantic, pragmatic, epistemological, methodological, ontological, praxiological, axiological, ethical, and aesthetical aspects of biology; and the philosophical analysis of specific conceptual problems in biology.

The first of these, a topic within general philosophy of science, is the problem of the nature, structure, and function of scientific theories. In various specific philosophies, such as that of biology, the question arises as to whether theories exist as such and whether they are of the same type as those found in other scientific disciplines. Of course, the answer to be given depends centrally on the explication of the metascientific concept of theory, to which we will return later, and on the successful application of that concept in the realm of biology. Furthermore, the explication of the concept of theory is linked and contributes to the explication of other metascientific concepts, such as scientific concept, statement, law, principle, or explanation, and of other philosophical issues of science, such as hypothesis and theory testing and evaluation, conceptual change, theory-change, scientific progress, and scientific rationality.

In relation to the second kind of philosophical research, the analysis of theories entails the analysis of some logical, semantic, pragmatic, epistemological, methodological, ontological, praxiological, and, eventually, axiological aspects of biology, and makes possible the subsequent analysis of some ethical and aesthetic aspects of biology. And regarding the third kind of philosophical inquiry, the analysis of theories includes and contributes to the explication of all the concepts occurring in them (see Section 4.3).

Throughout the twentieth and early twenty-first centuries, three main general explications of the metascientific concept of theory, or conceptions of scientific theories, can be identified: the classical or received view, the historical or historicist view, and the semantic or model-theoretic view. It is worth noting that despite the use of the singular definite article to refer to the three previous metatheoretical conceptions, we ought to clarify that each groups together a number of versions, variants, or approaches that share certain basic ideas but differ from each other in the particular way they understand or elaborate these ideas. We will now refer to some of the most significant discussions and contributions made in Latin America in this field, appealing to the three major metatheoretical conceptions mentioned above.

4.1 Discussions and Contributions from and on the Classical View

One theory that has been the subject of philosophical analysis in Latin America, as in other regions of the world, is the theory of evolution. Two of the foundational and most influential figures of the philosophy of science in Argentina and Latin America, Mario Bunge and Gregorio Klimovsky, discussed the nature of evolutionary theory in terms of the classical view (Carnap 1956), understanding theories as hypothetico-deductive systems consisting of a set of starting hypotheses, fundamental hypotheses, or principles, along with all their logical consequences, including derived hypotheses and observational consequences (Klimovsky 1994), or as sets of propositions closed under deduction (Mahner & Bunge 1997).

Klimovsky presents an analysis of the theory of evolution (following Julian Huxley 1942) standard to Darwin’s argument, which distinguishes two parts. One of these corresponds to the short argument or core of the argument, of which natural selection is the conclusion. In the other part, the explanatory power of natural selection and its evidential support are tested. In basic agreement with several authors (Wallace 1891; Huxley 1942; Flew 1959; Ghiselin 1969; Lewontin 1978; Ruse 1979; Ospovat 1981 and Mayr 1982, 1991, 2001; among others), Klimovsky reconstructs the short argument as a hypothetico-deductive argument with the principle of natural selection as its conclusion. He (1971, 1994) distinguishes three levels of statements of a scientific theory. Level 1: basic or singular empirical statements, containing only observational terms; level 2: general empirical statements or empirical generalizations; and level 3: general theoretical statements with theoretical terms. According to Klimovsky (1994), the theory of evolution is characterized by not including level 3 statements, in accordance with what Putnam (1962) pointed out with regards to Darwin’s original formulation.

Anna Carolina K.P. Regner, who transitioned from initially working as a general philosopher of science to becoming a professional philosopher of biology and played a significant role in the introduction and consolidation of philosophy of biology in Brazil, criticizes hypothetico-deductive reconstructions of Darwin’s short argument. She claims that by virtue of the meaning of the concepts that appear in the premises and conclusion, this argument fails to satisfy at least two basic requirements for a deductive argument: independence of the premises from each other and independence of the premises from the conclusion (Regner 2010). Regarding the constructive part of her analysis, Regner maintains that the Origin of Species as a whole presents one long argument as a narrative without a linear structure, as a network made up of successive steps that take the form of chapters or partial arguments, each of which summarizes the preceding step and introduces the subsequent ones, such that the parts sustain the whole. On the other hand, it is from the complete argument that each part derives its support and meaning. She emphasizes that Darwin makes use of different resources throughout his work, including metaphors and dialectical and rhetorical arguments, in addition to more traditional logical arguments and procedures (Regner 2010; see also Section 5.4).

In his book, written in conjunction with German biologist and philosopher of science Martin Mahner (Mahner & Bunge 1997), Bunge argues that there is no unified hyper-general theory of evolution. Rather, evolutionary theory is not a proper theory but, as Lewis (1980) states, a system of theories with different degrees of generality, with the theory of natural selection being the most conspicuous example of a hypergeneral theory in evolutionary biology (Mahner & Bunge 1997: Section 9.3.3). Mahner and Bunge argue that there is no reason to abandon the view of scientific theories as hypothetico-deductive systems and instead adopt the semantic view of theories given that there is nothing in mathematical structures and state spaces that cannot be expressed by propositions. However, these authors propose considering the theory of natural selection in terms of models: either as the family of all their theoretical models or as their union (Mahner & Bunge 1997: Section 9.3.3), which actually constitutes the core of the semantic view, as we will see in Section 4.3.

Before moving on, we must mention the analysis of medical theories made from the classical view of theories by Argentine physician, philosopher and historian of science César Lorenzano. As early as 1977, during his Mexican exile, he published an analysis of Hans Selye’s stress theory, or General Adaptation Syndrome (Selye 1952), following Klimovsky’s teachings of the classical view. Lorenzano’s intention was to show that, first, medicine has theories in several of its subdisciplines, such as anatomic pathology, pharmacology, and therapeutics, but at its very core, physiopathology, the theories possess theoretical terms, that statements from level 3. This contrasts with to Klimovsky’s analysis of the theory of natural selection. Second, Lorenzano argued that medicine should be studied independently of biology, though the two fields are related. Finally, he stated that medicine should not be considered a craft or an applied science, that is, a biological technique, but rather a science in its own right, reducible neither to biology nor to a small part of all theoretical and practical medical knowledge, namely, the medical clinic (C. Lorenzano 1977). This argument runs counter to Kuhn (1962 [1970]) and Bunge (1967).

4.2 Discussions and Contributions from the Historicist View

One kind of general criticism to the classical view came mainly from scholars interested in history of science, once referred to as new philosophers, such as Thomas S. Kuhn (1962 [1970]) and Imre Lakatos (1970). The majority of diachronic studies and analyses typical of these authors is supposed to be closer to scientific practice as history presents it to us. Besides, underlying them is a new conception of the nature and synchronic structure of scientific theories. The point is often merely implied and is not always systematically developed, and in Section 5 we will refer to the more general problem of the relations between synchronic and diachronic studies and between philosophy and history of science/biology. These historicist philosophers of science conceive this new notion of theory in different ways, referring to them by different terms, e.g., paradigm or disciplinary matrix in Kuhn (1962 [1970\) and scientific research program in Lakatos (1970).

As Kuhn (1970) recognizes, he had been using the term “paradigm” in 1962 in two different though related senses: (1) as the global set of commitments shared by the members of a given scientific community, which he later called the disciplinary matrix and which contains exemplars as one of its components; and (2) as concrete solutions to problems, which he then called exemplars.

As for the application of Kuhnian views to the field of biology, we have not identified a systematic use or application of the notion of paradigm as disciplinary matrix in the analysis of particular cases pertaining to the field of biology. A notable exception in the field of biochemistry is the analysis made by César Lorenzano (1994), after coming into contact with the philosopher C. Ulises Moulines, a disciple of the German philosopher Wolfgang Stegmüller and one the main figures of the structuralist view of theories (Sneed 1971 [1979]; Stegmüller 1973; Balzer, Moulines, & Sneed 1987), who lived in Mexico from 1976 to 1984. Lorenzano developed his own “structuralized”, though informal, version of Kuhn’s conceptions: a Kuhnian perspective passed through the sieve of a version of the semantic view to which we will refer later.

The sense of paradigm that philosophers of biology have found most fruitful in carrying out their analyses is that of the exemplar, either arguing that the theories of the biological and/or biomedical sciences possess a particular structure distinct from that of physical theories (Schaffner 1980, 1986; Darden 1991) or considering that this is not the case, if they are analyzed within the framework of some version of the semantic view of theories (Schaffner 1993). Argentine philosopher and historian of science Pablo Lorenzano, who first studied in Mexico with his father, César, and with C. Ulises Moulines, then with the latter and Wolfgang Balzer in Germany, argues along the same lines as Schaffner (1993). However, he also maintains that the theories of the biological and/or biomedical sciences can be analyzed without developing a new variant of the semantic view of theories. Instead this can be plausibly carried out using the structuralist version of the semantic view of theories (P. Lorenzano 2007a, 2012).

Although it has not been central to the field, the Lakatosian perspective has not been entirely absent from analysis in biology. However, there are only a few analyses that systematically use Lakatos’s concept of a scientific research program, that is, that clearly identify the components of such a program, including its irrefutable hard core, its protective belt, and its (negative and positive) heuristics. Nevertheless, we find some examples in Latin America where these components are clearly identified. For instance, analyses carried out by Argentine philosopher Juan Manuel Torres (1996) on the competing research programs on the origin of life, the Oparin-Fox “phenotype program”, and the Muller-Haldane “genotype program”; those made by the Argentine philosopher and historian Héctor A. Palma and biologist, science teacher, and communicator Eduardo Wolovelsky (Palma & Wolovelsky 1997) on Darwin’s theory of natural selection; those conducted by Brazilian biologists and philosophers Nei F. Nunes-Neto, Ricardo Santos do Carmo, and Charbel N. El-Hani (2009) on Lovelock’s Gaia hypothesis; and those performed by Argentine helminthologist and philosopher Guillermo Denegri (2008; Cabaret & Denegri 2008) in parasitology. The latter, together with Argentine philosopher Gisela Lamas and Argentine biologist Vicente Dressino, also use Lakatos’ approach, modifying it by substituting the notion of hard core for that of conservative nucleus, the difference being that the latter allows slight changes with regards to the initial proposal in the course of its development, focusing on the study of the facial component in mammals (Dressino, Denegri, & Lamas 1998). In turn, Pablo Lorenzano (2013d) also uses the Lakatosian notions of hard core, protective belt, and positive and negative heuristics to analyze the first research program in genetics, Bateson’s Mendelism. However, he more precisely applies Lakatosian analysis through use of the structuralist concepts of fundamental law/guiding principle, specializations, and the way of obtaining and testing specializations (see Section 4.3 below), which explicate the notions of hard core, protective belt, and positive and negative heuristics, respectively.

4.3 Discussions and Contributions from the Semantic View

The distinctive feature of the semantic view is the centrality of models in the philosophical analysis of the concept of theory (Lloyd 2006; Moulines 2008; P. Lorenzano 2013a). This does not rule out that models, in some of their many senses, play a role in other aspects of science. It also does not deny that scientific theories, in some plausible sense of the concept, can be identified in different areas of science, including biology, and are relevant in many contexts, even if they do not constitute the totality of science or exhaust all philosophically relevant things that can be said about science.

According to the semantic view, concepts relative to models are much more fruitful for the philosophical analysis of theories than concepts relative to statements. The nature, structure, and function of theories can be better understood when their metatheoretical characterization, analysis, or reconstruction is centered on the models they determine, rather than on a particular set of axioms, understood either as linguistic formulations or as propositions, or on other resources and devices through which they fulfill this function, such as diagrams or graphs. For this conception, the most fundamental component for the identity of a theory is a class (set, population, collection, family) of models, which is not the same as stating that a scientific theory should be identified with a class of models. Some misrepresentations or sloppy presentations of the semantic view do make this assertion. It is also not the same to say that the class of models is the only one component of the theory.

It is within the framework of the semantic conception that the largest number and most significant contributions made from Latin America to the analysis of biological theories are to be found. One of the versions of the semantic view used is that of Patrick Suppes (1957), especially how he identifies the class of models by the definition a set-theoretical predicate, shared by other variants of the semantic view, such as the partial structures approach (Da Costa & French 1990) and the standard presentation of the structuralist view of theories (Balzer, Moulines, & Sneed 1987). We find this in some works by Brazilian biologist Nelson Papavero, who also worked in philosophy and history of biology with the group led by Brazilian logician and philosopher Newton da Costa, one of the founders of the partial structures approach. Papavero, together with Brazilian mathematician Jair Minoro Abe, combined some of the fundamentals of set theory with mathematical logic to create a classification system that is isomorphic with phylogenetic systematics (Papavero & Abe 1992). We also find a Suppesian analysis in the work of Brazilian biologist and philosopher João Carlos Marques Magalhães, together with his advisor Décio Krause, a mathematician by training who later became a philosopher of physics advised by Newton da Costa. Magalhães and Krause make use of axiomatization à la Suppes in an attempt to identify the class of models of the theory of evolution by natural selection and of population genetics, extending the axiomatic treatment of the evolutionary theory presented by Mary Williams (1970) to encompass aspects of genetics (Magalhães & Krause 2001) and to deal with the concept of Darwinian fitness so as to explore the relationships between Darwinian theory and population genetics (Magalhães & Krause 2006).

However, it is the structuralist view of theories, or Sneedian or metatheoretical structuralism, that has produced the largest number of analyses of particular theories from the biological sciences in Latin America, as well as from the biochemical and biomedical sciences. However, this fact has gone largely unnoticed by the international audience, perhaps because most of the relevant works have been published in Spanish or German, rather than in English.

These analyses have been carried out in Mexico, after C. Ulises Moulines’s time there, mainly by biologist turned philosopher Mario Casanueva, who obtained a doctorate in Barcelona under Moulines’s direction, and by biologist and philosopher Diego Méndez, first a student and then a colleague of Casanueva. Other relevant analyses have been done in Argentina, largely due to the formative work of César and Pablo Lorenzano and the collaborative work they promote among philosophers Santiago Ginnobili, Mercedes O’Lery, and Federico Bernabé, biologists and philosophers Lucía Federico, Daniel Blanco, and Martín Díaz, and biochemist and philosopher Karina Alleva, as well as to Ginnobili’s later formative work with a younger generation of philosophers such as Ariel Roffé and Andrea Olmos, and the teamwork among all these scholars.

Among the theories analyzed, in the field of evolutionary biology we can find the theory of evolution by natural selection (Ginnobili 2010, 2016, 2018; Díez & Lorenzano 2013; Ginnobili & Blanco 2019), the theory of common descent (D. Blanco 2012), the theory of functions (Ginnobili 2011), and the niche construction theory (Casanueva & Madrigal 2021; Méndez 2021); in the field of systematics, cladistics (Roffé 2020); in the field of inheritance and genetics, theories of classical, molecular, and population genetics (Balzer & Lorenzano 2000; Casanueva 1997, 2002, 2003; Casanueva & Méndez 2005, 2012; P. Lorenzano 1995, 2000, 2002, 2013b,c, 2014; and O’Lery 2016); in the field of ecology, population dynamics theory (P. Lorenzano & Díaz 2020); in the field of cytology and histology, cellular and tissue theories (Asúa & Klimovsky 1987, 1990); in the field of neurosciences and of neuroendocrinology, organizational-activational theory (Bernabé 2019); in the field of biochemistry, enzyme and metabolic theories (Donolo, Federico, & Lorenzano 2006, 2007, 2016; Federico 2009; C. Lorenzano 2002, 2007), allosteric theory (Alleva, Díez, & Federico 2017), and free-radical theory of aging and the model of oxidation-reduction reactions (O’Lery 2012a, b); and in the field of biomedical sciences, physiology (C. Lorenzano 2010), clinical medical theory (C. Lorenzano 2011), the humoral theory of immunity (C. Lorenzano 2012), and the theory of the circular motion of the blood (Barutta & Lorenzano 2012).

In all these theories, and in accordance with the methodology of metatheoretical structuralism, all the main concepts that occur in them are identified, distinguishing those that refer to empirical objects from those that refer to mathematical objects. Concentrating on concepts of the first kind, the descriptive ones, their formal structure is pointed out, making explicit whether they are qualitative, comparative, or quantitative concepts, as is their logical type, stating whether they represent sets, relations, or functions, whether numerical or not. Finally, the relations they have with each other are specified, in the case that some of them should be considered to be basic or primitive and others could be considered to be defined.

In addition, descriptive concepts are distinguished by the function they fulfill within each theory. On the one hand, we have the concepts that constitute the empirical, applicative, or testing part of the theory and are used to identify and represent empirical systems. The theory’s users intend to account for “portions of the world” conceived by means of this kind of descriptive concepts. This specific domain of application of the theory depends strongly on pragmatic and historical factors. On the other hand, we have the concepts that constitute the “theoretical” part of the theory and are used to identify and represent the theoretical models, and how they relate to each other and to the concepts of the previous kind to say something about the world, i.e., to identify and represent the “laws” of the theory.

All the theories analyzed have been shown to have a strongly hierarchical structure, forming a kind of net or theory-net with laws of very different degrees of generality, significance, and scope within the same conceptual setting. These theories or theory-nets usually have a single fundamental law or guiding principle at the top of the hierarchy and a vast array of more special laws which apply to specific situations and not obtained by deduction but by specialization or specification.

Two remarks are pertinent here. The first is that since models are the semantic or model-theoretic counterpart of laws, the above is equivalent to distinguishing different levels of generality between models of a single theory. The other is to realize the implications of acceptance of at least a minimal characterization of laws as counterfactual-supporting regularities within the structuralist view, regardless of whether they are context-sensitive or domain-restricted. There are also implications identifying “fundamental” laws for the general philosophical problem of laws and the specific problem regarding about the existence of laws in biology. Here, we use “fundamental” in the sense of the scope and role played within the theories, and not in the sense of belonging to a supposed “fundamental theory or science”, even if some of them are implicit. Furthermore, all these analyses of particular theories make it possible to deal with some of the philosophical issues arising in the various biological subdisciplines to which they belong, some of which have been explicitly addressed in the analyses of the particular theories referred to above or in relevant works that develop the implications of such analyses for these issues.

Some examples are the following. In relation to evolution, these issues include the structure of the theory, the nature and role of certain concepts such as adaptation, fitness, and functional attributions; the scope of the theory, its refutability, and the nature of the principle of natural selection; and the unity of selection and its relation to population genetics. Regarding classical and population genetics and population dynamics, issues include the status of Mendel’s laws, the Hardy-Weinberg law, and the Lotka-Volterra model, within their respective theories. Relative to cladistics, we can identify the issue of their empirical character, and, in relation to neuroendocrinology, the discussion of androcentrism, particularly in its form of neurosexism, pointing out where values play a role.

5. Philosophy and History of Biology

The discussion of the relationships between philosophy of science and history of science has a long tradition, as well as distinct metascientific practices that link philosophy of science and history of science in various ways. The interrelations between these two metascientific disciplines are ever-changing and are not free of tensions. Some of the main authors of the nineteenth and early twentieth centuries, such as William Whewell, Ernst Mach, and Pierre Duhem maintained that there was a close relationship between the two, in the sense that they understood their philosophical positions were based on reflections made in the history of science, and in order to carry out historical analyses of science one had to possess some philosophical concept of science.

However, despite the work of the aforementioned authors, as well as that of Émile Meyerson and his “Circle”, which included Alexandre Koyré, Léon Brunschvicg, and Hélène Metzger, and of Édouard Le Roy, Ernst Cassirer, Edgar Zilsel, Ludwik Fleck, Abel Rey, Gaston Bachelard, and Georges Canguilhem, among others towards the mid-twentieth century, the conception that philosophy and the history of science are different disciplines with little or no mutual influence became crystallized in the received view in the philosophy of science.

At the same time, however, some philosophers of science, including Norwood Russell Hanson, Mary Hesse, and Stephen Toulmin, acknowledged the relevance of history of science for philosophical reflection on science, giving rise to what would become known as the historical turn, which was continued in the 1960s, 1970s, and even 1980s by Thomas Kuhn, Paul Feyerabend, Imre Lakatos, and Larry Laudan. The work of these historicist philosophers of science, as well as the attempts of other more formalist authors, such as Joseph Sneed, Wolfgang Stegmüller, and C. Ulises Moulines, along with the popularization of the paraphrasing of Kant’s dictum, contributed to rethinking the relationship between the philosophy of science and the history of science. This dictum was first formulated in two sentences by Hanson (1962) and then put together in a single sentence by Lakatos (1970):

Philosophy of science without history of science is empty; history of science without philosophy of science is blind.

The discussion of such relationships continued with a questioning of the link developed between the two metascientific subdisciplines, whether it was not more a marriage of convenience than an intimate relationship (Giere 1973), the adoption of the naturalistic turn, and the proposal of the so-called confrontation model (Laudan et al. 1986; Donovan, Laudan, & Laudan 1988) and, more recently, the development of the new historical epistemology (Lorraine Daston, Hans-Jörg Rheinberger, Jürgen Renn; see Feest & Sturm 2011; Braunstein 2012) and the so-called integrated history and philosophy of science (Jean Gayon, Hasok Chang, Jutta Schickore, Theodore Arabatzis, Friedrich Steinle; see Arabatzis & Howard 2015).

Linked to these different authors and positions, as well as to those in the philosophy of history, such as the dispute of historicism in Germany since the second half of the nineteenth century and approaches grounded in conceptual and intellectual history, in Latin America we find historically-minded philosophers of science and philosophically-minded historians of science. Therefore, the region is characterized by diverse and plural ways of doing research that relates philosophy of biology to history of biology. These approaches range, on a continuum, from those that erroneously do not seem to be linked or relevant to the history of science to those that, also erroneously, seem unrelated to philosophy in general and of science in particular. This continuum begins at one extreme with synchronic philosophical analyses of episodes in the history of biology, moves through diachronic philosophical analyses and historico-epistemological analyses, and ends at the other extreme with conceptual analyses of episodes in the history of biology.

On the one hand, synchrony and diachrony represent two sides of the same coin. Every synchronic analysis presupposes a rupture within temporal becoming, and every diachronic analysis presupposes synchronic analysis of successive events in time. Analogous to de Saussure’s introduction of the synchronic/diachronic distinction, if a historian creates a picture of an event, one does not have the impression of leaving history, and if a philosopher of science carries out a synchronic analysis, they likewise do not leave history. Thus, even synchronic philosophical analyses are based on history, namely, on what the philosopher might consider the best history available, even though they might be incorrect and later revise their decision. Given the inextricable link between synchrony, diachrony, and history, it is not only true that diachronic philosophical analyses of science can contribute to a better understanding of the history of science; synchronic philosophical analyses can also shed light on some historiographical problems raised in the history of science. On the other hand, every historiographic narrative has theoretical presuppositions, even if it claims to be “merely” descriptive or consists of the narrative criticized by Kuhn of a repository of anecdotes or chronology, and of which historians may or may not be aware.

Thus, it is clear that theoretical-philosophical presuppositions play an important role in choosing the type of history of science to be carried out, within a range that includes the following: biographical, autobiographical, prosopographical, fictional, thematic, institutional, national, disciplinary, comparative, hypothetical (counterfactual), anachronic (Whig or presentist), diachronic, experimental, scientometrical, and conceptual (theoretical, philosophical). The various types of historiographic analyses always presuppose some sort of theory about science, though it may be a poor or murky one. And in some of the different types of historiographic analyses, e.g., in the conceptual history of science, some general philosophical concept of science and some metascientific concepts usually explicated by philosophy, such as scientific concept, hypothesis, law and theory, are also presupposed.

Finally, we must bear in mind that there are no clear-cut boundaries in the continuum formed by the different modes of doing research relating the philosophy of science to the history of science: synchronic philosophical, diachronic philosophical, historico-epistemological, and conceptual analyses of episodes in the history of science. We must also emphasize that even when these approaches explicitly adopt different perspectives or conceptions, they may be linked together or combined in various ways. Consider, for example, a classical, historicist, or semantic view of theories, in the case of synchronic philosophical analyses; or a Fleckian, Popperian, Kuhnian, Lakatosian, Laudanian, or structuralist approach, in the case of diachronic philosophical analyses; or a Duhemian, Bachelardian, Canguilhemian, Dastonian, Rennian, or Rheinbergerian view, in the case of the historical epistemology, both old and new.

5.1 Synchronic Philosophical Analyses

Within synchronic philosophical analyses, equally linked to the history of science for the reasons given above, we can refer to those already mentioned in Section 4, where, from different conceptions of scientific theories, distinct biological theories were analyzed at different moments of their historical development. For instance, the theory of evolution by natural selection in Darwin’s time, by using a Lakatosian (Palma & Wolovelsky 1997) or a structuralist analysis (Ginnobili 2010; Ginnobili & Blanco 2019); or for an analysis of the same theory at the time of the “synthesis” (Klimovsky 1994), or at a later time (Mahner & Bunge 1997) by using the classical view of theories. On the other hand, given the relations between synchrony and diachrony, some of the works mentioned in Section 4 provide a natural basis for the diachronic analyses referred to in the next section.

In addition, some of the works mentioned in Section 4 made it possible to address specific problems raised by historians about the theories analyzed. For example, historians of biology have wondered to what extent Darwin and Wallace proposed the same theory or whether Mendel, with his work, mainly tried to solve the problem of heredity, introducing the basic concepts of genetics and the laws that bear his name. With their synchronic philosophical analysis of the theory of evolution by natural selection, Ginnobili & Blanco (2019) show that Darwin’s and Wallace’s theories coincide in many ways. However, Darwin’s proposal should be considered more general, encompassing, and unifying than Wallace’s, such that Wallace’s would constitute a part, more precisely a specialization in the sense of metatheoretical structuralism, of Darwin’s theory. In contrast, synchronic philosophical analyses of Mendel’s work (Casanueva 1997, 2002; P. Lorenzano 2022) show the difficulty in stating that Mendel proposed a theory of heredity in identical terms to what is usually presented under the label of classical or even Mendelian genetics.

5.2 Diachronic Philosophical Analyses

As far as diachronic philosophical analyses are concerned, Mercedes O’Lery (2016) carries out a Kuhnian examination of the controversy generated around Rebeca Gerschman and Denham Harman regarding the priority of the free radical hypothesis in living systems. She shows that this “empirical novelty” demanded a change of the paradigm/disciplinary-matrix for chemical reactions. This would later be articulated in the Leonor Michaelis’s work on partial reduction of molecular oxygen. On the other hand, César Lorenzano (1994) also provides a Kuhnian analysis of the work of Argentine Nobel Prize winner Luis Federico Leloir, but in terms of a “structuralized Kuhnian normal science”, that is, an “improved” version of Kuhn’s normal science with the tools of Sneedian or metatheoretical structuralism, but used in an informal way.

Juan Manuel Torres (1996), in turn, assesses the various stages in the evolution of the competing phenotype and genotype research programs on the origin of life with respect to the crucial Lakatosian notions of progressivity and regressivity. He establishes internal reasons why the RNA version of the genotype program (developed in particular by L. Orgel and S. Spiegelman) has taken on a progressive character and enjoys recognition by the international scientific community.

Also appealing to Lakatos, Martín Orensanz and Guillermo Denegri (2017) examine the possibility of using the methodology of scientific research programs for reconstructing the history of helminthology and the comparison between the two rival programs in helminthology, the internalist and the externalist, from the seventeenth century to the nineteenth and twentieth centuries. In their analysis of the Gaia research program, Nei F. Nunes-Neto, Ricardo Santos do Carmo, and Charbel N. El-Hani (2009) hold that the success of the CLAW hypothesis, named after R.J. Charlson, J.E. Lovelock, M.O. Andreae, S.G. Warren, can be qualified as a “progressive problem shift” in the understanding of the sulphur cycle.

Several episodes of biological science are analyzed within the framework of structuralist view of theories, Sneedian or metatheoretical structuralism, accepting from the outset that interpretation takes place in philosophy of science and history of science, as well as in science itself, both in natural and social and human science (Stegmüller 1979), and that the working process in philosophy of science, as well as with its link to history of science, can be conceived as one of feedback or reflective equilibrium (Stegmüller 1973, 1986, 1987). Both aspects, the hermeneutic and that of understanding the process as one of reflective equilibrium, was later emphasized by Schickore (2011).

Although the diachronic philosophical analyses made by Santiago Ginnobili and Daniel Blanco concentrate on the history of evolutionary biology, those carried out by Mario Casanueva, Diego Méndez, and Pablo Lorenzano do the same with the history of genetics. Ginnobili (2014) analyzes the relationship between the Darwinian theory of natural selection and the intelligent design of natural theology not only in terms of theoretical incommensurability but also of empirical incommensurability, with both concepts of incommensurability understood in a structuralist way. Daniel Blanco (2016) analyzes the peripheral or accidental changes in the development of the theory of natural selection, and Ginnobili and Blanco (2019) analyze the relationship between Darwin’s and Wallace’s elaborations of the theory of natural selection, showing that the diachronic modification of the set of intended applications of the theory of natural selection does not affect its identity. They further analyze the incorporation of some previous Owenian components into Darwin’s theory of natural selection (D. Blanco & Ginnobili 2020).

In addition, based on his own historiographic research (P. Lorenzano 1995), Pablo Lorenzano (2007b, 2008) carries out a structuralist analysis of the different theories proposed by the scientists usually mentioned in the “official story” or “orthodox image” of classical genetics (Mendel, the rediscoverers De Vries, Correns and Tschermak, Bateson and Morgan) as forming a continuous, cumulative and linear process. His analysis shows that among these theoretical developments, there are both continuities and ruptures, which are best conceptualized in terms of the explicated concepts of theoretical incommensurability and empirical comparability. Moreover, by making more precise some concepts of the problem-solving approach, Lorenzano analyzes the interrogative aspects of Mendel’s hybridist theories, the theory of the development/evolution of hybrids and the theory on the cellular foundation of the development/evolution of hybrids (2013b), and the change from Bateson’s Mendelism to Morgan’s Classical Genetics (2013c).

Complementary to Lorenzano’s analyses, Méndez and Casanueva (2012) combine aspects of the structuralist program’s apparatus with the ordination technique of formal concept analysis (Wille 2005) to reconstruct the domain of biological heredity theories from the period of 1865–1902. In addition to Mendel’s proposal, this period includes Brooks’s theory, Galton’s and Darwin’s pangenesis, De Vries’ intracellular pangenesis, Weismann’s germ-plasm theory, Pearson’s law of ancestral heredity, and Bateson’s and Yule’s proposals around 1902.

5.3 Historico-epistemological Analyses

One of the most important and influential proposals for a philosophical history of science or a historical epistemology in Latin America is that of Mexican biologist, philosopher, and historian of science Carlos López Beltrán, already mentioned in Section 3. Good examples of his work in this direction are provided by his series of publications (López Beltrán 1994, 1995, 2004a, 2004b, 2007), in which he carries out a conceptual history à la Canguilhem by analyzing the historical structuration of the concept of biological heredity, stressing in particular the role played by the medical and alienist tradition, and not only the significance of the traditions of hybridists, breeders, Mendelians, and biometricians.

Studies within the historico-epistemological tradition are also conducted by Mexican biologist, philosopher, and historian of science Edna Suárez-Díaz. Significant contributions include her 1960s–1970s analysis of the case of molecular evolution as a process of integration of different types of traditions, including theoretical, experimental, and descriptive, that share a scientific domain, in which the concepts of molecular clock and informational molecules played a central role (Suárez-Díaz 1995, 2009); and her Rheinbergerian study of the construction of satellite-DNA and the evolution of nucleic acid hybridization, which illustrates the close relationship existing between the evolution of techniques and the stabilization of phenomena in experimental biology (Suárez-Díaz 2001).

From a perspective that combines history, philosophy, and sociology of science, Mexican Vivette García-Deister, mentioned in Section 3, argues that models of genetic regulation do not replace each other as they solve problems but rather are provisional answers to questions posed by scientists in a given context, attending to the establishment and use of the three types of technologies distinguished by Shapin and Schaffer (1985) in their study of Boyle: the material, the literary, and the social technological (García-Deister 2013).

Taking his interest in evolutionary biology as a starting point and convinced of the relevance of epistemological history as an indispensable form of philosophical analysis of scientific discourse, Argentine-born and Brazil-based philosopher and historian of biology Gustavo Caponi, mentioned in Section 3, has developed one of the most prolific bodies of work in Latin America from this approach. In an attempt to better understand the process of naturalization of teleology operated by the theory of natural selection, and to have a point of comparison with the Darwinian formulation of the idea of adaptation, he begins a series of historico-epistemological analyses à la Canguilhem aimed at understanding the way in which organic teleology was considered in pre-Darwinian Natural History. He also aims to correct certain historiographical myths, such as Cuvier’s or Lamarck’s supposed adaptationism and Alfred Russel Wallace’s putative discovery of the theory of natural selection. Some of the most significant results of his historico-epistemological research are found in his books on Cuvier (Caponi 2008), on Buffon (Caponi 2010), and in his epistemological history of the adaptationist program (Caponi 2011), in the account of which he uses Toulmin’s concept of ideal of natural order.

Moreover, in a kind of historical epistemology from a conceptual-philosophical point of view, Brazilian Maurício de Carvalho Ramos addresses history of biology. He published several papers of this type of analysis, especially applied to cases taken from the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries, in particular the natural philosophy of Pierre-Louis Moreau de Maupertuis, regarding which Ramos analyzes the trajectory of his natural philosophy linked to Newtonianism, showing that he formulated the principle of minimum action and that his theory of organic generation brought a new approach to issues related to crossbreeding and hybridization, the production of malformations, and the transformation of races and species (Ramos 2003, 2004, 2005, 2009).

After a historical review of the gene as an instrumental concept and the advent of a realist view and genes as units in Mendelian genetics to the classical concept of the molecular gene, Charbel El-Hani (2007), mentioned in Section 4.3 and Section 5.2 and known for his work at the intersections between philosophy, history, and education of biology and his important contributions to biosemantics, calls attention to the crossroads at which the concept of gene finds itself: on the one hand, being at risk of being erased from the genetic vocabulary and, on the other, benefiting from efforts to save it from this fate. El-Hani advocates maintaining this concept, but considers that the unit concept should be dispensed with, and that, regarding the generality of biological concepts, gene included, it should be considered on a restricted domain of application similarly to what Weber (1999) argues for biological laws, paving the way for a new and possibly pluralistic understanding of what a gene is.

Following another line of research within the historico-epistemological analyses, Brazilian biologist and historian Maria Elice Brzezinski Prestes, who also works at the intersections between philosophy, history, and education of biology, focuses her work on methodological and philosophical aspects of observation and experimentation in the history of biology, especially on the development of the experimental method in the modern age. Her research on Lazzaro Spallanzani tends to correlate methodological, empirical, and conceptual considerations of Spallanzani’s studies on plant and animal reproduction, striving to offer an epistemological foundation that shows the autonomy of research on living beings in the eighteenth century, as well as to provide new evidence of the consolidation of the experimental method developed by the Italian naturalist, whose perspective of tracing analogies allowed the unification of these two “great groups of organized beings” (Prestes 2006; Prestes & Russo 2008).

5.4 Conceptual Historical Analyses

To conclude this section, among the many conceptual analyses of history of biology linked to the philosophy of that discipline developed in Latin America, we will mention below only a few of them, carried out in Mexico and Brazil. One of the central themes addressed in Mexico in this kind of history is evolutionary biology, in particular the history of the reception and development of Darwinism in Mexico and its connection with positivism. This has been analyzed by biologists, historians, and philosophers of biology Rosaura Ruiz and Ana Barahona, two of the most influential and best-known promoters not only of the conceptual history of biology but also of the history of biology in general, including its institutional history, as well as the philosophy of biology in Mexico.

Following Ivette Conry’s (1974) argument that the introduction of Darwinism in a country implies that it becomes operative within biology and is applied to the interpretation of biological facts, and not only to their mention or discussion, Ruiz (1987, 1996) analyzes Darwinism in Mexico. She points out that the first known discussion of Darwinism in Mexico, starting with the lecture given in February 1877 by Pedro Noriega at the Gabino Barreda Methodofile Society, was mainly concerned with philosophical issues, such that the introduction of evolutionism to biology did not occur in Mexico at the end of the nineteenth century, when biology was still in its beginnings.

Among Ana Barahona’s numerous publications on the history of biology, especially on the history of genetics in Mexico (Barahona & Gaona 2001; Barahona, Pinar & Ayala 2003, 2005; Barahona & Ayala 2005; Barahona 2008, 2009, 2010, 2013; Barahona & Richmond 2020; Alonso-Pavón et al. 2021), are those in which she takes up Ruiz’s analysis and complements it by pointing out that it was Justo Sierra who first made Darwin’s ideas known in Mexico in 1875, triggering the debate that took place both in scientific societies and the press (Barahona & Ledesma 2002; Ledesma & Barahona 2003; Barahona 2009). The analysis of visual representations in the history of biology constitutes another Barahona’s lines of research (Barahona 2007), which is followed by Mexican biologist and historian of science Erica Torrens in relation to representation through diagrams, such as those used in natural history and evolutionary biology (Torrens & Barahona 2012, 2013, 2014), or through images and pictures to represent Homo sapiens and racial hierarchies (Torrens 2019).

In Section 4.1, we mentioned one of Brazil’s most prominent Darwin specialists, Anna Carolina K. P. Regner, in connection with her critique of the conception of Darwin’s theory in terms of the classical view, particularly her critique of the hypothetico-deductive reconstructions of Darwin’s short argument and her analysis of his one long argument. Expanding on the latter, Regner makes a very detailed analysis of the structure and the functioning of Darwinian argumentation. As an analytical too, she adopts Dascal’s typology of polemic interactions, in particular his analyses of controversies and their role in scientific argumentation, and his concept of soft rationality (Regner 2014): one that weighs reasons for and against, whose logic is non-monotonic and cannot be reduced to standard deductive logic, and that unlike deduction, in Leibniz’s words, “inclines without necessitating” (Dascal 1998, 2005). Regner also adopts Aristotle’s Rhetoric as a tool of analysis. She then systematically reconstructs Darwin’s argumentative strategies in Origin, showing a juxtaposition between the rhetorical procedures recommended by Aristotle and those adopted by Darwin, which “persuade without demonstrating”. She describes the particular whole-part movement, Darwin’s appeal to the explanatory power as a whole, the comparison of his view with those of his opponents, the treatment of difficulties/objections, the interplay of the actual and the possible, and the weight of reasons (Regner 2007, 2014) and also explores the interactions that took place in the scientific controversy between Darwin and Mivart, in particular the argumentative strategies employed by them (Regner 2008).

Another detailed analysis of Darwin’s argumentation, particularly of the one he developed in relation to the origin of domestic pigeons (Darwin 1859: Chap. 1; 1868: Vol. I, Chaps. 5–6), is carried out by Brazilian physicist, historian, and philosopher of science Roberto de Andrade Martins (2012). Andrade Martins is mainly a historian and philosopher of physics but has also made contributions in the field of the history of biology, where he stresses methodological, foundational and dynamical aspects of scientific work (L. Martins & R. Martins 1996; R. Martins 2005) and contributes to the education of new generations of philosophers and historians of science in Brazil, including in the field of biology. In his analysis of Darwin’s study of pigeons, Martins highlights the relevance of Darwin’s claim that all known breeds were produced from a single species, Columba livia or the rock pigeon, since the differences between the several domestic breeds is so large that, if they were found in the wild, they could be classified as different species or genera, as well as the relevance of an experiment crossing widely different breeds, which led Darwin to obtain pigeons similar to wild species. Andrade Martins’s analysis shows the extreme care Darwin took in his attempt to provide strong arguments for his theory.

However, not all conceptual analyses of history of biology are limited to evolutionary biology. There are also analyses of theories of heredity and genetics, both in their relation to evolutionary biology and in their independent treatment. To the analyses on heredity and genetics already mentioned in Sections 5.1–5.3, we would like to add those by Brazilians Luzia Castañeda and Lilian Al-Chueyr Pereira Martins, both of whom trained with Roberto de Andrade Martins. Whereas biologist and historian of science Luzia Castañeda analyzes Buffon’s and Bonnet’s ideas on reproduction and heredity (Castañeda 1995) and the idea of acquired characters in Lamarck, Darwin, and Weismann (Castañeda 1997), biologist, historian, and philosopher of science Lilian Al-Chueyr Pereira Martins carries out numerous and very careful analyses linked to conceptual and methodological aspects, in addition to the history of evolution, particularly of Lamarck’s work (L. Martins 2007) and early genetics, mainly Bateson’s work and the chromosomal theory of inheritance (L. Martins 1998, 1999a, b, 2006, 2010, 2013, 2020; L. Martins & Prestes 2013).

6. Concluding Remarks

Philosophy of biology in Latin America has come a long way from its early history. It has been developed through changing and challenging circumstances involving social, political, economic, academic, and cultural shifts. However, in recent decades the community of philosophers of biology in the region has experienced exponential growth, a trend that is repeated with regards to the amount and diversification of its production. The originality and depth of work has increased significantly through dialogue both within Latin America and with other regions. This production deserves and is beginning to attain international visibility.

The work of Latin American philosophers of biology of the first and even second generation presented here are now studied by new generations, and many more scholars are trained in this approach to the philosophy of science, laying the foundations for an emerging tradition. Philosophy of biology at present plays an important role in Latin American developments in philosophy of science. In addition, the work done in this area may contribute to teaching, education, and communication of science, and to science policy and management. It may even contribute to the development of a socially sensitive and ethically responsible scientific community and society. Although the future of philosophy of biology in Latin America is difficult to predict, we can state that, given appropriate political and economic conditions, it will further develop and continue to flourish.


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